Supplement to Formal Epistemology

Example of polarization in the O’Connor-Weatherall model

Description of video: A collection of 20 circles is shown; each circle represents one doctor’s credence. Each circle is confined to a horizontal line, running from credence 0.0 on the left to credence 1.0 on the right. The midpoint 0.5 is marked by a vertical line. Initially, the circles are all coloured either green or blue. Those to the left of the 0.5 midpoint are green, those to the right are blue. As the animation plays, the circles slide left or right. When a circle crosses to the right of the 0.5 midpoint it turns blue; when it crosses to the left it turns green. Meanwhile a counter labeled ‘Epoch’ starts from 0 and counts up. Before long some circles at the far left turn red, indicating that they are too far from the blue circles to trust them. Occasionally a blue circle will move left and come close enough to the red circles to turn them green again. But, over time, the circles settle into two groups: blue ones at the far right, and red ones on the left. At the end of the animation (epoch 25), there are 6 blue circles located at the far right, and 14 red circles scattered around toward the left end, between roughly 0.0 and 0.3. (For the most part, the 6 finally blue circles are ones that started out closer to the right. But there are some exceptions: 3 of the finally red circles started out even closer to the right than others that ended up blue.)

Copyright © 2021 by
Jonathan Weisberg <>

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