François Poulain de la Barre

First published Thu Oct 3, 2019

François Poulain de la Barre (1648–1723) is known for his treatises De l’égalité des deux sexes [On the Equality of the Two Sexes] (1673), De l’éducation des dames [On the Education of Ladies] (1674) and De l’excellence des hommes [On the Excellence of Men] (1675). Despite its name the third treatise continues his defense of equality between the sexes by overturning rhetorically presented arguments on the behalf of the excellence of men. Together the three books constitute one of the most detailed analyses of the subjugation of women written in the seventeenth century.

Poulain’s thought was deeply influenced by René Descartes’ philosophy. He used Descartes’ methods of doubt and right reasoning in order to reject prejudices about the inferiority of women and his arguments in defense of the equality of the sexes use many insights drawn from Descartes’ account of the nature of the human being. After an introductory biographical sketch, this entry will first examine the Cartesian foundations of Poulain’s thought and then proceed to a discussion of his analysis of the subjugation of women. Next, his four main arguments for the equality of the sexes are presented and evaluated. The entry closes with a brief discussion of Poulain’s direct and indirect relations to later developments in the history of feminist thought. Throughout, the aim is to present Poulain’s core ideas as well as examine their philosophical validity.

1. Life and Works

We know relatively little about the life of François Poulain (or Poullain) de la Barre. No correspondence or accounts by his contemporaries have survived. What we know has to be reconstructed from occasional surviving official documents and from supposedly autobiographical remarks in his writings. Accounts of Poulain’s life rely on archival research done in particular by Marie-Louise Stock (1961), Madeleine Alcover (1981), and Siep Stuurman (2004).

Poulain was born in Paris in 1648, as the third child to wealthy Catholic parents. As many younger sons he was destined for a church career and he earned his bachelor’s degree in theology at Sorbonne in 1666. This lower degree was generally considered sufficient for priesthood, but Poulain did not at this point of his life seek to be ordained and this decision, though temporary, is often connected with his growing interest in Cartesian philosophy (Stuurman 2004: 30). In his second main work De l’éducation des dames [On the Education of Ladies] (1674), a set of five conversations between a Cartesian teacher, a young man and two young women, Poulain describes how the teacher Stasimachus became a follower of René Descartes’ philosophy. Stasimachus tells his young interlocutors how, one day, when he found

all the sciences of the Schools particularly distasteful, by a great stroke of luck I allowed myself to be taken off by a friend to hear a Cartesian lecturing on a subject concerning the human body. (TTen 245; TTfr 281)

Fed on Scholastic prejudices against Cartesian philosophy, Stasimachus was initially suspicious and then

astonished to hear nothing but what was clear and intelligible, to realize that [the speaker] was reasoning on the basis of principles that were so simple and so true that I could not fail to agree with them. (TTen 245; TTfr 281–282)

As Stuurman points out, this description is a “streamlined conversion story”, of a type often repeated by followers of Descartes’ philosophy during the second half of the seventeenth century (Stuurman 2004: 35). Stasimachus’ conversion must not be read as Poulain’s autobiography, but we have strong grounds to assume that Poulain became interested in Cartesian philosophy while still a student and that his interest was connected to attending public lectures, such as those held in Paris by the Cartesian Jacques Rohault (Stuurman 2004: 43).

Scholars also agree that after leaving university, Poulain was teaching literature and a textbook on translating Latin into French, published anonymously in 1672, has been attributed to him (Stock 1961: 19–20; Welch 2002a: 9). In the following year he published De l’égalité des deux sexes [On the Equality of the Two Sexes] (1673), the first and most widely known of his three feminist treatises. One year later it was followed by De l’éducation des dames and in the next year by De l’excellence des hommes, contre l’égalité des sexes [On the Excellence of Men, against the Equality of the Sexes] (1675). Despite its name the third treatise continues Poulain’s defense of equality between the sexes by overturning his rhetorically presented arguments on the behalf of the excellence of men. This treatise is less Cartesian than the two earlier ones and more engaged with theological arguments. In this respect it resembles earlier treatises participating in the Renaissance querelle des femmes, the debate about the superiority of women versus men, such as Cornelius Agrippa’s De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus [On the Nobility and Preeminence of the Female Sex] (1509/1529).

At some point after publishing his three feminist treatises, Poulain returned to theology and he was ordained a Catholic priest in 1679. His decision to take up a church career after having written treatises heavily critical of Scholastic philosophy might seem odd. There is no doubt that Poulain used Cartesian arguments as a basis for his feminist claims and that he was critical of Scholasticism, but we must also note that his third treatise is in many respect a reconciliation between his feminism and theology. When reconstructing Poulain’s opinions we must be careful not to identify him too closely with the character Stasimachus. As Carol Pal has argued in the case of the friendship between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, with strong Cartesian sympathies, and Anna Maria van Schurman, who was in many respects a Scholastic thinker, it was not unusual that seventeenth-century intellectuals combined elements from the old and the new philosophy (Pal 2012: 250–254). It is quite possible that Poulain was less militant a convert to Cartesianism than his character Stasimachus.

After being ordained Poulain served as a curate in two parishes in Picardy, first in the medium-sized village La Flamengrie, from where he was transferred to the small village Versigny in 1685, possibly as the result of some disciplinary measure (Stuurman 2004: 239–240). In Picardy Poulain witnessed the persecution of Protestants and this is often interpreted as paving the way for his own conversion from Catholicism to Calvinism. He left his parish in 1688 and after a short stay in Paris, where his conversion is assumed to have taken place, he moved to Geneva, where he received the status of habitant in December 1689 (Stuurman 2004: 242–243). As a resident of Geneva, Poulain continued his earlier career teaching French and in 1690 he married Marie Ravier (d. 1742), with whom he had two children, Jean-Charlotte (1690–1716) and Jean-Jacques (1696–1751), a future Calvinist minister and follower of many of his father’s theological ideas (Welch 2002a: 17–20; Stuurman 2004: 245–246). Poulain published two more books, Essai des remarques particulières sur la langue françoise pour la ville de Genève [An Essay of detailed comments about the French language, for the city of Geneva] (1691), related to his career as a teacher, and La Doctrine des Protestans sur la liberté et le droit de lire l’Ecriture Sainte, etc. [Protestant Teaching about the Freedom and the Right to Read the Holy Scriptures, etc.] (1720), developing his mature theological opinions. He did earn a secure living in his chosen homeland, though he did not find the religious freedom he appears to have been hoping for. In 1693, and again in 1696, Poulain was accused for being a Socinian, an accusation that was related to his rationalistic approach to theology, which did not draw a strict distinction between theology and philosophy (Stuurman 2004: 248–249). This affair has been seen as the main reason why Poulain had to wait until 1708 before he was appointed to a permanent teaching position at the Collège de Genève, a position that he held until his death in 1723.

2. Cartesian Foundations

Poulain’s treatises De l’égalité des deux sexes and De l’éducation des dames are both profoundly influenced by Descartes’ philosophy, but in different ways. In the first treatise Descartes is not mentioned by name, but Poulain’s discussion of the equality between the sexes draws heavily on his philosophical method as well as his metaphysics. The second treatise discusses Cartesian philosophy in detail and the leading character Stasimachus is a proclaimed follower of Descartes, but the book itself is not as evidently relying on Descartes’ philosophical method. My discussion of Poulain’s Cartesian influences will draw on both treatises and I will first discuss the role of Cartesian method and then discuss to what extent Poulain adopted a Cartesian metaphysics.

2.1 Descartes’ method

At the very beginning of the preface to De l’égalité des deux sexes, Poulain writes that the

best idea that may occur to those who try to acquire genuine knowledge, if they were educated according to traditional methods, is to doubt if they were taught well and to wish to discover the truth themselves. As they make progress in this search for truth, they cannot avoid noticing that we are full of prejudices, and that it is necessary to get rid of them completely in order to acquire clear and distinct knowledge. (T1en 119; TTfr 53)[1]

This paragraph is an excellent summary of Descartes’ method for the search for truth as it is presented in all his major works. In the Discours de la méthode, for example, Descartes writes that

since I now wished to devote myself solely to the search for truth, I thought it necessary to […] reject as if absolutely false everything in which I could imagine the least doubt, in order to see if I was left believing anything that was entirely indubitable. (CSM I, 126–127; AT VI, 31–32)

It is notable that Poulain’s reference to the necessity of getting completely rid of prejudices follows the radical nature of Descartes’ doubt and its emphasis on rejecting everything as false, unless it is entirely indubitable. Poulain is true to Descartes’ terminology also at the end of the cited paragraph, where he refers to certain knowledge as “clear and distinct”. In Principia philosophiae (part I, § 45), Descartes emphasizes that in order to “serve as the basis for a certain and indubitable judgment” a perception needs to “be not merely clear but also distinct” (CSM I, 207; AT VIIIA, 22). By “clear” he means that “it is present and accessible to the attentive mind” and in order to be “distinct” it must, in addition to being clear, be “so sharply separated from all other perceptions that it contains within itself only what is clear” (CSM I, 208; AT VIIIA, 22).

