Richard FitzRalph

First published Mon Jul 8, 2013; substantive revision Thu May 9, 2024

Richard FitzRalph (1299–1360) was regarded, even during his lifetime, as one of the leading thinkers to emerge from that generation of exceptionally talented thinkers at Oxford in the early 1330s. Although his later fame was mainly due to his polemical writings, especially regarding the poverty question and his attacks on the Franciscans, he was acknowledged as a significant interlocutor by thinkers such as Holcot, Wodeham, Wyclif and Gregory of Rimini among others. Although viewed as somewhat traditional in his doctrinal tendencies, he was particularly well-regarded for the careful and detailed re-formulation of the arguments of thinkers such as Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus, especially on matters such as infinity, future contingents and the relation of the will to the intellect. His was the first book by an Irishman to be printed (as an incunabulum), and consequently many of his ideas underwent a revival in the 1500s; for example, his theory of dominion was still being discussed in the sixteenth century. Already, however, somewhat old-fashioned in its theological method by the time of the Council of Trent, his thought was neglected by Catholic thinkers but, on the other hand, he was constantly recalled in Anglican circles from the sixteenth to the nineteenth centuries where he was favorably seen as a forerunner of the English Reformation.

1. Life

Richard FitzRalph was born in Dundalk, probably slightly before 1300. Although not a member of the Gaelic race, he was referred to by his Oxford contemporaries as “Hibernicus,” as was the Anglo-Norman Peter of Ireland (Petrus de Hibernia, ca. 1200–1265) a generation before. Around the age of 15, he went to Oxford (there was no university in Ireland before the reign of Elizabeth I) where he was a fellow of Balliol College and he gained his MA there. He later went to University College (then University Hall), where he graduated with a doctorate in theology in 1331. He became chancellor of the University of Oxford in 1332, embarking thereafter on a successful ecclesiastical career both in England and in Ireland. On his first visit to Avignon, only five years after concluding his lectures on the Sentences, FitzRalph, it seems, was consulted as one of the eighteen leading theologians of Europe by Pope Benedict XII to correct the views of his predecessor, John XXII, on the beatific vision. He became archbishop of Armagh in 1347. He is perhaps best known for his opposition to the mendicant orders on the question of evangelical poverty and his defense of the rights of the secular clergy against the friars. It was while pursuing his suit against the mendicants that he died at Avignon in 1360. In the company of Ockham, Bradwardine and Wodeham, FitzRalph became one of the four most frequently cited insular theologians in the fourteenth century.

2. Writings

FitzRalph was a prolific author and most of the works from his mature period are of a theological or pastoral nature, or, indeed, polemical writings concerned with the anti-mendicant controversy. And whereas some topics are dealt with such as future contingents (in the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum), or the question of dominium, it is to his earlier work, the Lectura on the Sentences, dating from 1328–29, that we must look for more philosophical themes. FitzRalph was also the author of a (now lost) Commentary on the Physics which brought him into conflict with Richard Kilvington. Furthermore, some logical works once attributed to FitzRalph are now to be attributed to another Armachanus, John Foxhalls (Johannes Anglicus) (Dunne 2013b). The most extensive treatment to date of FitzRalph’s thought as presented in the Lectura is still that by Gordon Leff (1963), even though in many points it is now largely superseded. Leff’s book gives a good overview of FitzRalph’s thought and is generous with quotations from the text itself. What emerges from Leff’s examination is that a good deal of FitzRalph’s Lectura was not concerned with theology at all, or at least only tangentially so. For example, when dealing with the theological problem of the creation of the world, the discussion focuses on topics (such as the eternity of the world) that FitzRalph had already dealt with in his commentary on the Physics (Dunne 2008). A series of determinationes or disputationes ordinariae whose authenticity has been established by Schabel (2023) and edited by him, now reveal an intense discussion with FitzRalph’s contemporary, William Skelton, on the issues of grace, sin and merit when FitzRalph was regent in theology in the years 1331–32. The debate centred on the temporal aspect of an increase in grace, whether instantaneous or extended in time. FitzRalph argued against Skelton’s position that grace can increase in an instant and held that a sustained effort in difficult conditions increases merit more. Another question reveals FitzRalph’s “pelagian” tendencies which he shared with Robert Holcot. Holcot held that if one can avoid sin for a time, then one should be able to avoid sin at all times, in theory at least. The test case is that of the Antichrist who, if he can be good while on earth could remain good at any time of his life, even if Scripture says that he will be damned. FitzRalph’s semi-pelagian tendencies are evident when he states that God does not withhold the goal from someone who does what he can through his own efforts (ex suis naturalibus), so anyone with the use of reason can possibly be saved, including the Antichrist.

3. Position in the History of Philosophy

Although many hold that FitzRalph later turned away from scholasticism (Leff 1963: 175), this point has been refuted by W. Duba (Duba 2013: 104). FitzRalph’s lectures on the Sentences have turned out to be of greater importance than might have at first been realized by some authors such as Leff. Leff saw FitzRalph’s approach as being heavily influenced by the neo-Augustinian movement deriving ultimately from Henry of Ghent. Leff’s summation of FitzRalph is rather negative, holding that FitzRalph shows an unwillingness to be deeply involved in the controversies of his time and that he was content to “restate what his contemporaries re-formulated” (Leff 1963: 175). This assessment, however, leaves one wondering what there was about FitzRalph’s ideas that his contemporaries such as Holcot and Wodeham and later, Gregory of Rimini and Pierre d’Ailly, found so challenging. In fact, contrary to Leff’s assessment recent scholarship affirms that FitzRalph was one of the leading protagonists of the Oxford of his day and at a time when Oxford theology briefly eclipsed the University of Paris in importance.

