First published Wed Dec 17, 2014

Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu 莊子 “Master Zhuang” late 4th century BC) is the pivotal figure in Classical Philosophical Daoism. The Zhuangzi is a compilation of his and others’ writings at the pinnacle of the philosophically subtle Classical period in China (5th–3rd century BC). The period was marked by humanist and naturalist reflections on normativity shaped by the metaphor of a dào—a social or a natural path. Traditional orthodoxy understood Zhuangzi as an anti-rational, credulous follower of a mystical Laozi. That traditional view dominated mainstream readings of the text. Recent archeological discoveries have largely laid that ancient orthodoxy to rest.

Six centuries later, elements of Zhuangzi’s naturalism, along with themes found in the text attributed to Laozi helped shape Chan Buddhism (Japanese Zen)—a distinctively Chinese, naturalist blend of Daoism and Buddhism with its emphasis on focused engagement in our everyday ways of life.

This wide range of views of Zhuangzi stem from the style of the text. Zhuangzi’s prose style is its own distinctive literary treasure. The central feature is the parable, typified as a discussion between imaginary or real interlocutors. Typically short, pithy, and amusing, his tales are both accessible and philosophically seductive—they both entertain and make you think. A respite from the dry moralizing of Confucians, the text was always a favorite of the Chinese intellectual, literati class. The Zhuangzi also attracts modern Western readers with its thoroughgoing naturalism, philosophical subtlety, and sophisticated humor, all set in a strikingly different conceptual scheme and its distant, exotic context.

Philosophically, Zhuangzi strikes us as more the Hume of his tradition than a system builder like Plato, Aristotle or Kant. He drew skeptical and relativist implications from a naturalist approach to normative guidance. His treatment of natural dàos focused on the norms governing correct use of language. His ethical relativism grew out of an indexical model of how natural conditions shape the norms governing the use of terms.

This linguistic analysis emphasized indexical contexts especially for the evaluative terms of choices of natural paths of behavior (dàos). Zhuangzi’s foils were mainly credulous and dogmatic Confucian humanists, particularly the innate intuitionist absolutism of a type familiar from the Mencius. He also took his linguistic insights to undermine Mozi’s pragmatic utilitarian alternative to Confucianism. He engaged seriously with later Mohist, realist, linguistic theories, both acknowledging their challenge to primitive quietism (the anti-language view familiar in The Laozi) and yet remaining skeptical of the realist conclusion. His most frequent co-discussant in the text was Hui Shi, a rival linguistic relativist.

The following highlights the central interpretive controversies then develops a philosophical interpretation that fits the Zhuangzi into the classical philosophical dialogue.

1. Zhuangzi’s Life and Times

Zhuangzi flourished through the latter half of the 4th century BC roughly contemporary with Mencius, and the movement known as the School of Names (名家 ming-jia name school). Zhuangzi shows familiarity with Classical Chinese theories of pragmatic-semantics and makes his own theoretical contributions to it. The traditionally recognized figures in this school included Gongsun Long and Hui Shi—Zhuangzi’s close friend and most frequent direct philosophical discussant. With the recovery of the Later Mohist dialectical work detailing their theory of language, we find compelling evidence that the linguistic turn in Classical thinking was a widespread feature of this mature phase of the Classical period. The later Confucian thinker, Xunzi, follows Zhuangzi in reacting to and incorporating this linguistic turn in his thinking.

Most of what we infer about Zhuangzi’s life, we draw from evidence within the Zhuangzi, although the Han biographers did speculate about his place of origin (the state of Meng) his personal name (Zhou), and the official posts he held (minor in Qiyuan in his home state) and period he lived (during Prince Wei reign over Chu—which ended about 327 BC). Scholars have found it hard to confirm any details of his life from outside this text and from his being discussed by later thinkers. The text itself contains scattered stories about Zhuangzi, but given its frequent use of fantasy, even these we must season with the salt of textual skepticism. We attribute a large chunk of the extant text of the Zhuangzi to “students of Zhuangzi” but we have little hint of who his students were or if he even had students in any formal sense.

2. Evolving Text Theory

A scholar working around 600 years later after the fall of the Han, Guo Xiang (d. 312), edited and reduced what he saw as a haphazardly accumulated cluster of apocryphal and possibly authentic texts. He concluded that many were added after the time Zhuangzi lived. Guo reports compressing that prior collection of writings from fifty-two chapters to thirty-three. This is the extant text on which our knowledge is based. Guo divided the chapters he had chosen into three sections: the “Inner Chapters” (1–7), the “Outer Chapters” (8–22) and the “Miscellaneous Chapters” (23–33). He attributed only the first section to the period dating from Zhuangzi’s lifetime—hence possibly originating from Zhuangzi himself. The second grouping may have included writings of a “School of Zhuangzi.” Modern scholarship assigns various sources of other influences found in both the second “outer” and final “miscellaneous” chapters. Graham drawing on work of the Chinese theorist, Kuan Feng and followed with some variation by Liu Xiaogan and Harold Roth, divides these influences into roughly four variously named groups:

  • Zhuangzi’s students or the School of Zhuangzi credited with those later writings committed most closely to the views expressed in the “inner chapters.”
  • Authors with egoist views associated with Yang Zhu (4th century BC). The Mencius presented Yang’s thought as a version of an ethical egoism that rejected conventional altruistic social dàos.
  • The third group Graham dubbed the ‘primitivists’. Primitivists share Yang Zhu’s antipathy to social, historical or conventional dàos—typically those supporting social norms extending beyond agricultural village life—in favor of more natural ways. This group shares attitudes with the text of the Laozi (Dàodé Jing) mixed with Yangist themes.
  • The final group, dominated the “miscellaneous” sections, Graham called them syncretists (eclectics) who seemingly attempted comprehensiveness by combining all points of view into a single complete dào.

However widely assumed, Zhuangzi’s authorship of any of the “inner” chapters remains a speculative hypothesis. Guo’s original assessment that Zhuangzi did not author any of the remaining sections remains conventional scholarly wisdom, but religious Daoists treat the entire book as a Canon—The Nánhúa Zhen-Jing.

Combining all these elements into a single volume reflects a familiar Classical pattern of embellishing the teachings of a master, adapting the additions to the namesake’s writing style and expanding on his themes and insights in distinctive ways. The four schools contributing to the extant text shared an emphasis on natural –usually as opposed to social-cultural, dàos. Yangism or egoism largely rejected social or moral dàos on the apparent assumption that natural guiding dàos essentially recommend self-preserving behavior. Its paradigm is the anti-social hermit. Motivation by self-interest was normatively prior to any conventional dào. They preserved their natural purity from social corruption by rejecting society’s mores.

Primitivism similarly rejected social and conventionally moral dàos (mores), but has its own conception of a natural, pre-social, typically intuitive, way of life that supports rustic, agricultural, village life. It supports populist and anarchist political tendencies.

Syncretism does not reject social dàos per se, but does reject any particular dào as biased and narrow in contrast to a more, “rounded,” idealized, or comprehensive dào. This is often expressed in an ideal observer form (the sage, perfect human, or tiannature:sky’s dào). These views tend toward epistemic supernaturalism—claims to superlative cognitive or religious access to some transcendently correct dào. Both tend to deny that their correct dàos can be expressed and transmitted in language or words.

The discussions in the “Inner Chapters,” particularly in the 2nd chapter, by contrast, treat language as also natural and social-conventional dàos as themselves natural dàos. It undermines the otherwise presupposed contrast of natural vs. conventional dàos. Humans are naturally social animals and execute natural causal processes when their walking, speaking, writing, and other practices leave marks in nature, (like a trail or a text) which become physically accessible to later walkers as history (stored in memory, legend, writings, or footprints etc.).

The pivotal 2nd chapter draws relativist and skeptical conclusions from its normative naturalism. It rejects the religious traditionalism of Confucianism and the Gaia-hypothesis implicit in the Mohist attempt at utilitarian naturalism. Nature provides us with many ways to go, but does not favor or command our making any choices among them. Shì-fēi 是非 (This way not that) judgments are made by living creatures in nature, not by tiānnature:sky itself. We can find guiding structures, dàos, in nature but not a favored or dictated dào of nature.

Like the later syncretist chapters, the “Inner Chapter” Zhuangists accept that social dàos are continuous with natural ones, but they do not endorse any imagined or alleged, comprehensive judgments from everywhere, from all natural points of view. The cosmic judgement from nowhere is a non-judgment. Zhuangists are not committed to Laozi’s conception of an exclusive choice of natural ( tiānsky:nature) over social ( renhuman) dàos. They are skeptical of any claim of special access to contextless guiding knowledge by alleged or self-styled sages, “ideal observers” or perfect exemplars of epistemic virtues. They accept language but also accept our natural capacity and inclination to toy with it, alter it, and mould it to our use in various situations of practical choice.

Zhuangzi’s exemplars are butchers, musicians, cicada catchers, wheelmakers—exemplars of mundane and focused action guidance. Each is an exemplar of one of the many ways of life (dàos) who execute their particular specialties in a highly cultivated, precise, smooth, and seemingly easily executed way. The imagined eclectic synthesis of all the various ways of life into some total-comprehensive dào is no more than de-facto restatement of their co-existence in a single natural world as optional ways of life. The cosmos makes no judgment that they should exist—though it combines them into a cosmic dào that is the history of everything. That the cosmos has this outcome does not mean it makes a human-like choice which humans could or should execute. We are ill advised to strive for skill in everything.

The eclectics were probably the last community working with the text, adding to it and carrying it into later periods. The Laozi had become enmeshed with a ruler cult worship of The Yellow Emperor. Laozi became the far more influential figure during the entire Confucian orthodoxy of the Han (206–220 BC).

3. Competing Interpretive Narratives

The wide range of views of Zhuangzi stem from the style of the text and the ways it has figured in China’s intellectual history as well as the ways it was caught up in the modern interaction between China and the modern, scientific West.

Zhuangzi’s style is the philosophical parable, typically a brief discussion or exchange between two points of view. There is slight plurality of humans among the discussants joined by natural and imaginary creatures. Its fictional characters are usually cleverly named, some are Confucian icons (Confucius or his alleged teacher, Lao Dan). Some discussants are animals (real and fictional fish, birds, snakes), a talking skull, the wind, musicians, debaters, tigers, trainers, butchers, butterflies, burglars and the myriad “pipes of nature.” Expressive brevity and subtlety of detail enhances the impact of the often complex and elusive point of the parables—they seldom explicitly formulate the moral or point explicitly. Most commonly, the author(s) end discussions in a doubting tone, a double rhetorical question or some pithy enigmatic parting shot. They may make their point by having the two parties walking away shaking their heads, agreeing only to disagree; both appreciating that they barely understand one another, and yet feeling that something has been learned from the exchange.

Translation into Western languages invites biases that are hard to avoid. The main effect is loss of the conceptual cohesion of the original, but the parables still engage our Western philosophical curiosity. We get the exhilaration of immersion in an independent philosophical tradition of comparable antiquity and richness. Readers in and out of China invariably suspect that the Zhuangzi’s appealing style is infused with philosophical genius, even as they disagree about its philosophical upshot. Indeed, much of the Zhuangzi’s philosophical appeal may stem from its seemingly deliberate open-ended texture, the interpretive malleability of its dialogues which invites, even perhaps requires, us to join the author(s) in their philosophical reflection.