In De l’éducation des dames Poulain extends his discussion of methodological doubt and attributes this method to Descartes. The character Stasimachus explains how no other author “has better discussed prejudice nor countered it more convincingly” (TTen 242; TTfr 277). The egalitarian aspect of Descartes’ method is also emphasized and Stasimachus points out that “almost all of us have enough reason and good sense to seek the truth”, which is found when “we have formed clear and distinct ideas” (ibid.). Poulain’s text is a very close echo of the first paragraph of Descartes’ Discours de la méthode, where he famously claims that

the power of judging well and of distinguishing the true from the false—which is what we properly call ‘good sense’ or ‘reason’—is naturally equal in all men. (CSM I, 111; AT VI, 2)

Poulain’s take on Descartes’ philosophy is explicitly methodological and he adds that Descartes is to be trusted because he provides the best “methods and principles” (TTen 242; TTfr 277). Adopting Descartes’ method means that one has to critically examine its author as well as other authors, and Stasimachus concludes his presentation by emphasizing that

I am not claiming that Descartes is infallible or that everything he proposed is true and unproblematic, or that one has to follow him blindly, or that others couldn’t find something as good or even better than he has left us. All I am saying is that I believe him to be one of the most reasonable philosophers we have, whose method is the most universal and the most natural, the one that most closely conforms to good sense and the nature of the human mind, and the most likely to distinguish the true from the false even in the works of the one who is their author. (TTen 243; TTfr 278)

In addition to Descartes’ method of doubt, Poulain also adopts his scientific method and his discussion of the order of the sciences, as it is presented in the preface to the French translation of Principia philosophiae (see also Pellegrin 2013; Reuter 2017: 34–37). Descartes famously compares the whole of philosophy, which is here understood as including all different forms of knowledge, to a tree, where the

roots are metaphysics, the trunk is physics, and the branches emerging from the trunk are all the other sciences, which may be reduced to three principal ones, namely medicine, mechanics and morals. (CSM I, 186; AT IXB, 14)

Descartes’ metaphor emphasizes the unity of the sciences and this idea is taken up by Poulain, who replaces the metaphor of a tree with that of the human body. In De l’éducation he writes that “there is a necessary relationship and dependence between all the sciences, quite similar to those between the different parts of the human body” (TTen 208; TTfr 239).

Poulain puts less emphasis than Descartes on the hierarchical structure of sciences implied by the original metaphor of a tree, but he does adopt Descartes’ emphasis on physics and in De l’égalité he uses the idea of the unity of the sciences in order to argue that women are as able as men to master all forms of knowledge. Here Poulain is arguing against those who claim that women are unable to hold civil offices and to rule over others and he points out that these people

fail to notice that the mind needs only discernment and accuracy in all its actions, and that anyone who displays these qualities in one context is capable of applying them as easily and in the same way to everything else. Morality and social science do not change the nature of our actions; the latter always remain physical, […] Once someone understands the laws of motion in natural philosophy, they can apply them to all changes and all variations that occur in nature. Similarly, if someone has once understood the true principles of the social sciences, they do not experience a new challenge when applying them to novel situations that occur. (T1en 174; TTfr 116–117)

Poulain does not seem to reduce knowledge of morality to knowledge of physics, but he emphasizes that there is a methodological unity, which makes it possible to compare the way in which true principles are applied in the natural and the social sciences. His argument criticizes the Scholastic tradition in two ways. First, he argues against the common view (originally presented by Aristotle) that since women’s deliberative faculty lacks sufficient authority, women have difficulties governing themselves and therefore cannot govern others (Aristotle, Politics 1260a12–14). Second, Poulain criticizes the idea, dominant among the Scholastics, that different forms of knowledge require different methods and that theoretical reasoning does not as such ground practical judgment (see Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics 1140b1–7, for the distinction between practical reason (fronesis) and theoretical knowledge). Defenders of women, who, like Christine de Pizan, wrote within the Aristotelian tradition, found it necessary to argue separately that women are as capable as men in their practical judgment as in their theoretical reasoning (see in particular Livre de la Cité des Dames [The Book of the City of Ladies], 1405, part I, chap. 43). Poulain’s argument is novel in its emphasis on the unity of science, from which it follows that if women are capable of theoretical reasoning, which was a less controversial claim, they are also capable of practical judgment. This argument is directly based on the criticism of Scholastic science that Descartes develops in the preface to the French translation of Principia philosophiae and which culminates in the idea of the unity of all the sciences (CSM I, 185–186; AT IXB, 12–14).

In Descartes’ metaphor, metaphysics constitutes the roots of the tree of philosophy and we must therefore assume that one cannot be a Cartesian philosopher without adopting Descartes’ metaphysics. Poulain did do so, though he was, as we will see in the next section, less profoundly influenced by it than by Descartes’ philosophical methodology.

2.2 Metaphysics

In the second part of De l’égalité, Poulain claims that “the mind has no sex” and loosely connects his claim to Descartes’ dualism (T1en 157–158; TTfr 99–100). The claim in itself was not new—we find it already in the theological doctrine of Augustine, who holds that the rational souls of women and men are equally created in the image of God (De trinitate XII 7.12), and in Poulain’s time it had recently been stated, with strong feminist emphasis, by Marie le Jars de Gournay (G-EMW 65; G-OC 978). Still, many of Poulain’s contemporaries as well as modern scholars agree that Descartes’ dualism strengthened the idea that the mind has no sex (different positions have been argued by Hoffmann 1969; Perry 1985; Harth 1992: 81–86; Atherton 1993; O’Neill 1999 and 2011; Broad 2002: 4–12 and 2017; Pellegrin 2011: 28–37 and 2019: 568–569; Reuter 2013 and 2019: 38–41; Detlefsen 2017). It might seem surprising that Poulain does not make more out of Descartes’ dualism than he actually does.

In the passage in question, Poulain points out that if “the mind is considered in itself, it […] have the same nature in all human beings” (T1en 158; TTfr 100). In order to consider the mind in itself one has to presuppose that it can in some respect be distinguished from the body, but Poulain does not discuss the metaphysical nature of the relation between mind and body. Instead he leaves the discussion of the mind considered in itself behind and focuses on the mind-body union, which he describes in the following words:

It is God who unites the mind with the body of a woman as with that of a man, and who unites them by means of the same laws. This union is established and maintained by sensations, passions, and acts of the will; and since the mind acts in the same way in both sexes, it is equally capable of the same things in both of them. (T1en 158; TTfr 101)

This description is indeed very close to the description Descartes gives in the Sixth Meditation, when he examines “what God has bestowed on me as a combination of mind and body” (CSM II, 57; AT VII, 82), but whereas Descartes begins this last Meditation by emphasizing the real distinction between mind and body, according to which it “is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it” (CSM II, 54; AT VII, 78), Poulain does not discuss the real distinction between mind and body before he focuses on their union.

Poulain’s focus on the mind-body union is continued in De l’éducation, where the fourth conversation stages a detailed discussion of self-knowledge. Here the young Timander, who is usually a spokesperson of Scholastic views, raises a significantly Cartesian objection. He points out that

it would be easier to begin with the study of the mind. For if it is easier for man to know himself and what immediately surrounds him than what is remote from him [as has been previously established], by the same token it seems that the mind would know itself better than it would know the body. (TTen 214; TTfr 246; see also Welch 2002b: 139)

Timander’s point resembles Descartes’ emphasis in the Second Meditation, where he begins by examining himself as a thinking thing (CSM II, 19; AT VII, 28), but rather than following this order of metaphysical inquiry, Stasimachus points out that though this is true

provided one can separate the mind from the body […] if we consider them a single, interdependent entity […] I am convinced that knowledge of the body should precede that of the mind. (TTen 214: TTfr 246)

Again, Poulain proceeds directly to a study of the mind-body union and here his reference to the distinction between mind and body is even more fleeting than in De l’égalité.

