Galileo Galilei

First published Fri Mar 4, 2005; substantive revision Fri Jun 4, 2021

Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) has always played a key role in any history of science, as well as many histories of philosophy. He is a—if not the—central figure of the Scientific Revolution of the seventeenth century. His work in physics (or “natural philosophy”), astronomy, and the methodology of science still evoke debate after more than 400 years. His role in promoting the Copernican theory and his travails and trials with the Roman Church are stories that still require re-telling. This article attempts to provide an overview of these aspects of Galileo’s life and work, but does so by focusing in a new way on his arguments concerning the nature of matter.

1. Brief Biography

Galileo was born in Pisa on February 15, 1564. By the time he died on January 8, 1642 (but for problems with the date, see Machamer 1998b, 24–25), he was as famous as any person in Europe. Moreover, when he was born there was no such thing as ‘science’; yet by the time he died, science was well on its way to becoming a discipline, and its concepts and method a complete philosophical system.

Galileo’s father Vincenzo, though of noble heritage, was a semi-itinerant court musician and composer of modest means, who also authored treatises on music theory; his mother, Giulia Ammannati, descended from Pisan cloth merchants. In 1572, they resettled the family in Florence. As a boy, Galileo was tutored privately and, for a time, by the monks at Vallombrosa, where he considered a religious vocation and may have started a novitiate. He returned home, however, and then enrolled for a medical degree at the University of Pisa in 1580. He never completed this degree, but instead studied mathematics, notably with Ostilio Ricci, a mathematics teacher attached to the Tuscan court and the Florentine Accademia del Disegno.

After leaving university, Galileo worked as a private mathematics tutor around Florence and Siena and cultivated the support of leading mathematicians. He visited Christoph Clavius, professor at the Jesuit Collegio Romano, and corresponded with the engineer Guildobaldo del Monte, Marchese of Urbino. In 1588, he applied and was turned down for a professorship in Bologna, but a year later, with the help of Clavius and del Monte, he was appointed lecturer in mathematics at Pisa. In 1592, he obtained, at a much higher salary, a chair of mathematics at the University of Padua, in the Venetian Republic. Galileo also supplemented his income by producing a calculating instrument of his own design (see Galilei 1606) and other devices in a household workshop, and by private tutoring and consulting on practical mathematics and engineering. During this period, he began a relationship with Marina Gamba, and their daughter Virginia was born in 1600. In 1601, they had another daughter, Livia, and a son, Vincenzo, in 1606.

In Padua, Galileo worked out much of the mechanics he would publish later in life, and which constitute his primary lasting contribution to physical science. However, these projects were interrupted in 1609, when Galileo heard about the recently invented spyglass, invented an improved telescope, and used it to make astounding celestial discoveries. He rushed these into print in Sidereus Nuncius (Starry Messenger), which appeared in March 1610 and launched Galileo onto the world stage. Among others, Johannes Kepler, Imperial Mathematician at Prague, lauded the work (Kepler 1610). Clavius and his colleagues at the Collegio Romano confirmed its results and threw a celebratory banquet when Galileo visited in 1611. During the same Roman sojourn, Galileo was admitted to what was perhaps the first scientific society, the Accademia dei Lincei; he would style himself “Lincean Academician” for the rest of his life. Some fascinating treatments of this period of Galileo’s life and motivations have recently appeared (Biagioli 2006; Reeves 2008; Wilding 2014).

Galileo also used the Starry Messenger to solicit patronage in his native Tuscany, naming the moons of Jupiter he had found the “Medicean” stars, in honor of the ruling Medici family. His negotiations were ultimately successful, and Galileo moved to Florence as “Chief Mathematician and Philosopher to the Grand Duke” and holder of a sinecure professorship at Pisa. His daughters moved with him and were shortly placed in the convent of Saint Matthew at Arcetri, near Florence. Vincenzo and his mother, Marina, were left behind in Venice.

Once a courtier, Galileo entered into several debates on scientific topics. In 1612, he published a Discourse on Floating Bodies, and in 1613, Letters on Sunspots, where he first openly expressed support for Copernican heliocentrism. In 1613–14, Galileo entered into discussions of Copernicanism through his student Benedetto Castelli, and wrote a Letter to Castelli defending the doctrine from theological objections. Meanwhile, it had become known that Copernicanism was under scrutiny by Church authorities. Galileo lectured and lobbied against its condemnation, expanding his Letter to Castelli into the widely circulated Letter to the Grand Duchess Christina in 1615 and travelling to Rome late that year. Nevertheless, in March 1616, Copernicus’s On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Orbs was suspended (i.e., temporarily censored), pending correction, by the Congregation of the Index of Prohibited Books. Galileo himself was called to an audience with Cardinal Robert Bellarmine, a leading theologian and member of the Roman Inquisition, who admonished him not to teach or defend Copernican theory. (The details of this episode are far from straightforward, and remain disputed even today. See Shea and Artigas 2003; Fantoli 2005.)

In 1623, Galileo published The Assayer, which deals with the nature of comets and argues they are sublunary phenomena. This book includes some of Galileo’s most famous methodological pronouncements, including the claim that the book of nature is written in the language of mathematics. It also contains passages suggestive of atomism, a heretical doctrine, for which the book was referred to the Inquisition, which dismissed the charge.

