The tradition of Chinese ethical thought is centrally concerned with questions about how one ought to live: what goes into a worthwhile life, how to weigh duties toward family versus duties toward strangers, whether human nature is predisposed to be morally good or bad, how one ought to relate to the non-human world, the extent to which one ought to become involved in reforming the larger social and political structures of one’s society, and how one ought to conduct oneself when in a position of influence or power. The personal, social, and political are often intertwined in Chinese approaches to the subject. Anyone who wants to draw from the range of important traditions of thought on this subject needs to look seriously at the Chinese tradition. The canonical texts of that tradition have been memorized by schoolchildren in Asian societies for hundreds of years, and at the same time have served as objects of sophisticated and rigorous analysis by scholars and theoreticians rooted in widely variant traditions and approaches. This article will introduce ethical issues raised by some of the most influential texts in Confucianism, Mohism, Daoism, Legalism, and Chinese Buddhism, with the most attention directed at the first four, which are indigenous to China and arose during the classical period (about the middle of the 6th to the end of the 3rd century BCE) of Chinese philosophy.
- 1. Characteristics of Chinese Ethics: Practical Focus and Closeness to Pre-theoretical Experience
- 2. Confucian Ethics
- 2.1 Virtue ethics: the dao, the junzi, and ren
- 2.2 The centrality of li or ritual
- 2.3 Ren and li as relational values in contrast to values of individual autonomy
- 2.4 The centrality of filiality in Confucian ethics and the doctrine of care with distinctions
- 2.5 Mencius’s defense of care with distinctions and his theory of the roots of moral knowledge and motivation in human nature
- 2.6 Xunzi versus Mencius on human nature and the origins of morality
- 2.7 Confucianism and the situationist problem for virtue ethics
- 2.8 Responsibility and agency in Confucian ethics
- 2.9 Neo-Confucian theories of morality and their grounding in a cosmology
- 2.10 Confucianism and Gender
- 2.11 Confucianism and Liberal Democracy
- 3. Mohist Ethics
- 4. Daoist Ethics
- 5. Legalism (Fajia)
- 6. Chinese Buddhist Ethics
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In the Analects 13.18, the Governor of She tells Confucius of a Straight Body who reported his father to the authorities for stealing a sheep. Confucius (Kongzi, best known in the West under his latinized name, lived in the 6th and 5th century B.C.E) replies that in his village, uprightness lies in fathers and sons covering up for each other. In the Euthyphro, Socrates encounters Euthyphro (whose name can be translated as “Straight thinker”), reputed for his religious knowledge and on his way to bring charges against his father for murder. The conversation between Socrates and Euthyphro leads to a theoretical inquiry in which various proposed answers as to piety’s ousia (essence) are probed and ultimately found unsatisfactory, but in which no answer to the piety or impiety of Euthyphro’s action is given. The contrast between these two stories highlights one of the distinctive features of Chinese ethics in general: its respect for the practical problem. The practical problem discussed by Confucius and Socrates is arguably a universal one: the conflict between loyalty owed to a family member and duty to uphold public justice within the larger community. Confucius’s response is one dimension of a characteristically Chinese respect for the practical problem. The nature of the problem demands a practical response. However, another dimension of a reflective respect for the practical problem is to maintain a certain humility in the face of a really hard problem. It is to be skeptical that highly abstract theories will provide a response that is true to the complexities of that problem. A tradition exemplifying such respect will contain influential works that will not pretend to have resolved recurring tensions within the moral life such as those identified in the Analects and the Euthyphro.
Confucius gives an immediate practical answer in 13.18, but the reader and commentators have been left to weave together the various remarks about filiality (or as it is often called, “filial piety”) so as to present a rationale for that answer. These remarks quite often concern rather particular matters, as is the matter of turning in one’s father for stealing a sheep, and the implications for more general issues are ambiguous. Do fathers and sons cover up for each other on all occasions, no matter how serious, and if there is a cover-up, is there also an attempt to compensate the victim of the wrongdoing? The particularity of these passages is tied up with the emphasis on praxis. What is sought and what is discussed is often the answer to a particular practical problem, and the resulting particularity of the remarks invites multiple interpretations. The sayings often are presented as emerging from conversations between Confucius and his students or various personages with official positions, or among Confucius’s students. One passage (11.22) portrays Confucius as having tailored his advice according to the character of the particular student: he urges one student to ask father and elder brother for advice before practicing something he has learnt, while he urges the other to immediately practice; the reason is that the first has so much energy that he needs to be kept back, while the second is retiring and needs to be urged forward. With this passage in mind, we might then wonder whether the apparent tension between remarks made in connection with a concept is to be understood in terms of the differences between the individuals addressed or other aspects of the conversational context.
All texts that have become canonical within a tradition, of course, are subject to multiple interpretations, but Chinese texts invite them. They invite them by articulating themes that stay relatively close to the pre-theoretical experience that gives rise to the practical problems of moral life (see Kupperman 1999 on the role of experience in Chinese philosophy). The pre-theoretical is not experience that is a pure given or unconceptualized, nor is it necessarily experience that is universal in its significance and intelligibility across different traditions of thought and culture. This attention to pre-theoretical experience also leads to differences in format and discursive form: dialogues and stories are more suited for appealing to and evoking the kind of pre-theoretical experience that inspires parts of the text. By contrast, much Western philosophy has gone with Plato in taking the route of increasing abstraction from pre-theoretical experience.
The contrast is not meant to imply that Chinese philosophy fails to give rise to theoretical reflection. Theoretical reflection of great significance arises in the Mozi, Mencius, Hanfeizi, Xunzi, and Zhuangzi, but there is more frequent interplay between the theorizing and references to pre-theoretical experience. In Chinese texts there are suggestions for theorizing about this experience, but the suggestions often indicate several different and fruitful directions for theorizing to go further. These directions may seem incompatible, and they may or may not be so in the end, but the tensions between these directions are real. The result is a fruitful ambiguity that poses a problematic. Pre-theoretical experience poses a practical problem. Apparently incompatible solutions to problems are partially theorized in the text, but the apparent incompatibility is not removed. Much of the value of these texts lies in their leaving the tensions in place with enough theory given to stimulate thinking within a certain broadly defined approach. There is more than enough for the sophisticated theorist to try to interpret or to reconstruct a more defined position as an extension of that broadly defined approach. At the same time, the problematic is partly framed with the language of pre-theoretical experience in the form of dialogue and story, making the texts accessible to a much broader range of readers than is usually the case with philosophy texts. The following sections present some of the major kinds of problematic that appear in the major schools of Chinese ethical thought.
A common way to understand Confucian ethics is that it is a virtue ethic. For some scholars this will be an obvious, uncontroversial truth. For others, it is a misconstrual that imposes contentious Western assumptions on Confucianism about what it is to be a person and what an ethics should be about. In light of this controversy, it is important to specify the sense in which it is relatively uncontroversial to claim that virtues constitute a major focus of attention in these texts. Virtues in the relevant sense are qualities or traits that persons could have and that are appropriate objects of aspiration to realize. These virtues go into the conception of an ideal of a kind of person that one aspires to be. Given this rather broad sense of “virtue,” it is unobjectionable to say that Confucian texts discuss ethics primarily in terms of virtues and corresponding ideals of the person.
What makes the characterization of Confucianism as a virtue ethic controversial are more specific, narrower senses of “virtue” employed in Western philosophical theories. Tiwald (2018) distinguishes between something like the broad sense of virtue and a philosophical usage that confers on qualities or traits of character explanatory priority over right action and promoting good consequences. Virtue ethics in this sense is a competitor to rule deontological and consequentialist theories. There simply is not enough discussion in the Confucian texts, especially in the classical period, that is addressed to the kind of questions these Western theories seek to answer.
There are other narrower senses of “virtue” that are clearly mischaracterizations when applied to Confucian ethics. Virtues might be supposed to be qualities that people have or can have in isolation from others with whom they interact or from their communities, societies, or culture. Such atomistic virtues could make up ideals of the person that in turn can be specified or realized in social isolation. Further, virtues might be supposed to be identifiable through generalizations that hold true in every case, such that the ways these traits are concretely manifested in conduct do not vary across context or situation. Prominent and influential critics of the “virtue” characterization of Confucian ethics--Roger Ames (2011, 2021) and Robert Neville (2016)--seem to be supposing that the term is loaded with such controversial presuppositions.
As will become clear in subsequent discussion here, one can employ virtue language with the appropriate qualifiers and at the same time acknowledge much of what the critics claim as insights of Confucian ethics: e.g., that the process of realizing the virtues characteristically takes place in relationship to others--those to whom one has responsibilities as a son or daughter or mother or father, for example--and that it can be part of one’s very identity to be a particular person’s son or daughter, mother or father. It is part of the Confucian vision of a life befitting human beings that it is a life of relationships marked by mutual care and respect, that one achieves fullest personhood that way. One achieves this in a manner that is particular to one’s circumstances, including the particular others with whom one most interacts. None of this is inconsistent with virtue characterizations in the broad sense (for an alternative role-ethic characterization of Confucian ethics that incorporates these insights in a different way, see Ames, 2011, 2021).
The most frequently discussed ideal is that of the junzi. The Chinese word originally meant “prince’s son,” but in the Analects it refers to ethical nobility. The first English translations rendered it as “gentleman,” but Ames and Rosemont (1998) have usefully suggested “exemplary person.” Among the traits connected to ethical nobility are filiality, a respect for and dedication to the performance of traditional ritual forms of conduct, and the ability to judge what the right thing to do is in the given situation. These traits are virtues in the sense that they are necessary for following the dao, the way human beings ought to live their lives. As Yu (2007) points out, the dao plays the kind of role in ancient Chinese ethics that is analogous to the role played by eudaimonia or flourishing, in ancient Greek ethics. The junzi is the ethical exemplar with the virtues making it possible to follow the dao.
Besides the concepts of dao and junzi, the concept of ren is a unifying theme in the Analects. Before Confucius’s time, the concept of ren referred to the aristocracy of bloodlines, meaning something like the strong and handsome appearance of an aristocrat. But in the Analects the concept is of a moral excellence that anyone has the potential to achieve. Various translations have been given of ren. Many translations attempt to convey the idea of complete ethical virtue, connoting a comprehensive state of ethical excellence. In a number of places in the Analects the ren person is treated as equivalent to the junzi, indicating that ren has the meaning of complete or comprehensive moral excellence, lacking no particular virtue but having them all. However, ren in some places in the Analects is treated as one virtue among others such as wisdom and courage. In the narrower sense of being one virtue among others, it is explained in 12.22 in terms of caring for others. It is in light of these passages that other translators, such as D.C. Lau, 1970a, use ‘benevolence’ to translate ren. However, others have tried to more explicitly convey the sense of ‘ren’ in the comprehensive sense of all-encompassing moral virtue through use of the translation ‘Good’ or ‘Goodness’ (see Waley, 1938, 1989; Slingerland, 2003). It is possible that the sense of ren as particular virtue and the sense of comprehensive excellence are related in that attitudes such as care and respect for others may be a pervasive aspect of different forms of moral excellence, e.g., such attitudes may be expressed in ritual performance, as discussed below, or in right or appropriate action according to the context. But this suggestion is speculative, and because the very nature of ren remains so elusive, it shall be here referred to simply as‘ren’.
Why is the central virtue discussed in such an elusive fashion in the Analects? The answer may lie in the role that pre-theoretical experience plays in Chinese philosophy. Tan (2005) has pointed to the number and vividness of the persons in the Analects who serve as moral exemplars. She suggests that the text invites us to exercise our imaginations in envisioning what these people might have been like and what we ourselves might become in trying to emulate them. Use of the imagination, she points out, draws our attention to the particularities of virtue and engages our emotions and desires. Amy Olberding (2008, 2012) develops the notion of exemplarism into a Confucian epistemology, according to which we get much of our important knowledge by encountering the relevant objects or persons. Upon initial contact, we may have little general knowledge of the qualities that make them so compelling to us, but we are motivated to further investigate. Confucius treated as exemplars legendary figures from the early days of the Zhou dynasty, such as the Duke of Zhou and Kings Wu and Wen. Confucius served as an exemplar to his students, perhaps of the virtue of ren, though he never claimed the virtue for himself. Book Ten of the Analects displays what might appear to be an obsessive concern with the way Confucius greeted persons in everyday life, e.g., if he saw they were dressed in mourning dress, he would take on a solemn appearance or lean forward on the stanchion of his carriage. Such concern becomes much more comprehensible if Confucius is being treated as an exemplar of virtue from which the students are trying to learn. The focus of Book Ten and elsewhere in the Analects also suggests that the primary locus of virtue is to be found in how people treat each other in the fabric of everyday life and not in the dramatic moral dilemmas so much discussed in contemporary Western moral philosophy.
Analects 1.15 likens the project of cultivating one’s character to crafting something fine from raw material: cutting bone, carving a piece of horn, polishing or grinding a piece of jade. The chapter also stresses the importance of li (the rites, ritual) in this project. In the Analects ritual ranges quite widely to include ceremonies of ancestor worship, the burial of parents, and customs governing respectful and appropriate behavior within the family and with friends, in everyday interactions with others in one’s village, and protocols for officials performing their duties within the court.
Ritual is an exemplification of the saying that the personal is the political. It is personal in the sense that engaging in ritual, learning to perform it properly and with the right attitudes of respect and consideration while performing it, is to engage in a kind of cutting and carving and polishing and grinding of the self. One of the most distinctive marks of Confucian ethics is the centrality of ritual performance in the ethical cultivation of character. For example, while Aristotelian habituation generally corresponds to the Confucian cultivation of character, there is no comparable emphasis in Aristotle on the role of ritual performance in this process of character transformation. Ritual is also political in the sense that the right governance of a society is thought to be founded upon the appropriate conduct of relationships at all levels in a society, starting with family relationships as the foundation. As Olberding puts it, the term li covers both good manners and political civility because the Confucians did not distinguish between them: “both require interpreting situations and steering conduct to communicate respect, consideration, and toleration. Success in both will likewise often depend on developed disposition, on prior patterning that renders me more prone to one kind of response than another” (2019, 28).
It is clear that in the Analects any complete description of self-cultivation must include a role for the culturally established customs that spell out what it means to express respect for another person in various social contexts. Just how that role is conceived, however, is one of the central interpretive puzzles concerning the Analects. The interpretive question of how li is central to self-cultivation is posed in particular about its relation to the chief virtue of ren. In the Analects 3.3 the Master said, “A man who is not ren—what has he to do with ritual?” The implication is that ritual is a means of cultivating and expressing a ren that is already there, at least in a raw or unrefined state. This implication about the role of ritual is consistent with passages of the Analects in which Confucius shows flexibility on the question of whether to follow established ritual practice. 9.3 shows him accepting the contemporary practice of wearing a cheaper silk ceremonial cap rather than the traditional linen cap. 9.3 also shows Confucius rejecting the contemporary practice of bowing after one ascends the stairs leading up to the ruler’s dais, and maintaining the traditional practice of bowing before one ascends the stairs. The implication is that the contemporary practice expresses the wrong attitude toward the ruler—presumptuousness in assuming permission to ascend. 9.3 suggests that it is something like the right attitude that is cultivated and expressed by ritual. Kwong-loi Shun (1993) has called this kind of understanding of ritual the “instrumental” interpretation.
However, in other places of the Analects, ritual seems to take on a more central role in the achievement of ren. Indeed, it seems to be presented as the key. A very common translation of 12.1 has Confucius telling his favorite student Yan Hui that “Restraining yourself and returning to the rites constitutes ren. If for one day you managed to restrain yourself and return to the rites, in this way you could lead the entire world back to ren. The key to achieving ren lies within yourself—how could it come from others?” (translation from Slingerland, 2003, though see Li, 2007, for a different translation of the word wei usually translated as ‘constitutes’, with different implications for the question of the relation between li and ren). Such passages have given rise to the “definitionalist” interpretation, as Shun calls it, which makes li definitive of the whole of ren. Obviously the instrumental and definitional interpretations cannot both be true.
One possibility for resolving this tension is to construe Confucius’ remarks as directed towards a particular student and informed by his conception of what sort of advice that student needs to hear given his strengths and weaknesses. Perhaps Confucius believes that Yan Hui should be focusing on disciplining himself through observing the rites, but his advice should not be be taken as an intended generalization about the relationship between ren and li. Perhaps the remarks that suggest more of an instrumentalist construal of the relationship are similarly context and audience bound. Such interpretation, of course, leaves open the question of what that relationship is, or indeed, whether Confucius ever had in mind a generalization about the relationship that informed his remarks.
Some have argued that such serious conflicts within the text constitute reasons for thinking that the Analects is an accretive text, i.e., composed of layers added at different times by different people with conflicting views. To some extent, viewing the Analects as accretive is nothing new, but Bruce and A. Takeo Brooks (1998, 2000) have taken that view very far by identifying Book 4 (and only part of it, for that matter) as the most reflective of the historical Kongzi’s views, and the other books as stemming from Confucius’s students and members of his family. The different books, and, sometimes, individual passages within the books, represent different time periods, people, with different agendas who are responding to different conditions, and often putting forward incompatible strands of Confucianism. The Brooks suggest that the parts of the Analects most directly associated with the historical Confucius and his disciples are the parts that feature ren as the pre-eminent virtue and that de-emphasize the role of ritual. The parts that are due to another trend in Confucianism, headed by Confucius’s descendants, are the parts that elevate ritual as the key to ren. The Brooks’s theory of the Analects has drawn appreciation and disagreement (e.g., see Slingerland, 2000 for both). It threatens to dislodge the assumption that underlies the dominant mode of interpreting the Analects, which is that the text, or most of it, reflects the coherent thought of one person.
Tao Jiang (2022) distinguishes between the sinological approach of the kind done by the Brooks and the approach of philosophers that focuses on the “influential received text” which presents to the reader a “textual author,” e.g., a Confucius, to whom authorial intent is attributed through the sayings and ideas in the text. The philosopher investigates this textual object as part of a lengthy and highly influential philosophical and cultural tradition that often deploys texts to address problems of contemporary concern.
A third approach, different from though in some respects simiar to the second, is to acknowledge the real possibility that different sets of passages are the products of different thinkers, but also to hold that these different thinkers might have employed different but philosophically substantial perspectives on common problems. One of those problems might indeed have been the relation between ren and li, and at least part of the explanation of why different and potentially conflicting things are said about that relation is that the relation is a difficult one to figure out and that different thinkers addressing that common problem might reasonably have arrived at different things to say. Whether these different things are ultimately irreconcilable remains an open question. This third approach merges with the second if one is open to the possibility that the “textual author” could be conceived as being of more than one mind as to how to solve the problem in question. This, after all, is a plausible thing to say about some philosophers of whom we are pretty sure that they were the single authors of the texts under study. One might take a constructive attitude to the different possible solutions, ask what good philosophical reasons could motivate the different approaches, and determine whether there is a way of reconciling what all the good reasons entail. If not, one can ask what might be the best solution, all things considered.