The lack of any explicit discussion of the soul as a distinct substance has led Desmond Clarke to argue that Poulain rejected Descartes’ notion of the soul as a substance and held this notion to be a mere Scholastic residue. According to Clarke, Poulain defended the view that the

union of the body and the soul and their reciprocal interdependence was a more fundamental datum of human experience than the speculative distinction of the soul as a scholastic substance. (Clarke 2013: 43)

Following the same line of inquiry Marie-Frédérique Pellegrin argues that for Poulain “anthropology is more decisive than metaphysics” (Pellegrin 2019: 576).

Poulain’s emphasis on the embodied aspect of human nature was not unique among his contemporary Cartesians, on the contrary, he shares it with Jacques Rohault and Louis de la Forge, for example, who are both mentioned in his list of suggested readings presented in De l’éducation (TTen 237; TTfr 272). Some influence is very likely and Clarke compares Poulain’s above cited account of the mind-body union in De l’égalité with the account de la Forge gives in his Traitté de l’Esprit de l’Homme [Treatise on the Human Mind] (1666) (T1en 158n45). Still, we must note that while stressing the union, de la Forge’s account was firmly anchored in substance dualism and his aim was to address—within a strictly Cartesian framework—unsolved problems related to the operations of the mind and the interaction between mind and body (Drieux 2019).

Poulain’s unorthodox Cartesianism is most evident when he describes the relation between individual thoughts and the body. In De l’éducation, Poulain writes that “all the actions of the mind […] depend on the participation of the body” and a few pages later, less rigorously, that “one almost never acts without the other” (TTen 213, 223; TTfr 244, 256). These claims overlook the distinction Descartes makes between the actions and the passions of the mind, according to which passions depend on the body whereas actions, such as volitions, do not (CSM I, 335; AT XI, 342–343; for more detail see Reuter 2013: 79–82). Poulain does acknowledge the distinction between volitions and passions in one passage in De l’égalité, where he writes:

As for the causes that quicken the passions, we can understand their workings as soon as we have studied physics sufficiently to understand how the things that surround us affect us and influence us, and through experience and use how we can yoke our will to them or dissociate it from them. (TTen 84; TTfr 102; see also Broad 2017: 76)

This passage relies on Descartes’ dualism by distinguishing between the passions, that are dependent on the body, and the will, that is free to either yoke or dissociate itself. But again there is no further discussion and Poulain seems to be unaware of the metaphysical dimension of the distinction he makes.

Poulain does not seem to hold that there is a necessary dependence of mind upon body. He is not explicitly arguing for a materialist alternative to Descartes’ dualism, but rather emphasizing the interdependence between mind and body, without taking an explicit stand on what kind of metaphysical foundation this interaction requires. Poulain was young when he wrote his feminist treatises and though he was evidently familiar with a wide range of Cartesian topics, it is possible that he was not very deeply read in the Cartesian corpus. Compared to other Cartesians such as Rohault, de la Forge, Nicolas Malebranche, and Antoine Arnauld, Poulain did not contribute by examining unsolved problems in Descartes’ physics and metaphysics. Instead, his unrivalled contribution lies in his Cartesian analyses of the moral, political, physical, and metaphysical relations between the sexes.

3. The Subjugation of Women

Poulain’s analysis of the subjugation of women combines a Cartesian criticism of prejudice with a historical analysis of the origin of these prejudiced opinions.

3.1 The role of prejudice

Right at the beginning of the first part of De l’égalité, Poulain compares prejudice concerning the sexes to other equally persistent, but unjustified beliefs. First, he points out that apart

from a few scholars, everyone thinks that it is indubitable that the Sun moves around the Earth, despite the fact that what we observe in the revolutions of the days and the years leads those who examine it to believe that it is the Earth that moves around the Sun. (T1en 122; TTfr 59)

Second, he refers to people, who imagine that animals are intelligent beings guided by reason, just

like primitive people who suppose that there are little souls inside the clocks and machines that they are shown though they know nothing about their construction or their inner springs. (T1en 122–123; TTfr 59)

Finally, and perhaps most interestingly, Poulain refers to social prejudices, which cause people to believe that their own country is the best, because it is most familiar, and

that the religion in which they were reared is the true religion that must be followed, even if they may never have thought of examining it or comparing it with other religious traditions. (T1en 123; TTfr 60)

These social prejudices also include beliefs concerning wealth and rank, and Poulain points out that “the unequal distribution of goods and offices causes many people to conclude that human beings are not equal to each other” (ibid.).

Poulain’s comparisons place his analysis of the relations between the sexes in the framework of new science, including both astronomy and mechanistic explanations of the animal body, as well as in the framework of current ideas about religious freedom and human equality. He claims that when properly examined, the equality of the sexes should be as evident as the newly established fact that the earth moves around the sun.

Poulain continues by emphasizing that when one examines the foundations of prejudice one finds that these beliefs are based on mere self-interest and custom. Interestingly, he is also quite aware that beliefs based on prejudice are more difficult to change than beliefs based on reason. He points out that when

someone’s opinion is based only on prejudice, it is incomparably more difficult to change their minds than if they had been convinced by reasons that seem strong and persuasive to them. (T1en 123; TTfr 60)

People can make mistakes when they think that they have strong evidence to believe what they believe, but people who make this kind of mistakes are more prone to change their minds when they encounter new evidence than people who hold untrue beliefs based on prejudice (for an excellent discussion of Poulain’s Cartesian analysis of prejudice, see Schmitter 2018; also Fraisse 1985). The persistance of prejudice is an important insight, which is still very relevant for discussions about our “post-truth” society and different forms of populist rhetoric.

When discussing prejudices about the inferiority of women, Poulain emphasizes that these are particularly difficult to overcome because they are shared by both men and women. He writes that these beliefs, though unjustified, seem

all the more convincing when one considers how women themselves tolerate their condition. They accept it as if it were natural to them, either because they do not think at all about what they are or because, having been born and reared in dependency, they think about it in the same way as men. (T1en 126; TTfr 63)

Here Poulain touches upon the important—and also still relevant—topic of internalized prejudice (also Schmitter 2018, 6–9). The subjugation of women does not consist only in the political and economic power men exercise over them, but also in the fact that women internalize their subjected position and perceive it as natural. In twenty-first century feminist philosophy this same insight provides the ground for discussions about the objectification of women (Haslanger 1993; Langton 2000) as well as about implicit biases and so called stereotype threat, which can affect the performance of disadvantaged groups in situations where they identify themselves as inadequate performers (Saul 2013).

Since subjection is in part based on false self-understanding, Poulain is very aware that we need true self-knowledge in order to liberate ourselves. In De l’égalité he points out that “[s]elf-knowledge is absolutely necessary in order to address [the equality of the sexes] properly” and following his emphasis on the bodily aspect of the human condition, he adds that this concerns “especially knowledge of the body” (T1en 155; TTfr 97). In De l’éducation, Poulain devotes the whole fourth conversation to the topic of self-knowledge and though he does not in this context explicitly address the question of the equality of the sexes, he makes several important remarks on how our self-knowledge is affected by the prejudiced opinions of others. Stasimachus explains:

We are prejudiced about nearly everything that exists, and most of all about ourselves. We are not only the authors of the prejudice but also its theater and its victims. As far as the things that touch us most closely are concerned, we immolate ourselves to our ghosts, so to speak. […] Although we are made in a certain way, and nature makes us realize that and protests constantly against our own imagination, we still try to be the way people tell us we are. (TTen 212; TTfr 243)

Poulain’s account is remarkably aware of what we would call the unconscious aspects of our minds and of the difficulties to change our self-conception even in cases when we consciously know that we are the victim of prejudice. He was clearly aware of the ongoing French discussion of self-knowledge, where Neo-Augustinian thinkers such as Pierre Nicole and Blaise Pascal questioned its possibility, and he combined a defense of the achievability of self-knowledge against those who claim that knowing oneself is

like moving mountains and that we will never get to the end of it, that man is hidden from himself, that there are countless hidden recesses of the heart he can never uncover (TTen 211; TTfr 242)

with a nuanced awareness of the difficulties involved (for a detailed discussion see Reuter 2017: 44–49).