Also in 1623, Maffeo Barberini, Galileo’s supporter and friend, was elected Pope Urban VIII. Galileo felt empowered to begin work on his Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems. The “two systems” are the Ptolemaic and Copernican, and the text clearly, though not explicitly, favors the latter. Printing was completed in Florence by February 1632. Shortly afterwards, the Inquisition banned its sale, and Galileo was ordered to Rome for trial. In June 1633, Galileo was convicted of “vehement suspicion of heresy,” and a sentence of imprisonment was immediately commuted to perpetual house arrest. (There is more about these events and their implications in the final section of this article, Galileo and the Church.)

In 1634, while Galileo was confined to his villa in Arcetri, his beloved eldest daughter died (Sobel 1999). Around this time, he began work on his final book, Discourses and Mathematical Demonstrations Concerning Two New Sciences, based on the mechanics he had developed early in his career. The manuscript was smuggled out of Italy and published in Holland by the Elzeviers in 1638. Galileo died early in 1642, and due to his condemnation, his burial place was obscure until he was re-interred in 1737.

For detailed biographical material, the best and classic work dealing with Galileo’s scientific achievements is Stillman Drake’s Galileo at Work (1978). More recently, J. L. Heilbron has written a magnificent biography, Galileo (2010), that touches on all the multiple facets of his life.

2. Introduction and Background

From the seventeenth century onward, Galileo has been seen by many as the “hero” of modern science. He is renowned for his discoveries: he was the first to report telescopic observations of the mountains on the moon, the moons of Jupiter, the phases of Venus, and the rings of Saturn. He invented an early microscope and a predecessor to the thermometer. In mathematical physics—a discipline he helped create—he calculated the law of free fall, conceived of an inertial principle, determined the parabolic trajectory of projectiles, and advocated the relativity of motion. He is thought to be the first “real” experimental scientist, who dropped stones from towers and ships’ masts, and played with magnets, clocks, and pendulums (noting the isochrony of the latter). Much of his cultural stature also arises from his advocacy and popularization of Copernicanism and the resulting condemnation by the Catholic Inquisition, which has made him a purported “martyr” to the cause of rationality and enlightened modernity in the subsequent history of a supposed “warfare” between science and religion. This is no small set of accomplishments for one seventeenth-century Italian, who was the son of a court musician and who left the University of Pisa without a degree.

Momentous figures living in momentous times are full of interpretive fecundity, and Galileo has been the subject of manifold interpretations and much controversy. The use of Galileo’s work and the invocations of his name make a fascinating history (Segre 1991; Palmerino and Thijssen 2004; Finocchiaro 2005; Shea and Artigas 2006), but this is not our topic, which are the philosophical implications of his work.

Philosophically, Galileo has been used to exemplify many different themes, usually as a personification of whatever the writer wished to make the hallmark of the Scientific Revolution or of the nature of good science—whatever was good about the new science or science in general, it was Galileo who started it. One tradition of Galileo scholarship has divided Galileo’s work into three or four parts: (1) his physics, (2) his astronomy, and (3) his methodology, which might include his method of Biblical interpretation and/or his thoughts about the nature of proof or demonstration. In this tradition, typical treatments deal with his physical and astronomical discoveries and their background and/or who were Galileo’s predecessors. More philosophically, many ask how his mathematical practice relates to his natural philosophy. Was he a mathematical Platonist (Jardine 1976; Koyré 1978), an experimentalist (Settle 1967; Settle 1983; Settle 1992; Palmieri 2008), an Aristotelian emphasizing experience (Geymonat 1954), a precursor of modern positivist science (Drake 1978), or maybe an Archimedean (Machamer 1998a), who might have used a revised Scholastic method of proof (Wallace 1992; Miller 2018)? Or did he have no method and just fly like an eagle in the way that geniuses do (Feyerabend 1975)? Alongside these claims there have been attempts to place Galileo in an intellectual context that brings out the background to his achievements. Some have emphasized his debt to the artisan/engineer practical tradition (Rossi 1962; Valleriani 2010), others his mathematics (Giusti 1993; Feldhay 1998; Renn, et al. 2000; Palmieri 2001; Palmieri 2003; Peterson 2011; Palmerino 2016), his mixed (or subalternate) mathematics (Machamer 1978; Lennox 1986; Wallace 1992; Dear 1995; Machamer 1998a), his debt to atomism (Shea 1972; Redondi 1983), his use of Hellenistic and Medieval impetus theory (Moody 1951; Duhem 1954; Clagett 1959; Shapere 1974), or the idea that discoveries bring new data into science (Wootton 2015).

Still, almost everyone working in this tradition seems to think the three areas—physics, astronomy, and methodology—are somewhat distinct and represent different Galilean endeavors. More recent historical research has followed contemporary intellectual fashion and shifted foci, bringing new dimensions to our understanding of Galileo by studying his rhetoric (Finocchiaro 1980; Moss 1993; Feldhay 1998; Spranzi 2004), the power structures of his social milieu (Biagioli 1993; Biagioli 2006), his personal quest for acknowledgment (Shea and Artigas 2003), and more generally emphasizing the larger social and cultural history (Reeves 2008; Bucciantini, et al. 2015), in particular the court and papal culture in which Galileo functioned (Redondi 1983; Heilbron 2010).