Kwong-loi Shun’s approach to the ren and li is compatible with the third approach. Shun holds that on the one hand, a particular set of ritual forms are the conventions that a community has evolved, and without such forms attitudes such as respect or reverence cannot be made intelligible or expressed (reasons in favor of the definitionalist interpretation). In this sense, li constitutes ren within or for a given community. On the other hand, different communities may have different conventions that express respect or reverence, and moreover any given community may revise its conventions in piecemeal though not wholesale fashion (reasons in favor of the instrumentalist interpretation).
Chenyang Li (2007) proposes a different approach based on a different reading of the word ‘wei’ used in 12.1 and often translated as ‘constitutes’ to render the crucial line, “Restraining yourself and returning to the rites constitutes ren.” Li notes that a common meaning of the word is ‘make’ or ‘result in.’ The relation between li and ren need not be construed as either definitional or constitutive, nor need it be construed as purely instrumental. Li proposes that li functions something like a cultural grammar where ren is like mastery of the culture. Mastery of a language entails mastery of its grammar but not vice versa.
Both Shun and Li are striving to capture a way in which ren does not reduce to li but also a way in which li is more than purely instrumental to the realization of ren. There are good philosophical reasons for this move. Consider the reasons for resisting the reduction of ren to li. As indicated above, 9.3 suggests that the attitudes of respect and reverence that are expressed by ritual forms are not reducible to any particular set of such forms, and Shun has a point in arguing that such attitudes could be expressed by different sets of such forms as established by different communities. In studying the cultures of other communities, we recognize that certain customs are meant to signify respect, even if we do not share these customs, just as we recognize that something that does not signify disrespect in our culture does indeed so signify in another culture. The fact that we can distinguish the attitude from the ritual forms that we use to express them allows us to consider alternative ritual forms that could express the same or similar attitude. Ceremonial caps that are made of more economical material are acceptable, perhaps, because wearing such caps do not affect the spirit of the ceremony. By contrast, bowing after one ascends the stairs constitutes an unacceptable change in attitude. To maintain that particular ritual forms do not define the respect and reverence they are intended to express is not to underestimate their importance for cultivating and strengthening these attitudes. Acting in ways that express respect given the conventionally established meanings of accepted ritual forms helps to strengthen the agent’s disposition to have respect. The ethical development of character does involve strengthening some emotional dispositions over others, and we
strengthen dispositions by acting on them. By providing conventionally established, symbolic ways to express respect for others, ritual forms give participants ways to act on and therefore to strengthen the right dispositions. The cultivating function of observing ritual highlights the distinctive practical focus of Confucian ethics. It is every bit as concerned with how to acquire the right sort of character as it is with what the right sort is.
On the other hand, there is good reason to resist the reduction of li simply to the role of expressing and cultivating a set of attitudes and emotional dispositions. In his influential interpretation (1972) of the Analects, Herbert Fingarette construes ritual performance as an end in itself, as beautiful and dignified, open and shared participation in ceremonies that celebrate human community. Ritual performance, internalized so that it becomes second nature, such that it is gracefully and spontaneously performed, is a crucial constituent of a fully realized human life. There are nonconventional dimensions of what it is to show respect, such as providing food for one’s parents (see Analects 2.7), but the particular way the agent does this will be deeply influenced by custom. Indeed, custom specifies what is a respectful way of serving food. On the Confucian view, doing so in a graceful and whole-hearted fashion as spelled out by the customs of one’s community is part of what it is to live a fully human life.
Ritual constitutes an important part of what ren is, and hence it is not merely an instrument for refining the substance of ren. At the same time it is not the whole of ren. Consider that part of ren that involves attitudinal dispositions. Attitude is not reducible to ritual form even if acting on that form can cultivate and sustain attitude. Moreover, 7.30 emphasizes the connection between desire for ren and its achievement (“If I simply desire ren, I find that it is already there”). The achievement of ren is of course a difficult and long journey, and so 7.30 implies that coming to truly desire it lies at the heart of that achievement. The multifaceted nature of ren emerges in Book 12, where Confucius is portrayed as giving different descriptions of ren. In 12.1, as already noted, he says that ritual makes for ren. But then in 12.2, he says that ren involves comporting oneself in public as if one were receiving an important guest and in the management of the common people behaving as if one were overseeing a great sacrifice (the duty to be respectful toward others). 12.2 also associates ren with shu or “sympathetic understanding,” not imposing on others what you yourself do not desire. Here the emphasis is not so much on ritual or not exclusively anyway, but on the attitudes one displays toward others, and on the ability to understand what others want or do not want based on projecting oneself into their situation. In 12.3, when asked about ren, Confucius says that ren people are hesitant to speak (suggesting that such people take extreme care not to have their words exceed their actions). And then in 12.22, when asked about ren, Confucius says that it is to care for people. Such diverse characterizations are appropriate if ren is complete ethical virtue or comprehensive excellence that includes many dimensions, including but not reducing to the kinds of excellence associated with li.
If we take the relevant passages on li and ren as forming a whole in which a coherent view is embedded, there is a pretty good case for regarding the observance of ritual propriety as a constituent of ren as well as crucial for instrumentally realizing some other dimensions of ren. But it does not exhaust the substance of ren. If the text is as radically accretive as the Brooks maintain, then the proposed construal of the relation is more of a reconstruction of what the best philosophical position might be on the nature of the relation. The reconstructive possibility should not be disturbing as long as we recognize it for what it is. Thinkers within a complex and vigorous tradition frequently re-interpret, expand, develop, revise, and even reject some of what one has inherited from the past. The fact that the Analects itself might be a product of this kind of engagement might usefully be taken as encouragement for its present students to engage with the text in the same way.
The Confucian position on the importance of li in ethical cultivation is interesting and distinctive in its own right, and this is partly because Confucianism hews close to a kind of pre-theoretical experience of the moral life that might otherwise get obscured by a more purely theoretical approach to ethics. If we look at everyday experience of the moral life, we see that much of the substance of ethically significant attitudes such as respect is in fact given by cultural norms and practices, and learning a morality must involve learning these norms and practices. Children learn what their behavior means to others, and what it should mean, by learning how to greet each other, make requests, and answer requests, all in a respectful manner. Much of our everyday experience of moral socialization lies in the absorption of or teaching to others of customs that are conventionally established to mean respect, gratitude, and other ethically significant attitudes (see Olberding, 2016, 2019).
So construed, Confucian ethics provides an alternative to understanding the nature of the moral life that is different from an understanding that is primarily based on abstract principles, even abstract principles that require respect for each person. This is why there is significant resonance between Confucianism and communitarian philosophies such as those defended by Alasdair MacIntyre (1984, 1989) and Michael Walzer (1983). One of the distinctive marks of communitarianism is the theme that much of the substance of a morality is given not in abstract principles of the sort typically defended in modern Western philosophy but in a society’s specific customs and practices. In the Analects, the ambiguous relation between ren and li poses the problematic of how we are to understand the relation between cultural norms and practices on the one hand and that part of morality that appears to transcend any particular set of norms and practices. The Analects suggests a large role for culture, but on the reading suggested here, not a definitional role. There is much room for theoretical elaboration on the nature of that role.
Furthermore, in understanding why Confucians take a life of ritual practice to be partly constitutive of a fully human life, one must understand the aesthetic dimension of their notion of a fully human life. Such a life is lived as a beautiful and graceful coordinated interaction with others according to conventionally established forms that express mutual respect. A good part of the value attached to the fully human life lies in the aesthetic dimensions of a “dance” (Ihara, 2004) one performs with others. To better understand why the moral and the aesthetic cannot be cleanly separated in Confucian ethics, consider that a graceful and whole-hearted expression of respect can be beautiful precisely because it reflects the extent that the agent has made this moral attitude part of their second nature. The beauty has a moral dimension. Both these themes—the importance of contextualized moral judgment and aesthetic value of human interaction according to custom and tradition—offer opportunities for practitioners of, say, Anglo-American moral philosophy to reflect on what their approaches to the moral life might miss.
Consider ren in its meaning as the particular virtue of caring for others and li in its aspect as the valued human dance. These values are the basis for characterizing Confucian ethics as a relational ethic, meaning that it is in part distinguished by its placement of relationships at the center of a well-lived life (see Ames, 2011, 2021). Confucian ethics are often taken to stand in contrast to ethics that place individual autonomy and freedom to choose how to live. While there is much that is true about this contrast, it must be carefully described so as to differentiate it from some other contrasts. For example, the value of individual autonomy usually includes several different dimensions that do not necessarily accompany one another: (1) prioritizing of individual interests over group or collective interests when these conflict; (2) giving moral permission to the individual to choose from a significantly wide range (within certain moral boundaries) of ways to live; and (3) emphasizing the importance of living according to one’s own understanding of what is right and good even if others do not see it the same way.
Confucian ethics in significant part, though not in all parts, accepts autonomy in the sense of (3) (see Shun, 2004; and Brindley, 2010). Confucius is often depicted in the Analects as emphasizing the importance of cultivating one’s own character even when others do not recognize or appreciate one’s efforts (e.g., 4.14) and of acting independently of what is conventionally approved or disapproved (e.g., 5.1). The texts associated with Mencius (Mengzi, best known in the West under his Latinized name, lived in the 4th century B.C.E.) and Xunzi (4th and 3rd centuries B.C.E.), the most pivotal thinkers in the classical Confucian tradition after Confucius, both articulate the necessity to speak up when one believes the ruler one is serving is on a wrong course of action (e.g., Mencius 1A3 and Xunzi 29.2). On the other hand, none of these classical thinkers argue for the necessity of protecting a frank subordinate from a ruler who is made angry by criticism, and it could be argued that Confucianism does not fully endorse autonomy in sense (3) without endorsing such protection for those who wish to engage in moral criticism of the powerful.
Most interpretations present Confucian ethics as rejecting (2). There is a way for human beings to live, a comprehensive human good to be realized, and there can be no choosing between significantly different ways of life that are equally acceptable from a moral perspective (an important exception to this kind of interpretation is provided by Hall and Ames, 1987, who interpret Confucius’s dao as a human invention, collective and individual). On the other hand, Confucian ethics de-emphasizes legal coercion as a method for guiding people along the way and instead emphasizes moral exhortation and inspiration by way of example (see, most famously, 2.3 of the Analects, which emphasizes the necessity of a ruler’s guiding his people by instilling in them a sense of shame rather than by the threat of external punishment). While a Confucian might believe in a single correct way for human beings, they might endorse a significant degree of latitude for people to learn from their own mistakes and by way of example from others (see Chan, 1999).
Confucian ethics does not accept (1), but not because it subordinates individual interests to group or collective interests (for criticism of the rather common interpretation of Confucianism as prioritizing the group over the individual, see Hall and Ames 1998). Rather, there is a different conception of the relationship between individual and group interests. The best illustration of this different conception is a story to be found in the Mencius that concerns sage-king Shun. When Shun wanted to marry, he knew that his father, influenced by his stepmother, would not allow him to marry. In this difficult situation, Shun decided to marry without telling his father, even though he is renowned for his filiality. Mencius in fact defends the filiality of Shun’s act in 5A2. He observes that Shun knew that he would not have been allowed to marry if he told his father. This would have resulted in bitterness toward his parents, and that is why he did not tell them. The implication of this version of Shun’s reason is that filiality means preserving an emotionally viable relationship with one’s parents, and in the case at hand Shun judged that it would have been worse for the relationship to have asked permission to marry. The conception of the relation between individual and group interests embodied in this story is not one of subordination of one to the other but about the mutual dependence between the individual and the group. The individual depends on the group and must make the group’s interests part of their own interests, but, on the other side of the equation, the group depends on the individual and must make that individual’s interests part of the group’s interests. Shun’s welfare depends on his family and therefore must make his family’s interests part of his own (he resolves to do what is necessary to preserve his relationship to his parents), but his family’s welfare depends on Shun, and therefore it must recognize his interests to constitute part of its welfare (the family must recognize that it is damaging itself in requiring Shun to deny himself the most part important of human relationships).
The way that Confucianism conceives of the relationship between the individual and the group, as well as the way it is typically misconceived, is reflected in its notion of harmony or he. A typical misconception of harmony as a Confucian value is that it involves agreement and conformity with the views of others. In Analects 13.23, however, Confucius says that the junzi pursues harmony rather than sameness, while the small person does the opposite. The pre-Confucian thinker Yan Ying expresses a similar idea about harmony in likening it to a soup made with meat or fish, the strong flavor of which must be balanced and complemented by other ingredients such as vinegar, sauce, salt, and plum (Zuozhuan, Duke Zhao, 20th year; see Legge 1960 translation). The metaphor is meant to convey the idea that a ruler will not seek only ministers who agree with him but will seek to reconcile a diversity of viewpoints from his ministers. Reconciliation not only involves acceptance of difference but also acceptance of a degree of tension and conflict, even if one seeks to reduce the latter from dangerous levels (Li 2014; Wong 2020) to achieve a productive equilibrium. Moreover, that equilibrium is dynamic and is continuously created and re-created.
Success in achieving a satisfactory equilibrium is never guaranteed. Confucian ethics draws much of its appeal and power from its placing at the center of our attention the human desire for connection with others. At the same time, satisfying connections can be surprisingly fragile and subject to both predictable and unpredictable conflict. Acting in accordance with li and cultivating one’s dispositions for respect and tolerance of others is a way of making desired relationships more fruitful and less alienating (Olberding 2019). However, we have limited control over what others do and over what happens to them. As a result, the most satisfying relationships also make us exceedingly vulnerable when they break or are lost through separation and death. We may never be the same persons when such loss occurs, and a continuing concern of the Confucian tradition is how to reckon with such loss when one’s identity as a person includes significant others and our moral commitments to them (for a discussion of how this is treated in the Confucian tradition, with connections drawn to feminist analyses of the way our ties to others makes for value and vulnerability, see Ing 2017). The wholeness and integrity of one’s relational identity may be threatened with disintegration upon the loss of these others, or when one’s multiple attachments present conflicting and possibly irreconcilable demands on the self. Ing (2017) points out that the Confucian tradition as a whole produced different points of view on whether it was always possible to deal successfully with threats to the integrity of the self. One point of view, which might be reasonably attributed to the Analects, Mencius, and Xunzi, is that there is always a way to preserve one’s integrity if one is wise and able enough. Ing articulates another point of view elsewhere defended in the Confucian tradition, to the effect that there are inherently tragic situations in which no option could be said to be right or best. This second possibility resonates with one defended in contemporary Western moral and political philosophy by philosophers such as Michael Walzer (1973).
Along with the emphasis on li, the centrality of filiality is one of the most distinctive characteristics of Confucian ethics. The Analects 2.6 says to give parents no cause for anxiety other than illness, whereas 2.7, as mentioned earlier, emphasizes the need for the material support of parents to be carried out in a respectful manner. 2.8 emphasizes that it is the expression on one’s face that is filial and not just taking on the burden of work or letting elders partake of the wine and food before others.
Is obedience to parents always required of the filial child? What if the child believes that parents are wrong and their wishes run contrary to what is right or to ren? In those cases where one thinks them wrong, what is one to do? The Analects 2.5 portrays Confucius as saying, “Do not disobey,” but when queried further as to his meaning, he explains obedience in terms of conformance to the rites for burying and sacrificing to deceased parents. In 4.18 Confucius says that when one disagrees with one’s parents, one should remonstrate with them gently. Most translations of what follows have Confucius concluding that if parents are not persuaded, one should not oppose them (e.g., Lau, 1979; Slingerland, 2003; Waley, 1938), but it is possible to read the spare and ambiguously worded passage as requiring instead that one not abandon one’s purpose in respectfully trying to change one’s parents’ minds (Legge, 1971; see Huang, 2013, 133–137 for a survey of the different interpretations and an argument for the persistence-in-remonstrating translation). In other Confucian texts, the question of whether obedience is required has received different answers in the Confucian tradition. Chapters 1 and 2 of the Record of Ritual (Legge, 1967, vol. 1) say that one must obey if one fails to persuade one’s parent. On the other hand, Xunzi declares that following the requirements of morality rather than the wishes of one’s father is part of the highest standard of conduct (29.1 of the Xunzi; for a translation see Knoblock, 1988–94; or Hutton 2014) and moreover that if following the course of action mandated by one’s father would bring disgrace to the family and not following it would bring honor, then not following is to act morally (29.2 of the Xunzi). Xunzi’s position is supported in part by the distinction between service to parents and obedience to them. It might very well fail to be of service to parents if following their wishes is to bring moral disgrace to them and the family.
Another ethical issue arising from the strong Confucian emphasis on filiality concerns possible conflicts between loyalty to parents and loyalty to the ruler or public justice. Consider again Analects 13.18, in which Confucius says that uprightness is found in sons and fathers covering up for each other. In this case, at least, loyalty to parents or to children takes precedence over loyalty to ruler or to public justice. This precedence is one implication of the Confucian doctrine of care with distinctions (“love with distinctions” is a frequent translation, but perhaps “care with distinctions” is less misleading because it covers both the emotionally freighted attitude toward kin and a more distanced attitude toward strangers). Though all people are owed moral concern, some are owed more than others, according to the agent’s relationship to them.
Jiang (2021) argues that much of the dynamic development of classical Chinese philosophy springs from a tension between values of humaneness based on special relationships such as family membership, on the one hand, and on the other hand, impartial values such as justice, a tension that surfaces in the Analects. The Confucian response to this tension divides, he suggests, between two streams: an “extensionist” approach that sees the two kinds of value as ultimately compatible, and a “sacrificialist” approach that focuses on the conflict between them and prioritizes humaneness.
An alternative reading of the tradition that does not put the tension quite so much at the center would not construe the relationship between humaneness and justice as inherently conflictual: after all, the Confucians recognized that family loyalty is the foundation for the development of moral concern for the welfare of others outside the family and at the same time that circumstances can bring the two kinds of value into conflict. In any case, it seems right to see the relationship between these values and the different ways that thinkers reacted to that relationship as a fertile source of newly developing streams of thought.
This issue works into understanding the thought of a pivotal critic of Confucianism in the classical period. Mozi (probably 5th century B.C.E), who possibly was once a student of Confucianism, came to reject that teaching, partly on the grounds that the Confucian emphasis on ritual and musical performance was a wasteful expenditure of resources that could otherwise be used to meet the basic needs of the many (Mozi, for a translation, see Books 25, 32 in Fraser 2020). A related criticism in the text of the Mozi is that tradition does not hold normative authority simply because it is tradition, for there was a time when the practice in question was not tradition but new (Book 39 in Fraser). If a practice has no authority when it is new, it has no authority at any subsequent time simply because it is getting older.