3.2 Historical origins

Poulain’s finely tuned analysis of the psychological aspects of oppression is combined with a robust analysis of the historical origin of the prejudiced opinion that women are inferior to men. He explains that we need to trace the prejudiced opinion about women “back to its origin” and that would

involve evaluating what was done in earlier times by reference to current practices, and judging ancient customs by comparison with those that we see developing in our own day. If we had followed that rule, we would not have fallen into so many mistakes in innumerable judgments. And, in respect of the current condition of women, we would have recognized that they were dominated only by the law of the strongest, and that it was not because of a lack of natural capacity or merit on their part that they failed to share the advantages that give men a superior position in society. (T1en 126; TTfr 63–64)

According to Poulain, the law of the stronger (la Loi du plus fort) is in several respects arbitrary. He emphasizes that with the exception for the dependence of children upon their parents, dependence “is a purely physical or civil relation” and it should be “considered only as an effect of change, violence, or custom” (T1en 153; TTfr 95). As argued by Stuurman, Poulain can have been influenced by Thomas Hobbes’ views about the artificial nature of political power (Stuurman 2004: 177–178). Inequality is not natural and neither is the male sex oppressive by nature. Poulain explicitly rejects the idea that men, when they usurped power over women, were “driven by some hidden instinct—that is, by a general command of the author of nature—to act in this way” (T1en 126; TTfr 63). God has not made men oppressive. From the arbitrary nature of the power relation between the sexes follows also that “women might have [favored their sex] had they been in a similar situation” (T1en 152; TTfr 95). Neither sex is by its nature oppressive or submissive.

Poulain does not deny that men are, on an average, physically stronger than women or that “the interruptions of pregnancy and its after-effects reduced the strength of women for periods of time” and made them dependent on “their husbands’ assistance” (T1en 127; TTfr 65). This was not a problem, though, as long as “families consisted of just a mother, a father, and a few small children” but it became problematic when families expanded into larger units, when household chores became more diversified and all family members submitted to the rule of the father (T1en 127–128; TTfr 65).

Poulain is committed to the idea of an original golden age, preceding the present diversified society, and he emphasizes the idea of original liberty in particular in his third treatise De l’excellence des hommes, where he also describes the process through which natural liberty was lost. He explains that when

some men took advantage of their strength and their leisure to try to subjugate others, the golden age of liberty gave way to an iron age of servitude. Self-interest and wealth were so bound together through domination that it became impossible not to have to depend on others. This combination increased in proportion to the distance from the state of innocence and peace, giving rise to greed, ambition, vanity, extravagance, idleness, pride, cruelty, tyranny, deceit, schisms, wars, chance, worries—in short, all the infirmities of mind and body that afflict us. (TTen 313; TTfr 392)

Like Jean-Jacques Rousseau after him, Poulain connects the origins of inequality to wealth and the dependence on others that follows from an increasing division of labor. This historical process does not only give raise to unequal material conditions, it is also the origin of negative emotions such as greed, pride and cruelty. The tyranny of men over women has the same historical origin. In De l’égalité Poulain describes how the original voluntary dependence between husband and wife becomes subjugation when wars forced women “to accept as husbands unknown strangers who considered them merely as the most beautiful part of their booty” (T1en 128; TTfr 66). The commodification of women is thus, according to Poulain, an integral part of the historical origin of inequality.

Poulain’s understanding of the difference between the original harmony of mother, father and a few children and the oppression of women in developed societies is further illuminated by his remarks on the difference between marriage and political society. In De l’excellence he compares political society and the “society of marriage [which] is composed only of two persons, of whom one, therefore, cannot use authority and coercion towards the other” (TTen 280; TTfr 313). Poulain argues that marriage does not require a hierarchical division of power because it is “not founded on fear, but on love” (ibid.). Marriage can thus be based directly on the natural equality of wife and husband, without either of them usurping power over the other, whereas a society of three or more people, where one is “able to join forces with another to force the third to abide”, requires submission to laws and sovereigns, otherwise people will “be constantly at war” (ibid). In order to avoid war and tyranny established through war, political society requires sovereign power, but like Hobbes, Poulain emphasizes that the right to command

does not belong naturally to any one person more than to another, since it consists in the voluntary submission of those who give it to the one who is vested with it. (ibid.)

Both marriage and political rule must thus acknowledge that human beings are naturally equal, even if political society cannot be based on natural equality in the same direct manner as marriage can—and was, according to Poulain, during the golden age of liberty, before the arbitrary subjugation of women.

4. The Equality of the Sexes

We have seen that Poulain claims that all human beings are equal, but how does he argue for the equality of the sexes? We do not know if Poulain was familiar with Marie de Gournay’s treatise Égalité des hommes et des femmes [The Equality of Men and Women] (1622), but he shares her emphasis on equality based on the similarity of the sexes. Gournay self-consciously distinguished herself from earlier participants in the querelle des femmes, who often argued for the superiority of either sex, and emphasizes that she is “content to make women equal to men, for nature is also as opposed to superiority as to inferiority in this respect” (G-EMW 54; G-OC 965; see also Deslauriers 2018). Whereas Gournay followed Aristotle and argued that the unique form of the human animal consists in the rational soul, which is the same in both sexes (G-EMW 65; G-OC 978; also Deslauriers 2019), Poulain rejected Scholastic philosophy and attempted to ground most of his arguments on Descartes’ philosophy. When we analyze his discussions of the equality of the sexes, we can distinguish four main arguments. First, Poulain argues that there is no evidence in favor of inequality, which is a mere false belief. Second, he argues that women and men are in all relevant respects mentally and physically similar and therefor equal. Third, he refers to a normative concept of natural equality, and finally, he develops a normative demand for equal opportunity. I have devoted one subsection to each argument.

4.1 Inequality is a false belief

This argument is based on Descartes’ method for the search of truth (section 2.1) and closely connected to Poulain’s criticism of prejudice (section 3.1). It is Poulain’s most substantial argument in the sense that a large part of De l’égalité consists of his refutations of claims about the inferiority of women. Poulain argues that beliefs about women are not based on women’s essence or nature, but historically constructed prejudices (section 3.2). Desmond Clarke, in particular, has emphasized this aspect of Poulain’s criticism and connected it to a general Cartesian criticism of Scholastic explanatory models, which explain “any phenomenon simply by postulating a ‘form’ or ‘nature’ that corresponds to each reality that needs to be explained” (Clarke 2013: 41). Poulain’s criticism of a scholastic notion of ‘nature’ is most explicit in a passage where he argues against “Lawyers’ opinions”, which carry “a lot of weight for many people because they profess specifically to give everyone their due” (T1en 152; TTfr 94). These Scholastic lawyers, among whom scholars claim that Poulain includes Hugo Grotius (Stuurman 2004: 166–167), say “that it is nature that assigns women to the lowest functions in society and removes them from public offices”, but they would, according to Poulain,

be hard pressed if they were required to explain intelligibly what they mean by ‘nature’ in this context, and to explain how nature distinguished the two sexes, as they claim. (T1en 152; TTfr 94–95)

Poulain argues that ‘nature’ is, in this context, a non-explanatory concept. We can compare his criticism with that of Gournay: whereas she argues that when correctly interpreted, the Scholastic concept of the human being does not allow for a distinction of sex, he argues that this kind of concept cannot explain the true nature of the sexes in the first place.

Poulain also argues that inequality is a false belief by giving numerous examples of the equal and even superior abilities of women. Many of these examples are speculative generalizations, which would not satisfy Cartesian criteria for certainty. Poulain writes, for example, that it

is a pleasure to hear a woman pleading a legal case. No matter how complicated a case may be, she unravels it and explains it clearly. […] One finds throughout women’s conduct of legal cases a certain competence that men lack. (T1en 139; TTfr 79)

The generalization made here is not valid and does in fact resemble the generalizations about women’s inferiority that Poulain is attacking. But we must also note that he does not need more than one example of a woman who pleads her case well in order to show that women are not by their nature unable to do so. In this sense his generalizations are superfluous. Poulain seems to be aware of this philosophically more valid aspect of arguing from examples when he writes:

Just as it is rather unfair to believe that all women are indiscreet simply because one knows five or six who are such, one should be equally fair and conclude that women are capable of scientific study because one sees that a number of them have been able to raise themselves to such heights. (T1en 142; TTfr 82)

Even here Poulain is not completely clear about the crucial difference between invalid generalizations from examples and the valid use of examples in order to show that a given generalization is untrue. But he allows for a generous interpretation according to which his primary aim is to show that generalizations about the inferiority of women are false.