In philosophical matters FitzRalph generally follows Aristotle, but an Aristotle who is constantly read through the lens of his Commentator. Averroës is taken by FitzRalph to be the authentic interpreter of Aristotle, despite the condemnations of the 1270s, but in so doing FitzRalph is not an Averroist (as some surmised) but is merely following the accepted practice of the times. For example, he is not, as one would expect, Averroistic in accepting the doctrine of a single soul and indeed doubts whether it is truly Averroës’s teaching. Aquinas, when mentioned, is treated with respect and FitzRalph follows him on a number of important points. Anselm receives significant (though not uncritical) attention. Again, as one might expect, Augustine is the guide in theological matters, but FitzRalph does not content himself to give references to Augustine’s works. In fact, he tends to provide long quotations from Augustine, indicating a close personal reading, something he shared with his patron, Bishop John de Grandisson. Contemporaries are not named (contrary to the practice of Wodeham or Holcot a few years later) and their contributions have to be identified (as do indeed FitzRalph’s own positions) in the course of his presentation of each topic in the text and which usually involves an examination of the answers given by Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus. FitzRalph would have perhaps felt closest in spirit to (though not always agreeing with) the neo-Augustinianism of Henry of Ghent; in method and approach, however, he seems closest to Duns Scotus. However, the techniques he employs (including measure language and mental experiments) are something he holds in common with his contemporaries (particularly the Calculators) and it was these, it seems, together with the high quality of his arguments which appealed to other writers down to Jacques Almain and Francisco de Vitoria.

There is little or no evidence of radicalism in FitzRalph’s early writings such as Lectura which would anticipate the polemical Armachanus attacking the privileges of the mendicant orders at the papal court at Avignon in the 1350s. The later FitzRalph was a socially conscious prelate who reprimanded his Anglo-Irish audience in his sermons regarding their unjust treatment of the Gaelic Irish population. It was in this context that he developed his teaching on dominium, a doctrine which would have long-term implications through his influence on Wyclif (Lahey 2003), or indeed in its rejection by later authors such as De Vitoria (Dunne 2004: 243–58).

4. Natural Philosophy

FitzRalph’s views on motion, time and infinity were the topics upon which his near contemporaries, especially Wodeham and Holcot, most frequently quoted him (Dunne 2008). Wodeham, it seems, changed many of his opinions in the light of FitzRalph’s, especially regarding infinity. In Book III of his Oxford Lectura, Wodeham followed FitzRalph word for word on the issue, thereby rejecting the very position he had himself defended in Book I. Again, Gregory of Rimini recognized FitzRalph as the source for the common view of infinity held at Oxford by Holcot and Wodeham and he repeated FitzRalph’s arguments, albeit in order to reject this position (Courtenay 1987: 76–8.)

FitzRalph deals with these topics in the Lectura Book II, qu. 1: Whether God at the beginning of time created the world from nothing. One of the more striking features of the text is its predominantly philosophical flavor and its comparative lack of theological material. The principal question is devoted to the general problem of the eternity of the world. FitzRalph begins by putting forward arguments against the beginning of the world in time. One goes as follows: if God’s power is always the same, then it was the same before the world was created; therefore, God could always from eternity have produced the world. Thus, there is no contradiction in stating that the world has always existed. FitzRalph attributes this position to the Commentary on the Sentences of Thomas Aquinas. Indeed, he continues that, even if the world is not from eternity, we can argue that in the future God might make it so, since what he once can do, he can always do. In other words, it remains part of God’s power to make a universe that has always existed, just as it remains possible for God to destroy this universe, or again, to create other universes that have always existed.

Another argument among the many put forward is that if some contradiction can be found in the notion of a world existing from eternity, then this should be shown through the use of reason. If it were possible to show that the world and time began at a certain instant, then the philosophers of the past would have proven it. FitzRalph quotes Aristotle as saying, in the first book of the Topics, that either position is possible and can be argued for, but neither position can be shown to be conclusive. Thus, FitzRalph concludes that the creation of the world ex nihilo et de tempore can be taken only as an article of faith; indeed, if this were not the case, then there would be no merit in believing in the creation of the world.

When dealing with the associated question of the infinity of the number of souls FitzRalph discusses the nature of the infinite. He comments that the eternity of the world does not necessarily imply an infinity of souls, since the first man could have been made at a certain time and so have a finite number of descendants. Again, through reincarnation a finite number of souls could be continually reborn throughout a perpetual time. FitzRalph continues by pointing out that some people say that an infinity of souls is in no way impossible, or, at least, does not involve a contradiction, since God can make an actual infinite number of souls, angels, or beings at once, or he can do so successively, so that an actual infinite will exist at some future time, even given that the world began at a certain point.

Again, in every body there is an infinite number of proportional parts (partes proportionales: the terminology is Chatton’s and the source for the treatment that follows is probably the De indivisibilibus of Wodeham) that are completely distinct one from another (totaliter diverse). Thus, God can make something exist at once which is actually infinite and the same is as true of souls or angels as it is of bodies. That there is an infinite number of proportional parts in a body is considered by FitzRalph to have been shown by Aristotle in Book III of the Physics and in Averroës’s commentary, since every continuum is composed of an infinite number of proportional parts, each of which is distinct from the other. FitzRalph holds that it can be argued that in any line there is an infinite number of points, that there is an infinite number of lines in any surface and an infinite number of surfaces in every body and yet each is distinct from the other.