In an intellectualist recidivist mode, this entry will outline his investigations in physics and astronomy and exhibit, in a new way, how these all cohered in a unified inquiry. In setting out this path, we shall show why, at the end of his life, Galileo felt compelled (in some sense of necessity) to write the Two New Sciences, which stands as a true completion of his overall project and is not just a reworking of his earlier research that he reverted to after his trial, when he was under house arrest and going blind. Particularly, we shall try to show why both of the two new sciences, especially the first, were so important—a topic not much treated except recently (Biener 2004; Raphael 2011). In passing, we shall touch on his methodology and his mathematics, and here refer you to some of the recent work by Palmieri (2001; 2003). At the end, we shall add some words about Galileo, the Catholic Church, and his trial.

3. Galileo’s Scientific Story

The philosophical thread that runs through Galileo’s intellectual life is a strong and increasing desire to find a new conception of what constitutes natural philosophy and how natural philosophy ought to be pursued. Galileo signaled this goal clearly when he left Padua in 1610 to return to Florence and the court of the Medici. He asked for and received the designation ‘Philosopher’, in addition to ‘Mathematician’. This was not just a status-affirming request, but also a reflection of his programmatic aims. What Galileo accomplished by the end of his life was a reasonably articulated replacement for the traditional set of analytical concepts connected with the Aristotelian tradition of natural philosophy. He offered, in place of the Aristotelian categories, a set of mechanical archetypes that were accepted by most everyone who afterwards developed the “new sciences,” and which, in some form or another, became the hallmark of the new philosophy. His way of thinking became the way of the Scientific Revolution (and yes, there was such a revolution, pace Shapin 1996 and others; see the selections in Lindberg and Westman 1990; Osler 2000).

Some scholars might wish to describe what Galileo achieved in psychological terms, as an introduction of new mental models (Palmieri 2003) or a new model of intelligibility (Machamer 1994; Machamer, 1998a; Adams, et al. 2017). However phrased, Galileo’s main move was to dethrone the Aristotelian physical categories; namely, the one celestial element (aether, or quintessence—i.e., “fifth element”) and the four terrestrial ones (fire, air, water, and earth), along with their respective motive natures (circular, and up and down). In their place, he left only one element, corporeal matter, whose properties and motions he described using the mathematics of proportional relations typified by the Archimedian simple machines—the balance, the inclined plane, and the lever—to which Galileo added the pendulum (Machamer 1998a; Machamer and Hepburn 2004; Palmieri 2008). In doing so, Galileo changed the acceptable way of talking about matter and its motion, and so ushered in the mechanical tradition that characterizes so much of modern science, even today. See Dijksterhuis 1961; Machamer, et al. 2000; Gaukroger 2006; Roux and Garber 2013.

As a way of understanding Galileo’s accomplishments, it is useful to see him as being interested in finding a unified theory of matter—a mathematical theory of the material stuff that constitutes the whole of the cosmos. Perhaps he did not realize that this was his grand project until the time he actually wrote the Two New Sciences in the mid-1630s. Despite working on problems of the nature of matter from 1590 onwards, he could not have written his final work much earlier than 1638; certainly not before the Starry Messenger of 1610, and probably not before the Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems of 1632. He had thought deeply about the nature of matter before 1610 and had tried to work out how best to describe matter, but before 1632, he did not have the theory and evidence he needed to support his claims about a unified, singular matter. The idea of unified matter theory had to wait for the establishment of principles of matter’s motion on a moving Earth. And this he did not accomplish until the Dialogue.

Galileo began his critique of Aristotle in a treatise he drafted around 1590, titled De Motu (On Motion). The first part of this manuscript deals with terrestrial matter and argues that Aristotle’s theory has it wrong. For Aristotle, the matter of the terrestrial realm within the sphere of the moon is of four elemental kinds—earth, water, air, and fire. These possess two formal principles that give rise to their natural motion: heaviness (gravitas; in earth and water) and lightness (levitas; in air and fire). Galileo, using an Archimedean model of floating bodies, and later the balance, argues that there is only one principle of motion—heaviness. Bodies move upward not because they have a natural lightness, he says, but because they are displaced or extruded by other heavier bodies moving downward. So on his view, heaviness is the cause of all natural terrestrial motion.

This move left Galileo with a problem: what is heaviness and how is it to be described? In De Motu, he argued that the moving arms of a balance could be used as a model for treating all problems of natural motion. In this model, heaviness is the proportionality of the weight of an object on one arm of the balance to the weight of another body on the other arm. In the context of floating bodies, heaviness is the weight of one body minus the weight of the medium. Galileo quickly realized these characterizations were insufficient, and so began to explore how heaviness might be related to specific gravities; i.e., the comparative weights of bodies having equal volume. He was trying to figure out the concept of heaviness that is characteristic of all matter. What he failed to work out—and this was probably the reason why he never published De Motu—was this positive characterization of heaviness. There seemed to be no way to find a standard measure of heaviness that would work across different substances. At this point, he did not have a useful replacement for Aristotelian gravitas.