4.2 Similarity of the sexes

In addition to showing that claims about inequality are false, Poulain aims to show that the sexes are equal, because they are in all relevant respects similar. In the second part of De l’égalité, this argument is placed under the subtitle Women, when considered from the perspective of the principles of sound philosophy, are as capable as men of every kind of knowledge and begins with the above (in section 2.2) cited claim that “the mind has no sex” (T1en 157; TTfr 99). Poulain argues:

It is easy to see that sexual differences apply only to the body. Since, strictly speaking, the body alone is involved in the reproduction of human beings and the mind merely gives its assent and does so in the same manner in everyone, it follows that the mind has no sex. (T1en 157; TTfr 99–100)

Here, Poulain is primarily concerned with the nature of the mind, but the way he connects reproduction and assent is also noteworthy and corresponds to his emphasis, in De l’exellence, that when a woman and a man “agree to live together it is purely voluntary” (TTen 280; TTfr 313; see also De l’égalité, T1en 153; TTfr 95). From his claim about equal consent, Poulain draws the conclusion that if “the mind is considered in itself, it is found to be equal and to have the same nature in all human beings, and to be capable of every kind of thought” (T1en 158; TTfr 100; see also section 2.2).

The equality of independent minds is not enough, though, since human beings are compounds of minds and bodies. Minds are constantly affected by bodies. Therefore Poulain continues by arguing that the bodies of the sexes are also similar in all cognitively relevant respects. He claims that this is particularly true of the brain:

[The fact that the mind functions no differently in one sex than in the other] is even clearer if one considers only the head, which is the unique organ of scientific knowledge and in which the mind exercises all its functions. Even with the most detailed anatomical investigations, we cannot observe any difference in this organ between men and women. The brains of the latter are completely similar to ours; they receive and combine sensory impressions there in the same way as we do, and they store them for the imagination and memory in exactly the same way. (T1en 158; TTfr 101)

The problem with an argument based on the similarity of cognitive organs such as the brain, is that it makes equality dependent on empirical findings. The “most detailed anatomical investigations” to which Poulain refers was not very advanced according to today’s standards and the contemporary Cartesian Malebranche drew different conclusions about women’s brains, including their imaginations (see also Clarke 2013: 44, 50). Malebranche does not claim that all women have weaker capacities than all men, quite the contrary: “some women are found to have stronger minds than some men”, but he argues that most women “cannot use their imagination for working out complex and tangled questions” and connects this inability to the “delicacy of the brain fibers [that] is the principal cause of all these effects” (Malebranche 1674–75 [1997: 130]). Present day brain research is more advanced, but has still not settled the question of whether there are cognitively significant differences between women and men. Considered as a philosophical argument, an appeal to brain research remains weak. In order to avoid reducing the question of mental capacity to a question to be answered by brain scientists, we need a concept of the mind that cannot be reduced to the physiological body.

Even if Poulain emphasizes the similarity of the cognitively significant physical organs of women and men, he does not seem to want to provide a thoroughly materialist account (see also section 2.2). Jacqueline Broad has developed a nuanced interpretation of Poulain’s position, where she emphasizes the role of the free will and in particular its capacity to assent or dissent (Broad 2017: 74–76). Descartes famously argued that a judgment consists of two elements: a perception of the intellect and an action of the will. In order to avoid error, the will must assent only to those perceptions that are clear and distinct (e.g., Principia §§ 32–35; CSM I, 204; AT VIIIA, 17–18). According to this account it is ultimately the will which is responsible when we err. Broad’s interpretation builds on the passage in De l’égalité where Poulain claims that “we can yoke our will to [the causes of the passions] or dissociate it from them” (TTen 84; TTfr 102; see also section 2.2). She argues that

like Descartes, Poullain suggests that agents are capable of overcoming the influence of their bodies through the exercise of free will: they might either “yoke” their will to the causes of their passions or “dissociate” it from them. (Broad 2017: 76; on Descartes’ and Poulain’s accounts of judgment, see also Reuter 2013: 79–80)

Broad’s interpretation captures Poulain’s egalitarian intentions and an account built on the independence of the will has the obvious advantage that even if there would be empirically detectable differences in how women and men are influenced by their bodies, they may share an equal freedom of will to assent or dissent to their passions as well as imaginings (see also Reuter 2019: 49–51). The philosophical problem with this account is that it leaves Poulain’s position open to the objections raised most prominently by Elisabeth of Bohemia in her correspondence with Descartes. On 22 June 1645 she writes:

I know well that in removing everything upsetting to me (which I believe to be represented only by the imagination) from the idea of an affair, I would judge it healthily and would find in it the remedies as well as the affection which I bring to it. But I have never known how to put this into practice until the passion has already played its role. (Shapiro [ed.] 2007: 93; AT IV, 233–234)

Elisabeth is describing her inability to dissociate her will from the affairs that affect her. This lack of ability is not due to a lack of knowledge about how external influences act on her, quite the contrary, she is well aware of the roles played by the passions and the imagination, but argues that regardless of her knowledge, she is unable to voluntarily dissociate her assent. In this letter Elisabeth is arguing from her personal experience, but her criticism is framed by the metaphysical questions she raised in her early letters. In her second letter (10 June 1643) she summarizes the point:

it is altogether very difficult to understand that a soul, as you have described it, after having had the faculty and the custom of reasoning well, can lose all of this by some vapors, and that, being able to subsist without the body, and having nothing in common with it, the soul is still so governed by it. (Shapiro [ed.] 2007: 68; AT III, 685)

Elisabeth raises the question of how it is possible that the mind can be simultaneously distinct from and affected by the body. These are exactly the kind of metaphysical worries that Poulain leaves unaddressed, with the consequence that he is unable to provide a valid metaphysical basis for his claims about the similarity of the sexes.

4.3 Natural equality

Regardless of how successfully Poulain is able to show the similarity between the intellectual capacities of women and men, such descriptive similarity provides a weak—if any—foundation for a normative concept of equality (also Clarke 2013: 49; Hoekstra 2013). In order to find a normative basis for Poulain’s claim about the equality of the sexes I will first look at his references to the natural equality and liberty of humankind. In De l’égalité, Poulain writes that “dependence and servitude are contrary to the law of nature which makes all men equal” (TTen 78; TTfr 95) and a few pages later he points out that when humans are imagined separate from civil society, they are found “completely free and equal, with only a desire for self-preservation and an equal right to everything that would be necessary to achieve it” (T1en 164; TTfr 106). Poulain does not elaborate on what he means by the law of nature or by the state of nature preceding civil society. It is not clear to what extent he is relying on the Scholastic tradition of natural law, which he would have known from his studies at Sorbonne, and to what extent he is inspired by more recent developments, such as the natural law theory of Hugo Grotius and Thomas Hobbes.

Both passages cited above are situated in contexts that do have Hobbesian connotations: in the first case Poulain is distinguishing natural equality from the arbitrary nature of dependence in the civil state (see also section 3.2) and in the second case he continues:

But [the woman studying law and politics] would also notice that this equality would involve them in war or a permanent state of mutual distrust, which would be inconsistent with their objective, and that the natural light of reason would dictate that they could not live in peace unless everyone surrendered their rights and made contracts or conventions. She would also see that, in order to validate these decisions and to protect people from anxiety, it would be necessary to have recourse to a third party who would have authority to force everyone to observe what they had promised to others. (T1en 164; TTfr 106; see also Hobbes, Leviathan, part I, chap. 13–15)

On these grounds, and considering which works were available in Poulain’s intellectual context, Stuurman concludes that “Hobbes is his most likely source” (2004: 177). The probable influence of Hobbes is very illuminating, in particular when we consider Poulain’s view of the arbitrary nature of power, but Stuurman seems to overemphasize the Hobbesian nature of Poulain’s views when he indicates that Poulain rejects natural sociability (Stuurman 2004: 178). Poulain does indeed emphasize the role of fear as a motive for political society in De l’égalité (T1en 164; TTfr 106) as well as De l’excellence (TTen 280; TTfr 313), but it is crucial to note that he does not consider fear to be a necessary aspect of the natural condition of humankind. The description of “the golden age of liberty”, which Poulain gives in De l’excellence, is a description of natural sociability:

At the dawn of the world, traces of which are still to be seen in the innocent loves of shepherds and shepherdesses and in the pleasures of the rustic life, which is untroubled by the fear of powers or enemies, all men were equal, just, and sincere, since their only rule and law was that of good sense. (TTen 313; TTfr 392)

As we can see, fear does not exist in this original state, it is introduced as a consequence of “some men [taking] advantage of their strength and their leisure to try to subjugate others” (ibid.; see also the passage cited in section 3.2). Poulain does claim that humans have “a desire for self-preservation and an equal right to everything that would be necessary to achieve it” (T1en 164; TTfr 106), but when we consider his writings as a whole, he does not seem to claim that this desire is in itself the origin of constant confrontations and the fear raised by these confrontations.