FitzRalph continues his argument by stating that if there is an actual infinity within bodies, that is to say, if they can actually be divided to infinity, then it is clear that it is possible for God to make an infinite number of other things. Thus, there is no contradiction in there being an infinite number of human souls. Nor is there any problem with God’s not knowing which is first and which is last in an infinite series; this is not because of any ignorance on God’s part but because, quite simply, there is no first and last. In the end he refers his audience back to his discussion of the topic in his commentary on the Physics, now lost.

Finally, FitzRalph makes an interesting distinction between philosophy and theology. In the ninth argument, where Anselm’s assertion (in the Monologion, chap. 22) that time is composed of parts is addressed, FitzRalph begins by stating that he is concerned here with Anselm’s standing (auctoritas) as a natural philosopher and not as a theologian. In fact, FitzRalph goes further: “here we must follow reason more than the standing (auctoritas) of any theologian.”

Annelise Maier identified a debate (something she deduced from Wodeham’s Lectures on the Sentences) which had occurred between FitzRalph, an opponent of the existence of actual infinity and Kilvington who, on the contrary, was a declared infinitist. FitzRalph’s initial views were first put forward in his commentary on the Physics (which has not survived) but were carried forward into his Lectura on the Sentences whereas we possess both Kilvington’s philosophical and theological works. In contrasting the approach of these two Oxford theologians to the question of infinity, Jung (2023) argues that in following Ockham, Kilvington was sure that mathematics was a language to be used in all of the sciences including theology, whereas FitzRalph following Aristotle was rather convinced that logic was the proper tool for the sciences.

5. Psychology and Cognition

5.1 Mind as a trinity of intellect, memory and will

In his Lectura, FitzRalph holds that memory, understanding and willing are expressions of the essence of the soul and whereas each expresses something of the soul they cannot be said of each other and as such are distinct (Dunne 2012: 443–50). Memory understanding and willing are to be found in the soul’s complete nature but the soul is not to be found completely in any one of them. As regards the relationship between willing and understanding, Wodeham will later specifically oppose FitzRalph for treating them as distinct. FitzRalph, on the other hand, opposed Aquinas for regarding memory and understanding as the same. For FitzRalph, memory, understanding and willing are not the same (which was the position of Scotus and that adopted by Chatton against Ockham), neither are they really distinct but are distinguished inasmuch as the soul expresses itself differently through these powers. Finally, for FitzRalph actual knowledge is really distinct from the species in memory, i.e., there is a real distinction between the powers.

The topic was a traditional one but FitzRalph’s treatment shows how such a tradition was capable of renewal in the light of contemporary developments, such as the debate regarding the distinction between the mind and its powers and that between the powers itself, as well as the species in memoria.

5.2 Species theory

In the Lectura Book II, q. 1, a. 2, Whether motion and time are really distinct, FitzRalph makes a digression while defending the species in medio theory and refers to a respected person (valens) who had argued against the theory. He also tells us that he himself once shared a similar opinion and gives the reason why:

It seems to me that if those people are not aware that the species in their eyes are just like the sounds in their ears, then they will not believe that such things [as species] exist but will say that sight is seeing and that hearing is hearing and that illuminated air is light – and I once heard a very respected person (valens) say exactly this. Others say that every colour is light and that every taste is a mixture of the prime qualities and that every smell is taste – as indeed I believed once, holding that nothing existed except the five prime qualities, namely the four elemental qualities and light … .

The valens in question could well be Ockham, since FitzRalph was old enough to have heard him speak before the former left Oxford in 1324 (Maier 1959: 16). (Maier also discusses FitzRalph’s text in the context of the later debate regarding primary and secondary qualities). Nor was FitzRalph alone in defending the theory of the species in medio: “Ockham’s attack on the species elicited an almost immediate and prolonged negative response.” (Tachau 1982: 395). Ockham’s position was criticized by John of Reading and also by Walter Chatton, Robert Holcot, William Crathorn and Wodeham. Thus, FitzRalph found himself in the company of many who would normally be seen as close to the position of Ockham. As Tachau concludes (1982: 443), “in epistemology at any rate, there seems at Oxford to have been no school of Ockhamistae.”

However, with FitzRalph’s treatment of the topic there seems to be a shift from a concern with the species in medio to the species in memoria. This change of emphasis seems to have influenced the manner in which the topic as treated by Holcot and especially Crathorn, the latter devoting much of his treatment to an analysis of FitzRalph’s arguments (Dunne 2012; both Holcot and Crathorn lectured on the Sentences in the years 1330–32 around the time when FitzRalph was magister regens).

5.3 The will and its relation to the intellect

Tachau (2013: 82) writes that on Leff’s interpretation, FitzRalph reached for a moderate if not mediocre position, rejecting both Aquinas’s “doctrine” of the intellect’s superiority and Scotus’s decision in favor of the will’s “primacy,” instead “contrapos[ing] his own opinio media” (Leff 1963: 97). On the issue of which of the two mental faculties, will or intellect, is superior, Scotus’s “view of the will as a power superior to the intellect … appealed to FitzRalph personally,” in Walsh’s judgment, but he deemed Aquinas’s support for the opposite ranking “more authoritative.” Walsh gained the impression that FitzRalph’s position was somehow untenable, so much so that “Wodeham took him to task for trying to have things both ways” (Walsh 1981: 60).