This appeal stems only partly from the quality and sophistication of his episodes; each illuminated a patch of philosophical territory ending with a question for further pondering—rather like Nietzsche or the Later Wittgenstein. Each exchange presents or illustrates shards of insight with open-textured conclusions—all laced with Zhuangzi’s obvious joy in exploring paradox—particularly linguistic ones of the sort that appeal to analytic Western thinkers. Each is an expression of some natural, but perhaps inaccessible, alternative way of life. The frequent enigmatic conclusions “the answer is X” leaves interpreters arguing centuries later, Fermat-like, how X can be an answer—or what X is (e.g., “free and easy wandering,” “walking two paths,” “goblet words,” “clarity,” and so forth). Each seems easily to fit into a range of puzzles familiar to thinkers in both traditions. One suspects that we find the correct interpretation by finding our way, like Wittgenstein’s fly, out of some philosophical bottle. The correct philosophy coincides with the correct interpretation of Zhuangzi.

The traditional religious Zhuangzi narratives placed him as the disciple of Laozi, whom they regard as a quasi-divine founder of a mystical religion worshipping a mysterious entity translators tended to render as a definite descriptive term, but capitalized it as if it were a singular name, “The Dào.” Compatible philosophical treatments were versions of metaphysical monism, epistemic intuitionism (often explicitly anti-rationalist), political anarchism and a vague normative absolutism—follow The Dào. The bulk of popular and religious treatments still follow this interpretive line, treating Laozi as the earliest layer of “Daoist mystical thought” or “Lao-Zhuang” thought and situating Zhuangzi as his “follower.”

The story of the religious view of Zhuangzi starts a century after Zhuangzi lived (4th century BC). Philosophical schools were closed, books burned and thought repressed during the superstitious Qin dynasty (221–206 BC) which followed the classical period. This initiated China’s philosophical “Dark Age.” The more orthodox Confucian Han Dynasty (206 BC to 220) followed. Over two decades (109–91 BC) the Han emperor’s hereditary Grand Historians, Sima Tan and Sima Qian (a father and son team), wrote an official history from the mythical Yellow Emperor (c. 3rd Millennium BC) to the Han. It is in this account that the classification of thinkers into three concept schools, Daoist, Legalist, and School of Names first occurs. Graham speculates that the assumption of an affiliation of Zhuangzi to Laozi may have originated from the Outer Chapters. There Zhuangzi’s students used the mythical teacher of Confucius, Lao Dan or Laozi, to ridicule Confucius in a cycle of dialogues.

A cult of Huang-Lao, worshipping the Yellow emperor and Laozi as divinities, had grown up in the Qin. The father and son historians were students of Huang-Lao masters. At the fall of the Han the narrative of Zhuangzi as a follower/elaborator of a semi-divine Laozi was well entrenched. The post-Han resurgence, known as Neo-Daoism, began with the editing of the received edition of, first, the Laozi (Wang Bi 226–249) then the Zhuangzi (Guo Xiang d. 312 see above). Neo-Daoist discussion practices and ideas were influential in bringing Buddhist and Chinese thought into interaction and Daoism became enmeshed with Buddhism in the popular view (especially with Chinese Chan Buddhism). A Daoist “religion”, borrowing models of religious institutions from Buddhism (monasteries, monks and nuns) influenced discourse about Daoism throughout the period of Buddhist domination of the Chinese intellectual world (achieved gradually during the Six Dynasties period 220–589 and extending through the Tang 618–907). Neo-Confucians from the medieval period on treated Buddhism and Daoism as essentially similar religions.

Modern text theory concerning the Zhuangzi grows from two recent discoveries.

  1. The reconstruction of the Later Mohist dialectical works and
  2. Archeological reconstructions of the text of the Daode Jing.

The following section discusses their twin impact on our view of Zhuangzi.

Developments at the end of the 19th and early 20th century in China led Chinese intellectuals to adopt the European concept of philosophy (哲學) with its implicit distinction from religion. This distinction was seen as pivoting on logic—the theory of proof or argument. They started to segregate their own writings which seemed most like argument, inference and logic from those sustained mainly by credulity and tradition. They began to sort out the philosophical aspects of their traditional thought from its more religious and superstitious elements. Sun Yirang’s (1848–1908) 1897 reconstruction of the Mohist Canon provided convincing evidence that analytically inspired and rigorous thinking had grown up in Classical China. This example encouraged 19th century intellectuals like Yan Fu (1854–1921) and Liang Qichao (1873–1929). They started to emphasize the ancient schools that more clearly related to the logical paradigms of Western philosophy and Mohist analytics. Hu Shih (1891–1962) continued this tradition of reconceiving and re-centering Chinese thought away from the Confucian scholasticism that had dominated since the decline of Buddhism.

The early 20th century logic-inspired reformation recently began to influence the interpretation of the Zhuangzi and the Xunzi in the west, largely inspired by Angus Graham who had observed that both ancient texts demonstrated a mastery of the technical vocabulary of Mohist linguistic theory.

Modern philosophical appreciation of the Zhuangzi, probably stems from Graham’s 1969 “[Zhuangzi]’s Essay on Seeing Things as Equal” (Graham 1969, predating his work on Mohism). Wryly replying to Wang Fuzhi’s speculation that Shen Dao, not Zhuangzi had authored the beloved chapter, Graham averred that whoever wrote that philosophically rich text is the person we would want to think of as Zhuangzi. Graham proposed looking at the text’s seemingly conflicting thoughts as analogous to the “inner dialogue” of a reflective thinker who formulates a view, considers then rejects it. Graham also noted the writer’s deep involvement and apparent fluency in the technical language and obscure issues arising in Classical Chinese theories of language which he then only beginning to study.

Graham’s outlook conflicted overtly with a traditional Chinese narrative of a disciple Zhuangzi following a semi-divine Laozi in worship of The Mystical Dao. Zhuangzi, Graham quipped, didn’t know he was a Daoist. Graham later argued that the internal evidence suggested Zhuangzi had never seen the text of the Laozi (The Dào Dé Jing) and probably thought of Lao Dan as a Confucian. Most interpretive disputes are, to a greater or lesser degree, a result of the tension between Graham’s textual arguments and the traditional Historian’s picture of Zhuangzi as a religious mystical Daoist follower of the semi-divine Laozi, similarly worshipping “The Dào.”

Graham’s textual arguments were indirectly supported by archeological discoveries of different Laozi texts. The discoveries in the early 1970s and 1990s together implied a relatively late date for the emergence of the Laozi text—probably some years after Zhuangzi had lived and perhaps overlapping the composition of a series of dialogues between Laozi and Confucius in the “Outer Chapters” section. Graham speculated that Zhuangzi’s students, who were writing the cycle of Laozi-Confucius dialogues, may have rhetorically chosen to use the legendary Lao Dan (mythical teacher of Confucius) to give him authority to lecture and ridicule the revered master.

When we abandon the traditional identification of Zhuangzi as a Laozi follower, it opens the door for speculation about his relation to the relativist, linguistic theorist, Hui Shi, traditionally treated as belonging to the School of Names. Christoph Harbesmeier speculated he may have been either Zhuangzi’s teacher, mentor or fellow student. If he was a teacher, he came to accept his student as an equal or even superior. Zhuangzi portrays him as playing a role in Zhuangzi’s philosophical skill development as an intimate philosophical interlocutor and eventually as a foil for sharpening his analysis. Among those texts that concentrate on míngnames, Hui Shi’s ten theses mark him as a relativist response to Mohist realism on the relation of names and “stuff”—focusing especially on comparative and indexical terms.

We can read Zhuangzi’s relativism, accordingly as an alternative, arguably more reflectively subtle, indexical relativism about 是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgments regarding choices of paths (dàos) of correct use of names/words/concepts as guideposts to our xíngwalking:behavior. This can both explain Zhuangzi’s relativist direction of analysis and his recognition of sound Mohist/realist responses to Hui Shi’s version of that relativist direction of thought. This article develops and expands on Graham’s philosophical interpretation and emphasizes this relation to Hui Shi rather than to Laozi.

Between the traditional, piously mystical Daoist religious interpretation and that view’s nearest philosophical neighbors, lies the bulk of the interpretive historical and religious literature. Given the philosophically oriented venue of this article, what follows should not be treated as ecumenical.

4. A Modern Philosophical Interpretation

4.1 The Background Dispute about Social Normative Daos

Confucian dàos were broadly humanist. The earliest version (Confucius 551–479 BC) traced normativity to earlier human invention. Metaphorical trails are left by past human walkings, i.e. social practices. Language was an example of such an invented social practice which intertwined with routine activities (rituals) to yield the correct, sage-king inspired way of life—the social 道 dàopath. A later version (Mencius 372–239 BC) focused on natural human psychology. The correct path is that to which our natural moral psychology inclines us. Humans have a xīnheart-mind that is naturally shangood-at normative choice and practice.

Mencius may have been reacting to Mohism. Mozi (470–391 BC) had earlier initiated a shift in focus to more natural and objective, less culturally relative way of grounding normative judgment. His claim that 天 tiānnature:sky exhibited a tendency to a course leading to human utility or well-being. So humans should use that natural norm, the 辯 biàndistinction between 利害 lì-hài benefit-harm in constructing our social dào, including the norms of language.

Correctly using terms is using them to mark the path of cooperative behaviors that lead to general human benefit—a social 道 dàopath utilitarianism, rather than a law or rule version. Nature intends us to follow its natural structures in ways that lead to universal human benefit. Ethical questions thus have a single correct answer in an ideally engineered and shared normative linguistic practice. Mohist utilitarian metaethics pointed to natural realism.

Daoist primitivism (symbolized by the mythical Laozi and the anonymous text known as the Dàodé Jing) was, as noted above, a further trend toward a broader ethical naturalism with anti-language absolutist implications. We should forget or ignore all social norms and practices, including linguistic ones. Utility (perhaps egoistic utility) does motivate our behavior as naturally as water follows the paths created by natural contours of earth. Language should not interfere in any way with this natural guiding interaction between us and the course(es) of nature.

4.2 The Conceptual Foci of Chinese Daoist Normative Theorizing

Understanding the Zhuangzi is made more difficult by the huge differences not only in the philosophical context, but in the pervasive metaphors that structure and focus discussions of norms of behavior in the Chinese vs Indo-European classical traditions. His positions invite comparisons with modern metaethical naturalism but he does not focus them with concepts linked to grammatical sentences such as “laws” or “rules” (sentences in all form) or “facts” (sentence-sized chunks of reality) or “properties (realities corresponding to sentence predicates).” Zhuangzi used the traditional 道 dàopath metaphor together with the technical terminology developed in Mohism  of shì-fēithis-not that, biàndistinction and permissible.

The metaphor shaping most Chinese discussions of pragmatic knowing, choice and behavior was dào—a path or trail. Questions we would phrase in terms of moral propositions, laws, or principles are questions about finding, choosing and following dàos, paths or ways. Dàos can be social or natural structures that guide us in answering practical questions: what to do or how to do it. As the focus of warring Chinese conceptions of guidance, dào guidance has three phases. We must find or notice them, choose one from among those we notice, and then follow or interpret the selected dào in xíngwalking:behavior. We biàndistinguish, discover and recognize them; choose or approve (shìthis:right) them or reject (fēinot-that:wrong ) them, and treat them as permissible  or not. Our capacity to engage in these three processes governing natural guiding structures, dàos, is an internal dào—our virtuosity.  Our virtuosity at interacting with the web of dàos reads and interprets the path-marks thus generating our xíngwalking:behavior.

The dào metaphor corresponds closely with the Western translation metaphor of ‘a way’ which, while ubiquitous in philosophical discourse, is rarely a central focus of philosophical analysis of normativity. The salient differences between the two traditions accounts of behavior are that the Chinese does not focus on sentential items (actions, events, beliefs) particularly as conclusions of belief plus desire mental arguments. Instead, it focuses on the interplay of natural processes grounded in the temporally shifting distributions of 氣 qiphysical stuff that yields path-like guidance structures for living things.