Poulain’s discussions of natural equality and liberty in De l’excellence are framed by theological references, including a reference to “St. Augustine, who claims that man should place nothing above himself save God alone” (TTen 279; TTfr 312; also Wilkin 2019: 234–236). Poulain may have in mind a passage in De civitate Dei (book XIX, chap. 15), where Augustine writes:

God wanted rational man, made to his image, to have no dominion except over irrational nature. He meant no man, therefore, to have dominion over man, but only man over beast. So it fell out that those who were holy in primitive times became shepherds over sheep rather than monarchs over men, […]. (Augustine 413–427 [2008: 223])

Kinch Hoekstra, among others, has emphasized that this chapter from De civitate Dei, as well as a passage in De doctrina Christiana (book I, chap. 23), where Augustine states that human beings are naturally equal, influenced discussions about natural equality and liberty well into the seventeenth century (Hoekstra 2013: 95). When we look for the normative basis of Poulain’s claim that all humans are equal (shepherds and all), this theological origin, deriving equality from the creation of humankind, is at least as probable as Hobbes’ account of equality (for an influential interpretation of the normative nature of the latter, see Hoekstra 2013). Here we do not find a definite break with the scholastic tradition. Poulain is using its concept of equality in order to argue—against many Scholastic authors—that natural equality must be applied to the relation between women and men.

4.4 The demand for equality

Desmond Clarke and Jacqueline Broad both emphasize that Poulain’s concept of equality is normative in the sense that it includes a demand for equal opportunity. According to Clarke we find in Poulain (and other seventeenth-century feminist authors) a “claim to the effect that all persons should enjoy equal access to certain human goods” (2013: 49). This demand is in itself dependent on the idea that people are in some relevant respect equal and in the case of Poulain we can see that his demand for equal opportunity is rooted in his discussions of ability (section 4.2) as well as his notion of natural equality (section 4.3).

Broad points at a passage in De l’égalité where Poulain’s demand for equal right is clearly put: “all of us, men or women, have an equal right to truth since the minds of both are equally able to apprehend it” (TTen 91; TTfr 111). Here the connection between equal right and equal ability is explicit and we can see why it is so urgent for Poulain to show that women and men have equal minds. The claim that there are no relevant differences between the minds of women and men is not in itself normative, but provides a basis for demanding the equal right to exercise ones mind. As Broad shows, Poulain’s demand for an equal right to truth is closely connected to the pursuit of virtue and ultimately of true happiness, that can be achieved only through virtue (Broad 2017: 79; 2019: 32). Poulain writes that “[s]ince the two sexes are capable of the same happiness, they have the same right to everything that may be used to acquire it” (T1en 169; TTfr 111).

It is important to note, as Broad does, that Poulain, following Descartes almost word by word, defines virtue as “a firm and stable resolve to do what one thinks is best in various circumstances” (T1en 187; TTfr 131; also Descartes’ letter to Elisabeth of 4 August 1645, Shapiro [ed.] 2007: 98; AT IV, 265). From this emphasis on resolve follows that we do not need to assume that the will is always actually able to yoke itself to or dissociate itself from the passions (see section 4.2): it is sufficient to make a resolute attempt in order to be virtuous. Poulain’s claim that women and men have an equal ability of resolution, an ability he explicitly claims belongs to the mind and depends on the body only as its instrument (T1en 187; TTfr 131), is thus valid regardless of whether the sexes are actually able to similarly govern their passions (even if he holds that the second claim is also true). An equal ability of resolution is in itself enough as a basis for the demand that women and men have an equal right to knowledge and all other additional means of achieving full virtue and thereby, according to Poulain, happiness. (There is an extensive scholarly discussion of exactly how Descartes connects virtue and happiness; for a recent account see Svensson 2019.)

Poulain’s demand for an equal right to knowledge is in effect a demand for an equal right to proper education. When Poulain refers to education, it is most often in order to lament “the minimal education that women are given” (T1en 196; TTfr 141). In De l’égalité he argues that if we conceive a lack of cognitive ability in women, that “should be attributed uniquely to the conditions in which they live and the education they are given, which include the ignorance in which they are left” (T1en 188; TTfr 132–133; see also G-EMW 59–60; G-OC 971–972). But Poulain’s criticism of the current state of affairs includes a demand for change and right at the beginning of the first conversation in De l’éducation, Stasimachus points out: “as I think it absolutely essential to have an education, I would organize things in such a way that women could get one as easily as men” (TTen 144; TTfr 163). Following from Poulain’s Cartesian criticism of the Scholastic institutions of learning, articulated in detail by Stasimachus, education is pictured as a private enterprise and the outline of De l’éducation, five conversations set in Sophia’s private home, can be read as Poulain’s example of the ideal form of education. In this setting equality is emphasized by the fact that we have one learned person of each sex, Stasimachus and Sophia, and one eager pupil of each sex, Eulalia and Timander (on the roles of the four characters, see Schmitter 2018, 7–9).

The topic of education is also the topic that Poulain most evidently shares with many of his predecessors as well as successors. The question was forcefully raised by Christine de Pizan in Le Livre de la Cité des Dames (part I, chap. 27), where she argues that

if it were the custom to send little girls to school and to teach them all sorts of different subjects there, as one does with little boys, they would grasp and learn the difficulties of all the arts and sciences just as easily as the boys do, (Christine 1405 [1999: 57])

and is still an essential theme in Mary Wollstonecraft’s A Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1792).

5. Poulain and His Successors

Poulain’s feminist treatises did not have a large following in France, but neither were they without impact. There were some authorized as well as unauthorized re-editions (for a complete list see Alcover 1981; also Welch 2002a: 25–31), but the references to his works are scarce. One exception is Gabrièle Suchon, who mentions “the author of the Equality” in her Traité de la morale et de la politique [Treatise on ethics and politics] (1693), where she defends women’s liberty as well as capacity of learning (Welch 2002a: 29; Shapiro 2017; Wilkin 2019). In the next century Louise Dupin cites Poulain in her unfinished manuscript Ouvrage sur les femmes [Work on Women] (ca. 1745), and we have direct evidence that Montesquieu spoke highly of De l’égalité (Thielemann 1983: 321–326; Stuurman 2004: 283–289; Wilkin 2019). It is also very likely that Rousseau, who was working as Dupin’s secretary while she worked on her manuscript, was familiar with at least Poulain’s first treatise.

Already in 1677, De l’égalité was anonymously published in English translation under the name The Woman as Good as the Man and Poulain’s thoughts, if not his name, seems to have influenced English discussions of the equality of the sexes well into the eighteenth century (Leduc 2010; Clarke 2013: 12–13). One important mediator was the treatise Woman Not Inferior to Man: or, A short and modest Vindication of the natural Right of the FAIR-SEX to a perfect Equality of Power, Dignity, and Esteem, with the Men (1739), published under the pseudonym “Sophia, A Person of Quality”. This treatise, which has only recently received attention from scholars, appropriated several passages from Poulain’s treatise and radicalized his claims into an even more explicit demand for the rights of women (Clarke 2013: 43–44; Broad 2019). We do not yet know enough about the reception history of Sophia’s treatise, or about Wollstonecraft’s use of sources, in order to be able to even guess if there was a direct influence between the two vindications of the rights of women, but Broad has recently shown that we can detect a continuity in the topic of dignity as the foundation for women’s rights that stretches from Poulain to Wollstonecraft (Broad 2019).

When we consider Poulain’s influence in France during the eighteenth century, we must take into account that the idea of equality based on the similarity of the sexes was much more contested than in England. In Émile (1762), Rousseau famously claims:

how vain are disputes as to whether one of the two sexes is superior or whether they are equal—as though each, in fulfilling nature’s ends according to its own particular purpose were thereby less perfect than if it resembled the other more!. (1762 [1979: 358]; 2012: 825)

Rousseau argued that the sexes are neither equal nor unequal, they are different, and should aim at perfecting their differences in order to form a harmonious couple. Poulain’s demand for equality based on similarity was something to be argued against rather than adopted. Though Rousseau’s views on the relations between the sexes were heavily criticized by English feminists such as Wollstonecraft (Reuter 2014), they influenced many French feminists (Bergès 2016). When Olympe de Gouges declares the rights of women during the French Revolution, she does not appeal to the similarity of the sexes, but to their harmonious union, which is fulfilled by all other animals except humans. In her famous Les droits de la femme. A La Reine [The rights of women. To the Queen] (1791), she writes, addressing tyrannical men,

distinguish, if you can, between the sexes in the workings of nature. Everywhere you will find them intermixed; everywhere they cooperate in this immortal masterpiece with a harmonious togetherness. (1791 [2011: 30]; 1993: 206)

We do hear an echo from the golden age of liberty, but it is an echo formed by Rousseau’s emphasis on the harmonious union of the sexes.