Tachau (2013: 85) points out that what Wodeham actually says is that “the will truly is not nobler than the intellect nor vice versa and note that FitzRalph holds the same.” FitzRalph recognized that the various distinctions (real, formal, intentional, or of reason) that previous scholastic generations had drawn among the intellective and sensitive substances of the soul, or its “faculties,” or the faculties’ diverse acts and habits, were problematic; yet, he also pointed to significant philosophical and theological impediments that would arise from denying all distinctions, obstacles that neither he nor his contemporaries had entirely satisfactory means of eluding (Tachau 2013: 92). So if there were no distinction whatsoever between the intellectual soul’s faculties of will and intellect, then presumably a cognition of any given object, as an act of the intellect, would be identical to the will’s volition regarding the same object. To accept this conclusion, however, would introduce numerous complications into any theory of whether and how God reveals future contingents and lead to untenable consequences (Tachau 2013: 93).

Michałowska (2023) shows the level of engagement by FitzRalph in the voluntarist debate and notes that his interest moved towards a Scotistic oriented version of voluntarism. FitzRalph’s clear stance is that the will is active and free with regard to volitions that are the acts of the will in the proper sense (2023:15). One of the many arguments looked at by Michałowska takes on the analysis of Book I, q. 10, a. 1 “Whether the will is active or passive with respect to its action” and shows FitzRalph rejecting the passivity of the will by arguing that if that were the case, any sin would be involuntary. The acting of the will is compared to the moving of an object where there must be a cause of movement, so every change of will must be initiated by a preceding movement which is ultimately traced back to the will itself. On the other hand, FitzRalph distinguishes between intrinsic and extrinsic acts where the will is the cause of its intrinsic acts but is not the immediate and active cause of any external act. The will is only the cause of the external acts in a mediated way. The will freely and actively causes its own volitions which then set up another chain of acts, the external ones which remain outside of the will. As Michałowska notes (2023: 111), this distinction is to be found in Duns Scotus who proves the freedom of the will towards its effects by means of showing that the will can act indirectly using other powers.

Another example mentioned by FitzRalph is where the will is not regarded as active but as a recipient. The will needs something to either will or nill, as when the will is exposed to an object worthy of desire which through the mediating role of the intellect produces an appetite in the soul that affects the will. However, neither the appetite nor the intellect is the proper or sufficient cause of the willing or nilling of the will. For FitzRalph the will cannot be coerced by bodily affections or appetites. There are a number of dilemmas that arise from FitzRalph’s position, even if these are sometimes ignored by him. For instance, the freedom of the will requires that the will is contingent because otherwise its willing would be necessary. However, if it is a contingent cause, then something else might be the cause of its acts. Another problem which FitzRalph examines is the possibility, or otherwise, of the synchronic and diachronic contingency of the will, by asking whether it is possible to will and nill the same act at the same time. FitzRalph rejects the concept of synchronic contingency with regard to the will’s internal acts (willing and nilling the same thing) but does accept the possibility of the will producing simultaneously contrary acts that are external, such as loving and hating the same thing. In the end, concludes Michałowska, FitzRalph is happy to sacrifice the concept of synchronic contingency in favour of a diachronic contingency (2023: 115–116) in order to safeguard the freedom of the activity of the will.

5.4. God as the Agent Intellect

In the Lectura there is a series of articles which deal with matters closely related to the question on the human mind as an image of the Trinity but which clearly were not integrated when FitzRalph presumably abandoned the editing process when he became Chancellor of Oxford University. These articles are of interest in their own right since in them we see FitzRalph engaged in a long debate with both certain quodlibets of Henry of Ghent and the Commentary on the De Anima of Averroes. One of these articles is entitled “Whether the Agent Intellect is a certain part of the Image.” Somewhat unexpectedly, at the end of the article FitzRalph, in a way reminiscent of Bonaventure, asserts that the Agent Intellect is God, or that the Agent Intellect is not a certain part of the image but is the First Form or God. This seems to place FitzRalph in an earlier tradition, going back even to William of Auvergne and Robert Grosseteste and a return to an earlier Augustinianism.

6. Philosophical Theology

6.1 Proving God’s existence

The first question of Book I of the Lectura, is “Whether the wayfarer can know that God exists by means of philosophical proof,” and a number of arguments are presented, six against and six for. He tells us how he will deal with the problem: firstly, he will deal with the question as to whether the existence of God as such can be known and then, secondly, whether one can have both faith and knowledge of the same thing at the same time. Then, thirdly, he will examine the various authorities. This is the basic structure followed in the rest of the Lectura, even if FitzRalph did not always reorganize his material fully in this manner, since sometimes individual articles remain on their own or questions are left unresolved. FitzRalph quotes the views of Henry of Ghent on demonstrating the existence of God, but he accepts the position of Aquinas. Again, regarding whether God’s existence is self-evident or not, he follows Aquinas. There then follows a long and elaborate treatment of the ontological argument but, curiously, no form of a cosmological argument is to be found in his writings. It must be surmised that the latter was not the focus of debate in Oxford at this time.