Mozi also argued that exclusive concern for one’s own (oneself, one’s family, one’s state) is at the root of all destructive conflict (Book 16 in Fraser). Exclusive concern for the self causes the strong to rob the weak. Exclusive concern for one’s family causes great families to wreak havoc on lesser families (it is not difficult to see how this thought might apply to the idea of protecting one’s own, even if they have committed serious crimes against others outside the family). Exclusive concern toward one’s state causes great states to attack small states. Mozi advocated the doctrine of jian ai as a remedy. “Ai” usually means “love” or “affection,” but for Mozi it probably meant an emotionally cooler form of concern. “Jian” usually means “inclusive.” One possible translation of “jian ai” is “inclusive care” (see Fraser, 2016). Other translations render “jian” as “impartial,” as in “impartial care” (see Ivanhoe 2005). The latter translation conveys clearly the understanding that Confucians, at least since Mencius, have had of jian ai, which is that it requires one to have equal concern for everyone regardless of one’s relationship to them. The next section explains how Mencius incorporated this understanding of jian ai in his criticism of it and in his development of Confucian ethics.
2.5 Mencius’s defense of care with distinctions and his theory of the roots of moral knowledge and motivation in human nature
The substantial following that Mohism gained in the classical period forced a response from Confucians (see Hansen, 1992, and Van Norden 2007, for a discussion of Mozi’s pivotal impact on the Chinese tradition). They responded on two subjects: first, they had to address what is required by way of concern for all people and how to reconcile such concern with the greater concern for some that the Confucian doctrine of care with distinctions requires; second, they had to address the question of what kinds of concern are motivationally possible for human beings, partly in response to the Mohist argument that it is not difficult to act on jian ai (which they came to interpret as being contrary to care with distinctions), and partly in response to others who were skeptical about the possibility of acting on any kind of genuinely other-regarding concern. Mencius, in the text purporting to be a record of his teachings, explicitly sets himself to the task of defending Confucianism not only against Mohism but the teachings of Yang Zhu. Yang’s teachings seemed to Mencius to sit on the opposite end of the spectrum from Mohism (there is no surviving text purporting to articulate and defend Yangism). According to Mencius’s characterization, Yang Zhu criticized both Mohism and Confucianism for asking people to sacrifice themselves for others. Yang Zhu on this view was an ethical egoist: i.e., one who holds that it is always right to promote one’s own welfare. Mencius positioned Confucianism as the occupying the correct mean between the extremes of having concern only for oneself on the one hand and having an equal degree of concern for everyone.
Mencius 1A7 purports to be an account of a conversation between Mencius and King Xuan, the ruler of a Chinese state. Mencius is attempting to persuade the king to adopt the Confucian dao or way of ruling. The king wonders whether he really can be the kind of king Mencius is advocating, and Mencius replies by asking whether the following story he has heard about the king is true. The story is that the king saw an ox being led to slaughter for a ritual sacrifice. The king decided to spare the ox and substituted a lamb for the ritual sacrifice. Thinking back on that occasion, the king recalls that it was the look in the ox’s eyes, like that of an innocent man being led to execution, that led him to substitute the lamb. Mencius then comments that this story demonstrates the king’s capability to become a true king, and that all he has to do is to extend the sort of compassion he showed the ox to his own people. To say that he can care for an ox but not for his people is like saying “my strength is sufficient to lift heavy weight, but not enough to lift a feather” (translation adapted from Lau, 1970a) His failure to act on behalf of his people is due simply to his not acting, not to an inability to act. What the king has to do, suggests Mencius, is to treat the aged in his family as aged, and then extend it to the aged in other families; treat his young ones as young ones, and extend it to the young ones of others; then he can turn the whole world in the palm of his hand.
The passage demonstrates one characteristic of the text that is pertinent to Mencius’s response to Mohism and quite possibly its influence on him. In contrast to the Analects, the ruler’s duties to care for his people are more frequently discussed and play a more prominent role in the conception of a ruler’s moral excellence. Mencius is portrayed in this text as very much engaged in getting the kings of Chinese states to stop mistreating their subjects, to stop drafting their subjects into their wars of territorial expansion, and to avoid overtaxing them to finance their wars and lavish projects. At the same time, Mencius’s assertion that the king is able to extend the kind of concern he showed the ox toward his own people is a reply to those who advocate Yangism on the grounds that acting for one’s own sake is natural. Mencius holds that natural compassion is a part of human nature. The task of moral self-cultivation is the task of “extending” what is natural. What is natural, or at least more so, is properly acting toward the aged and the young in one’s family and then extending that to the aged and the young in other families.
Extension is necessary because natural compassion is uneven compared to where it ought to extend. King Xuan may find it natural to have compassion for an innocent man about to be executed or a terrified ox about to be slaughtered, but not toward all his subjects when he is focusing on the benefits that a war of territorial expansion might bring him. This story of Mencius, the King, and the ox is rich material for reflection on the nature of moral development. It seems plausible that development must begin with something that is of the right nature to be shaped into the moral virtues, and also plausible that what we begin with is not as it fully should be. The questions posed by the story is what the natural basis of morality is and how further development occurs. Mencius’s theory of the “four duan” addresses these questions. “Duan” literally means “tip of something” and is often translated as “beginnings” in this context.
What are the four beginnings of morality? In 2A6 human nature (ren xing) it is said that no person is devoid of a heart (the word for heart in Chinese stands for the seat of thinking and feeling, hence often translated as “the mind”) sensitive to the suffering of others, and to illustrate this beginning, Mencius asks us to suppose that a man were suddenly to see a young child about to fall into a well. Such a man would certainly be moved to compassion, not because he wanted to get in the good graces of the parents, nor because he wished to win the praise of his fellow villagers or friends, nor yet because he disliked the cry of the child. This natural compassion can develop into the virtue of ren (in Mencius, ren is more often a particular virtue that concerns caring and hence is often translated as “benevolence” or “humaneness”). A second beginning is the heart that feels shame in certain situations, e.g., in 6A10, Mencius says that if rice and soup are offered after being trampled upon, even a beggar would disdain them. Under the right conditions, innate shame develops into the virtue of yi or righteousness—being able to do the right thing and dedication to doing it. The third beginning is the heart that feels courtesy,e.g., the younger sometimes instinctively knows to respect and be courteous to the older. Under the right conditions, courtesy develops into li, which as a virtue consists in the observance of the rites or the virtue of ritual propriety. And finally, there is the heart that can make morally relevant distinctions (shi/fei, the thing to do or not to do). Under the right conditions, this sense of approval and disapproval develops into wisdom, which includes having a grasp of the spirit behind moral rules so that one knows how to be flexible in applying them.
It is important to note that Mencian beginnings of morality are not just blind feelings or primitive urges to act in certain ways, but contain within them certain intuitive judgments about what is right and wrong, what is to be disdained and what is deferential, respectful behavior. In the example of the beggar who does not accept food that has been trampled upon, it seems that Mencius is suggesting we have an original, unlearned sense that allows us to judge the sort of respect that is due to ourselves as human beings. Similarly, in suggesting that we have an unlearned sense of deference, Mencius is suggesting that we have an unlearned sense of what is due to others such as elders and our parents. Mencius’s theory tallies with some of the more recent theories of emotion that point toward the intertwining of cognitive and affective dimensions (the theory does not necessarily imply, however, that the affective amounts to nothing more than the cognitive, as shall be discussed later).
The Mencius contains different metaphors that convey a view of human nature as the basis for moral development. On one metaphor, used in a debate with rival philosopher Gaozi in 6A2, the inborn goodness of human nature is like the tendency of water to flow downward. The metaphor implies that human beings develop virtues in the absence of abnormal interference such as water being damned up or struck so that it splashes upward. On the other way of conceiving ethical development, the four beginnings are more like barley sprouts that need nurture analogous to sun, water, and fertile soil (6A7). Mencius seems to treat the the two conceptions as equivalent, but arguably they are are significantly different since the “growing” conditions for the sprouts are not necessarily provided in the normal course of affairs (see Wong, 2015b).
In some passages, extension is characterized as a matter of simply preserving or not losing what is given to one at birth (4B12, 4B19, 4B28, 6A10, 6A11), and such passages accord with the water metaphor in suggesting that moral development happens in the absence of abnormal interference. In other places, the thinking seems to be more in accord with the sprout metaphor and identifies conditions for moral development that go well beyond noninterference: kings are held responsible for providing for their subjects a constant means of livelihood (1A7) that enables them to support parents and nurture wife and children; kings must also ensure the appropriate moral education about filiality, about the duties that rulers and subjects owe to each other and about respect for the elder. Mencius furthermore recognized natural predispositions other than the four beginnings that could potentially lead human beings astray. He mentions the desires of the senses in this regard (6A15). This is why Mencius places responsibility on everyone to si (reflect on, turn over in one’s mind) (6A14, 6A15) the manifestations of the four beginnings. With such reflection, human beings can recognize that virtue takes precedence over satisfaction of potentially conflicting desires and feelings (e.g., the priority of righteousness over the desire for life if one cannot have both), but lack of reflection will stunt moral development (6A9). If the deprivation of nourishing conditions is severe enough, the sprouts can be killed off (6A8). Thus, while Mencius is often characterized superficially by his saying that human nature is good (6A6), he means (at least when his thinking is guided by the sprout metaphor) that it contains predispositions to feel and act in morally appropriate ways and to make intuitive normative judgments that can with the right nurturing conditions give human beings guidance as to the proper emphasis to be given to the desires of the senses (see Shun, 1997; Van Norden, 2004, 2007).
It is not surprising that there should be the kind of ambiguity expressed by the juxtaposition of the water and sprout metaphors in Mencius. A very common contemporary conception of the innate comes very close to the implications of the water metaphor, i.e., that which develops under normal conditions. On the other hand, we are also capable of recognizing that other things develop under a narrower or much more contingent (not necessarily realized in the normal course of affairs) set of conditions. A barley sprout develops only if human beings plant it in the right kind of soil and put effort into cultivating it. Yet it seems intuitively correct to say that its direction of growth is innate. If the conditions for growth are realized, it will become a barley plant, not a corn plant. Contemporary thinking about the innate bases of morality also shows this range of thinking. Claims that morality is constrained by an innate universal grammar (e.g., Hauser, 2008; Mikhail, 2011) seem closer to the idea that the moral (or its underlying universal structure) develops under normal conditions; other conceptions acknowledge more of a role for contingent factors (Nichols, 2004; Haidt and Bjorklund 2008). The ambiguity in Mencius’ thought, then, anticipates contemporary swings in thinking about the relative roles of what human beings are born with and what they acquire through learning, experience and culture.
Much of what is fascinating in Mencius lies in his explorations of how moral learning takes place and how this learning might also interact with emotion. Consider now in combination the theme that the cognitive and affective go into the constitution of emotion and the theme that the emotional beginnings of morality can be extended through provision of the right kind of nurture. What is necessary for extension? Is cognitive extension, i.e., more moral knowledge, sufficient? The answer to this question depends on the nature of the intertwining between the cognitive and affective in emotions. Consider again the story of King Xuan and the ox. Mencius expresses confidence in King Xuan’s ability to have compassion for his people, based on his act of compassion for the ox. Here the question of whether cognitive extension is sufficient emerges in the concrete. Was it sufficient for Mencius to have reminded the king that he has even more of a reason to spare his people from suffering than he had to spare the ox from suffering (more reason because Mencius clearly ranks the interests of animals below those of human beings, and because for him there is a good moral reason for the performance of ritual sacrifices)? Logical consistency alone cannot be expected to provide motivation, as David Nivison has pointed out (1996), but then what is Mencius trying to do with the King if not move him through logic?
Nowhere in the Mencius is there enough said to point to a definitive interpretation on this matter, but various reconstructions of possible positions can be given. Perhaps the King’s innate nature contains all the motivation he needs, and all that Mencius is doing is reminding him that he has the motivation to spare his people. This interpretation seems roughly in accord with Mencius’ likening moral development to water flowing downward: it will proceed unless interfered with. Perhaps the King’s nature needs some degree of transformation that starts with the sort of compassion he can feel for a terrified ox or an innocent man about to be executed and then expands the scope of that compassion to more of its appropriate objects. This interpretation seems roughly in accord with Mencius’ likening moral development to the growth of sprouts that need the appropriate water, soil and cultivation efforts. (See Im, 1999, Ivanhoe, 2002, Shun, 1997, Wong, 2002, Van Norden, 2007, and McRae 2011 for a range of different possible positions that could be attributed to Mencius).
What seems philosophically fruitful about the Xuan and ox story is that it portrays an attempt at moral teaching of the kind that actually occurs in the moral life, and the ambiguity that it presents to the reader is fruitful precisely because it is not a completely theorized story. We are not told exactly what Mencius is trying to do with the King in terms of a theory of the nature of emotions and the relation between the cognitive and affective. Rather, we are led to reflect on the most plausible possibilities in trying to arrive at a reconstruction of what might have been meant by the text, as well as what might be the most illuminating position on its own merits. The story is particularly intriguing for those philosophers who believe in the possibility that learning can influence emotion at the same time that emotion can help learning become motivationally efficacious. At one moment in the conversation between King Xuan and Mencius, the King remarks that Mencius has helped him to understand that he was truly motivated by compassion to spare the ox. As Mencius was talking, he says, he felt the stirrings of compassion again. It is at this point that Mencius reminds the King of the suffering of his people. Perhaps what Mencius was trying to do was to expand the scope of the King’s feeling for those who suffer. He may know in the abstract that he has a duty to advance the welfare of his people, but he may not feel it very much, and by stimulating the King to re-experience the feeling of compassion he had for the ox, Mencius is perhaps trying to get that feeling to expand to include his subjects. Mencius is reminding the King of his duty precisely when he has primed the King to assimilate it emotionally. In any case, this is a plausible picture of how the cognitive and affective can interact in emotionally development and both be necessary for effective moral motivation (see Wong, 2015a).
If we recall Mencius’s saying in 6A10 that even a beggar would refuse food that has been trampled upon, we may infer that something like a concept of human dignity is implied. In virtue of the four duan, we are entitled to respect. What is of further interest, however, is the idea that the source of our dignity is also the source of our responsibilities to each other and to ourselves. We have the responsibility of reflecting on the duan, and if we abuse them and kill them off, we have made ourselves unworthy of the respect to which we were originally entitled. These implications of the Mencian idea about the source of human dignity are not so much highlighted in the Western tradition. The idea that we might render ourselves unworthy of the basic respect to which we are originally entitled might appear harsh, but what should be kept in mind is that others share in the responsibility to develop our duan (see section 2.8 below). Most importantly our family shares in that responsibility, but as Mencius also emphasizes, the king has responsibility for putting in the conditions for material security that enable most people to reflect on and develop their duan. In fact Mencius holds responsible the king who does not provide a constant means of livelihood for the crimes his people commit in order to survive and feed their families. It is those who have adequate material security and moral education and yet who still fail to reflect who must bear the fuller share of responsibility for their wrongdoing.
What about the priority of filial loyalty over loyalty to the larger community? Mencius’ defense of this priority draws from his theory of human nature as containing not only the beginnings of affective motivations for being moral but also intuitive judgments about what is right and about what deserves the feeling of shame. His question to a Mohist, Yizi, is how Yizi can justify providing his deceased parents a special burial when the Mohist prescriptions are for a plain burial for anyone. Yizi’s reply is to quote from the Book of History: the sage-kings treated all their subjects as if they were their new-born children. Yizi’s interpretation of this saying is that there should be no distinctions in one’s concern for people, though the practice of it may begin with one’s parents (how concern without distinctions is compatible with special burial for one’s parents is unclear, and there is no further clarification in 3A5, but the issue involves the question of what Mohists meant by jian ai, which is addressed in section 3 below). Mencius’s counter-reply is to ask whether Yizi really holds that a person loves his elder brother’s son no more than his neighbor’s baby. This is not just an assertion about what people tend to feel but also an assertion about what people intuitively hold to be right to feel and to do. Then Mencius makes a puzzling remark to the effect that Yizi is singling out a special feature in a certain case: “when a new-born babe creeps toward a well, it is not its fault.” This last part of Mencius’s response is puzzling because Yizi did not say anything about a baby and a well. One possibility is that Yizi may have obliquely referred to Mencius’s claim that all have the original and unlearned feeling of distress at seeing a child about to fall into a well. In other words, Yizi might have been challenging Mencius by asking, “Does not your own postulated unlearned compassion require us to regard that child the same way, regardless of whose child it is?” This way of taking Yizi helps makes sense of Mencius’s reply. First, he points out what he takes to be the indisputably greater affection one feels for elder brother’s son over one’s neighbor’s baby. Mencius grants that we all respond to a child about to fall into the well with alarm and distress, and it doesn’t matter whose child it is. However, one cannot infer from this one particular situation that we ought to have equal concern for everyone in all situations. The case of the child about to fall into the well has a particular feature that makes it relevant to treat it as one would any child. That feature seems to be innocence.
The Mencian position is premised on the principle that it is right to treat all people alike only when the ways they are alike are the most ethically relevant features of the situation. We should do the same thing only when the similarities between two cases are the most ethically relevant features of the situation. Mencius believes that in many instances, the presence or absence of a family relationship to a person is the most relevant feature (in deciding which children to give gifts, the fact that one child is one’s elder brother’s son and the other child is one’s neighbor’s child may be the most relevant feature). In other types of situations, such as a child about to fall into a well, it is the innocence that children share that is the most relevant feature. That is why it is proper to feel alarm or distress toward any child in that situation. The implied application of this idea to the sage-kings’ treatment of the people is that these kings treated all people alike insofar as they did not deserve the harm about to befall them.
Two issues arise from this response to Mohism as he understood it (whether he understood it correctly will be addressed in section 3). One issue is whether Mencius has sufficient warrant to trust the kinds of intuitive judgments he attributes to human nature. Mencius holds that the beginnings of morality are sent by Heaven, but in the absence of such a metaphysical warrant, can these intuitive judgments be accepted, particularly the ones that underwrite care with distinctions? Doubt about the metaphysical warrant may not doom Mencius’s response to Mohism, however, if one holds that all normative theories ultimately depend on intuitive judgments and if one has no good reason to be skeptical about these judgments. Thus one might hold that whether or not there is a metaphysical warrant, there is a great deal of plausibility to the intuitive judgment about owing parents more concern because they are the source of one’s life and nurturance. Of course one might also hold, as Mencius appears to hold, that people are owed concern in virtue of their being human, and the possibility for conflict of duties arises from these different sources of concern. The second issue is how the Mencius text deals with conflicts of the sort exemplified by the sheep-stealing case in the Analects.
The text contains themes embodying the theme of filial loyalty, and as in the Analects, such loyalty takes precedence over public justice. 7A35 tells a story about the sage-emperor Shun that illustrates this theme. Because Shun was renowned for his filiality, Mencius is asked what Shun would have done if his father killed a man. Mencius replies that Shun could not stop the judge from apprehending his father because the judge had the legal authority to act. But then, Mencius says, Shun would have abdicated and fled with his father to the edge of the sea. 5A2 and 5A3 describe the way that Shun dealt with his half-brother Xiang’s conspiring with his father and stepmother to kill him. He enfeoffed Xiang because all he could do as a brother is to love him. At the same time, Shun appointed officials to administer the fief and to collect taxes and tributes, to protect the people of Youbi from Xiang’s potentially abusive ruling. That is why some called Shun’s act a banishment of Xiang. However, the Shun stories exhibit a complexity that differentiates them from the story of the sheep-stealing coverup in the Analects. Though filial loyalty is clearly given a priority in each story, there is in Shun’s actions an acknowledgment of the other value that comes into conflict with filial loyalty. Though Shun ultimately gives priority to filial loyalty in the case of his father, his first action acknowledges the value of public justice by declining to interfere with the judge while he is king. While Shun declines to punish his half-brother, he protects the people of Xiang’s new fiefdom.