A while later, in his 1600 manuscript version of Le Meccaniche (On Mechanics), Galileo introduced the concept of momento, a quasi force that applies to a body at a moment, and which is somehow proportional to weight or specific gravity (Galluzzi 1979). Still, he had no good way to measure or compare specific gravities of bodies of different kinds, and his notebooks during this early seventeenth-century period reflect his trying again and again to find a way to bring all matter under a single proportional measuring scale. He tried to study acceleration along an inclined plane and to find a way to think of what changes acceleration brings to momento. Yet the details and categories of how to properly treat weight and movement eluded him.

We see from this period that Galileo’s law of free fall arises out of this struggle to find the proper categories for his new science of matter and motion. Galileo accepted, probably as early as the 1594 draft of Le Meccaniche, that natural motions might be accelerated. Particularly in the cases of the pendulum, the inclined plane, free fall, and projectile motion, Galileo must have observed that the speeds of bodies increase as they move downwards and, perhaps, do so naturally. But that accelerated motion is properly measured against time is an idea he realized only later, chiefly through his failure to find any satisfactory dependence on place and specific gravity. Also at this time, he began to think about percussive force. For many years, he thought that the correct science of these phenomena should describe how bodies change according to where they are on their paths. Specifically, it seemed that height is crucial. Percussive force is directly related to height and the motion of the pendulum seems to involve equilibrium with respect to the height of the bob (and time also, but isochrony did not lead directly to a recognition of time’s importance).

One of Galileo’s problems was that the Archimedian simple machines he was using as his models of intelligibility, especially the balance, are not easily conceived of in a dynamic way (but see Machamer and Woody 1994). Since they generally work by establishing static equilibrium, time is not a feature of their action one would normally attend to. In discussing a balance, for instance, one does not normally think about how fast an arm of the balance descends, nor how fast a body on the opposite arm is rising (though Galileo does in his Postils to Rocco circa 1634–45; see Palmieri 2005). The converse is also true. It is difficult to model dynamic phenomena that involve rates of change as balance arms moving upwards or downwards because of differential weights. So it was that Galileo’s puzzle about how to describe time and the force of percussion (the force of body’s impact) would remain unsolved. Throughout his life, he could not find systematic relations among specific gravities, heights of fall, and percussive forces. Even while the Two New Sciences was going to press in 1638, Galileo was laboring on an additional “Fifth Day” (not published until 1718) that presciently explored the concept of the force of percussion, which would become, after his death, one of the most fecund ways to think about matter and its motion.

In the period 1603–9, Galileo experimented with inclined planes and, most importantly, pendulums. These studies again exhibited to Galileo that acceleration and, therefore, time is a crucial variable. Moreover, the isochrony of the pendulum—the period depends only on the length of the cord, regardless of the weight of the bob—went some way towards showing that time is a possible term in the equilibrium (or ratio) that needs to be made explicit to represent motion. It also shows that, in at least one case, time can displace weight as a crucial variable.

The law of free fall—i.e., a body in free fall from rest traverses a distance proportional to the square of the time elapsed—was discovered by Galileo through the inclined plane experiments (Drake 1999, v. 2). At first, Galileo attempted to represent this phenomenon with a velocity-distance relation, and the equivalent mean proportional relation. His later and correct definition of natural acceleration dependent on time was an insight gained through recognizing the physical significance of that mean proportional relation (Machamer and Hepburn 2004; for a different analysis of Galileo’s discovery of free fall see Renn, et al. 2000). Yet Galileo would not publish anything making time central to his analysis of motion until 1638, in the Two New Sciences.

In 1609, Galileo began his work with the telescope. There are many ways to describe Galileo’s findings, and many interpreters have taken this to be an interlude irrelevant to his physics. However, they are remarkable insofar as they are his start at dismantling the celestial-terrestrial distinction entrenched in Aristotelian cosmology (Feyerabend 1975). Perhaps the most unequivocal case of this is when he analogizes the mountains on the moon to mountains in Bohemia in the Starry Messenger. Also crucial was his discovery of the four moons circling Jupiter, which lent credence to the Copernican system since it meant that a planet-moon arrangement was not unique to the Earth. The abandonment of the dichotomy between heavens and earth implied that all matter, whether celestial or terrestrial, is of the same kind. Further, if there is only one kind of matter, there can be only one kind of natural motion—one kind of motion that this matter has by nature. So it has to be that one law of motion will hold throughout the terrestrial and celestial realms. This is a far stronger claim than he had made in 1590, which concerned only the terrestrial elements.

A few years later, in his Letters on Sunspots (1613), Galileo offered new telescopic evidence that supported the Copernican theory. But these observations also served as additional reasons for dissolving the celestial-terrestrial distinction. One was that the sun is not an immutable aetherial sphere, but has changing spots (maculae) on its surface. Another was that the sun rotates circularly around its axis, like the Earth. A third was the discovery that Venus undergoes a full sequence of phases (like the moon), which entails that Venus revolves around the sun, and suggests that the Earth is likewise a celestial body moving around the sun. Certainly the phases of Venus contradicted the Ptolemaic ordering of the planets.