Confucians and Mohists had their own theories of the both the right dàos and the right virtuosity  to use together in guiding behavior. Confucian dàos tended to be those enshrined in past practice and their version of virtuosity  tended toward the intuitive, typically appealing to 仁 rénhumanity.

Mohists advocated guiding reform of conventional social dàos using a natural normative biàndistinction of 利害 lì-hàibenefit-harm. For Mohists, 利害 lì-hàibenefit-harm was a tiānnatural way of finding, choosing, reforming and interpreting social dàos. In contrast to Confucians, Mohists sought to elaborate their natural ways of selecting dào-like social practices as operational, objective, measurement-like processes accessible to ordinary people and not subject to training and indoctrination.

Chinese linguistic analysis folded naturally into similar language—it concerns ways of using words—dàos (norms) of linguistic behavior focused on word use. The more philosophically inclined schools began to see such norms of the use of words as underlying the explicit disagreements among schools about which norms or dàos to follow and how to follow them.

The discussion of norms of use are typically couched in behavioral formulations such as 取 choose, 舉 pick-outassertible:admissible biàndistinction zhǐpoint and combine. The core psychological attitude is wéideem:do which may be expressed as a tendency (in speech, both inner and expressed) to express a 是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgment regarding the use of a word. A phonetically and semantically related tendency is wèicalling it by the term. Behaviorally, it amounts to dealing with it under that word-concept. Conversely we can shì or fēi the use of a name of some contextual object—wèicall it or wéideem it properly associated with that míngname.

To 為 wéideem:do can be either to express the category assignment in one’s behavior—either speech-behavior or behaving toward the object as people would be expected to, given that they assigned the object to that category. The behavior for the category would be found in the social or natural dàopath they follow. A wéideem:do state is less a mental picture of a fact (a belief) than a disposition to treat or identify some object as deserving the term in question. Instead of the western reality vs. appearance dialectic, Chinese discussion revolves around the contrast of natural ( tiānnature:sky) dàos and human ( rénhuman) or socially constructed, dàos. The human dàos are constructed with the help of míngnames strung together into yánlanguage.

Mozi, as we noted above, appealed to what he regarded as a natural utility standard to judge the acceptability of yánlanguage use and Confucius relied more on past usage ranging back to the mythical sage kings. Problems of justifying approvals and disapprovals of word usage led such later Confucians as Mencius, to rely more on cultivating an intuition. Since the account of cultivation typically presupposed practice in conformity with the social practice requiring justification, the threat of circularity pushed traditionalists eventually to teach about and appeal to an allegedly innate or pre-social human psychology.

By contrast, the craft–inspired Mohists went on to emphasize the use of measurement tools and operations as the standards guiding term use. They argued that such operational standards would be more accessible to ordinary people who could rely only on their “eyes and ears.” The Confucians, by contrast, were forced to flip between appealing to some cultivated authority and attributing an innate moral inclination to the existing conventional language dào to such ordinary people.

是非 Shì-fēithis-not that judgments can concern choice of a dào or the interpretive performances of a chosen dào. Chinese writers similarly focused on assertible:permissible which may be said of a dào, or of a permissible walking of some dào—including those of language use. Disagreement could be at the level of dàos, or at the interpretive level—endorsing or rejecting a wéideem:do. The endorsing-rejecting 是非 shì-fēithis-not that and permissible behaviors themselves involve either choosing or interpreting dàos. Each time we make any of these judgments we contribute to further constructing our socially shared dào with its implied practices of míngnames use.

4.3 Zhuangzi’s Distinctive Approach

Zhuangzi conforms to the general pre-Han model, using a path metaphor to discuss normativity in general. This fuels the traditional view of him as a Daoist. Most of his discussion, moreover, further conforms to the practice of focusing on social dàos—undermining treatment as religious disciple of Laozi’s insistence we follow only tiānnatural dàos. What links him to a naturalist theme is his reluctance to draw the usual contrast between natural and social dàos. (Is it nature? Is it man?). Human social dàos are natural behaviors of natural animals. This grounds Zhuangzi’s pattern of talking about and with other equally natural creatures.

Humans are as natural as monkeys, birds, and fish. “How can dàos be hidden such that there are authentic and artificial?” he asks rhetorically? (Harvard Yenching Zhuangzi Yinde hereafter HY 4/2/24–5) All the different social traditions expand the number and kinds of naturally existing dàos. Other animals’ walking patterns also construct natural dàos which, similarly, become available for human finding, choosing and walking.

Zhuangzi’s discussion, particularly in the philosophically most sophisticated second chapter, is mainly about the plurality and relativity of second-level dàos, our naturally endowed, internal dàosways of finding, choosing and following one of many natural ways of life in the maze or network presented by nature. This stance makes the complexity of the natural network only the first level of variety and possibility. Recursion of dàos explodes the complexity. A tripartite recursion follows because there are many dàos of finding, of choosing, and of translating the first level plethora. The many layered complexity of dàos of dàos yields the human sphere of life. “Fish interact in water; humans interact in dàos” (Ibid., HY 18/6/72)

He naturalizes dàos less by attending to natural physical guiding structures (e.g. dàos of water) than to the variety of human dàos presented by analogy to the variety of creatures with different dàos. Alternately, he encourages us not to assume we have found all the available ways to behave or he reflects on the variety of sources of dàos of choice or of different capacities to catch on and follow within us—our different natural organs and the range of different ways we may train or habituate them. This complexity of dào structures fuels, in turn, both his skepticism of absolutes, of authority, of ideal observers, of social dogmas and his qualified advice to leave the finding, choice and interpretation to a working out from the variety of perspectives that make up the behaving units in the particular circumstance. Dào choices are best made from the perspective of walkers.(Ibid., HY 4/2/33)

The other distinctive feature of Zhuangzi’s approach lies in the sophistication of his handling the issues of language in explicating this natural complexity of dàos. Graham interpreted a famous Zhuangzi trope (the pipes of tiānnature:sky) as Zhuangzi’s way of positioning language as tiān (natural) sound.

The pipes of earth, these are the hollows everywhere; the pipes of men, these are rows of tubes. Tell me about the pipes of Heaven.’ Who is it that blows the ten thousand disputing voices, who when of themselves they stop their talk has sealed them, and puffs out of them the opinions that they choose for themselves?’ HY 3/2/4–9

Graham elaborates:

These are apparently the holes in the heart through which thought courses and the mouths which utter it, so that the breath blown by heaven through the inner formations of different men issues in contradictory utterances. (Graham 1969:149)

Zhuangzi’s Daoism, thus, starts by removing tiānconstant nature from its role as ultimate normative authority—the role it played in virtually all the rival accounts of which dào we should follow. All dàos that are practically available at the point of choice for walking (actually existing dàos) are similarly tiān. Tiān (nature) generates dàos as it generates the thing-kinds  (humans and other animals) that find and follow them. Neither it nor the cosmos can play the role of an authority, far less of an anthropomorphic authority commanding or dictating our choice among the network of naturally existing dàos. Dàos are chosen from those found in nature, but none represents nature’s choice for us—none of the dàos in nature is the dào of nature.

Dialectically, Zhuangzi’s replacement for tiān’s role as source of normative guidance would be the entire complex network of dào structures that permeate the natural world. He situates us at indexed points in this network seeking paths forward from here and now, choosing from among the plethora of those accessible which, if any, to follow.

The philosophical advantage of Zhuangzi’s way of discussing dàos, thus, does not leave him suggesting that what is natural is moral (analogous to implying “ought” from “is”). Nature gives us a complex network of iterative guiding structures among which we are about to swim. In our waking hours, we continue constructing systems of contending, resolving and agreeing on 是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgments—the rejected ones buried in rubble of ongoing construction of normative language marking behavioral paths. (HY 3/2/11–13)

We recognize greater and lesser models of both—the more reflective and engaging vs. a lazier, more wordy type. As we walk through a day, we encounter attitudinal states—joy, sorrow, surprise, ennui etc. We don’t know what role these play but they seem central to our choosing activity—indeed to our having a perspective, an ‘I’. (HY 3/2/11–14)

When we describe that entire structure, e.g. as resembling a natural network of links (dàos) between temporally and spatially indexed points we can see how it might generate talk of a single cosmic dao. All guidance is at a point in the network and available to and for some emergent object—physical, living, animal or human. The inner processes of seeking, choosing, and following dàos from node to node are themselves part of the natural network. We are not sure what the normative point of our natural reactions in walking through the nature’s maze. Each step or utterance adds a 是非 shì-fēithis-not that to the edifice of guiding discourse marking paths for ourselves and for others. It’s as if there is some natural authority guiding the construction process, though we can’t see marks of its authority. We can reliably walk paths or dàos but can't see the shape of the authority. We light on paths and react with heart-mind responses. That’s it. (Ibid., HY 4/2/14–16)

Human dàos of finding, choosing and following are capacities normally attributed to the xīnheart-mind.  Zhuangzi recognizes its involvement in the construction process, but is skeptical of making it a kind of natural authority. It is, after all, only one of the natural organs involved—our daily reactions include being directed by our stomachs, our eyes, etc. Why, Zhuangzi wonders, should we think they need a single authority? (HY 4/2/14–16)

Even, then, if we take the xīnheart-mind as an authority, it’s not clear how it can help us deal with the role of judgments of greater and lesser wisdom and different ways of using 是非 shì-fēithis-not that. Aren’t all the hearts involved in the evolving construction equally natural—the sages and the fools? (HY 4/2/21–22) 

Any output from our xīnheart-mind into this construction of a dào to follow from here is itself a product of our having walked one of a range of possible dàos to this point. (HY 4/2/20)

“To get a 是非 shì-fēithis-not that from the xīnheart-mind  without it’s having been constructed there is like going to Yue today and arriving yesterday, like getting something from nothing.” Even the wisest of mythical sages (Yao) can’t know how to do that! (Ibid., HY 4/2/22–23)

There are many natural ways of finding and choosing ways. Humans naturally exhibit variety in how they find or choose a course of behavior. This recursive complex of dàos of choosing is part of nature. No single one need be considered the dào of nature to the exclusion of others. They may be capacities of individuals or of social groups, embodied in their social practices. The gestalt set of past commitments and acquired inclinations to choose and interpret paths is another component of our situation or location in a complex web of dàos. The given dàos of choice are what Zhuangzi treats as 成 chéngconstructed/mature within our body as we traverse the nodes of the network of dàos. Our heart-minds reach an indexed point with a given momentum vector—a speed on an existing trajectory—this is our a point of view or perspective, complete with prior commitments to dàosways of appreciating and selecting among available paths.

These second-level dàos can also be chosen and walked correctly or incorrectly. Choosing an epistemic dào, in turn, depends on other a practically available dàos for guiding that meta-choice… and so on. Zhuangzi does not view it as a rational or logical construction, but a complicated, multi-layered natural one. He speaks of “eight virtuosities” involved in constructing dàos and guiding expressions, starting with the indexical locatives, left and right, then human relations, then mores, divisions (categories?), distinctions (disputes), competition and then strife. (HY 5/2/55–6)    

A similar recursion concerns dàos of finding and interpreting dàos. This network of recursive natural guidance structures constitutes the complex network of natural dào. We rely on meta-dàos, practically available links in this network, in choosing and in interpreting practically available ground-level dàos. Humans navigate in a sea of dàos.