These Shun stories illustrate that an agent’s response to a situation in which important values come into conflict need not be a strict choice between honoring one value and wholly denying the other. While some sort of priority might have to be set in the end, there are also ways to acknowledge the value that is subordinated, but how exactly that is to be done seems very much a matter of judgment in the particular situation at hand. The Shun stories are an expression of the Confucian theme that rightness cannot be judged on the basis of exceptionless general principles but a matter of judgment in the particular situation. It is difficult to see how this theme can be taught except by the way it is done in the Mencius: through exemplars of how it is done, and where the situation is presented through some kind of narrative.
The characteristic form of reasoning in Mencius is analogical reasoning (see Lau, 1970b; Wong, 2002). Starting from what seems true in one case and “extending” similar conclusions to another case that has similar conclusions. The trick in doing analogical reasoning correctly, as suggested earlier, is to extend the similar conclusions only when the two cases share ethically relevant and decisive features. The Mencius 4A17 shows a similar concern for treating like cases alike. Mencius grants that to save the life of one’s drowning sister-in-law, one of course suspends the customary rule of propriety prohibiting the touching of man and woman when they are giving and receiving. Another philosopher proposes to apply this idea of suspending the usual rules of propriety to save something else from drowning—the entire Empire! Mencius replies that one saves one’s sister-in-law with one’s hand but cannot save the Empire from drowning in chaos and corruption with one’s hand. The Empire can only be pulled out by the Way. Mencius is rejecting the analogy between compromising on ritual propriety to save the country and compromising on propriety to save one’s sister-in-law. There is a relevant dissimilarity between the case of the drowning sister-in-law and saving the country: one cannot save the Empire through compromises of ritual propriety, but instead by following the Way, which itself involves following ritual propriety.
So what do we do when we confront a problematic case in the present and we do not automatically know what the right thing to do is? Mencius believes we can rely on past cases in which we have made reliable judgments about, for example, what is right and shameful. These reliable judgments made in past cases serve as paradigms or exemplars of correct ethical judgment. In encountering new problem situations, we determine what sort of ethical reaction to the new situation is correct by asking which of the cases in which we’ve had paradigm judgments are relevantly similar. We then determine what reactions to the new situations would be sufficiently similar to the relevant paradigm judgments. Analogical reasoning is careful attention and comparing to a concrete paradigm. The pool of paradigm ethical judgments we have not only includes cases from our own personal experience, but also include the experience of others, especially those who serve as models of wise judgment. The stories of sage-king Shun in the Mencius text seem to give us such paradigms. Shun’s judgments on what to do about conflicts between filial loyalty and public justice are perhaps meant to serve as paradigm judgments. The conception of moral reasoning found in the Mencius offers important material for reflection on the process of moral judgment, especially for those who have come to reject the simple model of judgment as deduction from premises including a general moral principle and a description of the conditions that make the principle applicable to the situation at hand. The Mencian picture includes general moral considerations or values that bear on the situation at hand, such as the importance of family loyalty and public justice, but the picture also suggests that judgment in difficult situations includes finding a way to adequately recognize and realize the values in play. “Finding a way” seems much more a matter of imagination and ingenuity rather than deduction, but the Mencian picture also suggests that we can be guided by exemplars of wise judgment. Identifying the relevant similarities and dissimilarities between these exemplars and one’s present situation seems a matter of perception and close attention rather than deduction from principle.
In the Xing E (“[Human] Nature is Bad”) chapter (see Hutton 2014 for a translation), Xunzi explicitly opposes his position on human nature to Mencius’s. He asserts that far from being good, human nature is bad because it includes a love of profit, envy and hatred, and desires of the eyes and ears that lead to violence and anarchy. To avoid these consequences of indulging our spontaneous desires and impulses, it takes wei (conscious activity or deliberate effort), models and teaching, and guidance through observing ritual and yi (standards of righteousness). Through such efforts, natural emotions and desires are transformed as a crooked piece of wood is steamed and then straightened upon a press frame. All rituals and standards of righteousness are sheng (generated, produced) by the sages. These are generated from the conscious activity of the sages and not from their original nature. Just as the vessel made by a potter is generated from his conscious activity and not his original nature, so the sages accumulated their thoughts and ideas and made a practice of conscious activity and precedents, thereby generating rituals and standards of righteousness.
Part of Xunzi’s argument against Mencius is that human nature is not what is produced by conscious activity but rather that which is already there in human beings independently of conscious activity. Since it is clear that human beings are not already good but must work at it, it is clear that human nature cannot be good. When Mencius expresses the water-metaphor view of the human inclination toward goodness, Xunzi’s criticism has a point. Becoming good does not seem to be merely a matter of not interfering with what will unfold in normal circumstances. However, when Mencius expresses the sprout-metaphor view, the differences between him and Xunzi are more subtle. On the sprout-metaphor view, effort and reflection must be put into the project of extending the sprouts to where they should be. It might be thought that one of the real differences between Mencius and Xunzi is that the former believes the necessary effort lies in growing or extending what lies in human nature, whereas the latter believes that the effort lies in remaking and reshaping what lies in human nature. Perhaps one believes that we can go “with the grain” of what we are born with, and the other believes we must go “against the grain.”
Each thinker emphasizes one of these opposing directions, but it is a credit to the subtlety and power of their views that each also takes into account the direction that the other emphasizes. Mencius acknowledges that moral development is hindered when a person pays more attention to the “small” parts of the self that include desires for sensual and material satisfaction and fails to use the heart-mind to reflect on the great parts that have normative priority. In the chapter on rituals, Xunzi identifies natural and powerful emotional dispositions such as love of one’s own kind that rituals must give expression to and that seem to form more of a positive basis for moral development. Such natural love is expressed in love for parents and intense grief upon their deaths, which must be given appropriate expression in mourning and burial rituals. Thus Mencius acknowledges that there are natural parts of the self that must be disciplined and held in check while Xunzi acknowledges that there are natural parts that are largely congenial to morality in the sense that they are the natural basis for taking great satisfaction and contentment in virtue once one has gotten the self-aggrandizing desires and emotions under control.
Another disagreement between Mencius and Xunzi has to do with Mencius’ claim that human nature contains moral predispositions. As indicated earlier, such Mencian predispositions appear to contain moral intuitions (e.g., about what is shameful and right or wrong). On one plausible interpretation of Mencius, morality is part of the order imparted to the world by tian or heaven. By contrast, Xunzi seems to rule out the existence of natural predispositions with moral content when he claims that the sage kings generated ritual principles and precepts of moral duty. One natural interpretation of “generated” is “created” or “invented.” On these interpretations of each thinker, the contrast between Mencius and Xunzi exemplifies the contrast between a robust moral realism that has moral properties such as rightness existing independently of human invention and a constructivist position that makes moral properties dependent on human invention.
The interpretation of Xunzi as a constructivist does not commit him to a denial of the objectivity of morality or to the denial that there is a single objectively correct morality. It is possible to see Xunzi as a constructivist about morality but also as an objectivist (see Nivison, 1991). On the constructivist interpretation, Xunzi holds a functional conception of morality, according to which it is invented to harmonize the interests of individuals and to constrain and transform the heedless pursuit of short-term gratification for the sake of promoting the long-term interests of the individual and the group. Ritual principles and moral precepts are invented to accomplish such a function, and human nature constrains which of the possible principles and precepts are better or worse for accomplishing that function. Xunzi’s point about the mourning rituals prescribed by Confucians being suited to the nature of human love for one’s parents is a case in point.
Xunzi’s functional theory of morality bears added interest for those exploring the possibilities of a naturalistic approach to morality. One fairly common interpretation of Xunzi’s conception of tian or heaven is that it is an order-giving force in the cosmos that is neutral to whatever human beings have come to regard as right and good. In fact, a translation that better conveys such a meaning for ‘tian’ is “nature,” which is the translation given by Knoblock’s valued translation of the Xunzi. Textual passages that support this interpretation stress that tian operates according to patterns that remain constant no matter what human beings do or whether they appeal to it for good fortune (chapter 17). It is the proper task of human beings to understand what these patterns are in order to take advantage of them (e.g., so that they may know to plow in the spring, weed in the summer, harvest in the fall, and store in the winter).
Such a view of the difference between Xunzi and Mencius, however, depends on interpretations that been disputed in favor of alternative interpretations. Roger Ames (1991, 2002) defends an interpretation of Mencius that gives the greatest role in shaping the direction of moral development to human “creative social intelligence” rather than tian conceived as a force operating independently of human beings. For a contrasting view, see Irene Bloom (1994, 1997, 2002), who, sometimes in response to Ames, defends a greater role for biology in her interpretation of Mencius while also leaving an important role for culture. The Xunzi text is also susceptible to very different interpretations, partly because of the originality of its synthesis of several streams of thought: Confucianism, Daoism, Mohism, and the Jixia Academy. When Xunzi asserts that tian is unresponsive to human supplication and ritual sacrifice, it looks as if he might be drawing from Daoism (see below), but when he refers to the tian-given faculties human beings should exercise to solve the problem of conflict, he might be interpreted as implying that tian conferred these faculties upon human beings for the purpose of solving the problem of conflict and realizing fulfilling human lives together (see Eno 1990; and Machle, 1993 for an exploration of the rich interpretive possibilities regarding Xunzi’s conception of tian). While it might still be possible to interpret Xunzi as a constructivist on the origin of morality, this alternative interpretation might suggest that Xunzi’s tian had a blueprint it intended human beings to fulfill. Under alternative interpretations of Mencius and Xunzi, then, the differences do not disappear, but they might form even more subtle contrasts (Wong, 2016).
Even some of the theoretical difficulties that Xunzi has are instructive. In pressing his case against Mencius for the badness of human nature, he stresses the self-serving drives of human nature. Unlike Hobbes, he does not accept that human beings are inevitably motivated by self-interest, and he does not try to base adherence to moral norms on the basis of self-interest alone. This arguably is a promising move, given the heavy criticism that can be directed against the Hobbesian project and subsequent attempts to carry it out its basic idea (see Gauthier, 1986 for such an attempt; see Vallentyne, 1991 for criticism). Xunzi rather argues that the problems created by unrestrained self-interest point to the need to transform human motivation. People can come to love moral virtue and the rites for their own sakes, and this is necessary, on Xunzi’s view, for a stable solution to the problem of conflict between self-interested individuals. At times, Xunzi suggests that the intellect can override the desires arising from the natural emotions, but it remains unclear as to how self-regarding motivations can become a love of virtue and the rites simply because the intellect approves of them. The parts of Xunzi asserting a more complex picture of human motivation suggest a solution. If human beings are capable of genuine compassion and concern for others, as the chapter on rites suggests, then the ritual principles and moral precepts invented by the sage kings have some motivational leverage for the birth of a love of virtue and rites. Such a solution draws from what are arguably some of the most plausible positions of Mencius: that human beings are capable of altruism and compassion even if they are motivated much of the time by self-interest; and that moral transformation is a matter of cultivating and extending a motivational substance that is congenial to morality (see Wong, 2000).
Mencius and Xunzi, then, offer sophisticated theories that expand the range of possible ways of understanding moral knowledge, motivation, and the nature of morality itself. Mencius presents an interesting conception of the way that we reason by analogy from intuitive judgments and also a plausible conception of innate predispositions that are compatible with a major role for learning and upbringing in the development of character and virtue. Those who are more naturalistically inclined in their approach to morality (at least insofar as this involves resisting the idea of a transcendent source of moral properties) may find the interpretation of Xunzi as offering a functional conception of morality appealing, especially if it allows for a degree of objectivity regarding the content of morality.
In recent years, Gilbert Harman (1998–99, 1999–2000) and John Doris (2002) have pointed to the influence of situations over attitude and behavior as a problem for virtue ethics. Citing empirical work in social psychology, Harman and Doris claim that the extensive and surprising influence of situational factors undermines the commonsense idea that people possess stable character traits that explain what they do. Some of the classic psychological studies used in this argument appear to show that ordinary respectable American citizens will administer dangerous electrical shocks to an innocent person when urged to do so by an experimenter in a lab coat (Milgram 1974), and that being late for an appointment is the most influential factor in whether a seminary student will stop and help someone who seems to be falling ill, even if the appointment is to attend a lecture on the Good Samaritan (Darley and Batson 1973). Such studies pose a problem not only for the commonsense conception of character traits, but also for virtue ethics, which appear to assume the possibility of achieving stable character traits that are virtues. Perhaps human beings are inevitably creatures who are influenced by the situation in which they act and not by any characterlogical dispositions they bring with them to the situation. If so, it appears that the ideal of attaining virtues is misguided.
There are good reasons to expect Confucianism to offer some distinctive resources for dealing with this problem. First, as pointed out in 2.3, Confucians appreciate the relational nature of human life: who we are as persons very much includes our social context: the people with whom we are in relationship and our institutions and practices. So they are very much in a position to appreciate situational influences on how human beings think, feel, and act. Second, they appear to hold something like a conception of virtues as stable character traits that are resistant to undue situational influences. As noted in 2.3, and this pertains to the challenge posed by the Milgram study, the Confucians emphasize the importance of living according to one’s own understanding of what is right and good even if others do not see it the same way. Third, as noted at the beginning of this entry, Chinese philosophy in general is distinguished by a focus on the practical. This is illustrated in the Confucian case by the tradition of scholar-officials who not only wrote about and taught the importance of the ethical to the political life, but strove to enact this importance in their own careers. As a consequence, they were very much concerned with specifying in practical terms how one could go about cultivating the virtues in oneself. Fourth, and this is very much in response to the combination of the previous points, they describe a long and arduous program of ethical training to inculcate the virtues.
As Edward Slingerland (2011) has put it, Confucianism is in a good position to appreciate the “high bar” challenge of situational influence to the project of cultivating the virtues in oneself and others. In response to this challenge, their program of ethical training includes study of the classics (after the ancient period, the classics came to include, of course, the Analects and the Mencius), memorized and rehearsed until they become fully internalized and embedded in the unconscious patterns of thought that are so powerful in shaping what we do in everyday life (see Slingerland 2009). This is one characteristic pattern of Confucian self-cultivation: one consciously, deliberately and assiduously undertakes a program that inculcates dispositions to have ethically appropriate emotional responses and patterns of conduct. The intent is to make the dispositions for these responses reliable and resistant to undue situational influence.
Furthermore, the Confucians very much appreciated the power of models to inspire, to make one want to transcend one’s present self (see Tan, 2005 and Olberding, 2008, 2012, 2016). The psychologist Jonathan Haidt (2003) has given empirical evidence for an emotion he calls “elevation,” which is something like awe and admiration upon contemplating the morally admirable. The Analects, in fact, has been read as a record of how a group of men gathered around a teacher with the power to elevate, and as a record of how this group created a culture in which goals of self-transformation were treated as collaborative projects. These people not only discussed the nature of self-cultivation but enacted it as a relational process in which they supported one another, reinforced their common goals, and served as checks on each other in case they went off the path, the dao. They were each other’s situational influences. See Sarkissian, 2010 for the argument that Confucius shows how one can turn the power of situations on people’s attitudes and behavior toward positive ends; if situations can influence people, one can through small details of comportment and attitude be a situational influence on others that tilts things toward a better course.
Training in ritual, li, takes on another dimension of importance in light of the situationist problem. As noted in section 2.2 Confucian rituals help to express attitudes of respect and reverence for others that can exist independently of the rituals themselves, but rituals provide conventionally established, symbolic ways to express these attitudes toward others. Ritual forms, therefore, give participants manifold and (just as importantly) regularly recurring ways to act on and therefore to strengthen the right attitudes and behavioral dispositions. Given the renewed appreciation in contemporary psychology for the power of emotions to influence attitude and behavior, the resource offered by ritual training should not be ignored by anyone concerned about the problem of how to resist undue situational influence.
Finally, Confucianism points to the possibility that individuals, under the right circumstances and encouragement, can enhance their reflective control of their own emotions and impulses. Mencius’ conversation with King Xuan can be conceived as an attempt to get the king to nourish his moral sprouts by reflecting on them, to become aware of what his moral emotions are (such as compassion) and to take action to grow them. It should be noted that contemporary psychology is exploring the factors that work into the development of self-control of one’s emotions and impulses (e.g., chapter 3 in Belsky et al., 2022). See Lieberman (2011) and Creswell (2007) for studies indicating that meditation focused on cultivating compassion in oneself can be effective through enhancing one’s ability to identify and gain better control of one’s emotions.
Finally, in considering why robust character traits that could qualify as virtues are so rare, we should consider the perspective that very much informs the self-cultivation projects of Confucius and his students. They were very much aware of the lack of virtue as a social and political condition and not merely as an individual condition that just happened to be widespread (Hutton 2006 makes this point). There is a reason why Confucius and Mencius after him sought to have kings adopt their teachings. If in fact the achievement of robust virtues requires long and hard training, supported and guided by others who have taken similar paths before, and if as Mencius 1A7 holds, people cannot engage in such training until they have the material security that enables them to take their minds off the sheer task of survival, then it is no mystery at all why there are no such traits in societies structured to achieve very different goals. Ironically, the situationist psychological experiments do not take into account this underlying relational factor that might deeply influence the ability of people to form robust virtues, and neither do the philosophical critics of virtue ethics who rely on the situationist experimental evidence.
2.8 Responsibility and agency in Confucian ethics
In many respects, the ethics associated with the canonical figures of Confucius, Mencius, and Xunzi is about the way people should respond to one another, and in this sense it is a paradigmatic ethic of responsibility. Confucian ethics exemplifies, along with most other ethics, the idea that we must be responsive to, held responsible for, that which makes us morally valuable. Confucian virtues of ren, yi, li, and filiality are conceived to make their possessor trustworthy and reliable responders to the needs, welfare, and dignity of others. The centrality that Confucian ethics accords to relationship in what is valuable in human life results in some distinctive features of its conception of responsibility. A supreme degree of responsiveness to the needs and suffering of people is required of exemplary officials. In Mencius 4B29, Yu, legendary for working tirelessly to control the flooding of the great rivers of China and who later became King, is described as regarded those drowning as if he had drowned them himself. Ji, who bore his official responsibilities in a time of famine, regarded those starving as if he had starved them himself. Xunzi says that Tian gave birth to the people not for the sake of their lords, but established the lords for the sake of the people (chapter 27).