During the early decades of the twentieth century there was a new interest in what was seen as the history of feminist thought, actualized by the hotly debated question of women suffrage, and this resulted in some early scholarly essays on Poulain (Grappin 1913, 1914; Lefevre 1914). In 1949 Simone de Beauvoir made Poulain’s name known when she (rather freely) cites his phrase “one should be suspicious of everything that men have said about women because they are both judges and litigants” (T1en 151; TTfr 93) as a motto for her Le deuxième sexe [The second sex]. Poulain is more than a motto for Beauvoir and when discussing facts and myths about women, she describes his analysis in the following words:

[Poulain] thinks that since men are stronger, they favor their sex and women accept this dependence out of custom. They never had their chances: in either freedom or education. Thus they cannot be judged by what they did in the past. Nothing indicates their inferiority to men. Anatomy reveals differences, but none of them constitutes a privilege for the male. (Beauvoir 1949/1989: 184–185 [2011: 123–124])

In addition to being an excellent summary of Poulain’s argument, this passage is an interesting key to Beauvoir’s own analysis of how women become the second sex (see also Welch 2002a: 32; on Cartesian aspects of Beauvoir’s thought, see Heinämaa 2005).


Works by Poulain

  • 1672, Les rapports de la langue Latin avec la Françoise pour traduire élégamment et sans peine, Paris: C. Thibout.
  • 1673, De l’égalité des deux sexes: Discours physique et moral où l’on voit l’importance de se défaire des préjugés, Paris: Jean du Puis.
  • 1674, De l’éducation des dames pour la conduite de l’esprit, dans les sciences et dans les moeurs: Entretiens, Paris: Jean du Puis, [date on title page 1671].
  • 1675, De l’excellence des hommes, contre l’égalité des sexes, Paris: Jean du Puis.
  • 1681, Essai des remarques particulières sur la langue françoise pour la ville de Genève, Geneva.
  • 1720, La Doctrine des protestans sur la liberté et le droit de lire l’Ecriture Sainte, sur le service Divin en Langue entendue, sur l’invocation des Saints, sur le Sacrament de l’Eucharistie. Justifiés par le Missel Romain & par les Réflexions sur chaque Point, avec Un commentaire philosophique sur ces paroles de Jésus-Christ, Ceci est mon Corps; Ceci est mon Sang, Matth. Chap. XXVI, v. 26, Geneva: Fabri & Barrillot.
  • 1677, The Woman as Good as the Man: Or, The Equality of Both Sexes, trans. A. L., London: N. Brooks.
  • [TTen], Three Cartesian Feminist Treatises, introduction by Marcelle Maistre Welch, translated by Vivien Bosley, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press, 2002. Translations of On the equality of the two sexes (1673), On the education of ladies (1674), and On the excellence of men (1675).
  • [TTfr], De l’égalité des deux sexes, De l’éducation des dames, De l’excellence des hommes, Marie-Frédérique Pellegrin (ed.), Paris: Vrin, 2011.
  • [T1en], A Physical and Moral Discourse Concerning the Equality of Both Sexes, translation of Poulain 1673 in C-trans: 119–200, 2013.

Other Sources

  • Agrippa von Nettesheim, Henricus Cornelius, 1509/1529, De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus, R. Antonioli (ed.), Geneva: Librairie Droz, 1990. Translated as Declamation on the Nobility and Preeminence of the Female Sex, Albert Rabil, Jr. (trans. and ed.), Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press, 1996.
  • Aristotle, The Complete works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, 2 Volumes, ed. Jonathan Barnes, Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine, Saint, De doctrina Christiana. Translated as On Christian teaching, R. P. H. Green (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • –––, De Trinitate. Translated in On the Trinity, books 8–15, Stephen McKenna (trans.), Gareth B. Matthews (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • –––, De civitate Dei. Translated in The City of God, books 17–22, Gerald G. Walsh and Daniel J. Honan (trans.), H. Dressler (ed.), (The Fathers of the Church, 24), Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1954; paperback reprint 2008.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de, 1949/1989 [2011], Le deuxième sexe, vol. I, Paris: Gallimard, page numbers are from the 1989 edition. Translated as The Second Sex, Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier (trans.), New York: Vintage Books, 2011.
  • Christine de Pizan, 1405 [1999], The Book of the City of Ladies, Rosalind Brown-Grant (trans.), London: Penguin Books.
  • Clarke, Desmond M. (trans.), [C-trans], The Equality of the Sexes: Three Feminist Texts of the Seventeenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.
  • Descartes, René, [CSM], The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 vols., trans. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985. Cited as CSM followed by volume number.
  • –––, [AT], Œuvres de Descartes, 11 vols., eds. C. Adam and P. Tannery, revised edition, Paris: Vrin, 1996. Cited as AT followed by volume number.
  • Dupin, Louise Marie-Madelaine, ca. 1745, Ouvrage sur les femmes, major manuscripts drafts held by archives in Austin, Texas; Geneva, Switzerland; Montmorency, France.
  • Forge, Louis de la, 1666, Traitté de l’Esprit de l’Homme, de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps. Suivant les Principes de René Descartes, Paris: Theodore Girard.
  • Gouges, Olympe de, 1791 [2011], Les droits de la femme. A La Reine. Translated as The Rights of Woman. To the Queen, in Between the Queen and the Cabby: Olympe de Gouges’s Rights of Woman, John H. Cole, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press, pp. 28–41.
  • –––, 1993, Écrits politiques, vol. 1, Olivier Blanc (ed.), Paris: Côté-femmes.
  • Gournay, Marie le Jars de, [G-OC], Œuvres complètes, 2 vols., J.-C. Arnould, E. Berriot, C. Blum, A. L. Franchetti, M.-C. Thomine, and V. Worth-Stylianou (eds), Paris: Honoré Champion, 2002. Cited as G-OC.
  • –––, [G-EMW] 1622, Égalité des hommes et des femmes. Translated as The Equality of Men and Women, in C-trans: 54–73. Cited as G-EMW.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1651 [1998], Leviathan, or the Matter, Forme, & Power of a Common-Wealth Ecclesiastical and Civil, London. Reprinted J. C. A. Gaskin (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, 1674–75 [1997], Recherche de la vérité, two volumes, Paris. Translated as The Search after Truth, Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp (trans./eds), (Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1762 [1979], Émile, ou De l’éducation. Translated as Emile, or On Education, A. Bloom (trans. and ed.), New York: Basic Books.
  • –––, 2012, Œuvres complètes: Édition thématique tricentenaire, vol. 8, eds. R. Trousson, F. S. Eigeldinger,, Geneva and Paris: Slatkine and Champion.
  • Shapiro, Lisa (trans./ed.), 2007, The Correspondence between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and René Descartes, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sophia, 1739, Woman Not Inferior to Man: or, A short and modest Vindication of the natural Right of the FAIR-SEX to a perfect Equality of Power, Dignity, and Esteem, with the Men, London: John Hawkins, at the Falcon in St. Paul’s Church-Yard. Available at
  • Suchon, Gabrielle [G. S. Aristophile], 1693, Traité de la Morale et de la Politique, divisée en trois parties, sçavoir la liberté, la science, et l’autorité où l’on voit que les personnes du sexe pour en être privées, ne laissent pas d’avoir une capacité naturelle, qui les en peut rendre participantes, Lyon: B. Vignieu.
  • Wollstonecraft, Mary, 1792, A Vindication of the Rights of Woman, London: Joseph Johnson. Reprinted in Wollstonecraft [VR].
  • –––, [VR], Mary Wollstonecraft: A Vindication of the Rights of Men with A Vindication of the Rights of Woman, Sylvana Tomaselli (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511841231