Then who or what does the choosing? Zhuangzi’s theory here is similarly detached and natural. He focuses less on the consciousness or subjectivity of some mental substance or cognitive self or agent, but on a grammatical locus of judgment, a I:me  within the linguistic dào structure—the grammatical indexical marks a choosing point in the conceptual and space-time structure. Like Hume’s self, without the naturally occurring grab-bag of attitudes, it would not be there to play its choosing role. The 我 I:me is situated in a frame of reference with its own complicated 成 chéngcommitment trajectory in the iterative dàos of choice. The I:me that knows-how is situated in existing commitments embedded in an indexed here-now in the network of ways it will assign to shì-fēithis-not that. Each shì-fēithis-not that it “shoots out” further commits it to a path. (The narrator had introduced the above “pipes of heaven” metaphor to describe a gestalt he describes as having “said farewell to my I:me.”)

“Its eruptions are like a repeating crossbow” expresses how it manages 是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgments. “Its resting on them like an oath or treaty” expresses how it clings to past winners, “its death is like autumn and winter” expresses  how it daily declines, a weakening brought about by this (the weight of accumulated commitments?) and it cannot start the process over. “Its rejections are like tightening bonds” puts into language these aging channels. As the xīnheart-mind nears death, nothing can restore its dynamism. (HY 3/2/11–13)

Joy, anger, sadness, pleasure, worrying, sighing, resisting, clinging, being drawn to, eschewing, launching, and committing, like music from empty holes, dampness generating mushrooms, these day and night replace each other before us and yet none can know from what they emerge. Let it be! Let it be! They come from where they emerge—without these, there would be no 我 I:me and without a I:me there would be no choosing. (HY 3/2/13–14)

For Zhuangzi, the issue is not mind or consciousness, but the behavioral inclinations and the normative authority of these roving indexical perspectives scattered within the natural dào network. Their choices of which dàos to walk furthers the construction ( chéngfixing) of our perspective for the next choice.

It seems as if there is a natural authority, but we cannot find its authoritative source. There is sufficient reliability that this is walkable, but we don’t see it’s [authorizing?] shape—it has natural reality but no visible shape. (HY4/2/15–16)

The first level paths have a shape, but the dàos of correct choice and performance are inside the performer and not plainly visible.

The trend from social construction humanism toward naturalism had been gradual. Mozi’s argument for basing such constructions on a natural distinction of benefit and harm was an early step. Graham had separately theorized that Mencius developed both his response to Mozi and his account of the role of rénhumanity as arguments that Confucian ritual behavior had evolved from tiānnatural intuitive response patterns in the xīnheart-mind. This implicitly endorsed Mozi’s reliance on a tiānnatural ground for the social construction of morality.

4.4 Doubting Intuitionism

Graham’s Zhuangzi then addressed this Mencian response in a passage that extends the Hume-like skepticism about any identifiable “inner self”. That should be what guides the naturally occurring emotive reactions that are necessary for a I:me that chooses. It seems, he says, there must be one, but we find no evidence of it. We approve of behaviors and place our trust in its reactions but find no sign of what is authorizing or making them.

Hundreds of parts, nine openings and six viscera included and completed (成 chéngfixed) in place in us, with which should I feel most akin? Should I be pleased with them all? Is there a I:me among them?  Among them, should we deem some as rulers and as servants? Are the rulers and servants incapable of governing each other? Are they not capable of taking turns as ruler and servants? Is there a genuine ruler among them?  It’s as if trying and failing to grasp its real character has no bearing on whether it is genuine. (Ibid., HY 4/2/16–18)

Mozi had worried that it would be circular to appeal to intuitions about the word use in a social dào to authorize that very practice, for example Confucian ritual. Being a product of ritual training. acquired intuitions could not be a sufficiently neutral way of justifying our choosing ritual as our social guide. Nor could one trained practitioner have authority over another in resolving interpretive disputes about how to execute the ritual, e.g., about how to apply the terms found in ritual texts to concrete real-time behaviors. He insisted we need a neutral, non-cultural or natural basis for such meta-choices of social practices of choosing and interpreting practices.

The narrative history of Classical thought found near the end of the Zhuangzi (Ibid., HY 90/33/1) takes off from this dispute between Confucians and Mohists. It welcomes Mozi’s implicit search for neutrality, universality, and greater objectivity. However, the school viewed the familiar debate between a utilitarian and traditional morality as interminable because Mozi’s dàoguide, like Confucius’s, starts from different standards, different 成 chéngconstructed commitments to linguistic practices. Each relies on their past practice of judging how to use the key moral 名 míngnames. Confucians would reject Mozi’s standards because they led to what Confucians view as the wrong conclusions (e.g., implied Confucians should abandon 義 moral rituals such as burial). The Mohists reject burial rituals because they use 義 morality of the social mores reformed according to their standard of general utility. The pivotal statement of Zhuangzi’s position is expressed as a riff on the relativity or dependence of 是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgments about language use on natural circumstances, naturally existing past practice, commitments and attitudinal gestalt shifts.

Where candàoguides hide such that there are genuine and artificial? Where can 言 yánlanguage  hide such that there is 是 非 shì-fēithis-not that. Where can dàos hide such that they do not exist? How can a 言 yánlanguage exist and not be 可 assertible? Dàos hide behind small achievements and language hides behind rhetorical flourishes and elaboration. So you have the “this is right-that is wrong” of the Confucians and Mohists. Of what one says “this is right” the other says “that is wrong” and of what they say “that is wrong” says “this is right.” If you want to “wrong” what the other “rights” and “right” what the other ‘wrong’s, nothing matches 明 míngdiscerning. (Ibid., HY4/2/24–7)

Though balanced in judging this impasse, the Zhuangzi’s interesting target is the Mohist aspiration to objectivity. Many stories in the text target the notion that utility is a naturally constant value—particularly the human utility that Mozi champions. Among this series of parables, the most famous, the useless tree, illustrates the relativity of usefulness to Hui Shi. (Ibid.,  HY 3/1/46–7)

Not only are we implicitly appealing to a dào in choosing to adopt a benefit/harm standard, we are also going to appeal to interpretive dào to judge whether we have followed it correctly or not. Mozi had treated moral disputes as disagreements about how to 辯 biàndistinguish in applying terms like 義 morality and 善 shàngood-at. He had also objected to Confucian reliance on acquired intuition since it made access to such judgments esoteric. He argued that standards governing such evaluative word use should be made by 法 measurement standards that are accessible to the “eyes and ears” of ordinary people. His utility standard, Zhuangzi is suggesting, is still relative to the way of translating it to behavior.

Others in the ethical debate, notably Yang Zhu and related Primitivists, also appealed to tiān (natural constancy) as a normative arbiter. The growing awareness that norms of behavior are intertwined with norms of language use, produced another feature of this strand of thought bringing the natural world into our guidance. Primitivists came to advocate silence—letting the natural paths of the world take over completely.

For most of history, the Laozi has exemplified this rejection of language. It treated all social 道 dàospaths as implicit rejections of the natural 道 dàopath. Graham has argued that echoes of this line of thinking lay in the background of Mencius’s thought. That concern led him to attempt to substitute natural moral psychology (a natural moral disposition in human 心 xīnheart-mind) for positive social mores.

A paradigm of this anti-language, silence trend (cited in the Zhuangzi’s internal history just before discussing the Laozi group ) was Shen Dao. Shen Dao postulated a “Great Dào” (essentially the actual course of cosmic history from past to future) which “even a clod of earth” will follow. We all will follow Great Dào. We can (and should) therefore abandon knowledge of how to make linguistic distinctions (是非 shì-fēithis-not that judgments) to follow Great Dào. Shen Dao, based on his version of logical determinism (i.e., There being an actual complete history of space-time entails your behavior tomorrow is included) draws an anti-normative, quietist and stoic conclusion.

Later Mohist writings contain several acute critiques of such a trending pro-silence posture. Deeming all 言 yánlanguage as not-可 assertible is not 可 assertible. The explanation, later Mohists noted, lies in the asserter’s own use of yánlanguage. Rejecting (fēi-ing) all shì-fēi judgments is fēi (wrong, to be rejected). Similarly self-defeating is “teaching not to teach.”

Zhuangzi’s “pipes of nature” metaphor signals his departure from these defective Laozi-like or Primitivist anti-language positions. Language is natural and arguments for silence are self-condemning. So the point of Zhuangzi’s own reflections on the absence of natural normative endorsement of our shì-fēithis-not that  decisions should not guide us to stop making them. Making them is what we naturally do when we find our dàos in nature. It is natural for us to make a judgment, but not nature making it. Normativity arises from within nature, but nature only makes all its normative, behavior-guiding paths for us naturally available.

4.5 Relativism: It depends on …

The Zhuangzi emphasizes the plurality of natural stances or points of view from which one may see paths of possible behavior as “natural.” For one of the paths to be available for me will be dependent on where I am and my given trajectory in the network. All the appeals to tiānnature as an authority are right in insisting their dàos are natural, but mistaken in using that as a reason to deny a similar status to the dàos of rival normative thinkers. Tiān cannot serve as an arbiter of which rival norm is correct since it equally “puffs” all of them out. This allows each to claim their choices are of tiānnatural dàos but does not allow them the corollary that their rival’s choices violate tiān. They, like us, conform with tiān’s constancies in being committed to their dàos.

Any shì-fēithis:right judgment concerning a dào may be either a 因 yīndependent shì, based on prior or enacted commitments, gestalts orientations, and inner processes or it may be an arbitrary posited (為 wèido:deem) shì. Dependency arises from past (chéngfixed) commitments to the dào structures through which we worked our way to our here-now. We always encounter such choices as we are already engaged in walking along some dào. Those past dào commitments bring us to a normative stance from which successive judgments of shì-fēi and 可 permissible vs. not arise. Zhuangzi’s pivotal illustration pairs 是 shìthis with 彼 that as near and far indexicals. His use of another indexical here signals his view that 是 shìthis:right used normatively as opposite to 非 fēinot-that:wrong is relative to a commitment index.

Local justifications for having shì-fēithis-not that or assertible are delivered in accordance our chéngfixed commitment momentum along the dàos that guided us to this point. This relativity of normative dependence underpins Zhuangzi’s mildly ironic, skepticism of special or extraordinary normative statuses we give to, e.g., sages. The skepticism must apply even to the quietist posture that shì-fēithis-not that judgments are “bad” or unnatural. We should doubt any transcendent or allegedly perfect, totalistic epistemic access to nature’s inexpressible normative know-how. There are no naturally ideal observers.

Will the eventual result be there is both 是 shìthis:right and 彼 bǐthat?  Will the eventual result be there is neither shì nor bǐ? We can call the situation of neither shì nor fēi finding its opposite the “pivot of 道 dàoguides.” The pivot sets the start of the center of a sphere from which there are inexhaustible responses—inexhaustible shì and inexhaustible fēi.  Hence the saying “nothing matches 明 míngdiscernment.” (Ibid., HY 4/2/30–31)

This cautious skepticism undergirds Zhuangzi’s departure from the primitivists’. He neither thinks we should conclude that we must not issue shì-fēi judgments nor that we must reject or deny our natural, situational inclinations to shì-fēi. We should, however, adopt an attitude of epistemic modesty in making our perspective based choices and recommending our interpretations to others. That modesty arises from míngdiscerning that their perspectives, like ours, arise from within a immensely complex and complicated natural dào structure. Epistemic modesty also undergirds Zhuangzi’s openness and willingness to interact with others. If nature has a point of view, it is that one in which all actual dàos of shì-fēi-ing in nature are available as natural guiding structures. Hence nature makes no choice that implies a more absolute, or superior normative status on either perspective. Nature makes them possible candidate guiding dàos for us to choose and walk.