The authority of rulers rests on their being given the responsibility for bringing about the conditions under which their people can live fulfilling lives and develop their virtue. Recall Mencius’ declaration to King Xuan that if the people do not have a constant means of livelihood, they will not have the constant minds to set themselves on developing their virtue, and fall into crime (1A7). If a king allows such circumstances to afflict his people, if his people commit crimes to feed themselves and their families, and if the king punishes them, he will have entrapped them. Mencius’ declaration, then, amounts to distributing a great share of the responsibility for the people’s crimes to their king.
Mencius goes on to propose concrete policies to the king to avoid entrapping the people: not overtaxing them to fund aggressive wars against neighboring states, prohibiting close-mesh fishing nets so as not to catch young fish and turtles, limiting the harvesting of trees to certain seasons, and planting mulberry trees so that the people will have silk clothing to wear (1A3, 1A7). Such policies make for sufficiently fertile soil from which his people’s duan might grow. Mencius might here be construed as invoking what has been called “circumstantial luck” by Thomas Nagel in his classic “Moral Luck” essay (1976). While we do have control over some of our circumstances, we have none or very little control over other circumstances that greatly affect what can we make of ourselves. This is the source of Nagel’s intuition that an arbitrariness of evaluation infects our judgments of what we tend to hold people to answer for. Some of us have very unfavorable circumstances in which we choose, yet others with more favorable circumstances get more credit for their choices. Interestingly, the only exception Mengzi makes to the rule that those without a constant means will be unable to have a constant mind is the class of shi 士, the gentry-scholar class of which Mengzi himself was a member. In an era of great political turbulence and disintegrating social order, members of this class were dislodged from their comfortable niches in the lower aristocracy, but their knowledge of traditions made them valuable to competing warlord-kings who wished to replicate the glory of the old kings. This distinct set of circumstances for the shi made genteel poverty and itinerancy more favorable, or at least less adverse, circumstances for maintaining a constant mind than others lower in the social order.
People normally have responsibility to refrain from crime, which involves their responsibility to respond to the needs of their potential victims, but that responsibility can be mitigated by the lack of control they have to avoid severe suffering if they refrain from crime. Their responsibility is mitigated by the way desperation focuses the mind on self and those for whom one cares the most. When governments fail to realize the material conditions under which their people could devote adequate attention to the development of their virtue, they share a great deal of the responsibility for the wrongdoing and harm that results.
Though Xunzi has a very different theory of what happens in the cultivation of virtue, he too believes that helping individuals to become competent moral agents is a collective task. He recounts a story that occurred when Confucius was Minister of Justice. A father and son had become embroiled in a legal dispute. Kongzi detained them both but ultimately releases both. When questioned as to why he let the son go when he should have been punished for being unfilial, Kongzi questions the permissibility of killing subordinates when their superiors are at fault: to fail to teach the people and then judge their crimes is to kill the innocent; to fail to teach the people and yet hold them responsible for achieving meritorious works is being cruel; it is only when one stops these practices that it is permissible to apply punishments (chapter 28, see translation by Hutton 2014: 319). However, if the material conditions sufficient for the focusing of one’s attention on moral virtue are present, and if others capable of pointing the way toward learning are available to be followed, then it is up to the individual to put in the effort (see Mencius 6A9 and Jiang 2002).
Lack of control over the conditions under which one becomes a responsible moral agent, as discussed above, can result in mitigation of personal responsibility. However, it is also possible to become responsible for what is not under one’s control. This can happen because others who commit a moral wrong stand in special relationship to oneself. In addition, such others can enter so deeply into one’s identity that one cannot repudiate what they do without disowning part of the self. In the text Kongzi Jiayu (孔子家語 The School Sayings of Confucius, 37.4 – see Other Internet Resources), a story is told of the time Kongzi refrains from denouncing the unseemly conduct of an old friend and does not distance himself from it or his friend. In explaining this, Kongzi says that family members never lose that which makes them family and old friends never lose that which makes them old friends. Deep and lasting friendship can make us partly responsible for the misconduct of our friends (see Ing 2017 for an illuminating discussion of this passage).
Such consequences for the allotment of responsibility stem from the moral centrality given to relationship in Confucian ethics, but are not peculiar to Confucian ethics. Margaret Urban Walker (1993) has observed that moral agents who accept responsibility for circumstances beyond their control and who therefore “recognize their vulnerability to fortune are primed for dependability of humanly invaluable sorts” and “won’t fail us even under the blows of bad fortune or odd turns of fate which might otherwise prompt denial or opportunism” (1993, 25–26).
Agency, then, can be distributed among a larger group of people and is not limited to the agent who directly chooses the action in question; it is distributed among those who can some significant degree of control over the conditions under which the direct agent chooses. Others can share responsibility through having a relevant relationship to the direct agent. A significant degree of responsibility is retained by the direct agent, however, especially if the conditions (such as a constant means of livelihood and the presence of reliable teachers and models) favorable to the development of agency are present. Then responsibility is conceived to rest on the individual to exercise their heart-mind. In Mencius’ case, the individual needs to exercise the heart-mind’s capacity to think about the importance of developing the moral duan within; in Xunzi’s case, the the individual needs to reflect on what qualities of character and what kinds of cooperative relationships with others would provide the greatest, and most stable satisfaction of desire. In each case, there is an internal normative hierarchywithin the person that should be established, with the heart-mind as the leader or commander of the rest of the person. The heart-mind directs how the person should cultivate the self and conduct itself in relation to others. This hierarchy corresponds to the meritocratic order that Confucians believe should obtain in state and society: the most virtuous and most able (those who have developed their heart-minds the most) should have the most authority to govern. We shall see how the Zhuangzi (section 4.2) in particular poses a striking critique of both forms of hierarchy.
Zhu Xi (1130–1200) reinterpreted ethical themes inherited from the classical thinkers and grounded them in a cosmology and metaphysics that had absorbed the influence of Buddhism, particularly as it transformed in its interaction with Daoism when entering China (see the chapters on Zhu Xi and Wang Yang Ming in Ivanhoe, 1993 for the neo-Confucian reaction Buddhism and Daoism). Zhu established the Confucian canon that served as a basis for the Chinese public service examination, including the Analects and Mencius, along with the Great Learning (Da Xue) and Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong). In fact, he had his greatest influence through the commentaries he wrote on these texts (see Gardner, 2003 for a discussion of the influence of Zhu Xi’s reading of the Analects). Zhu affirmed the Mencian theme that human nature is good, with greater emphasis on that vein of thought in the Mencius that stresses that goodness is internal to human beings and will develop in the absence of interference. This reading of Mencius is unsurprising given the influence of Buddhism on the Neo-Confucians, and it meant the demotion of Xunzi within the influential Neo-Confucian reading of the tradition. Much of Zhu’s metaphysics centers on the relation between li 理 (not li 禮 as ritual but as principle or pattern or the fit and coherence between things) and qi (the material force or energy stuff from which objects emerge and return at the end of their existence). How Zhu Xi conceived this relation is a matter of interpretive debate. Some view him as holding a dualistic metaphysics in analogy to the way that Plato’s distinction between the Forms and the sensible world is often taken to embody a metaphysical dualism (Fung, 1948, chapter 25). However, others interpret Zhu’s li not as ontologically prior to qi but rather as being a pattern or deep structure that is immanent within and expressed by qi and delineates the range and possibilities of qi’s transformations (Graham, 1986; Thompson, 1988; Angle and Tiwald, 2017; Liu, 2018). Others have noted that li appears to have both subjective and objective aspects: it lays down the lines along which everything moves in a way that is independent of personal desires; but on the other hand, it is related to the pattern of one’s profoundest responses to things (see Angle, 2009, for an attempt to reconcile these aspects). With regard to qi, Zhu Xi held that even though goodness is within human nature, individuals differed with respect to their native endowment of energy stuff, and that this, together with differences in their family and social circumstances, affected the development of their good natures (Angle and Tiwald, 2017; Liu, 2018).
Zhu Xi saw one’s self-cultivation as a matter of apprehending the li of one’s own mind, largely through meditation practice, and, at the same time, investigating the li or patterns of things not only as revealed in texts such as the Analects but as embodied in concrete situations, including the patterns in relationships between persons. Both kinds of activities must be conducted with jing, which in Zhu’s thought means respectful attention. Zhu is sometimes characterized as a kind of scholastic, but he emphasized study of the texts in conjunction with acting, with observing li as principle, pattern, or coherence in external situations and relationships, and realizing the correspondence between the li of one’s own mind and the li of texts and of situations and relationships. Apprehending li in a concrete situation in order to respond appropriately to it was not a simple matter of absorbing generalizations from texts and applying it to the situation, but rather a matter of bringing to bear a mind that has been cultivated by meditation and by study of the texts and by observing and acting in previous situations. Such a mind can take into account relevant ethical considerations and is disciplined in attending to the situation (see the chapter on Zhu Xi in Ivanhoe, 1993; and Gardner, 1990).
The other Neo-Confucian whose influence rivals that of Zhu Xi is Wang Yang Ming (1472–1529). Wang saw Zhu’s emphasis on the investigation of patterns in external things as overly scholastic and leading to abstract speculation rather than practical guidance. He rejected what he saw to be the intellectualization of personal realization, and identified the mind with li. This means that the dispositions to judge properly the appropriate action in various situations constitute the mind’s original pure state. Li is not to be sought as a pattern residing in an independently existing external world but is embodied in judgments of the mind. This seems to commit Wang to an identification of the world with the experienced world and to a denial of a mind-independent world, but an alternative interpretation is that the structure of the world is mind-dependent while the world itself is not (Liu, 2018). Wang’s version of the Mencian theme that human nature is good is even more innatist than Zhu Xi’s (see Ivanhoe, 1990, for a comparison of Mencius and Wang Yang Ming). Original goodness does not need completion through learning about the external world. Then why aren’t all people fully good? Why are some very bad? Wang’s answer is that selfish desires cloud the sun of the complete and perfect moral mind, and that the task of human beings is to eliminate selfish desires and recover that mind (Chan, 1963, sections 21, 62).
One of Wang’s better-known themes is the unity of knowledge and action. There can be no gap between knowing what to do and doing it. Genuine knowledge is necessarily practical. Selfish desires and emotions get in the way of achieving genuine knowledge. One way of understanding this identification is to take knowledge as a knowing how to act that is expressed in acting. One expresses one’s knowing how to ride a bicycle by riding, not by articulating propositions about how to ride a bicycle that one might not be able to act upon. Furthermore, knowledge is particularist and context-sensitive in nature and is expressed in intuitive reactions to the present moment. Knowing how to ride a bicycle is continually reacting by shifting one’s body first this way and then that way to the changing center of gravity of one’s body in tandem with the bicycle. The moral life, on Wang’s view, is like that rather than applying a static set of generalizations one learns before encountering the situations in which one needs to act. Notice also that the kinesthetic sensations blend seamlessly with the bodily responses to those sensations that help one to go forward and keep one’s balance on a bicycle. In genuine moral knowledge, perception of the situation at hand blends seamlessly with the right response to it.
In emphasizing that the ultimate ideal is a kind of spontaneous and intuitive perceiving of the situation and the right response to it, Wang Yang Ming joins with Zhu Xi. However, this does not mean that there were not important dissenting voices. Dai Zhen defended an ethical ideal in which deliberative reflection on the right thing to do continues to play an important role and not just at stages in which one is a considerable distance from realizing the ideal. Dai particularly emphasizes the necessity for imagining the effects of one’s actions on others, which might help one better share their sorrows and joys. Whereas Zhu equated spontaneous and non-conscious identification with others as a reflection of the wholeheartedness of one’s motivations, Dai counters that needing to deliberate over the right thing to do is compatible with a wholehearted acting on one’s judgment when one arrives at it. Dai is inclined to give desires for the self a legitimate place in ethical reflection because he holds that one’s valuing of relationships can be strengthened when one understands that the other’s flourishing is tied up with one’s own (see Tiwald 2010, 2011a, 2011b).
Many contemporary philosophers who have seriously undertaken the study of Confucian ethics have concluded that it remains a “live” philosophy with insights of continuing relevance. A full defense of this claim requires not only identifying what is valuable in Confucian ethics but also addressing moral evils and liabilities that have long been associated with it (the same should be said of Aristotle and his views of women and slaves, or Kant, and his views of women or people of African descent). For example, Confucian ethics might be seen as providing a needed emphasis on the central value of relationship in most, if not all, human lives that are worth living. In response to the Socratic claim that the unexamined life is not worth living, the Confucian might be on at least equal footing in saying that an isolated life is not worth living. Yet the Confucian is also required to examine what sorts of relationships should have this high status. Does Confucianism require family relationships that are patriarchal, with the husband and father exercising authority over wife and children in ways that would inevitably offend values of equality and autonomy?
A recurring theme in the more recent literature on this subject is that views of women in the early period of Confucianism were relatively positive compared to the views adopted later. Raphals (1998) has extracted from the literature of the Warring States Period (during which Confucius lived) and the later Han Dynasty portraits of women who were active and sometimes very effective participants in their societies. For example, the “Collected Life Stories of Women” (Lienu zhuan) depicts women as having the same intellectual virtues as men, providing strategy and counsel to their rulers, husbands, fathers and sons, excelling in logic and argument, and presenting sagely wisdom. Nylan reads classical Chinese texts as talking “with almost stunning clarity of the power for good and evil that women bring to politics” (2000, 212), and she concludes that “[o]ur stereotypes of ancient China do not come so much from … [these texts] as from relatively recent sources, the Neo-Confucians and the May Fourth reformers” (2000, 213). At the same time, it must be said that the powerful women of ancient China were almost always excluded from official positions of power and authority.
Sin Yee Chan (2000) presents a portrait consistent with Raphals’ and Nylan’s from looking at the Analects and the Mencius. It is assumed in those texts that the proper roles for women lie in the inner, domestic sphere, and for men the outer, public sphere. This distinction, argues Chan, is functional and conceived as obtaining between complementary roles, not between women and men conceived as inferior and superior. But the consignment of women to the inner sphere does exclude them from one of the most central aspirations of the junzi, which is to serve in public office. It also excludes them from receiving the education that is a preparation for office. At the same time, there is no attempt to justify the exclusion of women from this aspiration, and no argument given in these texts that they possess lesser capabilities for achieving that aspiration, no conception of women as having inferior capacities for the development of strategic intelligence, moral wisdom, or self-discipline.
The inference is to the possibility of a version of Confucian ethics that fully acknowledges the capabilities of women to become junzi and that supports opportunities for them to achieve that ideal. Some who are sympathetic to this line of development for Confucian ethics have argued for its significant affinities with some strains of feminist thought. Consider ren in its meaning as the particular virtue of care for others. Chenyang Li (1994) has argued that there are important similarities between this central Confucian virtue and the feminist ethic of care articulated by Carol Gilligan (1982) and Nell Noddings (1984). Furthermore, both Confucian and feminist care ethics have conceptions of ethical reasoning that emphasize contextualized reasoning about moral problems rather than deducing solutions top-down from high general principles. Li acknowledges the patriarchal form that Confucian ethics came to take on, but stresses that in a contemporary dialogue between these two ethics, each could have something to contribute to the other.
Rosenlee (2014; also see 2007) addresses a criticism of care ethics of either the Confucian or Western feminist sort that has come from some feminist quarters, which is that care is a value pressed upon women so that they might be subordinate helpmates to men. While she acknowledges that the value has functioned in this way, she questions whether women should cease caring when “vulnerability and interdependency characterize human existence” (2013, 318). Shouldn’t they rather insist that men share equitably the task of caring? Rosenlee defends the Confucian value of filiality or xiao as the root of moral character, starting the project of caring with addressing the vulnerability of the child, then through the stages where a child reciprocates care for parents, and getting extended beyond the family.
Kupperman (2000) holds that Confucian ethics could benefit from adopting the feminist recognition that many social roles and the rituals that support them need to be reformed and perhaps re-invented in some cases, given the limiting and inhibiting effect they have on the life projects women have chosen or could have chosen for themselves (Meyers, 1989). He reads the classical Confucian texts as adopting a much more conservative and respectful attitude towards traditional social roles and rituals, and while he has a degree of sympathy for this attitude (there can be good reasons why things are old enough to be traditional), he concludes that Confucian ethics, if it is to fully support opportunities for development of women’s capabilities, must prepare to be radicalized with respect to at least some of the roles and rituals it has defended (see Neville 2017 for the argument that Confucianism is up to the task of seeing the need for new or radically revised rituals in this regard).
The issue of the Confucian orientation to tradition is itself a matter of contested interpretation. While the Confucian attitude is uncontroversially “conservative” in holding that there is much wisdom and guidance to be recovered from the past, some lean toward the more extreme Mohist interpretation that Confucians accept tradition simply because it is tradition (e.g., Hansen, 1992), while others view the Confucian attitude as a discerning and critical attitude toward tradition, citing passages such as Analects 3.15 in which Confucius says that his own persistent questioning at the Grand Temple is itself an act of li or proper observance of ritual (see Alan Chan, 2000). Further, and most importantly, Confucius was a pivotal figure in turning the meaning of “junzi” from a person of noble blood to a person of moral nobility who could come from any background.
To retrieve one’s cultural inheritance is itself a complex, contested task, given the internal diversity of belief and practice that is characteristic of any vibrant tradition. In her account of how Chinese thinkers in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries approached the task of bringing to bear Western thought to the reform of their own society, Jenco (2015) points out that a crucial part of their task was to identify what their own cultural inheritance was, such that it could be brought into relation to a present and future that involved possibly profound transformation. She points out that “Confucius offered one of the earliest accounts of how an orientation to a particular past could be both deliberate and transformative rather than merely descriptive of an established identity,” and that his conception of the Zhou inheritance was but “one of many possible lineages created when the present was sutured to that particular past” (Jenco, 2015, 57). Tan (2004, 82) makes a similar point in claiming that the Confucian “legacy is successfully transmitted only when the past is revitalized, so that it is embodied in the different experience of the present. Confucius considers one who ”revitalizes the old to realize the new (wengu er zhixin)“ worthy of being a teacher (Analects 2.11).” Those engaged in transforming Confucian ethics in relation to women can view their task as a project of the kind Jenco and Tan are describing.
The relationship between Confucian ethics and liberal democratic values has received vigorous and diverse discussion starting from the late nineteenth and early twentieth century. This discussion has centered on three kinds of tension: Confucian perfectionism versus pluralism in the recognition of what constitutes a good and worthwhile human life; the Confucian value of social harmony versus individual rights; and the Confucian value of meritocracy versus the grounding of a government’s legitimacy in its acceptance by the governed.