6.2 Divine omnipotence

Leff judged that it was Ockham and his followers who pushed the consequences of the discontinuity between faith and reason to often irreverent conclusions in the debate on the potentia Dei. Thus, thinkers such as Robert Holcot and Adam of Wodeham seem to show a sheer fascination with the paradoxes open to God in his absolute power, a fascination that led them to positions which were hardly in keeping with traditional Christian teaching. FitzRalph opposes such views by appealing to the Augustinian tradition. God’s potentia absoluta merely refers to God’s ability to act outside the present dispensation. Furthermore, God’s omnipotence entails his inability to sin and to deceive, just as it also excludes his dying. In other words, what God cannot do is to act against his own nature: God cannot be other than the summum bonum. God’s power does not consist simply and solely of doing anything whatsoever; his limit is not just his freedom from contradicting himself, as others held—rather it is his own nature. Since God is most good, most merciful and most just, his omnipotence must be in accordance with these aspects of his nature. For God to act otherwise would not be a sign of omnipotence but of impotence, since it would involve a denial or negation of his own nature. Thus, what is possible from the point of view of omnipotence taken in itself, is impossible from the point of view of God’s goodness, mercy and justice, and thus impossible not by reason of his power (ratione potentie) but by reason of his justice or goodness (ratione iustitie vel bonitatis).

6.3 Divine Foreknowledge and future contingents

One of the topics which exercised the minds of FitzRalph and his contemporaries was the topic of the revelation of future contingents. Indeed, FitzRalph discussed it on three separate occasions. His first treatment occurs in the Sentences commentary, where he considers the matter so important that he promises his audience he will return to it. He kept this promise a few months later when he gave his Quaestio biblica before he left for Paris in October 1329 (Genest 1991). Again, he returned to the problem in his Summa de quaestionibus Armenorum, where the matter is treated in a dialogue form.

The specific way in which FitzRalph addresses the problem is in terms of the revelation of future contingents. Given that future contingents have a determinate truth—namely, that they will happen and cannot not happen—how can their truth, as known by God, be revealed by him to a created intellect without their losing their contingency? As Leff points out, the problem as set out by his contemporaries was whether God’s knowledge of the future was different from that of the present and the past (Leff 1963: 40). According to Wodeham, Buckingham and Holcot, God’s knowledge about the future must be related to the contingency of the future and, therefore, this knowledge is of a different kind from God’s knowledge of the past and present. FitzRalph accepts the distinction, seeking to defend his position as being consonant with Augustine in the 83 Questions and De Trinitate. It was, in fact, a position rejected by Bradwardine and Gregory of Rimini.

From the sources which we have, FitzRalph is the first to devote an entire question to the problem of the revelation of future contingents and it is no less remarkable that it is six times the length of his question on divine foreknowledge (Genest 1991: 240). Again, FitzRalph’s treatment of the topic marks a turning point in the history of the problem, as is clear from comparing it what Ockham had written on the topic just before 1324 (in his Quodlibet IV, qu. 4). Whereas Ockham dealt with the problem in 800 words, FitzRalph—in a sign of the growing complexity of the problem—writes 20,000 words on the matter. While Ockham sought to remove all necessity from the proposition, “This was revealed”, by seeking to disassociate it from any temporal implication on God’s part, FitzRalph, without contesting this thesis (then nearly universally accepted), has to resolve a series of difficulties that this thesis leaves open. Against the possibility of a revelation of the future, FitzRalph lists fourteen arguments, which Genest examines in some detail. One of the central themes that emerge is a disjunction between the certitude of revelation and the conditions of acting for a creature, conditions which presuppose that in order to be free, there must be a certain ignorance of the future on the part of the creature. To take but one example: if God reveals to a just man that he will be damned, should he pray for his salvation? FitzRalph makes a distinction between a prophesy through which people are deceived, on the one hand, and lying on the other; thus a person may be deceived by the prophesy and yet God did not lie to them.

For FitzRalph God is good and does not act arbitrarily or irrationally. The revelation of free actions is contingent so that, if God should reveal to someone that he will be ultimately damned, this cannot relate to the person’s present state of grace but to actions freely undertaken in the future. This is because, for FitzRalph, if someone were to act necessarily, his or her actions would be neither just nor unjust. Someone might freely sin even if the future consequences were revealed to him, but that does not mean that he is compelled to sin.

With the exception of the final argument, all of the quod nons are based upon “cases” or particular circumstances (in isto casu, in casu posito) (Genest 1991: 242–3). Some are examples taken from Scripture, others we might call scholastic “thought experiments,” but most of them are accompanied by cases of conscience. According to Genest, many of them had already been put forward by his predecessors and many are to be found in the Lectura of the Franciscan John of Rodington, who read the Sentences at roughly the same time as FitzRalph; Rodington’s treatment is briefer, however (Genest 1991: 243). The stock of hypotheses must have been more or less complete when FitzRalph composed his question, but it is the breadth of the treatment which marks FitzRalph’s text as an important witness to the debate at Oxford at the end of the 1320s. A sign of this importance is the attention given to FitzRalph’s text by Wodeham in his Lectura oxoniensis (1333–1334), where he devotes five long questions to the topic (Sent. III, qu. 5–9). Again, when Holcot came to deal with the matter, he practically repeated what FitzRalph had said.