A question implicitly and repeatedly left to the reader is what Zhuangzi means by 明 míngdiscerning. Does it amount to taking the view of nature but of nowhere in particular or is it a naturally occurring, perspective on perspectives, a recognition of the plurality of natural perspectives? He usually recommends to our attention insights gained from realizing that our choice is one among a wide range of naturally available dàos. He provokes us to realize that we may make progress and improve our guiding perspective by simulating the guiding perspectives of others. Some tales, by contrast, warn us not to expect the dàos of others to mesh with our capacities and character—as with the boy from Shouling who goes to learn the Handan way of walking, which “cripples” his original ability. Still a third outcome of the interaction, as with violent gangsters, reminds us simply to keep our distance.

However, in the standard cases, we learn from simulating others’ perspectives, choices and interpretations of the natural dào-structures either from projecting or communicating—sharing methods and techniques we did not grasp before (new ways to use gourds or hand-salve or find ways to accommodate and interact while “walking two ways”). New accumulated insights about natural structures may improve our range of options, from our own point of view. Learning can also help us see how to walk in the natural paths together without getting in the other’s way.

In understanding other’s trajectories along their dàos, we may judge them as correct or incorrect. First, we do this from our own present perspective. We neither judge all to be right nor all to be wrong—nor even that all are equal. Certainly, not all are equally worthy of our choice. We need not judge that all are good choices for those following them—only that the grounds of their choice may be different from ours. They might still be dogmatic, careless, or unwarranted even given the situational grounds of their choice. Nothing about the naturalness of such choices arising makes them right. All this is compatible with recognizing others as natural creatures guided by natural inner processes along natural guiding dàos.

We neither seek to follow all at once or each equally—as Hui Shi seems to suggest. Nor do we resolve to follow none—as Shen Dao suggests. We do judge that we might gain from being aware of and engaging in open exchanges—as in Zhuangzi’s dialogues. We are more inclined to follow a path, and given our similarities, think we might pursue it with benefit when we know some natural being like us found and followed it. And Zhuangzi clearly does ridicule the social moralists (Confucians and Mohists) as well as Hui Shi for the narrowness of their range of choices—their failure to appreciate the richness and complexity of alternative ways of life.

Our tendency to appreciate and share others’ values, to mirror their behavior cooperatively, together with our awareness of the wide variety of perspectives, many of which we judge to be worthless, mistaken, or dangerous, makes it hard to treat any projected transcendental, comprehensive viewpoint as the single answer. Zhuangzi’s “pivot of dàos,” his “view from nowhere,” is not a final shì-fēi judgment. It is the point prior to any shì-fēi and from which all diverge. Each commitment propels us down a different path at a chéngfixed momentum. We rely on chéngfixed commitments to prior shì-fēi in all shì-fēi judgment. All shì-fēi are indexed within the network. The judgment from no-where-when is no-judgment.

We learn from openness and exchange because we acquire commitments from simulating others’ path following behavior. That we progress in such exchanges is something we ourselves judge, not the cosmos. No judgment comes from some point outside of or everywhere in the network of dàos. We are naturally influenced by others’ evaluations, their judgments of our choices and their behavioral virtuosity—especially when the others are our parents, perceived superiors and respected models. These, again, are the 因 yīndependencies on which present judgments depend.

This gives Zhuangzi’s indexical relativism a different contour from Hui Shi’s. The latter structures his analysis mainly on comparatives. This leads him to a version of normative ‘error theory’ –the conclusion that we should abandon normative semantic distinctions as all wrong. Since the 辯 biàndistinctions on which they are based are relative, they are unreal. Ergo, there are no real distinctions and the world is actually one. Any distinction making judgment, any shì-fēithis-not that, unnaturally divides what is naturally one. Hui Shih’s Tenth Thesis is:

Flood concern on all the 10,000 thing-kinds; The cosmos is one 體 unit. (HY 93/33/74)

Graham, relying on his hypothesis that Zhuangzi frequently considers positions which he later rejects, had already targeted the stereotype view of Zhuangzi as agreeing with Hui Shi’s monism. Graham’s translation reveals the reductio that puts monism in a “considered and rejected” category. It amounts to the self-rebutting anti-language stance targeted by the Later Mohists—the error Zhuangzi’s naturalism of all perspectives (the “pipes of heaven”) was intended to avoid.

“[H]eaven and earth were born together with me and the myriad things and I are one.”

Now that we are one, can I still say anything? Now that I have called us one, did I succeed in not saying something? One and the saying make two, two and one make three. Proceeding from here even an expert calculator cannot get to the end of it, much less a plain man. (HY5/2/52–54)

4.6 Zhuangzi on Language

Zhuangzi’s relativism expresses choice, commitment, and interpretive performance on analogy to natural processes involved in following a path. Commitment is setting off along a path. We have momentum and a trajectory. The shape of the path combines with these and commits us to walk on or continue in a way that depends on the discernible shape of the path. Walking a path involves staying mostly within its physical boundaries.

This account allows us to capture the flavor of Zhuangzi’s discussion which does not employ the familiar Western sentence-based metaphors of laws, rules, principles with norms of obedience, belief or propositional desire. Using the Western idiom, along with the associated practical syllogism of belief-desire explanation would give Zhuangzi the basis for a distinction between a cause and a reason—a distinction he seems not to draw in his talk of 因 yīndependence. There is a kind of inference from dàos of choice, interpretation etc. of a path and an internal feedback dào (our 德 virtuosity at) “reading” external paths to guide behavior.

Zhuangzi would not make that point in terms of deduction from a normative premise or principle. The internal and external paths themselves have a causal and normative relation to our walking behavior. A more sentential focus would similarly mean describing the outcome as an action rather than an extended course of walking/following behavior. A sentence would state the action or the intent—rather like the conclusion of a practical syllogism rather than, as as fits in this metaphorical space, as performing a role in a play or or part in a symphony.

Zhuangzi’s use of the path metaphor did extend to the understanding of language but, again, not with a focus on sententials. Rather than constructing dàos in sentential form, Zhuangzi construes language in dào form. The focus of ancient Chinese theory was on names on the analogy of path markers: “go past the tree, turn right and then down to the water.” Names take on importance as sign-posts along physical structures. Confucian social versions emphasized the names of social roles and statuses more than of natural kinds. Primitivist opposition to social dàos led them into the sweeping anti-naming postures that Later Mohists showed to be self-condemning.

Graham’s interpretation of Zhuangzi’s pipes of nature gave him a way to evade this anti-language abyss. Human language is a natural sound. Hui Shi’s using relativist premises about names to derive an absolutist monism which threatened to collapse to the primitivist anti-distinction, anti-naming quietism. Making everything one is equivalent to denying 辯 biàndistinctions thereby denying any real basis for the shì-fēithis way-not that statuses implicit in all 名 míngnames  and yánwords:language.

Zhuangzi’s naturalism is anti-dogmatic, it neither denies nor asserts any particular set of distinctions as authentic. Distinctions arise from indexed here-now points in the actual network of dào perspectives—by travelers on a trajectory along one of the dàos choosing 是非 shì-fēi this-not that from among multiple possible courses of behavior afforded by the cosmos. The cosmos does not select which way to make the choice.

Zhuangzi’s analogy of language and wind, however, had its own problems. Graham had noted that Zhuangzi returns to the metaphor nearer the middle of the dialogue, noting that here Zhuangzi seems to be taking back some of its implications. Having disposed of Mencius’s appeal to intuition and Hui Shi’s attempt to make everything normatively equal, he here addresses a more challenging position. The Later Mohists advocated a version of pragmatic-semantic realism. The Later Mohists had also argued that when a 辯 biàndistinction was formulated as a shì-fēi, e.g., one of the disputants calls it “ox” and the other “not-ox”, one of them must 勝 shèngwin i.e., 當 dānghit on it.

The Later Mohists’ version of common-sense realism incorporated social conventions. Conventions set out what 物 natural-kind each term “selects out” or biàndistinguishes from the rest. We then extend that distinction to pick out new objects based on their objective similarity or difference (those accessible to “eyes and ears” of ordinary people). This is the basis of a social standard of correct word use enshrined in past practice.

Hui Shi, however, had undermined that simple version of realism with his observation that between any two 物 natural-kinds we can find some similarity and some difference. The world, in effect, gives us many ways of establishing conventional distinctions and assigning names. The Later Mohists had failed to find an adequate account of what similarities would and would not lead to what they called 狂舉 kuāngjǔwild picking out . Zhuangzi’s analogy of language to the noises made by wind had seemed to echo Hui Shi’s normlessness about language. In this later passage, however, he revisits the wind analogy, and retreats, accepting the Mohist insight that language is more than a “natural sound.”

Language is not blowing; those who use language, have language. (Graham translates: “Saying is not blowing breath, saying says something.) That which it languages is decidedly not yet fixed. Is the eventual result that they have (there is) language? Or there has never been language? Deeming it as different from bird calls: does that mark a distinction?  Or is there no distinction?” (HY4/2/23–4) (This passage is followed by the passage cited in the “Intuition” sub-section above)

This frustrating vagueness and signature indecision in the text leaves interpreters to philosophize about what Zhuangzi’s implicit answer (明 míngdiscern:clear) might be. However, the analogy with bird calls is a fortuitous suggestion. We arrange, adapt and modulate the elements of our language to fit our environment, abilities, and opportunities (e.g., mating). Would Zhuangzi have guessed the same about birds?

The claim following that concurs that the “aboutness” of a language exists but aboutness is not fixed. This can be explicated with the above discussion of the indexicalsshìthis:right and 彼 that. Zhuangzi carries the diectic character over to his treatment of the ubiquitous shì-fēithis-not that that undergird the norms guiding how to use names (words). We endorse and recommend (shì this:right) our guiding terms, language and linked behavior. We may base that on our correctly following prior commitments to dàos of word use—relying on a Confucian traditional standard, the past and existing practices of our linguistic community.

In one passage, Zhuangzi allows this appeal to past or existing common practice but does not endorse it as right—merely as useful. Conventions are useful because they facilitate communication. He he adds a tone of “that is all” hinting we need not regard them as plausible candidates for being absolutely right—a single transcendent standard of use.

Only those who “break through” know how to communicate with it as a “one.” Because of this, we don’t use that strategy and instead locate things in the conventional realm. The conventional is useful; the useful, communicable, and the communicable achievable. If you hit on the achievable, you are almost there and dependent shìs end. (Ibid., HY 4/2/36–37)

Zhuangzi describes our past shìs of this kind as “like an oath or treaty.” (Ibid., HY 3/2/11) They have “enactment force” committing us to a dào governing their later use. We may conform to (correctly follow) and further construct our transmitted linguistic dào in expressing or performing (為 wéideeming) other things as shì-fēi. Our trajectory along our paths incorporates these accumulated commitments to prior practices of language use. As our dàos now bring us to new situations, how do we know to project the correct indexed choice from the prior history of differently-indexed behavior? That actual language behavior commits us to a linguistic dào-type, but it’s not clear what the commitment entails at this choice point. The Mohists and Confucians are both claiming, from their different directional perspectives, to be following similar commitments to existing dàos of practice.

Mozi’s recommending naturally or empirically available dàos for reforming shared linguistic practice was itself, Mozi thought, following existing natural practice. He even noticed that our ongoing linguistic practice rejects treating something’s merely being a shared past practice as automatically making it right. Our existing evaluation practices remind us that shared and unquestioned past practices can be wrong.