Later, in 1623, Galileo argued for a quite mistaken material thesis. In The Assayer, he tried to show that comets are sublunary phenomena and that their properties could be explained by optical refraction. While this work stands as a masterpiece of scientific rhetoric, it is somewhat strange that Galileo should have argued against the superlunary nature of comets, which the great Danish astronomer Tycho Brahe had demonstrated earlier.

Yet even with all these developments, Galileo still needed to work out general principles concerning the nature of motion for this newly unified matter. In this respect, Galileo differed from Ptolemy (at least of the Almagest), Copernicus, or even Tycho Brahe, who treated their planetary systems—be they Earth- or sun-centered—merely as models of the planets’ observed motions; that is, as mathematical conceits for calculating observable positions. For Galileo, by contrast, Copernicanism was also a commitment to a physically realizable cosmography. Consequently, he needed to work out, at least qualitatively, a way of thinking about the actual motions of matter. He had to devise (or shall we say, discover) principles of local motion that would fit a central sun, planets moving around that sun, a whirling Earth, and everything on it.

This he did by introducing two new principles. In Day One of his Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems (1632), Galileo argues that matter will move naturally along circular trajectories, neither speeding up nor slowing down. Then, in Day Two, he introduces his version of the famous principle of the relativity of observed motion. This latter holds that observers cannot detect uniform motions they share with objects under observation; only differential motion can be seen. Of course, neither of these principles was entirely original with Galileo. They had predecessors. But no one needed them for the reasons that he did, namely that they were necessitated by a unified cosmological matter.

One key effect of these principles is that the diurnal terrestrial rotation asserted by the Copernican system is unobservable. The Earth and all the objects on it naturally move in circles around the Earth’s axis once a day, but since human observers share this motion, it cannot be detected. We only notice departures from shared rotation, such as bodies falling or rising. Consequently, “all experiments practicable upon the Earth are insufficient measures” for proving its stability or its mobility, “since they are indifferently adaptable to an Earth in motion or at rest” (Galilei 1967, 6). This blunted standard objections to Copernicanism on the grounds that there is no evidence of terrestrial motion.

Having dispelled these arguments against the Copernican system, Galileo then dramatically argues in its favor. In Day Three of the Dialogue. Salviati, Galileo’s avatar, has Simplicio, the ever-astounded Aristotelian, make use of astronomical observations, especially the facts that Venus has phases and that Venus and Mercury are never far from the sun, to construct a diagram of the planetary positions. The resulting diagram neatly corresponds to the Copernican model. Then in Day Four, Galileo offers a supposed proof of Copernican theory on the basis of the tides, asserting that they result from the combination of the Earth’s diurnal rotation and its annual motion around the sun.

In the Dialogue, things are more complicated than we have just sketched. Galileo, as noted, argues for circular natural motion. Yet he also introduces, in places, an intrinsic tendency for rectilinear motion. For example, Galileo recognizes that a stone whirled circularly in a sling would fly off along the rectilinear tangent if released (Galilei 1967, 189–94; see Hooper 1998). Further, in Day Four, when he is giving his mechanical explanation of the tides, he nuances his matter theory by attributing to water an additional power of retaining an impetus for motion such that it can generate a reciprocal movement once it is sloshed against a side of a basin. This was not Galileo’s first dealing with water. We saw it first in the De Motu around 1590, where Galileo discusses submerged and floating bodies, but he learned much more in his dispute over floating bodies (which produced the Discourse on Floating Bodies in 1612). In fact, a large part of that debate turned on the exact nature of water as matter, and what kind of mathematical proportionality could be used to correctly describe it and bodies moving in it (see Palmieri 1998; 2004).

The final chapter of Galileo’s scientific story came in 1638, with the publication of the Two New Sciences. The second science, discussed in the last two Days, deals with the principles of local motion and has been much commented upon in the Galilean literature. But the first science, discussed in the first two Days, has been misunderstood and infrequently discussed. It has misleadingly been called the science of the strength of materials, and so seems to have found a place in history of engineering, since such a course is still taught today. However, this science is not about the strength of materials per se. It is Galileo’s attempt to provide a mathematical science of his unified matter (see Machamer 1998a; Biener 2004; Machamer and Hepburn 2004). Galileo realizes that, before he can work out a science of the motion of matter, he must have some way of showing that the nature of matter may be mathematically characterized. Both the mathematical nature of matter and the mathematical principles of motion he believes belong to the science of “mechanics,” which is the name he gives for this new way of philosophizing.

So it is in Day One that Galileo begins to discuss how to describe mathematically (or geometrically) the causes of the breaking of beams. But this requires a way to reconcile mathematical description with the physical constitution of material bodies. In this vein, Galileo rejects using finite atoms as a basis for physical discussion, since they are not representable by continuously divisible mathematical magnitudes. Instead, he treats matter as composed of infinitely many indivisible—which is to say, mathematical—points. This allows him to give mathematical accounts for various properties of matter. Among these are the density of matter, its coherence in material bodies, and the properties of the resisting media in which bodies move. The Second Day lays out the mathematical principles concerning how bodies break. Galileo does all this by reducing the problems of matter to problems of how a lever and a balance function, which renders them mathematically tractable via the law of the lever. He had begun this back in 1590, though this time he believes he is getting it right, showing mathematically how bits of matter solidify and stick together, and how they break into bits.