6.4 Predestination and Free Will

John Wycliff paid tribute to both Thomas Bradwardine and FitzRalph as the two Oxford teachers upon whom he relied most. However, on the question of predestination and free will, Wycliff followed Bradwardine and not FitzRalph. Wycliff’s position on predestination contrasted sharply with FitzRalph’s efforts to reconcile free will with a moderate acceptance of divine predestination. This might serve to explain why Wycliff quoted from the De Pauperie Salvatoris on dominion and from the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum on a wider range of theological issues, but he never refers to the Lectures on the Sentences. FitzRalph’s strong emphasis on the primacy of the will in the Lectures was of little use to Wycliff when he was working out his position, nor was FitzRalph it seems free from all traces of the doctrine that Bradwardine was to describe as ‘Pelagian’.

In the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum XV–XVII, FitzRalph turned to topics of free will and predestination being concerned with what he regarded as a new heresy being spread in the schools. In language more violent than anything found before the mendicant controversy, he expressed his horror at the new teaching, which he calls a ‘diabolical knowledge’. Although Bradwardine was not the object of FitzRalph’s attack, it seems to be written in response to disciples of Bradwardine who had espoused an extreme form of predestinarianism from a reading of the De Causa Dei. Predestinarianism reduces eternal salvation or damnation to the sovereign will of God alone and excludes free will as a secondary factor in determining man’s future state. Against an absolute determinism FitzRalph held that the punishment of the damned was just inasmuch as ‘their sin or its futurity was the reason from eternity why God willed to damn the wicked and not the contrary’ (Summa, XVI, 12) and defended the free human choice. Although the background to the debate is clearly Augustinian (see City of God, V:10), it is interesting to note that FitzRalph in the Summa seeks also to justify his position on the basis of Scripture.

7. Ethics and Political Theory: Dominium

After FitzRalph’s death his fame and influence grew among those who wished to reform the Church. His anti-mendicant polemic meant that he was often referred to in Middle-English Lollard literature. He was quoted extensively by Wycliff. His Defensio Curatorum was printed several times in the late fifteenth century and is the only work by an Irishman to be published as an incunabulum. John of Trevisa translated it into Middle English. Printings of this work continued in the following two centuries. Through the work of Ussher, Wadding and others, the memory of FitzRalph was kept alive in the first half of the seventeenth century.

One topic in which FitzRalph was to have an influence was that of his teaching on dominium, or lordship. In his dialogue De pauperie Salvatoris (1356), FitzRalph argued that grace alone entitled a person to lordship over temporal things. Some centuries later Lutherans thinkers, held that rights and hence the authority of secular rulers, were dependent on God’s grace. Thus, if a ruler was a heretic or a sinner his laws could not be binding in conscience – only a righteous ruler could be a just legislator. An unrighteous ruler could be deposed; and such ‘unrighteous’ included unbelievers.

The Council of Constance met between 1414 and 1418 at which Wyclif and Hus are condemned. Wyclif’s views on dominium are condemned but FitzRalph escapes censure. The acts of the Council are made public and printed in 1500. FitzRalph’s Defensio Curatorum is printed at Louvain in 1475 and his Summa de Questionibus Armenorum in 1515.

The circulation of these newly printed works seems to have occasioned a revival of interest in FitzRalph’s ideas. Firstly Jacques Almain in his Question at Vespers of March 1512 (published in 1518) engages with FitzRalph’s views on natural dominion with regard to taking from another in times of necessity.

In his On the Civil Power, Francisco de Vitoria (ca. 1485–1546) asked whether non-Christians have legitimate sovereigns in view of the Spanish discovery of the ‘New World’. He states: ‘Richard FitzRalph, archbishop of Armagh, a man of otherwise blameless character and intelligence, certainly argues in his De pauperitate Saluatoris that not merely unbelief but any mortal sin impedes any kind of power or dominion (dominium) or jurisdiction, either public or private; in the mistaken belief that the true title and foundation of all power is grace.’ Vitoria fought against the notion of dominium through grace since, as a consequence, Christians would be entitled to take the lands, wealth and property from the native Americans, because Christians could and should exercise dominium over all unbelievers and over the whole world. This, of course, would render natural rights, or those which belong to human beings precisely because they are human, null and void. It was natural law theory which enabled de Vitoria to mount an impressive argument against this position. I think that if we consider FitzRalph’s intentions in developing his theory of dominion, he would have reacted strongly against the injustice perpetrated by later upholders of grace-based dominium. Whatever his polemical and sometimes extreme positions such as he writings against the Franciscans, he had put forward a principle which was intended to bring some measure of justice into law and to deal with the ‘sinfulness’ of the Franciscan poverty-fiction and he would never have ended up with defending laws without a principle of justice regarding first nation peoples in the Americas in the sixteenth century and later.