Mozi appealed to what he would also have regarded as a purely natural practice. Practical efficiency ( benefit) is a standard accessible to all ordinary people’s “eyes and ears.” Each time we apply some natural, empirically guided interpretation in practice, we participate in shaping evolving normative practices (both linguistic and behavioral practices). Each such decision commits us and others to a dào of interpreting our social dào. We understand our commitment to that dào as a commitment to practice and transmit it correctly—where the standard of ‘correct’ is itself either enshrined in a past practice or in natural utility. This is the basis for Zhuangzi’s claim that social dàos, including linguistic dàos, are natural dàos—and there are many of them. Further, as the Laozi would later famously observe, dàos can be interpretively guided. They are changeable dàos. 

Humans, in finding ways to walk and walking them, initiate the construction of social paths, naturally and perhaps unintentionally, by leaving prints in the natural world. Zhuangzi links the path metaphor to a society’s linguistic practice thus:

That which we treat as 可 assertible is 可 assertible; that which we treat as not assertible is not assertible. Dàos are made by walking them; thing-kinds are made 然 ránso so by being called ‘so’. (Ibid., HY 4/2/33)

This sense of the immense complexity and the fluid nature of normative commitments to a dàopath underlie Zhuangzi’s skeptical themes. 明 Míngclear:discerning seems linked to the gestalt in which we accept ourselves as embedded, along with others similarly situated, in nature’s endlessly complex evolution of guiding structures. How do we know either that our past practice was correct or that we are correctly following them in this new situation, here and now, based solely on our eyes and ears?

4.7 Skepticism

Zhuangzi’s stance toward Mohist formal realism (if we disagree on a shì-fēi, one party must 勝 shèngwin) becomes clearer now. The Mohists did not specify any objective mechanism of “winning” beyond some vague suggestion of tipping a balance. However Zhuangzi’s point in response appears to track the warning function of a norm of truth (even when justified by our best available judging standards, we may still be wrong). Zhuangzi takes shèngwinning as a vague primitive in arguing that we cannot finally settle skeptical doubts by appeal to winning disputes. The main mechanism Zhuangzi discusses is appeal to a judge or authority. We appreciate that all judges will also use terms like shì-fēithis-not that indexed by their acquired commitment momentum. Their judgments, like ours, express their momentum along a dào of using these words here, now and projecting the usage to that, there, then.

Given that you and I have been brought to 辯 biàndispute and you win me over and I don’t win you over, in such a case is your distinction substantively 是 Shìthis:right? Mine substantively 非 fēi? If I win you over and you don’t win me over; is mine substantively right? And yours?; substantively wrong? Are they partly right and partly wrong? Or jointly right and jointly wrong? You and I cannot know between ourselves, so another human inherently inherits our obscurity and doubt. To whom can we go to correct us? Employing someone who agrees with you, given that they are like you, how can they correct the situation? Employing someone who agrees with me, given that they are like me, how can they correct it? Employ someone different from both me and you to correct it, given that they are different from us both, how can they correct it? Employ someone who is like both of us to correct it, given that they are like us both, how can they correct it? So you and I and others cannot know, and in these condition on what other can we rely? The changing sounds’ mutual dependence is like their conjoint autonomy. Harmonize them with glances at nature and make them dependent on eventual consensus and with that exhaust the years. (Ibid., HY 7/2/84–92)

It is not clear if the conclusion is supposed to be a solution to the skeptical problem posed or merely a way to cope constructively with complexity and uncertainty. The passage rules out any appeal to a special authority of any other point of view—while giving equal authority in the construction to all. Even where we all share some “conventional wisdom” it does not have special authority—say over other creatures. This, was implicit in Mozi’s rejection of socially agreed dàos. Zhuangzi’s notorious toying with the perspectives of animals expanded it (for naturalists). .

Gap-tooth asked Kingsley, “Do you know that which all natural kinds agree in shìendorse-ing?”
He answers “How would I know that?”
“Then, do you know of what you don’t know?”
“And how could I know that?”
“So, does no natural kind know anything?”
“And how would I know that? Nonetheless, let me try to put it in language. How would I know that what I call ‘knowing’ is not not-knowing? And what I call ‘not-knowing’, is knowing.”

And let me try a question on you. If people sleep in the damp, they get pains and paralysis; would eels? If in a tree, they tremble in fear; would monkeys? Of the three, does any know the correct place to live? … From where I see it, the origins of goodness and morality, painting things as ‘this/right’ or ‘not-that/wrong’ are, as boundaries, both confused and complicated; how could I know how to distinguish them? (Ibid., HY 6/2/64–70)

This passage reinforces the conclusion that norms of correct word use is Zhuangzi’s core skeptical target. So we may indeed know how to act, according to some norms of using ‘know how’ and not if judged by some other dào of correct usage of the knowing/ignorant distinction. Linguistic skepticism easily metastasizes to virtually any commitment. According to which dào of projecting past practice should we judge this linguistic behavior as conforming to our commitment or not. Normative skepticism, in a use-theory is hard to contain—especially when the model of all judgments is as some indexed 是 非 shì-fēithis-not that assignment. It sweeps in metaphysics, epistemics, and semantics.

A consequence is that Zhuangzi’s skepticism is broad but weak. Broad because it infects so many judgments, but weak not merely in the usual sense of denying absolute certainty, but in failing to imply that we should stop or refuse to make the judgment. It does not rest on any theory of the probability of an error, but that the concept of an error is subject to the same concerns as the original judgment. It neither undermines nor give us reason to withdraw our judgments. Appreciating that others reach their views as naturally as we do only removes our status to claim that our judgment is authentically and uniquely correct.

Temporally, Zhuangzi’s skepticism is buttressed by reminding us of our own past experiences of learning, of acquiring new gestalts, of realizing that what we had considered the way, was subject to reconsideration and improvement. The skepticism does not target any specific failure in my epistemic process. It does not advise me to abandon my present course. It reminds me only to remain open to the further possibility of learning more—about what? About the world? We can do that by learning more about other natural ways of processing and how they work in the world—other dàos.

It counts as skepticism because it reminds us that we normally err on the side of overestimating than underestimating our epistemic security. We think we know and do not more often than we think we don’t know and we do. And that is because we underestimate the range of possible alternative dàos. Hence the pragmatic upshot of his skepticism is to remind us to engage with more other points of view.

Zhuangzi’s skepticism is weak because it acknowledges that we may apply different concepts of ‘knowing’ in different situations. Implicitly, it does not deny that we could meet some particular standard of knowing, but that we could know for every situation which standard is the right one. What standard is the right one to use for acknowledging or denying someone knows well enough to satisfy, for example, the correct dào of assertion?

This feature of Zhuangzi’s skepticism lies at the heart of the famous debate between Zhuangzi and Hui Shi about the fish-pleasure in which Zhuangzi defends a claim to know against Hui Shi’s challenge. Zhuangzi makes an assertion and Hui Shi initiates the skeptical challenge. His challenge implies that there is a favored or correct standard of knowing that turns out to be impossibly strict. All knowledge must come from inside. It’s impossibly strict because it doesn’t allow Hui Shi to issue the challenge in this conversation.

Zhuangzi and Hui Shi wandered over the Hao River bridge. Zhuangzi said, “those mini-fish coming from there and cruising around, relaxed and unhurried, are fish at leisure.” Hui Shi said “You are not a fish; from whence do you know the leisure of fish?” Zhuangzi retorted, “You are not me, from what perspective do you know my not knowing fish at leisure?” Hui Shi responds, “I’m not you, of course I don’t know about you; You are not a fish and that’s enough to count as you’re not knowing fish’s leisure.” Zhuangzi concludes, “Let’s return to where we started. When you said ‘from what perspective do you know fish at leisure’, you clearly knew my knowing it as you asked me. I knew it here above the Hao.” (Ibid., HY  45/17/87–91)

Graham drew our attention to the role of perspective in this passage, noting that Hui Shi’s challenge to Zhuangzi’s assertion does not use the normal question form, (何 héhow do you know?) but a locative question word (安 ānwhence?). This brings the debate into alignment with Zhuangzi’s concern about the various perspectives from which to deploy a dào of word use. Here, as above, the word is 知 zhīknow. The norm of asserting, as in English, involves answering the challenge “how do you know?” What normative conditions allow me, here and now, correctly to use the term zhīknow—hence to make the assertion about these fish below me? Hui Shi both knew Zhuangzi was relying on a dào of using ‘know’ “from zhuangzi‘s here” and Hui Shi knew Zhuangzi’s situation from his own relevantly similar “here-now” and relying on the samedàonorm of claiming to know from a distinct perspective. Hui Shi cannot consistently insist that a speaker can only use 知 zhīknow when he occupies the perspective of the thing known.

4.8 Perspectives on Perspectives

Notice, the argument about the fish implies we have a perspective on the perspectives of others. So skepticism grounded in dependence or relativity of perspective need not be predominantly negative. Zhuangzi, here, uses it to justify a way of claiming to knowing. In many other parables, he addresses the kind of knowing that comes with a gestalt shift, especially when we see our own and others’ points of view as similar—see ourselves as others see us. This is the more comprehensive perspective Zhuangzi urges on us. We experience such gestalt shifts especially when we come appreciate we had been wrong before and now view things differently. We are confident from our own “now” that we have made epistemic progress—our new awareness seems “relatively” improved to us now. We reach a state where we judge our former perspective to be inferior to our present one. It includes insight into our relative situations. Evidently, this awareness of one’s own perspective as one of many, equally natural points of view motivates us to wonder if we have made the final correction. This enhanced awareness of ourselves as one of many perspectives is an intelligible candidate reading of Zhuangzi’s 明 míngclarity. It is harder to construct a coherent narrative for mystical and/or dogmatic readings—those that jump from an improved perspective to a perfect one.

This kind of gestalt shift leads us to reflect on how narrow our past perspective had been. It features prominently in the “Autumn Floods” Chapter 17. The Earl of the Yellow River, having thought himself as the ultimate, discovers the North Sea and announces his former error and newfound awareness of his lesser significance in “the greater path.” The North Sea Overlord tells him that he too sees himself as situated in a modest status in a still greater scheme and rejects the River Earl’s attempts to identify the North Sea’s as ultimate. He casts doubt on there being a final, ultimately small or large.

The lord of He river said, “So can I consider cosmos ‘large’ and the tip of a hair as ‘small’?” North Sea Ruo replied, “No! Thing kinds have unlimited measurement (ways of measuring); Time has no end; distinctions have no constancy, beginning and ending no inherent cause. Because of this great knowing is viewed within a range of distant and close. …We calculate that what humans know is never as great as what they do not know, their temporal extent of life is not as great as not as much as the time before life, and from the very small to try to take in the scope of the very large, is an invitation to confusion and disorder and not that from which we can gain. (Ibid., HY 42/17/14–20)

Can we describe Zhuangzi’s míng as “having a sense of our limited perspective?” Credulous, dogmatic and imperious absolutists do not appreciate themselves as being in one of a variety of natural perspectives. Broad open-mindedness and mild skepticism come together in the míngclarity Zhuangzi encourages in us. It has a dual nature—an epistemically modest perspective on ourselves that arises from improving our epistemic status and encourages us to continue. It helps us appreciate that we are still as naturally situated and others with whom we may disagree and still grow. Further improvement can come from further exchange of perspectives.