The First Day also contains Galileo’s account of the acceleration of falling bodies, and the argument that they fall equally fast in a vacuum, whatever their weight. This discussion contains the famous thought experiment refuting the Aristotelian theory of fall, according to which the speed of a body’s fall is proportional to its weight. In this “short and conclusive” argument, Galileo supposes that two bodies, one heavier than the other, are suddenly conjoined in the midst of falling. On the one hand, if Aristotle is correct, the faster fall of the heavier body will be retarded by the slower motion of the lighter body, so that the conjoined body will fall slower than the original heavy body. And yet, the conjoined body is heavier than either original body, so it should also fall faster. Hence, there is a contradiction in the Aristotelian position (Gendler 1998; Palmieri 2005; Brown and Fehige 2019).

Galileo’s second new science, in Days Three and Four of the Two New Sciences, deals with the mathematical description of local motion and the laws governing it. This is now the motion of all matter, not just sublunary stuff, and the treatment takes the categories of time and acceleration as basic. Here is where Galileo enunciates his law of free fall, the parabolic path of projectiles, and other physical “discoveries” that would lay the foundation for modern physics (Drake 1999, v. 2).

In the projected Fifth Day, Galileo would have treated the power of moving matter to act by impact, which he calls the force of percussion. Ultimately, Galileo was unable to give mathematical principles of this kind of interaction, but this problem subsequently became an important locus of interest. René Descartes, probably following Isaac Beeckman, would eventually convert the problem into the task of finding equilibrium between the forces conserved by colliding bodies. Descartes’s own mathematical treatment was mistaken, but correct principles were given in 1668–9 by Christiaan Huygens, John Wallis, and Christopher Wren.

The sketch above provides the basis for understanding Galileo’s career. He offered a new science of matter, a new physical cosmography, and a new science of local motion. In all these, he used a mathematical mode of description based upon, though somewhat changed from, the proportional geometry of Book VI of Euclid’s Elements and of Archimedes (for details on the changes, see Palmieri 2001).

It is in this way that Galileo developed the categories of the mechanical new science, the science of matter and motion. His new categories utilized some of the basic principles of traditional mechanics, to which he added the category of time and so emphasized acceleration. But throughout, he was working out the details about the nature of matter so that it could be understood as uniform and universal, and treated in a way that allowed for coherent discussion of the principles of motion. It was due to Galileo that a unified matter became accepted and its nature became one of the problems for the new science that followed. After him, matter really mattered.

4. Galileo and the Church

No account of Galileo’s importance to philosophy can be complete if it does not discuss the Galileo Affair—the sequence of interactions with the Church that resulted in Galileo’s condemnation. The end of the affair is simply stated. In late 1632, in the aftermath of the publication of the Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems, Galileo was ordered to appear in Rome to be examined by the Congregation of the Holy Office; i.e., the Inquisition. In January 1633, a very ill Galileo made an arduous journey to Rome. From April, Galileo was called four times to hearings; the last was on June 21. The next day, June 22, 1633, Galileo was taken to the church of Santa Maria sopra Minerva, and ordered to kneel while his condemnation was read. He was declared guilty of “vehement suspicion of heresy,” and made to recite and sign a formal abjuration:

I have been judged vehemently suspect of heresy, that is, of having held and believed that the sun in the center of the universe and immoveable, and that the Earth is not at the center of same, and that it does move. Wishing however, to remove from the minds of your Eminences and all faithful Christians this vehement suspicion reasonably conceived against me, I abjure with a sincere heart and unfeigned faith, I curse and detest the said errors and heresies, and generally all and every error, heresy, and sect contrary to the Holy Catholic Church. (Quoted in Shea and Artigas 2003, 194)

Tradition, but not historical fact, holds that, after abjuring, Galileo mumbled, “Eppur si muove (and yet it moves).” He was sentenced to “formal imprisonment at the pleasure of the Inquisition,” but this was commuted to house arrest, first in the residence of the Archbishop of Siena, and then, from December 1633, at his villa in Arcetri. When he later finished his last book, the Two New Sciences (which does not mention Copernicanism at all), it had to be printed in Holland, and Galileo professed amazement at how it could have been published.

The details and interpretations of these proceedings have long been debated, and it seems that each year we learn more about what actually happened. One point of controversy is the legitimacy of the charges against Galileo, both in terms of their content and the judicial procedure. Galileo was charged with teaching and defending the Copernican doctrine that holds the sun is at the center of the universe and the Earth moves. The status of this doctrine was cloudy. In 1616, an internal commission of the Inquisition had determined that it was heretical, but this was not publicly proclaimed. Instead, Copernicus’s book had been placed on the Index of Prohibited Books—the list of books Catholics were forbidden to read without special permission—with the status “suspended until corrected.” Even more confusingly, the requisite corrections had appeared in 1620, but the book nevertheless remained on the Index until 1835. In fact, the Church’s first public pronouncement that Copernicanism is a heresy appears in Galileo’s condemnation.