Secondary literature

  • Alcover, Madeleine, 1981, Poullain de la Barre: Une aventure philosophique, Paris, Seattle & Tübingen: Biblio 17/Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature.
  • Antony, Louise M. and Charlotte E. Witt (eds.), 1993, A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, Boulder, San Francisco & Oxford: Westview Press.
  • Atherton, Margaret, 1993, “Cartesian Reason and Gendered Reason”, in Antony and Witt 1993: 19–34.
  • Bergès, Sandrine, 2016, “A Republican Housewife: Marie-Jeanne Phlipon Roland on Women’s Political Role”, Hypatia, 31(1): 107–122. doi:10.1111/hypa.12215
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487125
  • –––, 2017, “Early Modern Feminism and Cartesian Philosophy”, in The Routledge Companion to Feminist Philosophy, Ann Garry, Serene J. Khader, and Alison Stone (eds.), London & New York: Routledge, pp. 71–81.
  • –––, 2019, “The Early Modern Period: Dignity and the Foundations of Women’s Rights”, in The Wollstonecraftian Mind, Sandrine Bergès, Eileen Hunt Botting, and Alan Coffee (eds.), London & New York: Routledge, pp. 25–35.
  • Broad, Jacqueline and Karen Detlefsen (eds.), 2017, Women and Liberty, 1600–1800: Philosophical Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198810261.001.0001
  • Clarke, Desmond M., 2013, “Introduction”, in C-trans: 1–53.
  • Deslauriers, Marguerite, 2018, “Gournay, Marie le Jars de (1565–1645)”, in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Abingdon, UK: Taylor & Francis.
  • –––, 2019, “Marie de Gournay and Aristotle on the Unity of the Sexes”, in Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Philosophical Thought, Eileen O’Neill and Marcy P. Lascano (eds.), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 281–299. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-18118-5_13
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2017, “Cartesianism and Its Feminist Promise and Limits”, in Descartes and Cartesianism: Essays in Honour of Desmond Clarke, Stephen Gaukroger and Catherine Wilson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 191–206. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198779643.003.0012
  • Drieux, Philippe, 2019, “Louis de La Forge on Mind, Causality, and Union”, in Nadler, Schmaltz, and Antoine-Mahut 2019: 318–331. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780198796909.013.19
  • Fraisse, Geneviève, 1985, “Poulain de la Barre, ou le procès des préjugés”, Corpus: revue de philosophie 1: 27–41.
  • Grappin, Henri, 1913, “Notes Sur Un Féministe Oublié: Le Cartésien Poullain de La Barre”, Revue d’Histoire Littéraire de La France, 20(4): 852–867.
  • –––, 1914, “A Propos Du Féministe Poullain de La Barre”, Revue d’Histoire Littéraire de La France, 21(2): 387–389.
  • Harth, Erica, 1992, Cartesian Women: Versions and Subversions of Rational Discourse in the Old Regime, Ithaca & London: Cornell University Press.
  • Haslanger, Sally, 1993, “On Being Objective and Being Objectified”, in Antony and Witt 1993: 85–125.
  • Heinämaa, Sara, 2005, “The Soul-Body Union and Sexual Difference from Descartes to Merleau-Ponty and Beauvoir”, in Feminist Reflections on the History of Philosophy, Lilli Alanen and Charlotte Witt (eds.), (New Synthese Historical Library 55), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 137–151. doi:10.1007/1-4020-2489-4_8
  • Hoekstra, Kinch, 2013, “Hobbesian Equality”, in Hobbes Today: Insights for the 21st Century, S. A. Lloyd (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 76–112. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139047388.007
  • Hoffmann, Paul, 1969, “Féminisme cartésien”, Travaux de linguistique et de littérature, 7(2): 83–105.
  • Langton, Rae, 2000, “Feminism in Epistemology: Exclusion and Objectification”, in The Cambridge Companion to Feminism in Philosophy, Miranda Fricker and Jennifer Hornsby (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 127–145. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521624517.008
  • Leduc, Guyenne, 2010, Réécritures anglaises au XVIIIe siècle de l’Égalité des deux Sexes (1673) de François Poulain de la Barre, Paris: Harmattan.
  • Lefevre, G., 1914, “Poulain de la Barre et le féminisme au xviie siècle”, Revue Pédagogique, 64: 101–113.
  • Nadler, Steven M., Tad M. Schmaltz, and Delphine Kolesnik-Antoine (eds.), 2019, The Oxford Handbook of Descartes and Cartesianism, (Oxford Handbooks), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780198796909.001.0001
  • O’Neill, Eileen, 1999, “Women Cartesians, ’Feminine Philosophy,’ and Historical Exclusion”, in Susan Bordo (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of René Descartes, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 232–257.
  • –––, 2011, “The Equality of Men and Women”, in Desmond M. Clarke and Catherine Wilson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 445–474.
  • Pal, Carol, 2012, Republic of Women: Rethinking the Republic of Letters in the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139087490
  • Pellegrin, Marie-Frédérique, 2011, “Poulain de la Barre: Un féminisme philosophique”, in F. Poulain de la Barre, De l’égalité des deux sexes, De l’éducation des dames, De l’excellence des hommes, Paris: Vrin, pp. 11–48.
  • –––, 2013, “La science parfaite: Savants et savantes chez Poulain de la Barre”, Revue philosophique de la France et de l’étranger, 138(3): 377–392. doi:10.3917/rphi.133.0377
  • –––, 2019, “Cartesianism and Feminism”, in Nadler, Schmaltz, and Antoine-Mahut 2019: 564–579. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780198796909.013.35
  • Perry, Ruth, 1985, “Radical Doubt and the Liberation of Women”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 18(4): 472–493. doi:10.2307/2739005
  • Reuter, Martina, 2013, “Freedom of the Will as a Basis of Equality: Descartes, Princess Elisabeth and Poullain de La Barre”, in Freedom and the Construction of Europe, volume 2, Quentin Skinner and Martin van Gelderen (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 65–83. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139519298.006
  • –––, 2014, “‘Like a Fanciful Kind of Half Being’: Mary Wollstonecraft’s Criticism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau”, Hypatia, 29(4): 925–941. doi:10.1111/hypa.12105
  • –––, 2017, “François Poulain de la Barre on the Subjugation of Women”, in Broad and Detlefsen 2017: 33–49.
  • –––, 2019, “The Gender of the Cartesian Mind, Body, and Mind-Body Union”, in Reuter and Svensson 2019: 37–58.
  • Reuter, Martina and Frans Svensson (eds.), 2019, Mind, Body, and Morality: New Perspectives on Descartes and Spinoza, (Routledge studies in seventeenth-century philosophy), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781351202831.
  • Saul, Jennifer, 2013, “Implicit Bias, Stereotype Threat, and Women in Philosophy”, in Women in Philosophy: What Needs to Change?, Katrina Hutchison and Fiona Jenkins (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 39–60. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199325603.003.0003
  • Schmitter, Amy M., 2018, “Cartesian prejudice: Gender, education and authority in Poulain de la Barre”, Philosophy Compass 13(12): 1–12.
  • Shapiro, Lisa, 2017, “Gabrielle Suchon’s ‘Neutralist’: The Status of Women and the Invention of Autonomy”, in Broad and Detlefsen 2017: 50–65.
  • Stock, Marie-Louise, 1961, “Poullain de la Barre: A Seventeenth-Century Feminist”, Ph.D. dissertation, Columbia University.
  • Stuurman, Siep, 2004, François Poulain de la Barre and the Invention of Modern Equality, Cambridge, MA & London: Harvard University Press.
  • Svensson, Frans, 2019, “A Cartesian Distinction in Virtue: Moral and Perfect”, in Reuter and Svensson 2019: 208–225.
  • Thielemann, Leland, 1983, “The Thousand Lights and Intertextual Rhapsody: Diderot or Mme Dupin?”, Romantic Review, 74(3): 316–329.
  • Welch, Marcelle Maistre, 2002a, “Introduction: Poullain de la Barre’s Cartesian Feminism”, in TTen 3–33.
  • –––, 2002b, “Introduction: On the Education of Ladies”, in TTen 125–137.
  • Wilkin, Rebecca, 2019, “Feminism and Natural Right in François Poulain de La Barre and Gabrielle Suchon”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 80(2): 227–248. doi:10.1353/jhi.2019.0013

Other Internet Resources


It is my honor to offer this replacement for the previous SEP entry on Poulain written by Desmond M. Clarke (1942–2016). In particular, my bibliography of Poulain’s works is based on his. In addition to the secondary literature cited and personal communication with many of the authors, my interpretations of Poulain’s thought are indebted to numerous discussions with Tuomas Parsio, the translator of Poulain’s De l’égalité into Finnish.

Copyright © 2019 by
Martina Reuter <>

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