Joseph Chan (2014) has classified Confucian ethics, along with much of ancient Greek ethics, as perfectionist in structure. Many of the central ethical judgments in Confucianism have to do what what it is to live a good human life, and the virtues it takes to live such a life. As indicated earlier, the Confucian conception of a good human life is centered around relationships--within the family, within friendship, and also within a society in which one aspires to serve a government by advancing the mission of securing the material and moral welfare of the people. From the standpoint of a contemporary liberal democratic theory, one might question how much room this leaves people to choose among a plurality of reasonable conceptions of the good life. Certainly, many contemporary Americans and Europeans would not place so central an emphasis on family relationship and on filiality as Confucians do. Chan (2000, 2014) proposes to defuse this tension through advocating a moderate Confucian perfectionism that refrains from promoting a comprehensive view of how people ought to live. The liberal argument that conceptions of the good life are too controversial to be promoted by the state does not apply, he argues, to some important constituents of the Confucian conception of how to live--prudential goods and goods necessary for agency. Such goods, when separated from a comprehensive conception that orders and prioritizes them into a particular way of life, can be promoted in piecemeal fashion through non-coercive methods in the context of particular issues, and justifications can be given on the basis of common ground and compromise.
Kim (2016) argues that Chan’s version of moderate Confucian perfectionism does not leave enough that is distinctively Confucian. Filiality as traditionally understood is tightly associated with a patrilineal family/clan structure and with rituals that express gender hierarchy, which is why it is the greatest failure of filiality to fail to produce a male heir who will continue the male family line and who will conduct the ceremonies of ancestor worship. On the other hand, if one does leave enough that is distinctively and traditionally Confucian, Kim argues, one will not have a perfectionism that is moderate enough to be compatible with the pluralistic, diverse character of contemporary East Asian societies. Kim proposes the alternative he calls “public reason Confucianism,” which sets traditional Confucianism and the democratic values of popular sovereignty, political equality, and the right to political participation in dialogue with each other. The two sides must accommodate to each other. In practice, it seems that the most glaring inequalities accepted under traditional Confucianism, including gender inequalities that support women’s unequal standing as citizens, must go, though traditionalist Confucian associations retain a degree of autonomy to run their affairs and to retain “moderate inequalities” when these do not have vital public implications (2016, 164). One of the challenges Kim may have to address is whether in the dialogue between traditional Confucianism and democratic values there emerges something that is coherent and still distinctively Confucian. The previously discussed commentators on Confucianism and gender equality illustrate how it might be argued that gender equality is more compatible with Confucian values than they are usually thought to be. They also raise the issue of what “traditional” Confucianism really is, whether it is one thing, and whether it has not always been constantly changing.
Angle (2012) addresses the tension between perfectionism and pluralism about the good life by developing an argument he finds in the twentieth century Confucian Mou Zongsan. Mou holds that politics must ultimately be based on moral values but is concerned about the excesses of governments trying to promote particular conceptions of virtue and the good life. Given the difficulties of achieving ethical insight, even among the most accomplished of human beings, it is necessary to separate to some degree political values from ethical value. Even a political leader who is a sage must engage in “self restriction” (ziwo kanxian). In practice, Angle explains, self-restriction means putting in place democratic institutions and the recognition of human rights. This not only sets up guardrails to keep political leaders from going badly off track, but also provides citizens the opportunity to participation in public life that is needed to advance their own ethical insight and further realize good character.
Tan (2003) argues that Confucian methods for encouraging the realization of virtues are non-coercive because its conception of the good life is process-oriented and fallibilistic, and its conception of personhood is social and relational. Human beings become persons through processes of relationship with each other, by contributing to each other’s ethical growth. What growth amounts to is something that can be meaningfully judged only within the particular circumstances and the processes that have led up to the present. A figure such as Confucius has authority not just because of who he is but because others respond to him with spontaneous acceptance, admiration, and emulation. Since Tan holds that these Confucian conceptions are eminently plausible, she argues that not only is Confucianism compatible with democracy, but that democracy needs to incorporate the insights of Confucianism. In the Western tradition, she finds in John Dewey a thinker who is sympathetic to these insights.
In section 2.3, it was suggested that Confucianism posits a fundamental harmony between individual and group interests, and that there are ways in which Confucianism values autonomy and ways it does not. These points have ramifications for the issue of whether Confucianism can recognize individual rights. Given the way that individual and group interests are conceived as mutually dependent and interwoven, Confucianism cannot recognize rights on the grounds that the individual’s interests inevitably conflict with group interests. Furthermore, Confucians might have a legitimate concern that an emphasis on individual rights, as things that can be claimed against the group, tends to encourage people to think of their interests as incompatible with the interests of others.
These considerations should hold some weight for Confucians, but so do some other considerations that support protections for individuals. Confucianism can recognize that individuals do not always accurately perceive or act on the fundamental compatibility between individual and group interests. Rights might be necessary in case relationships irretrievably break down and individuals need to be protected. Joseph Chan (1999, 2014) has made this very point for rights as “fallback” mechanisms. One might go further than Chan does and give rights a more prominent place if one expects regular misfiring on attempts to reconcile individual and group interests (e.g., see Fan 2010, Wong 2004). If in fact it can be a difficult matter to tell how to promote fundamental harmony between people’s interests, and if political leaders tend to have their judgment about this matter compromised by the influence of some of their own personal interests and by the sheer fact of holding power (there is evidence that one becomes less sensitive to other people’s interests the longer one holds power over them), there may be good reason to recognize rights to free speech that can be used by citizens to call office holders to account and to make their own interests more salient. Providing these protections under the heading of rights may help to protect citizens when the content of their speech concerns the wrongful or misconceived conduct and policies of an office holder (Wong, 2004).
Angle’s argument, inspired by Mou Zongsan’s idea of self-restriction, has a similar logic of pointing to human fallibility as a warrant for rights. A more positive justification for rights might be rooted in Confucian values. As mentioned earlier, Angle (2012) argues that participation in public affairs is necessary for advancing the cultivation of one’s character. Kim (2016) argues for equal rights of political participation based in the Mencian view that all human beings have the moral sprouts within their nature. What kept Mencius from recognizing an equal right to participation is his commitment to the sage-king paradigm of government, but such an arrangement is a non-starter for even contemporary East Asian societies with a substantial Confucian heritage.
Indeed, if one goes back to the classical Confucian notion of harmony discussed in section 2.3, there is a basis for ensuring room for a diversity of viewpoints. Harmony is not sameness of viewpoint but makes use of diversity of viewpoint. In Analects 9.30, Confucius states the inevitability of what we today might call “reasonable disagreement:” “The Master said, ”You can study with some, and yet not necessarily walk the same path (dao); you can walk the same path as some, and yet not necessarily take your stand with them; you can take your stand with them, and yet not necessarily weigh things up in the same way“ (translation from Ames and Rosemont, 2010).
Positive arguments for rights based on the goal of promoting the common good emerged in Chinese thought soon after it encountered the idea of rights from the West in the nineteenth century. For example, it was argued that individuals ought to have a range of freedom of expression and action so that they can contribute more richly and originally to the welfare of Chinese society. Chinese thinkers such as Liang Qichao and Japanese thinkers such as Kato affirmed both the legitimacy of the individual’s desires and the necessity to harmonize individual and group desires (see Angle and Svensson, 2001; Angle, 2002). Emphasis on the former would be the relatively new element in a contemporary Confucianism, but 1B6 of the Mencius provides a striking anticipation of this element. Here King Xuan tells Mencius that his ability to be a true king for his people is thwarted by his desires for wealth and for sex. Mencius replies that if the King accords the common people the same privileges for wealth and sex, there would be no problem in becoming a true king. Xunzi (see section 2.6) conceives of morality as a way of harmonizing the desires of individuals so that destructive conflict is replaced by productive harmony, and this gives the satisfaction of desire a central role in his version of Confucian ethics. Later on in the tradition, Dai Zhen defended the legitimacy of self-interested desire as long as it is tempered by a proper concern for others (see Tiwald, 2011a; and section 2.8). Rosemont (1991, 2004) has argued that ”second-generation“”positive“ rights to education and economic security are better grounded in the Chinese tradition than they have been in the West. Such grounding might have very deep roots in Confucian thought, specifically what Chan calls the ”service“ conception of government, or the idea that government finds its only warrant in protecting and advancing the welfare of the people.
The above arguments on behalf of recognizing rights within a Confucian framework provide resources for addressing the worry that rights undermine social harmony. Achieving harmony is a continuous process of adjusting to inevitable differences even among reasonable individuals. Providing a forum for the airing of differences can positively contribute to a better and more inclusive view of the common good. Rights need not be justified in a way that opposes them to the common good but can in fact be construed as necessary for its realization. This might present a somewhat different conception of rights that does not treat them as ”trumps“ but as based on substantial moral considerations that must be taken into account but do not necessarily override all other moral considerations. Greene (2021) has argued that the American legal tradition is an outlier (even among developed democracies) in regarding rights in the former way and that it would be better off adopting something like the latter way.
It might be argued that however much Confucianism evolves, it would be difficult to conceive of it without the idea that the wisest, most virtuous and competent should rule. Meritocracy is not in outright contradiction with popular sovereignty. One might hold that people should vote for those best equipped to promote the common good, for example, and one might further argue that in contemporary circumstances, Confucians have other reasons to take on board democratic institutions of citizen participation. Inspiration for the idea of combining legitimacy founded on popular election and legitimacy founded on merit originally came from a proposal by the influential contemporary Confucian Jiang Qing (2012). However, his proposal includes a third legislative chamber consisting of those representing the cultural and religious heritage of China, which most others have not included.
Joseph Chan (2014) has argued that Confucianism may do well to incorporate democratic electoral institutions to hold political leaders accountable to the common good. Accordingly, he proposes that there should be a democratically elected legislative chamber in a Confucian moderately perfectionist government. However, as democratic institutions are known not to necessarily result in the selection of the wisest, most virtuous and competent, Chan proposes a second legislative chamber to be paired with the first, the members of this second being chosen on the basis of demonstrated merit, in terms of virtue and competence, as chosen by those who have had the opportunity to observe them in action, such as colleagues and experienced journalists. Chan’s overriding Confucian concern is moral education throughout the whole society in virtues such as respect, reverence, trustworthiness, sincerity, beneficence, civility, and the common good. In fact, the primary function of the second chamber, in his view, is to advance this educative goal.
Daniel Bell (2006) and Tongdong Bai (2013, 2015) have proposed that one legislative chamber be comprised of elected representatives and the other by those selected on the basis of exams and previous performance in office. Bell and Bai are more pessimistic than Chan is about the prospects for modern democratic citizenry to make good choices. Bai points out that the ancient Greeks had slaves that made it possible for them to fully participate in the Assembly, and they belonged to a small city state, not a large society with many complex issues that require specialized knowledge to handle, and not one that gives rise to enormous inequalities that undermine the sense of a common good. Bell (2015) points out the negligible impact of any individual’s vote in large democracies, and the time and effort required to become better informed about complex issues requiring specialized knowledge. Even if individuals had the time and motivation to to be more informed, they are subject to a wide array of cognitive biases that they are liable to get little help in correcting.
In later work Bell (2015) proposes a ”vertical“ model in which democratic elections are instituted at the local level but the top national leaders are selected on the basis of merit. at the intermediate levels, experimentation with democracy can take place, and if successful can be tried in other places or on an expanded basis. He let go of the bicameral proposal because he became convinced that the democratically elected chamber would eventually dominate. Bell argues that democracy works best at the local level where voters are more likely to know the virtue and ability of the leaders they select. The issues are relatively straightforward and easier to understand. It is easier to generate a sense of community at that level. At the highest levels of government, the issues are much more complex. Bell is well aware of problems for realizing the ideal of virtuous and able leaders. There is corruption and ossification of an elite who are likely to come from and select colleagues from a narrow set of social, economic and educational backgrounds. Even if these problems could be addressed through institutional reform, there is in the end a need to legitimize conferring so much power and prestige on an elite who might not be that different from others in society who choose different vocations. Bell concludes that democracy (perhaps in the form of a popular referendum on the vertical model) might be necessary for the legitimacy of a political meritocracy, even in a country with a Confucian heritage such as China.
One common characteristic of the contemporary writing on Confucianism, rights and democracy is its relative openness to alternatives. There is less of a tendency to assume that a single model of government is right for all societies, even all large contemporary societies, or even all large, developed countries. At the same time, there is openness to learning from the experience of other societies. There is more awareness of the continuing nature of the debate and the inconclusiveness of history’s verdict thus far.
The Mohists constituted a philosophical school founded by Mozi, who was roughly contemporaneous with Confucius. Not much is known about him, but a reasonable speculation is that Mozi came from an artisan background. The text bearing his name contains purported quotations from Mozi, but it is manifestly the contribution of different persons over a substantial period of time. The text advocates a consequentialist ethic that requires concern and acting for the benefit of all. Those who made the earliest contributions to the Mozi had a conception of benefit that is very concrete and relatively narrow, limited to material goods to satisfy the basic needs of all (e.g., enough food, shelter and warm clothing), sufficient population, and social order. As will be discussed later, however, this earliest conception may have included relational virtues such as filiality. Later Mohists seem to have broadened their conception to something like a a preference satisfaction criterion using pleasure and displeasure as indicators (See Stephens’ 2021 argument for such an interpretation of the later Mohists; for a translation, see Fraser 2020: Books 40–3 A 26–27).
The Mozi is quite explicit in its consequentialism. It names three fa or standards for judging the viability of beliefs and theories (see Fraser 2020, Book 35). One standard is of usefulness. In applying this standard, one assesses the viability of a belief or theory according to the beneficial or harmful consequences of acting on it. Another standard is that of consulting the origin, which is the historical record on the actions of the sage-kings. One determines whether the belief or theory being judged accords with those actions. The third standard is looking at evidence provided by the eyes and ears of the people. This seems to refer to observations that garner some degree of intersubjective consensus. Each standard is presented as if its validity might be independent from the others, but there are indications that the standard of usefulness is the most basic one. For one thing, consulting the record of the sage-kings’ actions hardly seems to be a good idea in Mohist terms given the Mohist objection to valuing tradition for its own sake, unless these actions are good guides because they produced good results, a historical judgment that was commonly accepted by otherwise disputing philosophical schools. Furthermore, arguments given in the Mozi that are purportedly based on intersubjective observation seem extremely dubious, e.g., that ghosts exist because stories are told about them very often. In fact, the possibility that ghosts do not exist is explicitly admitted (Fraser 2020, Book 31), but sacrifices to spirits are justified on the grounds that they produce good effects among the living. Ghosts in general are put to good use in the text: their primary activity is to avenge themselves upon the living persons who have done them wrong. The standard of usefulness guides application of the other standards. Even what seems to be the attempted justification of the standard of usefulness by reference to the will of tian or Heaven (Fraser, Book 26) has a circularity to it. We are to promote benefits and avoid harms because that is the will of Heaven, and Heaven’s will is to be relied upon because it is the wisest and noblest of all agents. But what could be the criterion for a being’s being wise and noble exception the promotion of benefits and avoidance of harms? Furthermore, the will of Heaven is demonstrated by the fact that wrongdoers are punished and the virtuous rewarded. Again, the evidence seems highly selective and is guided by the very standard of usefulness that it is seeemingly being justified.
A crucial issue in the interpretation of Mohism is what kind of concern for all it requires. As indicated earlier, Mencius interpreted the Mohist advocacy of jian ai to be advocacy of equal or impartial care for all, but some of the more important contemporary scholarship of Mohism has problematized this interpretation. Three books in the Mozi text (Fraser 2020, Books 14, 15, and 16) all bear the title of ”Jian Ai“ (translated by Fraser as ”Inclusive Care“). These books differ somewhat in content, perhaps suggesting an evolution in Mohist thought over time corresponding to the order of the chapters (see Defoort, 2005–6). People who do nothing to benefit others if they are not related to them in the right way, or even harm them, are contrasted with those who act according to jian ai. In the later two books, we are told to care for others as we care for ourselves, to view others as we view ourselves, or to be for others as we are for ourselves. Such formulations might reasonably be taken to require equality or impartiality of care. Perhaps this is why Mencius interpreted Mozi as requiring denial of one’s parents (Mencius 3B9).
However, the jian ai books consistently count among the failures to care for others failures of filiality between fathers and sons. They correspondingly count among the benefits of acting according to jian ai the realization of relational virtues such as filiality. Furthermore, the words used to say that we are to care for others ”as“ we care for ourselves, to view others ”as“ we view ourselves, and to be for others ”as“ we are for ourselves, are ruo and you, which can be used to mean equality of relationship or merely similarity of relationship (see Chiu 2013; Fraser 2016). Chiu (2013) concludes that jian ai means only caring for everyone with no requirement in equality of care. Fraser (2016), on the other hand, points to passages in later chapters of the Mozi (in the section called the ”Mo Bian“ or ”Mohist Dialectics;“ see Fraser, 2016: 171) that support the equal or impartial caring interpretation.
Further complicating the situation is the necessity to distinguish jian ai as a prescription for the attitude to take toward others and a prescription for conduct toward them. To have equal care as an attitude does not entail acting toward others in the same way. Indeed, the limited nature of the mental and physical resources available to the individual agent seems to necessitate some degree of inequality of action toward others. This may be at least partly why the jian ai books are relatively modest in their prescriptions for how individuals are to benefit others, even though there is some expansion of requirement in the later chapters. In fact even the latter prescriptions do not seem incompatible with what might be prescribed in the way of conduct by Confucian care with distinctions: refraining from harming others, engaging in relationships of mutual aid, and contributing to the support of those least able to care for themselves and who lack families able to protect them. Thus the Mohists may eventually have come to the view that a division of moral labor is suitable for most people. Most can satisfy the duties of righteousness (yi) through refraining from harming others, devoting more of their resources to benefiting those in traditional relationships with them such as family, engaging in mutual aid in somewhat larger groups such as the village, being prepared to contribute along with others to the support and protection of the most needy, and being loyal to those charged with seeing to the benefit of much larger groups. This picture fits with Mozi’s express concern (in book 8 on promoting the worthy) that social conflict comes from each person having and acting on their own conception of what is right. To avoid conflict a strict nested hierarchy of authority must be instituted: the Son of Heaven rules over the entire country with the help of ministers, and the country is divided into states, which are further divided into fiefdoms, and so on. Each social unit has members who are required to report their views to a superior on what is right and wrong, and the superior’s word on what is right is final (though one may remonstrate with a superior if one believes them wrong), and each unit must report to the superior of the next larger unit containing it. The Son of Heaven is accountable to Heaven, Tian, a more clearly and consistently anthropomorphized deity than the Confucian Tian, and whose will is that people benefit and not harm one another.
Honoring the relational virtues of family may be justified on the grounds that it is part of a social division of labor that most efficiently contributes to the benefit of all. It may also be, as Fraser (2016: 146) has suggested, that the Mohist conception of benefit (li) includes the realization of such virtues as goods in themselves. On either construal or both, since the possible justifications are not inconsistent with another, Mohists may not have advocated as demanding an ethic as may appear from the text’s statements of what jian ai is. Even if one interprets the attitudinal component as requiring equal or impartial care, the conduct component might consist of only a moderately demanding norms for benefiting others.