Galileo’s own status was also problematic. In 1616, at the same time that the Inquisition was evaluating Copernicanism, they were also investigating Galileo personally—a separate proceeding of which Galileo himself was not likely aware. The outcome was Bellarmine’s admonition not to “defend or hold” the Copernican doctrine. This “charitable admonition” may (or may not) have been followed by a “formal injunction” “not to hold, teach, or defend it in any way whatever, either orally or in writing.” When the records of this disposition of the 1616 case were discovered in 1633, it made Galileo appear guilty of recidivism, having violated the Inquisition’s injunction by publishing the Dialogue.

To confound issues further, the case against Galileo transpired in a fraught political context. Galileo was a creature of the powerful Medici and a personal friend of Pope Urban VIII, connections that significantly modulated developments (Biagioli 1993). There were also pressures stemming from the Counter Reformation, the Thirty Years War, and resulting tensions within Urban’s papacy (McMullin 2005; Miller 2008). It has even been argued (Redondi 1983), that the charge of Copernicanism was the effect of a plea bargain meant to cover up Galileo’s genuinely heretical atomism, though this latter hypothesis has not found much support.

The legitimacy of the underlying condemnation of Copernicus on theological and rational grounds is even more problematic. Galileo had addressed this problem in 1615, when he wrote his Letter to Castelli and then the Letter to the Grand Duchess Christina. In these texts, Galileo argues that there are two truths: one derived from Scripture, the other from the created natural world. Since both are expressions of the divine will, they cannot contradict one another. However, Scripture and Creation both require interpretation in order to glean the truths they contain—Scripture because it is a historical document written for common people, and thus accommodated to their understanding so as to lead them towards true religion; Creation because the divine act must be distilled from sense experience through scientific enquiry. While the truths are necessarily compatible, biblical and natural interpretations can go awry, and are subject to correction.

Much philosophical controversy, before and after Galileo’s time, revolves around this doctrine of the two truths and their seeming incompatibility. Which of course, leads us immediately to such questions as: “What is truth?” and “How is truth known or shown?”

Cardinal Bellarmine was willing to countenance scientific truth if it could be proven or demonstrated (McMullin 1998). But Bellarmine held that the planetary theories of Ptolemy and Copernicus (and presumably Tycho Brahe) are only mathematical hypotheses; since they are just calculating devices, they are not susceptible to physical proof. This is a sort of instrumentalist, anti-realist position (Machamer 1976; Duhem 1985). There are any number of ways to argue for some sort of instrumentalism. Duhem (1985) himself argued that science is not metaphysics, and so only deals with useful conjectures that enable us to systematize phenomena. Subtler versions of this position, without an Aquinian metaphysical bias, have been argued subsequently and more fully by Van Fraassen (1980) and others. Less sweepingly, it can reasonably be argued that both Ptolemy and Copernicus’s theories were primarily mathematical, and that Galileo was defending not Copernicus’s theory per se, but the physical realization of it. In fact, it might be better to say the Copernican theory that Galileo was constructing was a physical realization of a simplified version of Copernicus’s theory, which dispensed with many of the technical details (eccentrics, epicycles, Tusi couples and the like). Galileo would be led to such a view by his concern with matter theory, which minimized the kinds of motion ascribed uniformly to all bodies. Of course, when put this way, we are faced with the question of what constitutes identity conditions for a theory. Still, there is clearly a way in which Galileo’s Copernicanism is not Copernicus’s.

The other aspect of all this that has been hotly debated is what constitutes proof or demonstration of a scientific claim. Galileo believed he had a proof of terrestrial motion. This argument concerning the cause of the tides is contained in On the Ebb and Flow of the Tides, a manuscript he composed in 1616 while Copernicanism was under the Inquisition’s scrutiny, and the main thrust of which appears in Day Four of the Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems.

In the first place, Galileo restricts the possible class of causes of the tides to mechanical interactions, and so rules out Kepler’s attribution of the cause to the moon. How could the moon cause the tides to ebb and flow without any connection to the seas? Such an explanation would be an invocation of magic or occult powers. Thus, for Galileo, the only conceivable (or maybe plausible) physical cause for the regular reciprocation of the tides is the combination of the diurnal and annual motions of the Earth. Briefly, as the Earth rotates around its axis, some parts of its surface are moving along with the annual revolution around the sun and some parts are moving in the contrary direction. (In the same way that a point near the top of a car’s wheel is rotating in the same direction as the car is moving, while a point near the ground is rotating toward the rear.) In the frame of the fixed stars, this creates accelerations and retardations of the Earth’s surface, and since the terrestrial waters are not attached to the surface, they slosh back and forth as their basins speed up and slow down. Hence the tides. Moreover, since the Earth’s diurnal and annual rotations are regular, so are the tidal periods. Local differences in tidal flows are due to the differences in the physical conformations of the basins in which they occur (for background and more detail, see Palmieri 1998). Albeit mistaken, Galileo’s commitment to mechanically intelligible causation makes this is a plausible argument. One can see why Galileo thinks he has some sort of proof for the motion of the Earth, and therefore for Copernicanism.