8. The Poverty Controversy

FitzRalph was not the first medieval secular author to write against the Friars but in terms of the threat they posed to organisation of the Church, particularly at the level of the local parish and the administration of the sacraments, he had much in common with writers such as Henry of Ghent and with his mentor John de Grandisson. The latter as Bishop of Exeter demolished mendicant chapels erected without permission in his diocese. FitzRalph’s Defensio Curatorum, preached at Avignon in 1357, was already translated by John Trevisa in 1380 ensuring that it had an influence over the centuries among those communities in England calling for a reform of the Church. For example, the protestant John Foxe’s Book of Martyrs from 1570 contains a full chapter dedicated to FitzRalph. It is important to note that FitzRalph was not opposed to monasticism, nor was he vehemently against other mendicants such as the Dominicans who had acknowledged that even for mendicants some ownership was necessary. The focus, however, for his polemical attacks was the Franciscans who maintained that they could renounce natural dominium and that in so doing they were perfectly following the gospel (vita evangelica ac perfecta). The latter potentially was a revolutionary indictment of the institutional Church of which FitzRalph was an archbishop because the clear implication was that only the complete renunciation of property would allow one to live according to Christ’s teaching. In the end FitzRalph would denounce the Franciscan stance that they did not possess anything but only had the use of it, by stating that no one could renounce original ownership or natural dominium. Riley (2023: 360–61) points out that in order to combat what FitzRalph saw as the erroneous views of the mendicants, he had first to set out a correct understanding of poverty. A significant part of FitzRalph’s teaching is his assertion in the eighth and final book of the De Pauperie Salvatoris that Christ worked as a carpenter and that poverty for FitzRalph was not equated with misery, a clear challenge to the Franciscan view that Christ had been a beggar who owned nothing and embraced poverty, instructing his followers to do likewise. This assertion was the particular focus of the work against FitzRalph by the English Franciscan, William Woodford. Nor was the personification of Christ as a working man followed by Wyclif, whose views on the poverty of Christ are actually closer to those of his Franciscan opponents such as Woodford. Riley has analysed the typology of poverty as outlined by FitzRalph where he states that poverty can be respectable but neediness (egestas) is shameful; thus, Christ could not have been a beggar since he would have acted in a shameful manner. There is also the case of the deserving poor such as widows and orphans who can rightly ask for alms but these are the people that the mendicants take from when they beg. Instead, FitzRalph holds that Christ would have worked for his livelihood and though poor, he was not destitute and did not beg. FitzRalph here puts forward a generalised appreciation of the nature of work and the worker. In the end, poverty is morally neutral and material poverty does not confer spiritual authority.

9. Influence and Afterlife

Already in his own lifetime, the Lectura on the Sentences was quoted by every major author in the fourteenth century, beginning with Wodeham and Holcot at Oxford and then figures such as Gregory of Rimini, Hugolino of Orvieto and John Hiltalingen of Basel (Augustinian Hermits) and Cistercians such as Jean de Mirecourt and Peter Ceffons (Schabel 2023a). Through the mediation of Augustinian sources FitzRalph’s thought reached Vienna either through Henry of Langenstein or Conrad of Ebrach. Nicholas of Dinkelsbühl adopted FitzRalph’s position on the filioque which became the basis of the view of the Faculty of Theology at Vienna. In fact, FitzRalph’s views on the Greeks remains an influence down until the Council of Florence (1438–45). The association with Wyclif keeps interest in FitzRalph alive in English circles down to the publication of FitzRalph’s De Pauperie Salvatoris (Books I–IV) by R. Lane Poole (1890) together with Wyclif’s De Dominio Divino. An important early reception of this association between FitzRalph and Wyclif is among the Hussites in Bohemia (Lahey 2023) where the link between the two was seen as much closer than in reality. FitzRalph was not an author that figured in the debates at the Charles University at Prague in 1420 but especially after the death of Hus, Wyclif receded into the background and FitzRalph comes to the fore since Wyclif had been formally condemned as a heretic. However, FitzRalph is usually quoted inadequately or out of context to support ideas which were really those of Wyclif. Regarding the vexed question of the clerical ownership of property, it was agreed at the Council of Basel that all must recognise that while the Church might exercise civil dominium over temporal goods, the goods of the Church are but a means by which the clergy can carry out their ministry. This was in fact, the situation as described by FitzRalph in De Pauperie Salvatoris VI and, as Lahey concludes (Lahey 2023: 401), somebody had been reading up on their FitzRalph and used him to effect the compromise.


Primary Sources

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  • –––, Defensio curatorum in Melchior Goldast, ed., Monarchia s. Romani imperii (Frankfurt: 1612), ii. 1393–1410 and Edward Brown, ed., Fasciculus rerum expetendarum ac fugiendarum (London: 1690), ii: 466–86.
  • –––, Propositio Unusquisque in L.L. Hammerich, “The Beginning of the Strife between Richard FitzRalph and the Mendicants, with an Autobiographical Prayer and his Proposition Unusquisque,” in Det kon: Danskes videnskabernes selskab: historisk-filologiske meddelelser, 26.3 (Copenhagen: 1938): 3–85, 18–22.
  • –––, Trevisa, J. Dialogus inter militem et clericum ; Richard FitzRalph’s sermon “Defensio curatorum” ; and, Methodius : “þe bygynnyng of þe world and þe ende of worldes” (London: Published for the Early English Text Society by H. Milford, Oxford University Press, 1925).