Heaven is treated as a kind of model for human beings. In one of the books on Heaven’s will, Mozi is quoted as saying that he treats the will of Heaven as a wheelwright holds to his compass and a carpenter his square. That Heaven is taken as a direct model in this way is significant for the question of whether jian ai taken in its attitudinal component means equal concern or merely concern that can vary in degree. Heaven’s will is not known through revelation or scripture but rather in how it acts. According to the text, it benefits and nourishes everyone; it rewards those who aid others and punishes those who harm others. It provides life and sustenance to rich and poor, noble and low, kin and nonkin; it created the regular and constant pattern of the seasons and weather that makes all these broadly distributed benefits possible. If Heaven’s will is taken as a model for the attitude one should have toward others, then impartiality of attitude seems to be the prescription.
Heaven also can serve as a model for conduct, such that one might not only benefit all in the sense of conforming to norms that would generally benefit everyone if enough people do their part, but also directly try to benefit as many people as possible, especially if one is in a position of means and influence. In the 16th book, King Wen is extolled as having exemplified the practice of jian ai. His practice was like the illumination of the sun and the moon, showing no favoritism to any direction or region. King Wen here exemplifies what can be a more demanding virtue than righteousness, which is benevolence (in the Mohist text this probably the best translation of ren). Fraser points out that in some of the later books of the Mozi that feature dialogues between Mozi and others, an ideal of sagehood emerges that is much more demanding than the prescriptions issued for everyone in the jian ai books. In chapter 49, righteousness is characterized as lying largely in helping others (Fraser 2016: 150). More radically, book 47 quotes Mozi as advocating the elimination of happiness, anger, joy, sorrow, likes and dislikes and dedicating oneself solely to benevolence and righteousness. Thus there might have been an evolution towards this more demanding ideal late in the Mohist movement, but perhaps, as Fraser (2016: 151) suggests, this ideal was treated as applicable only to the most devoted of Mohists.
This greater complexity associated with what it means to care for all might be a feature of any consequentialist ethic that takes seriously the idea of equal or impartial concern. Even if care as an attitude does not necessarily require trying to directly promote the benefit of all, the more capacity one has to promote the welfare of large numbers of people, the more one may (or should) feel bound to do so. Even if one acknowledges relationships such as those one finds in good families to have value in themselves, one might also be moved by the recognition that these things are valuable to everyone. One might come to feel bound by the acknowledgment that one would be doing the most good by helping the greater number to fulfill their basic needs and to achieve those relationships, even if this drains the mental and physical resources one has to put into one’s own relationships.
It is perhaps no accident that similar ambiguities are displayed in Western forms of consequentialism. There are very demanding forms of consequentialism, exemplified by Peter Singer’s argument for strong duties to contribute to famine relief (Singer, 1972). These forms typically focus on the good an individual could do on their own, regardless of whether others act similarly. When combined with the idea that others are no less morally important than oneself, these forms tend to justify very strong duties on the part of those with relatively plentiful resources to aid others. On the other hand, there are forms of consequentialism that construe the individual’s duties in terms of a generally applicable set of norms, the desirability of which is determined by the consequences of everyone or nearly everyone accepting them. Such forms of consequentialism, (e.g., for rule consequentialism, see Hooker 2000), tend to confirm more modest demands on the individual to aid others. Consequentialism may tend to oscillate between the pole of doing’s best in directly acting on equal concern for all others on the one hand and on the other hand acknowledging both practical and psychological limitations on the ability of (at least) most people to do so.
How, then, does Mohist ethics differ from Confucian ethics in the end? Because Confucian care with distinctions requires the extension of care to nonkin, and because Mohists by and large prescribed a modestly demanding form of jian ai as applied to conduct toward others, there is not as dramatic a practical difference as one might first think between Confucian and Mohist ethics. Confucians accept that there are plural sources of moral duty, and that conflicts between the reasons provided by these sources must be dealt with through the discretion and weighing of judgment. While Mohists appear to put forward a monistic source of duty—promoting benefits and avoiding harms, a plausible reading of the Mozi has it including plural sources of benefit, e.g., food and filiality. They may also have to resort to discretion and weighing of judgment when there are conflicts between plural goods. Mohists might attach more weight to the value of doing good for the most people when it comes into conflict with loyalty to kin, but there is no explicit position on this question in the Mozi.
There are certainly differences between the two ethics on the value of ritual and musical performance. Of course, many Confucians might be unhappy with the Mohist portrayal of their tradition as insisting on extravagantly expensive performances. But the difference over the value of ritual and music has even deeper roots than the issue of how much of a society’s material resources should be expended to stage them. Confucians tend to view the moral life as not only service to others but as fulfilling one’s own humanity. This feature of Confucian ethics, which it shares with classical Greek virtue ethics, distances it from Mohism.
Furthermore, as pointed out earlier, the Confucian conception of a humanly fulfilling way of life has aesthetic and emotionally expressive dimensions that set it further apart from Mohism. The focus on ritual and music exemplifies a deep concern for graceful and skillful enactments of concern and respect for others. To express these attitudes in a fitting and beautiful way is intrinsically valuable. The practice of ritual and music is also conceived as crucial for cultivation of one’s desires and emotional dispositions. For Confucius and Xunzi, such practice constituted training of one’s desires and emotional dispositions, ways of restraining a stubborn and undue concern for the self. While Mencius does not emphasize such a function for the practice of ritual and music, he does conceive of moral cultivation as nurturing the inborn emotional sensibilities that find fulfillment in relationship to others. He recognizes the danger of overfeeding the small part of the self that takes pleasure in eating and drinking. This need to shape and train the self stands in contrast with the aforementioned Mohist assumption that the main cause of social conflict is the variety of different conceptions of what is right that individuals tend to have. There is no indication in this Mohist diagnosis that there is any special difficulty in getting oneself or others to try to do what one thinks is right.
4.1 Ethical perspectives drawn from the Daodejing: the ”soft“ style of action and social primitivism
In the Daodejing (the text is associated with Laozi and is thought to have originated sometime in the period of 6th-3rd century B.C.E.) and Zhuangzi (a text associated with the historical Zhuangzi who lived in the 4th century B.C.E.) the focus shifts from the human social world to the cosmos, in which that human world often appears to be tiny and insignificant or even comically and absurdly self-important. It may seem that such a distanced and detached perspective has no ethical content or implications, but that is to assume an overly narrow vision of the ethical. In its own way, Daoism addresses as much as Confucianism does questions as to how one ought to live one’s life. Daoist ethics emphasizes appropriate responsiveness to the broader world that shapes and enfolds the human social world.
The nature of the vision of the broader world is open to dispute. A traditional interpretation of the Daodejing is that it conveys a metaphysical vision of the dao as the source of all things, and that this source is specially associated in nonbeing and emptiness as contrasted with being, perhaps suggesting that the dao is an indeterminate ontological ground in which the myriad individual things are incipient. Some contemporary commentators hold that the traditional interpretation is an imposition on the text of later metaphysical concerns (Hansen, 1992; LaFargue, 1992). Others hew closer to the traditional interpretation, citing passages such as those in chapter 4, where Dao is described as being empty, as seeming something like the ancestor of the myriad of things, as appearing to precede the Lord (di).
However that issue is resolved, it is apparent that a certain conception of the patterns of nature is embedded in the text and informs its ethical recommendations. Consider the characterizations of natural processes as falling into one or another of opposites: there is the active, aggressive, hard, and the male, on the one hand; and there is the passive, yielding, soft, and female, on the other hand (later these forces were much more explicitly associated with yang and yin). Conventional ”knowledge“ and ”wisdom“ dichotomizes processes into one or another of these categories and values the first over the second. The Daodejing extols the efficacy of the second. Whereas the first is associated with strength, the second, it is often said, possesses a deeper, underlying strength as demonstrated by water overcoming the hard and unyielding (chapter 78). Hence a ”soft“ style of action, wu wei (literally, ”nonaction“ but less misleadingly translated as effortless action) is recommended, even as a style of ruling. For example, chapter 66 says that one who desires to rule must in his words humble himself before the people, and that one who desires to lead the people must in his person follow them. Chapter 75 says that rulers eat up too much in taxes and therefore people are hungry. Rulers are too fond of action and therefore the people are difficult to govern. Setting too much store on life makes people treat death lightly. The last point brings out the related theme that striving after something often produces the opposite of the intended result. One of the more prominent themes in the Daodejing is the rejection of moralism: a preoccupation with and striving to become good or virtuous. Chapter 19 says to exterminate ren and discard yi (righteousness or rectitude), and the people will recover filial love.
One crucial ambiguity of the text is whether the ”soft“ wu wei style of action is meant consistently to be extolled over the ”hard“ style (as Lau claims in his introduction to his translation of the Daodejing, 1963), or whether the reversal of valuation is merely a heuristic device meant to correct a common human tendency to err in the direction of consistently valuing the hard style (LaFargue, 1992). The second alternative is consistent with a theme plausibly attributed to the text: that all dichotomies and all valuations based on them are unreliable in the end, even evaluations that are reversals of the conventionally accepted ones. Prescriptions to follow the ”soft“ style, taken as exceptionless generalizations, are no more reliable than the conventional wisdom to follow the ”hard“ style. On the other hand, many of the prescriptions in the Daodejing seem premised on the conception of there being genuine human needs that are simple and few in number, and that desires going beyond these needs are the source of trouble and conflict. Prescriptions for the ruler seem to be aimed at bringing about a reversion to a kind of primitivist state of society where no ”improvements“ are sought or desired. Carried to its logical limit, this primitivism implies the existence of a natural goodness with which human beings ought to become attuned. Indeed, the first of the three treasures of chapter 67 is ci or compassion. The ethics of the Daodejing is in these respects less radical and iconoclastic than some of its anti-moralistic language might suggest. If we are not to strive after goodness, it is there nevertheless as something that we must recover.
4.2 Ethical perspectives from Zhuangzi: skeptical questioning, attunement to the grain of things, inclusion, acceptance and freedom
On this point the Zhuangzi often sounds a much more skeptical note. In the second (Qi Wu Lun ”Equalizing All Things“) chapter of that text, the following questions go unanswered: ”How do I know that to take pleasure in life is not a delusion? How do I know that we who hate death are not exiles since childhood who have forgotten the way home?“ (translation from Graham, 1989, 59; see also the translation from Ziporyn, 2009). The human pretension to know what is true and important is lampooned by comparing it to the pretension of the cicada and turtle dove to know by their own experiences of flight the possibilities of how high creatures can fly. There is no vision of a primitivist utopia here either. Rather, the dominant attitude towards the possibility of large-scale social change for the better is pessimism. It is a dangerous task for the idealist to undertake, and one that will probably end badly for the idealist because rulers don’t like to be lectured on their failings. On this matter, the Zhuangzi not only diverges from the primitivist Utopian strain in the Daodejing but also more forcefully from the earnest and ever-striving idealism of the Confucians. In the fourth (Ren Jian Shi ”The Human World“) chapter, a pessimistic Confucius (who here seems to be speaking on behalf of Zhuangzi) tells his idealistic student Yan Hui that he will probably get himself killed trying to change the ways of a callous and violent ruler. Further, some passages in this story can be read as implying that Yan Hui’s deeper motivation is to gain praise for his own virtue. That Yan Hui might be characterized in this way is especially significant, because the Confucian tradition regards his motivations as being especially pure. The implication might be that the Confucian idealistic project is continually and inevitably self-undermining: people can sense the self-aggrandizing motivations behind the noble talk and react negatively (see Chong, 2016).
At the same time, it is significant that in this story Confucius does not reject Yan Hui’s idealistic project altogether, but suggests another way of proceeding. If he insists on trying, Yan Hui must refrain from formulating plans and goals. Such preconceptions will only interfere with seeing the ruler as he is and how he must be dealt with (there is a grain, then, unique to each human being to which one must become attuned to deal with him or her). So Yan Hui must prepare not with plans but by fasting and emptying his mind, so that he can listen to the ruler not only with his ears and mind, but also with his qi or vital energies. Such advice might in contemporary terms be construed as advice to cultivate one’s ability to tune into what is going on with other people through one’s gut intuitions, which on a neuroscientic level might correspond to the idea that human beings make practical decisions with the aid of bodily or ”somatic markers“ which record the positive or negative valence of outcomes ensuing from certain types of actions (Damsio 1994). Elsewhere in the text, there are happier references to activities that involve attunement to the grain of whatever is at hand. These forms of activity are presented as supremely satisfying. The most prominent example is that of Cook Ding in the third (Yangsheng Zhu ”The Primacy of Nourishing Life“) chapter, the cook who is able to wield his knife so skillfully in cutting up oxen that it flows without a nick through the spaces within the joints. Cook Ding has gotten past the stage where he sees with his eyes while cutting the ox; instead his qi or vital energies move freely to where they must go. The kind of phenomenology to which the Zhuangzi refers is one in which there is no self-conscious guiding of one’s actions but rather a complete absorption with the matter of hand. The efficacy and effortlessness of such activities might appear to suggest privileged veridical access to the situation and material at hand, but a less extreme interpretation is available.
Complete absorption in the matter at hand seems to involve the ability to keep one’s desires from interfering with one’s attention. The Daodejing contains epigrams about the desirability of being desireless, but first chapter (Xiao Yao You ”Wandering Far and Unfettered“ of the Zhuangzi includes an entertaining story that conveys this lesson. Huizi tries to figure out what to do with the shells of some huge gourds he had grown. He tried using them as water dippers and water containers, but they are too large and heavy for those purposes. Not being able to discover a purpose for them, he smashes them to pieces. Zhuangzi chides his friend for having underbrush in his head and not realizing that he could have lashed the gourds together to make a raft for floating about on the lakes and the rivers. A recurrent theme throughout the first chapter is that we are ruled by our preconceptions of the uses of things, which keeps us from being able to recognize the usefulness of the ”useless.“ When performing skill activities such as Cook Ding’s, preoccupation with the ”uses“ of these activities can interfere with our ability to perform them well. Woodcarver Qing (chapter 19 Da Sheng ”Fathoming Life“ of the Zhuangzi) makes marvelous bellstands. When he goes to make one, he fasts in order to still his mind. As he fasts, the distracting thoughts of congratulation and reward melt away, honors and salary, blame and praise, skill and clumsiness, even his awareness of having a body and limbs. Only when he is able to focus does he go into the forest to observe the nature of the wood, and only then does he have a complete vision of the bellstand.
Interpretations of the Zhuangzi tend to give primacy either to the skeptical passages or to the passages suggesting special access to the grain of things. On the first option, Zhuangzi simply appreciates the many perspectives on the world one could have, the many ways of dividing the world up by sets of distinctions, none of which can be shown in a non-question-begging manner to be superior to the others (Hansen, 1992, 2003; see also Chong, 2016). On the second option, Zhuangzi is often taken to hold in a kind of ineffable and nonconceptual access to the world, an access that makes possible the efficacy of activities such as Cook Ding’s (Ivanhoe, 1996; Roth 1999, 2000). A third possibility is that the text demonstrates a kind of continuing dialectic between skepticism and the conviction that one has genuine knowledge, and that the dialectic has no envisioned end. The dialectic includes a stage of skeptical questioning of whatever one’s current beliefs are, but the aim is not merely to undermine but to reveal something about the way the world that is occluded by one’s current beliefs. However, one is not allowed to rest content with the new beliefs but is led to question their comprehensiveness and adequacy precisely because they are suspected of occluding still something else about the world (Wong, 2005).
The third possibility does not subscribe to ineffable and nonconceptual access to the world, nor does it expouse a dogmatic skepticism that declares that no knowledge is possible. It is arguably consistent with some of the latest thinking about human perception--that it operates through selecting an extremely small portion of sensory input from the world and that is is both a bottom-up and top-down process in which that input is interpreted according to what we already believe about the world and is used as a basis for predicting what will be experienced in the near future. If there are discrepancies in our predictions we may be led to revise our prior beliefs and make new predictions to be tested (Clark 2016). This process is highly fallible because of necessary selectiveness in the sensory input to which we attend and because of tendencies toward biased interpretation of that input in the service of our prior cognitive commitments. Confucius’ advice to Yan Hui to ”fast“ his mind does not have to be construed as cultivating an ineffable and unmediated access to the world but rather as meditative practice that might unseat those commitments in favor of alternative perspectives on the world. These alternatives might better fit incoming sensory input or prompt us to take in a different range of input.
Such an interpretation aligns with apparent advocacy in the second chapter of going with the ”present this“ instead of sticking with a fixed perspective on the world, constituted by a set of distinctions between ‘this’ and ‘that’, ‘right’ and ‘wrong.’ Confucians are described as having their set of ‘this’s and ‘that’s, ’right’s and ‘wrong’s, which are diametrically opposed to the ‘this’s and ‘that’s and ‘right’s and ‘wrong’s of the Mohists, such that the ’this’ of the Confucians is the ’that’ of Mohists, the ’right’ of Confucians being the ‘wrong’ of Confucians. Instead of rigidly applying any single perspective in the face of present experience that does not fit it very well, the sage is described as finding a ”present this.“ When the Zhuangzi is construed as delivering such a message, it can be situated as taking to the ultimate a theme that is found in much if not all classical Chinese philosophy, one that Goldin (2005a) calls the ”primacy of the situation“ and Valmisa calls ”adaptive agency“ (2021). This theme, while not necessarily dismissing the relevance of general rules as guidelines for action, tends to view the particulars of the situation at hand as the ultimate ground for judging the appropriateness of action. In the Analects and the Mencius, for example, this theme is reflected in its conception of yi or rightness as appropriateness to the situation, though clearly the Zhuangzi is much closer to a kind of radically particularist view of what is appropriate.
However one might try to reconcile the tension between the skeptical questioning and the claims to special knowledge, the stories about skill activities such as Cook Ding’s arguably exemplify certain kinds of activities that human beings across cultures and historical periods have experienced to their great satisfaction. These activities involve the mastery of the many sub-activities that constitute a complex activity with goals that challenge abilities of the agent. The activities of master musicians (e.g., the technique of fingering on a flute), artistic performers (e.g., the placement of the toes in the pirouette of a dancer) and athletes (e.g., bringing the bat through the optimal plane while swinging it to hit a baseball) correspond rather closely to Cook Ding’s mastery of the sub-activities of cutting through the ox. In all these activities the agent does not need to pay conscious attention to performance of the sub-activities, and this enables attention to be focused on matters that escape the apprentice. Just as Cook Ding’s skill in the motor execution of the motions of cutting allows him to fully focus on where the joints and spaces are, the flutist is able to concentrate on the music as she is making it and not her fingering technique (see Csikszentmihalyi, 1990 for a study of such activities).