The naïve Confucian-Mohist advocates of imposing a single social dào thus disrupt the natural process by which social dàos evolve in real time as we seek a harmony guided by “glances at nature.” Seeing things from another’s perspective both alerts us to how we could be wrong and makes us feel that we now understand things better than with our former, narrower perspective. Yet, the Zhuangzi repeatedly reminds us not to abandon epistemic modesty when we make epistemic progress. That we now see things from a perspective in common with another does not make us both right. Yet, the more comprehensive our perspective, the “clearer” the new gestalt should seem.

The search for this kind of perspective on ourselves and others seems to motivate Zhuangzi’s willingness to engage and interact with others, seeking to understand their perspective as having a natural status and role for them as ours does for us. This is partly illustrated by common sense examples of our judging from our own current perspective that theirs “adds something” enriching our own perspective by our own lights. Sometimes it’s dangerous to try to mix others’ perspectives with your own.

And have you alone not heard tell of those from Shou-ling who studied walking with those in Handan? They never mastered the country’s skill and lost their original way of walking, and stumbled and crawled back. (Ibid., HY45/17/79–80)

Aside from its frequent usefulness from our point of view, the main benefit from the self-recognition as a natural creature embedded as are others at a perspective-point within a natural network structure is to encourage being open-minded. Part of the value is the humbling of our epistemic pride, mildly disrupting our judgment equilibrium. Without such an occasional perspective on ourselves, we too easily fall into exaggerating our epistemic exceptionalism. The reminder that we are intermingled with others in a web of natural perspectives gives us an appropriate, realistic correction. A Zhuangzi story illustrates such a moment.

Zhuangzi was wandering in Diaoling fields when he glimpsed a weird magpie-like-thing flying in from the south. It had a wingspan of over seven-feet and passed so close his forehead, he could feel it. Then it gathered its wings and settled in a chestnut grove. Zhuangzi thought “what bird is that?  Massive wings of such power and eyes so large it couldn’t see me.” He hiked up his robe and hurriedly tiptoed closer holding his cross-bow at the ready. Then he spotted a cicada settling in the shaded shelter without a worry for itself, but a preying mantis opened its pincers about to grab it, also focused on its gain and ignoring its own bodily danger. The strange magpie burst out and harvested them both—similarly unaware of the natural dangers he faced.

But Zhuangzi was suddenly seized with this thought, “We natural kinds are all interconnected! We two different species are mutually seeing things in our own ways.” He dismantled his crossbow and fled, himself now himself pursued by the game warden shouting out his crimes. (Ibid., HY 54/20/61–5)

Overall, Zhuangzi clearly recommends open-minded flexibility as when he scolds Hui Shi for being tied to conventional thinking about how to use giant gourds. He illustrates it again with his story about different uses of a salve that prevents chapping. He models such openness in his conversations with cripples (righteously shunned by Confucians), freaks, thieves, strange creatures, the wind, a shadow and a skull. He imagines many other conversations illustrating the differences of perspectives, capacities and needs.

While we cannot help making our own judgments and commitments, he seems to see tolerance and accommodation as values that follow from appreciating other natural perspectives:

A monkey keeper says (to the monkeys) “I’ll give you three [rations] in the morning and four in the evening.” The monkeys seemed angry. “Ok, I’ll give you four in the morning and three in the evening.” The monkeys were happy. So with no substantive loss, he could change their anger to happiness. This is an example of a shì judgment being dependent on circumstances. So the sage uses shì-fēithis-not that judgments to harmonize and rests in the natural balance. And we can call this walking as pairs. (Ibid., HY 5/2/38–40)

We are, as it happens, capable of understanding the perspectives of others well enough to accommodate and cooperate with them, to borrow insights and to reach agreements. However, the Zhuangzi seems skeptical that we can extrapolate from this ordinary capacity to broaden our perspective to having some absolute or comprehensive insight—as it were from all points of view. Nor, as we saw above, can we assume that because the two disputants come to a resolution or agreement, it constitutes knowing from a cosmically or absolutely higher perspective. Hui Shi’s relativism, recall, does point to such an infinite expansion ending in a single universal point of view. Here, however, we are reminded that while we experience a gestalt broadening of perspective as revealing something real and significant (like waking from a dream), we cannot extrapolate from that to the claim to be able to know the final result of such gestalt leaps to broader perspectives.

Even though North Sea Lord denies there is any final or ultimately broad perspective from which we can make shì-fēithis-not that judgments, the parable suggests a progressive path toward broader perspectives with those further along having the epistemic status to guide those with less comprehensive perspectives. However, arguments in Chapter 2 suggest that progress must always be judged from a moving frame of reference along a dào that is already chéngfixed in our xīnheart-mind that shoots-out the shì-fēi.

Our location and trajectory makes us receptive to some and not other avenues of learning. The boy was unable to master the Handan way of walking because of the way he had already learned to walk. The monkey keeper could accommodate the monkeys, but still disagreed with them about the importance of the breakfast-dinner choice. That someone understands and agrees with both of us does not make his judgment correct. The final skepticism concerns whether these paths of progress of perspectives must or will converge on a single outcome.

The epistemic modesty implicit in Zhuangzi’s skepticism targets mainly the paternalistic, superior attitude toward other points of view exemplified by Confucian and Mohist moralistic posture. When we have an accommodation (you and I come to a common agreement) you and I may both rate it as progress. However, it does not imply we have moved to a higher state of overall insight along an absolute scale—or from any arbitrary third point of view. Exchange of points of view can be valuable to each (perhaps in different ways) and broadening perspective in this way can make us wiser—but always as judged from our already operative 成 chéngfixed dàos . We can advise and recommend our normative perspective on others, but their being able to appreciate and use it depends on their capacities, options and situation.

At this point, Zhuangzi starts to draw an analogy of dreaming and waking up to the shift in gestalt that comes when we leap to a more comprehensive perspective. At awakening, we immediately appreciate the unreality of the dream, yet within the dream, we can have a similar gestalt shift and dream of having dreamed and interpreted that deeper dream.

How do I know that loving life is not a form of ignorance? How do I know disliking death is not a weak farewell of the sort when we don’t know about the return? Miss Li Zhi cries when she is betrothed to someone’s son, and when she first goes off to the Jin state soaks her clothing with her tears; but then she arrives at the kings abode, sleeps with the king in his bed, eats fattened livestock and then starts to regret her tears. How do I know the dead do not regret their former clinging to life, We dream of eating and drinking and on awaking cry bitterly, we dream of weeping and wailing and awake in a good mood to go off hunting. When we dream, we don’t know it as a dream, and in our dreams, judge something else as a dream. On awakening, we know it was a dream, and there could be another greater awakening in which we know a greater dream, and under these the conditions the ignorant think they are as enlightened as if they had learned it by an investigation. Gentlemen to shepherds inherently do this! (Ibid., HY 6/2/78–83)

So, is there an ultimate or final possible such shift in gestalt—some final state of knowing what to do? Zhuangzi’s relativism is mildly skeptical because he cannot know either that there is not nor that there is a final or ultimate “awakening”

The dream theme is memorably carried over to the story of Zhuangzi dreaming a butterfly and/or vice versa. It seems to suggest that the gestalt sense of liberation from error may even be reciprocal. Perhaps our subsequent perspective is one from which most would move to our former perspective. Adolescent conversion can be to or from a religion.

Once before, Zhuangzi dreamt of being a butterfly, gaily butterflying and himself embodied in this sense of purpose! He knew nothing of Zhuangzi. Suddenly awakening, he then is rooted in Zhuangzi. He doesn’t know if Zhuangzi dreamt being a butterfly or a butterfly is dreaming being Zhuangzi—though there must be a difference. This is called “things change.” (Ibid., HY7/2/94)

Elaborating the complexity this way makes Zhuangzi’s proposals seem disappointing as solutions. They amount to mildly suggesting that we allow the exchange of views to go on without the domination of any dogma and with some vague “glances at natural constancies” and see what comes out “in the long run.”

Zhuangzi’s conception of dàos in nature, from a here-now to a there-then, differs from a Mohist (broadly utilitarian) naturalism. Utilitarianism is a natural constraint, an allegedly single naturally correct way for all of us to choose our course. In effect, Zhuangzi is more of a natural pluralist, with the natural outcome of morality the product of ongoing individual and social construction.

Dàos are in nature but not choices of nature for us. So the discussion, competition, and even strife between dàos and their advocates are factors in an ongoing natural 道 dàoguiding process. We and our circumstances change as we each find, choose and walk different naturally evolving paths.

This does not entail we should not advocate our own way. Such exchanges are part of the natural process of construction of 道 dàospaths and making them available to others. Such a dialogue of competing dàos constitutes the natural evolutional dào of guidance. Realizing this, we should not flatter ourselves, posing as the Confucian father shaping his child’s character, but as a contributor in this competition among similarly natural ways. We express perspectives located in a real world of indexed points from which we choose behavioral paths.

Some characters in Zhuangzi’s dialogues wonder about exceptional figures who allegedly have abilities that justify that paternal posture—the capacity to transcend our location in points of view and to lecture all of us from a privileged perspective. The Zhuangzi’s response typically remind them that such idealized points of view are neither intelligible to us nor relevant to what we should do. Either these exceptional observers have their own naturally chéngfixed frames of reference in the natural world, or they are outside of the natural world in some unrealistically free realm. If the latter, then their views are both unintelligible and irrelevant to us. What they would do in our situation does not constitute helpful advice to us. To advocate following the advice of these ideal observers is to speak practical nonsense to non-ideal, actual actors.

Gap Tooth, following Kingsley’s skeptical formulation above says:

So you don’t know what is beneficial or harmful, does the “fully arrived human” necessarily not know them?  Kingsley replied, “the fully arrived person becomes pure sapience, he could be in a blazing forest and not be able to feel any heat, the rivers of our civilization could freeze and he couldn’t feel any chill, devastating lighting could pulverize mountains and the wind raise a tidal wave and he could not experience surprise. Someone like that could ride on clouds and air, straddle the sun and moon, and wander beyond the four oceans.  Death and life are not different for him, much less the inclinations of benefit and harm.”

Master Ju Que asked master Zhang Wu, “I’ve heard from my teacher that a sagely man does not find social dealings worth engaging, doesn’t pursue utility, doesn’t avoid harm, doesn’t take delight in striving, doesn’t follow dàos, in silence says things, and in saying things is silent, and roams outside the nitty-gritty of the actual world. Master regarded this as romantic fantasy but I deem it the execution of a mysterious dào. My kind sir what do you say of this?”

Zhang Wu replied, “This is something that, were the yellow emperor to hear, it would be like buzzing, and so how could the likes of Confucius come to know it? Furthermore, you have jumped to conclusions… . I’ll give you some absurd talk and you absurdly listen.” (Ibid., HY 6/2/71–7)

However, in later chapters, Zhuangzi himself seems to recommend to us examples of such spectacular capacities—the most beautifully and elaborately expressed of which is the passage celebrating Butcher Ding.

Butcher Ding carved an ox for Lord Wen Hui; his point of contact, the way he inclined his torso, his foot position, the angle of his knee … gliding, flowing! The knife sang “whuaa” with nothing out of tune. It was as if he were dancing the Faun Ballet or directing an opera.

Lord Wen Hui exclaimed “Ole! Splendidly done! Can talent extend even to this?.

Butcher Ding gestured with his knife, explaining,

“What your servant pursues is dào; which is what skill aims at. When I began to carve oxen, what I saw was nothing but the oxen. After three years, I had ceased seeing them as wholes, and now my sapience mingles so that I don’t see with my eyes, Sensory know-how ends and my sapient desires take over my performance. I rely on natural guiding structures, separate out the great chunks and steer through empty gaps depending on the anatomy. I evade places where cords and filaments intertwine, much less the large bones.