Secondary Literature

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  • Dunne, Michael W. and Simon Nolan (eds.), 2013a, Richard FitzRalph: His Life, Thought and Times, Dublin: Four Courts Press.
  • –––, 2023, A Companion to Richard FitzRalph: Fourteenth-Century Scholar, Archbishop and Polemicist, Leiden: Brill (Brill’s Companions to the Christian Tradition 105).
  • Dunne, M. W., 2024, “Richard FitzRalph on Contradictory Appetites (Appetitus Contrarii): An Unfinished Debate,” in Calculating Ethics in the Fourteenth Century, E. A. Lukács and M. Michałowska (eds.), 44–68, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2023a “Mind as a Trinity of Intellect, Memory and Will,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 62–100, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2023b, “Hybernicus contra Thomam. Richard FitzRalph on the Will and His Critique of Aquinas on the Primacy of the Intellect over the Will,” in Willing and Understanding: Late Medieval Debates on the Will, the Intellect and Practical Knowledge, M. Michałowska and R. Ferdriga (eds.), 191–209, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2022a, “Richard FitzRalph on the Religious Other: Avignonian Intersections between Christians, Muslims and Tatars”, in Encountering Others, Understanding Ourselves in Medieval and Early Modern Thought, N. Faucher and V. Mäkinen (eds.), 41–54, Berlin–Boston: De Gruyter.
  • –––, 2022b, Richard FitzRalph on Toleration,” in Tolerance and Concepts of Otherness in Medieval Philosophy, M. W. Dunne and Susan Gottloeber (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols.
  • –––, 2019, “Richard FitzRalph: New Perspectives,” in Philosophy in Ireland. Past Actualities and Present Challenges, S. Gottloeber (ed.), Newcastle: Cambridge Scholars Publishing.
  • –––, 2013, “John Foxholes OFM Armachanus (†1474): A Note on his Logical Treatises Formerly Attributed to FitzRalph”, in M. Dunne and S. Nolan (eds.), Richard FitzRalph: His Life, Thought and Times, Dublin: Four Courts Press, 199–203.
  • –––, 2012, “Richard FitzRalph on the human mind as a trinity of memory, understanding and will”, in Universalità della Ragione. Pluralità delle Filosofie nel Medioevo Universalité de la Raison. Pluralité des Philosophies au Moyen Âge Universality of Reason. Plurality of Philosophies in the Middle Ages. XII Congresso Internazionale di Filosofia Medievale. Palermo, 17–22 settembre 2007 a cura di Alessandro Musco e di Carla Compagno – Salvatore D’Agostino – Giuliana Musotto, Volume II.1, 443–450.
  • –––, 2010, “Richard FitzRalph’s Lectura on the Sentences”, in P. Rosemann (ed.), Mediaeval Commentaries on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, Leiden: Brill, Volume 2, 405–438.
  • –––, 2008, “Richard FitzRalph on Time, Motion and Infinity”, Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum, 37: 1–12.
  • –––, 2004, “Richard FitzRalph of Dundalk (c. 1300–1360) and the New World”, Archivium Hibernicum, 58: 243–58.
  • –––, 2001, “A fourteenth-century example of an Introitus Sententiarum at Oxford: Richard FitzRalph’s Inaugural Speech in praise of the Sentences of Peter Lombard”, Medieval Studies, 63: 1–29.
  • Genest, J.-F., 1991, “Contingence et révélation des futurs: La Quaestio biblica de Richard FitzRalph”, in J. Jolivet (ed.), Lectionum varietates: hommage à Paul Vignaux, Paris: Vrin, 199–246.
  • –––, 2023, “Richard FitzRalph and Future Contingents”, in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 272–292, Leiden: Brill.
  • Gwynn, A., 1933, “Richard FitzRalph, Archbishop of Armagh”, Studies: An Irish Quarterly Review, 25(97): 81–96.
  • Hammerich, L. L., 1938, “The Beginning of the Strife between Richard FitzRalph and the Mendicants, with an edition of his autobiographical prayer and his proposition Unusquisque”, Det Kgl. Danske Viderskabernes Selskab. Hist.-filologiske Meddelelser, 26: 3–85.
  • Haren, M. J., 2023, “Richard FitzRalph and the Friars: Emergence and Course of the Conflict,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 323–351, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 1998, “Richard FitzRalph and the Friars: The Intellectual Itinerary of a Curial Controversialist”, in J. Hamesse (ed.), Roma, Magistra Mundi. Itineraria Culturae Medievalis. Mélanges offerts au P. L.E. Boyle, Turnhout: Brepols, Volume 1, 349–367.
  • Jung, E., 2023, “Controversy and Infinity between Richard FitzRalph and Richard Kilvington,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 121–153, Leiden: Brill.
  • Lahey, Stephen E., 2003, Philosophy and Politics in the Thought of John Wyclif, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2023, “Dominium – FitzRalph at Basel,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 383–404, Leiden: Brill.
  • Leff, G., 1963, Richard FitzRalph: Commentator of the Sentences. A Study in Theological Orthodoxy, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Maier, A., 1959, Aus der Grenze von Scholastik und Naturwissenschaft, Rome: Edizione di Storia e Letteratura.
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  • Nolan, S., 2023, “Views from the Sixteenth to the Twentieth Centuries,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 427–463, Leiden: Brill.
  • Riley, B., 2023, “Wyclif, the Lollards and the Middle English Tradition – Incorporations and Rejections of FitzRalph’s Views,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 352–382, Leiden: Brill.
  • Schabel, C., 2023a, “Richard FitzRalph vs William Skelton, 1331–1332: The Attribution of the ”Determinationes“ in a Florence Manuscript,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 208–271, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2023b, “The Continental Reception of FitzRalph’s Philosophical Theology until the Council of Florence,” in M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), A Companion to Richard FitzRalph, 405–426, Leiden: Brill.
  • Tachau, Katherine H., 2013, “Adam Wodeham and Robert Holcot as Witnesses to FitzRalph’s Thought”, in M. Dunne and S. Nolan (eds.), Richard FitzRalph: His Life, Thought and Times, Dublin: Four Courts Press, 79–95.
  • –––, 1982, “The Problem of the Species in Medio at Oxford in the Generation after Ockham”, Mediaeval Studies, 44: 394–443.
  • Walsh, K., 1981, A Fourteenth-Century Scholar and Primate: Richard FitzRalph in Oxford, Avignon and Armagh, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

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