One interesting and realistic detail in the cook’s story challenges the reading of the skill stories as extolling the possibility of nonconceptual access to the grain of things. The cook says that whenever he comes to a complicated place in the ox, he sizes up the difficulties, tell himself to watch out and be careful, keeps his eyes on what he’s doing, works very slowly, and moves the knife with the greatest subtlety until the pieces fall away. Clearly there is conceptualization going on here, and in fact it is implausible to deny that the whole activity is being guided by a conceptualized goal! There is a difference between self-conscious conceptualization of experience and the application of concepts without awareness of applying them. One mustn’t confuse the latter with nonconceptualized experience. While there may be some way of squaring this part of the story with the interpretation that nonconceptual experience is celebrated in the Zhuangzi, the virtue of the story is that it is realistic and captures aspects of supremely skilled activities that are part of the experience of many people. Insofar as the Zhuangzi recommends such activities as part of a good life, it very much presents an ethic. When taken together with Confucius’ initial advice to Yan Hui to listen not only with his ears and not only with his mind but also with his qi
It also presents an ethic in supporting the idea of inclusiveness and acceptance. Here skeptical questioning of what we think we know, especially what we think we know about people and who is good and has something to offer to us are questioned in the chapter featuring stigmatized individuals, often with feet amputated (a common criminal punishment of the time), who turn out to be masters drawing as many students as Confucius. The Zhuangzi also urges identification and acceptance of the whole and of any and all of the changes that its creatures undergo. We should not be so sure that life is great and death is evil, and accept everything that comes our way, marveling at the possibility that upon our death we might be made into a fly’s foreleg the next time around. The Zhuangzi, like the Daodejing, calls upon human beings to identify with the whole of the cosmos and its transformations, and such identification involves acceptance, even celebration of death and loss, because in dying one participates in the next transformation of the cosmos and becomes something else to marvel at, such as a fly’s foreleg. Such a call may hold deep appeal, especially for those who cannot see any form of monotheism as a viable object for belief and yet desire some sort of spiritual connection that stretches beyond the merely human community.
However, such a call also raises challenging questions about human possibility. Can human beings really accept the loss of their selves and their loved ones with the kind of equanimity that identification with the whole requires? The Zhuangzi presents stories that represent different possibilities for conceiving of the nature of this equanimity. In the stories of the four masters, death is accepted without the slightest shiver. In the story of the death of Zhuangzi’s wife, a more complex emotional story is told, whereby Zhuangzi first feels her loss but comes to accept it as yet another transformation. This story suggests that one may retain one’s attachments to particular people and yet maintain resilience in the face of their loss because of one’s identification with the whole (Wong 2006; see Becker, 1998 for an discussion of resilience in the face of loss in the context of developing a contemporary Stoicism). But how is such identification psychologically possible? In the Zhuangzi, it seems based on a spirit of restless and joyful exploration of the richness of the cosmos. In the end, it embodies the emotion that is perhaps most fundamental to philosophy, and that is wonder.
Another implication could be drawn from the values found in the foundational texts that is not found in these texts but emerges in the contemporary context. The Zhuangzi’s lampooning of human pretension and arrogance, together with call to identify with the whole and with the nonhuman parts of nature, has appealed to those seeking philosophical perspectives within which to frame an environmental ethic (see Girardot, Miller, and Liu, 2001). A Daoist perspective offers both an alternative to an instrumentalist approach that would ground an environmental ethic solely in the idea that it defeats human beings’ interests to foul their own environment and to an intrinsic value approach that would ground duties to nature solely in a value that it possesses apart from its relation to human beings. A Daoist approach might point to the way that the human traits are conditioned by and responses to the nonhuman environment, such that these traits cannot be specified independently of the environment. In other words the Daoist self is not a substantial independent existence but a relational one whose boundaries extend into the conventionally nonhuman, and from a Daoist perspective that is reconstructed to be oriented toward the problem of the environment, we would do well to acknowledge the ways in which whatever we value in ourselves is connected to the nonhuman (Hourdequin and Wong, 2005; Hassoun and Wong, 2015). Treating the environment correctly is not purely a matter of satisfying conventional human interests such as conserving resources for our future consumption, nor need it be a matter of recognizing a value that the environment has in complete independence of its impact on us. It can be a matter of recognizing that who we are cannot be cleanly separated from the nonhuman environment. Moreover, there is much to be gained from being open to the transformation of our interests if we remain open to new sources of satisfaction in the nonhuman environment that currently escape our conceptions of the ”useful“ (recall Huizi and the gourds).
None of this shows that the composers of the classical Daoist texts had an environmental ethic. Goldin (2005b) points out that China does not have a very good history of concern for degradation or overuse of the environment and that the Daoist texts express no concern about such matters. As Goldin points out, the Chinese ancients simply had nothing comparable to our environmental problems. It is possible to find, however, fundamental attitudes toward the human relationship with nature that in our own time might seem a more promising basis for an environmental ethic. These attitudes embody a different relationship with nature that is not governed by the imperative of ceaseless consumption and the drive to colonize nature (see Jonathan Chan, 2009; and Miller, 2017 for further discussion of how Daoism might provide resources for dealing with the contemporary environmental crisis).
Within the ancient Chinese tradition, the Zhuangzi is taken to be highly unusual for its celebration of individual freedom. This shows in the text’s frequent characterization of social and moral norms as constraining and controlling the individual, as motivating small-minded condemnation of those who deviate from them. It also shows in the text’s rejection of the ideal of social and political service as dangerous to the individual. Jiang (2021) sees the text as offering two visions of freedom as counters to such constraint: freedom within the human lifeworld of social relationships; and freedom beyond the human lifeworld. The first is metaphorically illustrated by Cook Ding’s effortless, supremely responsive, navigation through the joints and spaces of the ox he is cutting up. One can navigate around social constraints instead of being restricted by them. More literally, freedom within the human lifeworld is exemplified in the text by friends who enjoy and accept one another but refrain from unwanted interference with each other’s affairs. The second is to identify with and embrace the inevitable processes of change and transformation, including death and the loss of what is most treasured within the human lifeworld. There are limits to the two kinds of freedom Jiang finds in the text: neither, in his view includes the kind of freedom that can be accomplished as a social and political value through challenging and changing the norms and institutions that unduly constrain the individual.
Lai (2020) distinguishes a third kind of freedom she sees in the Zhuangzi: freedom in working with constraints. On her account, one can cultivate the skills needed to match one’s capabilities to act with the situation at hand, which of course includes whatever might be regarded as social constraints. But to act by working with constraints is primarily to respond to the situation, which leaves open the question of whether one acts within the constraints, beyond them, or in some other way, perhaps even undermining them. This way of construing Zhuangian freedom is compatible with the above discussion of the way the text might be seen as encouraging the freeing of oneself from rigid preconceptions of how to understand the world and to be open to other ways of understanding one’s situation and to other ways of responding to it. Valmisa (2021) explicitly connects what she sees as social and political implications of Zhuangian freedom with the possibility of expanding one’s capabilities to efficaciously deal with constraints and to creatively imagine new possibilities. This possibility of a social and political construal of Zhuangzian values matches Chong’s (2016) perspective on the Zhuangzi as including a basic equality among all human beings that is inclusive in spirit and opposed to set hierarchical rankings of human beings in terms of unequal worth. This matches up with the Zhuangian critique of Confucian hierarchies, not only for society and state, but advocating for the individual an egalitarian conception of the parts of a person that puts the heart-mind in conversation with the rest of the body rather than in command (see the entry on mind (heart-mind) in Chinese philosophy).
Thinkers grouped under what is known in China as the Fajia 法家 or Fa tradition are usually known in the West as ”Legalists.“ This is misleading in that while the term fa can mean law, it can also include standards, norms, models, and methods (see Goldin 2005c, and the entry on legalism in Chinese philosophy). The English term is also misleading if taken to refer to thinkers who shared in common a cohesive set of doctrines when in fact the thinkers grouped under the name have a fairly diverse set of ideas. Nevertheless, there are some themes that are reasonably associated with some of the most prominent thinkers. One theme is perhaps best introduced as the opposite reaction to Analects 2.3, in which Confucius says that guiding the people by edicts and keeping them in line with punishments will keep them out of trouble but will give them no sense of shame; guiding them by virtue and keeping them in line with the rites will not only give them a sense of shame but enable them to reform themselves. In the most prominent Fajia text, the Hanfeizi (Hanfei lived during the 3rd century B.C.E. For a translation, see Watson 2003), the people are characterized as far too swayed by their material interests to be guided by a sense of shame. People must be guided by clear edicts and strong punishments. Furthermore, rulers must be wary of their ambitious ministers and take care not to reveal their own likes and dislikes so as not to be manipulated by their scheming subordinates. As to rulers themselves, it is a mistake to found government on the presumption that they are or can become virtuous. While exceptionally good and exceptionally evil rulers have existed, the vast majority of rulers have been mediocre. Governments must be structured so that it can run satisfactorily, because that is what rulers will be like almost always.
The Confucians held that the remedy to China’s turmoil and chaos lay in wise and morally excellent rulers—that moral excellence would ripple downwards from the top and create harmony and prosperity. The Daodejing upholds a vision of an original harmony that human beings once had, a way that consisted in living in accord with the natural grain of things, and that involves seeking only what one truly needs, not in multiplying useless desires that only agitate and ultimately make us unhappy. Many in the Fa tradition reject moral and spiritual transformation, of either the Confucian or Laoist kind, as the solution to China’s troubles. Most human beings will remain unlovely beings to the end, and governmental structures must be designed for such beings. Hanfei recommended a highly centralized government in which the ruler retains firm control of the ”two handles“ of government: punishment and favor (chapter 7). By making sure he always has his own hands on these handles, the ruler remains in firm control of his ministers. If a minister proposes a way to get something done, measure his performance on whether he gets it done in the way he says he will. If not, punish him. The ruler is to hold his officials strictly to the definitions of their role responsibilities, so that they are punished not only when they fail to perform some of those assigned responsibilities but also when they do more than their assigned responsibilities.
Some of the most interesting parts of the text consist of arguments supporting the necessity of governmental structure and the folly of depending on the character of rulers. It’s not just that virtue is a rare thing. Even if it appears in a ruler, it is not by itself sufficient for achieving a good society. The ”Five Vermin“ chapter (49) does not dispute an assumption that is commonly held across Chinese philosophical schools—that the sage-kings of ancient times were virtuous and ruled over a harmonious and prosperous society. It disputes, however, that their virtue was the primary cause of this golden age. What about those kings in more recent times who were ren and yi, benevolent and righteous, and who got wiped out for their trouble? Virtue by itself is not the explanation of success or failure. The explanation has much more to do with the scarcity of goods in relation to the number of people. It further has to do with whether the right sort of structure of roles with attendant powers and privileges is put into place. This structure can optimize the effectiveness of, and limit the damage done by, people who are not especially virtuous or extraordinarily able.
Confucians can give replies to such arguments. In answer to the argument that virtue is too rare a thing to depend upon, the most obvious reply is that they never promised virtue would be easy. Indeed, the canonical texts all stress the difficulty of achieving full virtue. Mencius in particular conceives of moral development as extending the natural beginnings of virtue to situations where they ought to extend but do not currently extend. Confucians might also object that good results will follow from the kind of structure described in the Hanfeizi only if persons of good-enough character staff it. The Hanfeizi sometimes implicitly acknowledges this point and integrates it with a reasonable stress on structure and impersonal administration. In chapter 6 there is discussion of what is necessary to compensate for a mediocre ruler: getting able people with the right motives to serve that ruler. Institute laws and regulations specifying how these people are selected: not on the basis of reputation alone, since that will give people an incentive to curry favor with their associates and subordinates and disregard the ruler; not on the basis of cliques, since that will motivate people only to establish connections rather than acquire the qualifications to perform in office. Specify the qualifications clearly in laws and regulations, appoint, promote, and dismiss strictly according to these specifications. The law, not the ruler’s personal views, must form the basis for these actions. In chapter 43, consideration is given to the suggestion that those who take heads in battle should be rewarded with desirable offices. This is rejected in cases where the office requires wisdom and ability rather than courage. In the end, one wonders whether a good number of such persons of right motive, competence, courage, wisdom and ability are enough, given the highly centralized nature of the government recommended in the Hanfeizi. A lot depends on the ruler who wields the ”two handles“ of government. Taken in moderate doses, Hanfeizi arguably provides a needed corrective to the Confucian emphasis on character. Structure can be designed with an eye to the realistic possibilities for mediocre and bad rulers. The Confucian emphasis on discretion in judgment is obviously subject to abuse that can be checked by structures that provide a degree of impersonal administration and consistent application of relatively clear laws and regulations. The American legal experience seems to show, however, that no set of laws can interpret itself with an eye to complex situations that are unforeseeable when laws are framed. Ultimately, stable character and wise discretion are needed.
The strongest challenge that Legalism raises to virtue ethics is not that stable virtues are impossible to achieve, but that they are not realistic possibilities for most persons, and that therefore lofty virtue ideals cannot provide the basis for a large-scale social ethic. Even if these ideals are directed only at an elite that is then expected to lead the rest of the people, the question arises as to what influence this elite can have on the rest if the majority do not have some attraction to virtue. It is dubious, however, that the solution lies in seeking to make character irrelevant. For a more extensive discussion of the Fajia thinkers, see the entry on legalism in Chinese philosophy,
Buddhism is not indigenous to China, and it has a long and rich tradition of thought and practice in India and in areas other than China. This brief section will focus on ethical aspects of the most distinctive form of Buddhism that developed once it was introduced to China: Chan Buddhism, or as it came to be known later in Japan, Zen. It should be noted, however, that prominent forms of Chinese Buddhism also include Tiantai and Huayan. All three forms of Chinese Buddhism developed in interaction with indigenous Chinese thought, especially Daoism. Chan developed partly as a response to the perception of some Chinese Buddhists that Tiantai and Huayan had developed in overly scholastic directions with proliferating metaphysical distinctions and doctrines that hinder rather than aid Enlightenment.
The immediate focus of Buddhist ethics is the problem of suffering, and a conception of the self is at the heart of the Buddhist response to that problem. The self is conceived as a floating collection of various psychophysical reactions and responses with no fixed center or unchanging ego entity. The usual human conception of self as a fixed and unchanging center is a delusion. Our bodily attributes, various feelings, perceptions, ideas, wishes, dreams, and in general a consciousness of the world display a constant interplay and interconnection that leads us to the belief that there is some definite ‘I’ that underlies and is independent of the ever-shifting series. But there is only the interacting and interconnected series. Human suffering ultimately stems from a concern for the existence and pleasures and pains of the kind of self that never existed in the first place. Recognition of the impermanence of the self can lead to release or mitigation of suffering, but the recognition cannot merely be intellectual. It must involve transformation of one’s desires. The belief on some abstract level, for example, that there are no permanent selves is a belief that can co-exist with having and acting on intense desires to avoid death, as if death were some evil befalling some underlying ‘I’. Similarly, the intellectual recognition that none of the ”things“ of ordinary life are fixed and separate entities, anymore than the self is, can lead to recognition of all of life as an interdependent whole and to the practical attitude of compassion for all of life. But if the latter recognition is again merely intellectual, one can still have and act on intensely self-regarding desires at severe cost to others. In both cases a transformation of desire is what is required in order to go beyond the merely intellectual and to achieve true Enlightenment and meaningful recognition of one’s true nature as impermanent and as interdependent with all other things.
Recall the practical focus and the closeness to pre-theoretical experience that are distinctive of indigenous Chinese philosophy. These traits interacted with Buddhism as it was introduced into China. The ‘Chan’ in ”Chan Buddhism“ comes from the Sanskrit ‘dhyana’ which means meditation. Though meditation practice is not the only practice employed in Chan, its central role does illustrate the focus on achieving transformation of one’s desires through experience of the self and the world. This kind of transformation is different than reaching intellectual conviction through textual study and understanding of argumentation, and also different than escape from the world of suffering through obliteration of one’s consciousness as an individual being. Chinese Buddhism in the form of Chan was especially influential in putting forward this conception of Enlightenment as lived in this world rather than escaping from it.
Daoism in particular has themes that make it especially appropriate for interaction with Buddhism. Recall the theme that one must keep desires from interfering with one’s attention to the matter at hand. Correspondingly, a major theme in Chan is that all forms of striving, especially the very striving for Enlightenment, interfere with attention to one’s true nature (Hui Neng, 638–713, Platform Scripture). Hence the reason for the otherwise puzzlingly harsh reactions of Chan masters to the earnest strivings of their students to reach Enlightenment (Yi Xuan, d. 866, The Recorded Conversations of Linji Yi Xuan) especially if such strivings have any tinge of the academic or doctrinal about them (Huang Po, d. 850, The Transmission of Mind). Recall also the theme in Daodejing concerning the dao as the source of the myriad things. The Buddha’s insight into the nature of the many things brought him to recognize the Many as also the One. Finally, recall the skeptical theme in Daoism about the limits of conceptualization. The Buddha’s insight into the Many as also the One does not mean that the Many are really only One, but rather Many and Once at once, and if we have difficulty making sense of that, it is founded in the limits of our conceptualization. Finally, there is the same possibility for ambiguity as to whether there is some ineffable and nonconceptual access to an ultimate reality or whether there is skeptical question that goes all the way down (or all the way up?). In the Zhuangzi this ambiguity is quite apparent. And though Chan is usually taken to affirm a foundation in ineffable access (Kasulis, 1986), there are those who argue that a thoroughgoing skepticism is truer to its spirit (Wright, 1998).
Since the self is a bundle of changing psychological and physical attributes whose boundaries are conventionally established, and since its attributes exist only in relation to other things outside its conventionally established boundaries, it ought to dampen its self-regarding cares and concerns and widen the boundaries of its concerns to embrace all life. This Buddhist reasoning certainly is an interesting way to ground impersonal concern, and it may appeal to those of us who see little plausibility in the idea of Cartesian substances as fixed ego entities. On the other hand, it’s not clear that a metaphysical deconstruction of an essential self assures that care for all others is normatively required. Further, this reasoning may seem to drain all passion from life, and it requires that we dampen the attachment we have not only to our selves but also to particular others such as friends and family members. Buddhism is especially well known for its advocacy of detachment, not only from material possessions, worldly power and status, but also from particular people and communities. For example, in Ashvaghosha’s poem on ”Nanda the Fair,“ the Buddha explains to Nanda that delusion alone ties one person to another (Conze, 1959, 110). The argument is that a family is like a group of travelers at an inn who come together for a while and then part. No one belongs to anyone else. A family is held together only as sand is held in a clenched fist. A number of Neo-Confucians, such as the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi, harshly accused Buddhists of selfishness while not quite squaring that accusation with the ideal of the Boddhisattvas in Mahayana Buddhism, who delay their entrance into Nirvana, their final release from suffering, until all beings are liberated from suffering. What the neo-Confucians might have been saying is that the real appeal of Buddhism is to the selfish impulse to save oneself, regardless of what their doctrines say.
Buddhist traditions are diverse, long-lived, and philosophically sophisticated in addressing these questions. Worries about the desirability and realistic possibility of assuming the kind of detached attitude the Buddhists upheld are similar to worries raised by Daoist identification with the cosmos. As the discussion of Zhuangzi and wife suggests, it may be possible to distinguish as an alternative to the pure and complete detachment exemplified in Ashvagosha another kind that is consistent with emotional involvement with others for as long as they are given to us.
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