A good cook gets a new knife every year; he chops! Mediocre cooks change knives monthly; they hack. My knife now has 19 years on it; it’s carved several thousand oxen and the edge is as if I had just taken it from the sharpener.

Those joints have gaps, and the knife’s edge no thickness, to put something infinitesimally thin in an empty space?! Effortless! It even allows the edge wander in with ample room to play. That is why, with 19 years on it, this knife’s edge is grindstone fresh.”

(Ibid., 7/3/2–8)

The Zhuangzi plays several variations on this theme. Sometimes the virtuoso performer catches cicadas on a sticky rod, another crafts chariot wheels, there are musicians, debaters, and thieves. The theme extends to animals, millipedes with their expertise in coordinating their limbs while maintaining a smooth flow, snakes flashing by while slithering on their stomachs, One implicit example is Zhuangzi’s own relation with his relativist rival and buddy, Hui Shi. Bemoaning his loss while visiting his sidekick’s grave, Zhuangzi spins a tale of a virtuoso ax-thrower who sliced specks off the nose of his crony, but lost his “knack” when his co-performer passed away. (Ibid., HY 66/24/48–51)

The tales often highlight the tranquil state that accompanies behavior that skillfully follows a natural path. The performances look and feel effortless. The spontaneity of the flow along a natural path gives performers the sense that their behavior is “world-guided” rather than internally controlled. These behaviors become second-nature. We move beyond anything like sub-vocalizing instructions, deliberating or reflecting—and yet we are concentrating intently on the behavior. The range of his examples reminds us that such satisfying states of performance can be experienced in even the most low caste and mundane of activities, including butchering, criminal skills, as well as in the finest of arts, and philosophy.

Another feature of this theme is the observation that such expertise in performance always comes with some kind of limitation—not least that each example is a different person with a different knack. There is no shortcut dào that gives you a knack at every activity. Cook Ding “comes to a hard place;” the cicada catcher tries to balance two coins on his stick—if he is not calm enough, he will have a bad night. The wheelwright could not teach his son the art; the musician cannot play all the notes and only reaches true perfection when he dwells in silence. And above all, the valorization of this kind of specialization in an art pulls in the opposite direction of Zhuangzi’s encouragement to broaden and enlarge our perspectives and scope of appreciation.

This theme of the limits of virtuosity is pursued explicitly in the Zhuangzi’s discussion of the necessary connection of 成 chéngcompletion:success and 虧 kuī failure:deficiency. The theme of this weak skeptical relativism plays out smoothly into the classical Chinese focus on paths as the model of normativity and the objects of knowledge. Paths are everywhere, but guide natural kinds from particular space-time locations and can guide a wide range of behavior types, normative subject matters. Each leads to subsequent choices among dàospaths.

Zhuangzi does not ground his skepticism in an account of specifically human epistemic deficiencies. We are one among many natural creatures with different capacities choosing paths from their indexed point in space and time. The skeptical theme is the wide range of our different perspectives. We are limited mainly in the sense that there is no behavior from the point of view of the whole—there is no omniscient perspective on the path structure. We may wonder if we have discovered all the available 道 dàospaths. And we may always wonder if our judgment about which is best now is about the best in the long run. All we can substitute for this global perspective is some local consensus.

Substantively, in the end, is there success and defect? Substantively, in the end, is there neither success nor defect?....If we can call these successful, then even I am also successful. If they cannot be called successful, then neither I nor any other thing may be called successful. For this reason, illumination of slippery doubt is that which sages target. For this reason, we do not use it and let things rest in the conventional. (Ibid., HY 5/2/42–47)

The weak skeptical conclusion is most strikingly expressed in the observation that introduces the chapter with the story of Cook Ding.

My life is limited and know-how is unlimited. To pursue the unlimited with the limited is dangerous. (Ibid., HY 7/3/1)


Primary Literature

Citations from the Zhuangzi above are in the form “HY p/b/l”, corresponding to (p)age/(b)ook/(l)ine numbers from:

  • Zhuangzi Yinde (A Concordance to Chuang Tzu), Harvard-Yenching Institute Sinological Index Series, Supplement no. 20, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1956.

Translations include:

  • Graham, Angus C., trans., 1981. Chuang-tzu: The Seven Inner Chapters and Other Writings from the Book Chuang-tzu, Boston: Allen and Unwin.
  • –––, 1981. Chuang Tzu: The Inner Chapters, London: Hackett Publishing Co. Inc.
  • Palmer, Martin, Elizabeth Breuilly, Chang Wai Ming, and Jay Ramsay (trans.), 1996. The Book of Chuang Tzu, London: Penguin Books.
  • Watson, Burton (trans.), 1964. Chuang Tzu: Basic Writings, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1968. The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Ziporyn, Brook, 2009. Zhuangzi: The Essential Writings (With Selections from Traditional Commentaries), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing.

Further Reading

The number of philosophical articles published on Zhuangzi’s philosophy has grown exponentially in the years since the discovery of analytic philosophy. The wide range of alternative views and approaches can only be hinted at in this bibliography. Particularly helpful are a number of collections of work dedicated to the understanding of Zhuangzi. They include (in order of publication):

  • Mair, Victor. 1983. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: [published for] Center for Asian and Pacific Studies [by] University of Hawai’i Press. [This was one of the earliest focused collections with several seminal papers that were pivotal in initiating the explosion in philosophical interest in the Zhuangzi.]
  • Kjellberg, Paul and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. 1996. Essays on Skepticism, Relativism, and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press. [This collection, reacted to trend sparked by the Mair collection. Despite the title, the writers share concerns about understanding Zhuangzi in skeptical or relativist terms. Each has a different alternative characterization.]
  • Ames, Roger T., ed. 1998. Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press. [This more diverse collection is inspired by the explosion of philosophically sophisticated treatments of the Zhuangzi.]
  • Cook, Scott, ed. 2003, Hiding the World in the World: Uneven Discourses on the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 317 pp. [This still more recent collection returns to the central themes of skepticism and relativism—here some, defending the analysis and others developing alternative characterizations.]
  • Ames, Roger and Takahiro Nakajima eds., 2015 Zhuangzi and the Happy Fish. Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press. [This most recent collection focuses on the discussion between Zhuangzi and Hui Shi about whether one can know the fish are happy.]

Secondary Literature

  • Ames, Roger, 1998. “Knowing in the Zhuangzi: ‘From Here, on the Bridge, over the River Hao’”, in R. Ames (ed.), Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi, Albany: State University of New York Press, 219–230.
  • Callahan, William A., 1998. “Cook Ding’s Life on the Whetstone: Contingency, Action, and Inertia in the Zhuangzi” in R. Ames (ed.) Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 175–196.
  • Chen, Gu-ying 陳鼓應. 1983. Zhuangzi Jinzhushi《莊子今註今譯》北京:中華書局.
  • Chong, Kim Chong, et al., 2011. “The Concept of Zhen 真in the Zhuangzi,” Philosophy East and West, 61(2): 324–6.
  • –––, 2006. “Zhuangzi and the Nature of Metaphor,” Philosophy East and West, 56(3): pp 370–91.
  • Connolly, Tim, 2011. “Perspectivism as a Way of Knowing in the Zhuangzi,” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 10: 487–505.
  • Coutinho, Steve, 2004. Zhuangzi and Early Chinese Philosophy: Vagueness, Transformation and Paradox, Burlington: Ashgate Publishing Company,.
  • Fox, Alan, 1996. “Reflex and Reflectivity: Wuwei in the Zhuangzi,” Asian Philosophy, 6(1): 59–72.
  • Fraser, Chris, 2009. “Skepticism and Value in the Zhuangzi,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 49(4): 439–547.
  • –––, 2008 “Psychological Emptiness in the Zhuangzi,” Asian Philosophy, 18(2): 123–47 .
  • Giles, H. A., 1911. Musings of a Chinese Mystic: Selections from the Philosophy of Chuang Tzu, London: J. Murray; reprint, London: J. Murray, 1927; and San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, 1977.
  • –––, 1889. Chuang Tzu: Mystic, Moralist, and Social Reformer, London: B. Quaritch; 2nd rev. ed., Shanghai: Kelly and Walsh, 1926; reprint, New York: AMS Press, 1974.
  • –––, 1961, Chuang Tzu: Taoist Philosopher and Chinese Mystic, London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Graham, Angus C., 1986. “How Much of Chuang Tzu did Chuang Tzu write?” in Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature, Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies; reprinted in H. Roth, A Companion to Angus C. Graham’s Chuang Tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press, 2003.
  • –––, 1983. “Taoist Spontaneity and the Dichotomy of ‘Is’ and ‘Ought’,” in V. Mair (ed.), Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press, 1983, 3–23.
  • –––, 1969. “Chuang-tzu’s Essay on Seeing Things as Equal” History of Religions, 7: 137–159 .
  • Hansen, Chad. 1983. “A Tao of ‘Tao’ in Chuang Tzu.” In Mair (ed.), Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press, 24–55.
  • –––, 1992. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2003. “Guru or Skeptic? Relativistic Skepticism in the Zhuangzi,” in S. Cook (ed.), Hiding the World in the World: Uneven Discourses on the Zhuangzi, Albany: SUNY Press, pp. 128–62.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J., 1991. “Zhuangzi’s Conversion Experience,” Journal of Chinese Religions, 19:1 Jan 1991 pp. 13–25.
  • Kjellberg, Paul, 1994. “Skepticism, truth, and the good life: a comparison of Zhuangzi and Sextus Empiricus,” Philosophy East and West, 44(4): 111–113.
  • Legge, James (trans.), 1891. The Sacred Books of China: The Texts of Taoism, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press; reprinted, New York: Dover, 1962.
  • Liu, Xiaogan, 1994. Classifying the Zhuangzi Chapters, William E. Savage (trans.), Ann Arbor: University of Michigan, Center for Chinese Studies.
  • Lundberg, Brian, 1998. “A Meditation on Friendship,” in S. Ames (ed.), Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi, Albany: State University of New York Press, pp. 211–218.
  • Moller, Hans-Georg, 1999. “Zhuangzi’s ‘Dream of the Butterfly’—A Daoist Interpretation,” Philosophy East and West, 49:4 pp. 439–50.
  • Raphals, Lisa, 1994. “Skeptical strategies in the ‘Zhuangzi’ and ‘Theaetetus’.” Philosophy East and West, 44: 501–526.
  • Roth, Harold D. (ed.), 2003. A Companion to Angus C. Graham’s Chuang Tzu (Monograph of the Society for Asian and Comparative Philosophy, No. 20, Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press.
  • –––, 1991. “Who Compiled the Chuang-tzu,” in H. Rosemont (ed.), Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Soles, Deborah H., and David E. Soles, 1998. “Fish traps and rabbit snares: Zhuangzi on judgement, truth and knowledge,” Asian Philosophy, 8(3): 149–64.
  • Stevenson, Frank W., 2006. “Zhuangzi’s Dao as background noise,” Philosophy East and West, 56:2 pp. 301–31.
  • Sturgeon, Donald, forthcoming. “Zhuangzi, perspectives, and greater knowledge,” Philosophy East and West.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W., 1996. “Competing interpretations of the Inner Chapters of the ‘Zhuangzi’,” Philosophy East and West, 58:4 pp. 552–71.
  • Wang, Xianqian, 1987. Zhuangzi ji jie (Xin bian zhu zi ji cheng), Beijing: Zhonghua Shu ju.
  • Wong, David, 2005. “Zhuangzi and the Obsession with Being Right,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 22: 91–107.

Other Internet Resources

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Chad Hansen <chansen@hku.hk>

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