Yet one can also see why Bellarmine and the instrumentalists would not have been impressed. First, they did not accept Galileo’s restriction of possible causes to mechanically intelligible causes. Second, Galileo’s explanation is not precise; it does not account for many details of tidal motion. Most significantly, the motion of the Earth’s surface varies over twelve hours, not the six-hour cycle of the tides. Third, the argument does not touch upon the central position of the sun or arrangement of the planets as calculated by Copernicus. So at best, Galileo’s argument is an inference to the best partial explanation from a limited set of features of Copernicus’s theory. Meanwhile, there were compelling considerations about the size of celestial bodies that weighed against the Copernican cosmology, stemming from a lack of understanding of the telescope’s optics (Graney 2015).

Nevertheless, when the tidal argument is added to the earlier telescopic observations that show the improbabilities of the older celestial picture—the fact that Venus has phases like the moon and so must revolve around the sun; the principle of the relativity of perceived motion which neutralizes the physical arguments against a moving Earth; and so on—it was enough for Galileo to believe that he had the necessary proof to convince the doubters. Unfortunately, it was not until after Galileo’s death and the acceptance of a unified material cosmology, utilizing the presuppositions about matter and motion that were published in the Two New Sciences, that people were ready for such proofs. But this could occur only after Galileo had changed the acceptable parameters for gaining knowledge and theorizing about the world.

To read many of the documents of Galileo’s trial, see Finocchiaro 1989; Mayer 2012. To understand the long, tortuous, and fascinating aftermath of the Galileo affair see Finocchiaro 2005; and for Pope John Paul II’s 1992 rehabilitation of Galileo, see Coyne 2005.


Primary Sources: Galileo’s Works

The main body of Galileo’s work is collected in:

  • Favaro, Antonio (ed.), 1890–1909, Le Opere di Galileo Galilei, Edizione Nazionale, 20 vols., Florence: Barbera; reprinted 1929–1939 and 1964–1966. [available online]

English translations:

  • 1586, The Little Balance (La Bilancetta)
    • Fermi, Laura, and Bernardini, Gilberto (trans.) in Fermi, Laura, and Bernardini, Gilberto, 1961, Galileo and the Scientific Revolution, New York: Basic Books; reprinted 1965, New York: Fawcett; and 2003 and 2013, Mineola, NY: Dover.
  • ca. 1590, On Motion (De Motu)
    • Drabkin, I. E. (trans.) in Galilei, Galileo, 1960, On Motion and On Mechanics, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
    • Fredette, Raymond (trans.), 2000, De Motu Antiquiora, Berlin: Max Planck Institute for the History of Science. [available online]
  • ca. 1600, On Mechanics (Le Meccaniche)
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.) in Galilei, Galileo, 1960, On Motion and On Mechanics, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • 1606, Operations of the Geometric and Military Compass (Le Operazioni del Compasso Geometrico e Militare, Padua: Pietro Marinelli.)
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.), 1978, Operations of the Geometric and Military Compass, Washington, D.C.: Smithsonian Institution.
  • 1610, The Starry Messenger (Sidereus Nuncius, Venice: Thomas Baglioni.)
    • Van Helden, Albert (trans.), 1989, Sidereus Nuncius, or The Sidereal Messenger, Chicago: University of Chicago Press; 2nd edition, 2016; reprinted, with facsimile of Library of Congress’s first edition and expository essays, in De Simone, Daniel, and John W. Hessler (eds.), 2013, The Starry Messenger: From Doubt to Astonishment, Washington, D.C.: Library of Congress/Levenger Press.
    • Barker, Peter (trans.), 2004, Sidereus Nuncius, Oklahoma City: Byzantium Press.
    • Shea, William R. (trans.), 2009, Galileo’s Sidereus Nuncius, or A Sidereal Message, Sagamore Beach, MA: Science History Publications; 2nd revised printing, 2012.
  • 1612, Discourse on Floating Bodies (Discorso intorno alle Cose che Stanno in su l’Acqua, Florence: Cosimo Giunti.)
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.) in Drake, Stillman, 1984, Cause, Experiment, and Science, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • 1613, Letters on the Sunspots (Istoria e Dimostrazioni intorno alle Macchie Solari, Rome: Giacomo Mascardi.)
    • Reeves, Eileen, and Van Helden, Albert (trans.) in Galilei, Galileo, and Scheiner, Christoph 2010, On Sunspots, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1623, The Assayer (Il Saggiatore, Rome: Giacomo Mascardi.)
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.), in Galilei, Galileo, Grassi, Horatio, Guiducci, Mario, and Kepler, Johannes, 1960, The Controversy on the Comets of 1618, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • 1632, Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems (Dialogo sopra i Due Massimi Sistemi del Mondo, Florence: Giovanni Batista Landini.)
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.), 1967, Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems, Berkeley: University of California Press; reprinted 2001, New York: The Modern Library.
  • 1638, Discourses and Mathematical Demonstrations Concerning Two New Sciences (Discorsi e Dimostrazioni Matematiche intorno a Due Nuove Scienze, Leiden: Elsevier.)
    • Crew, Henry, and de Salvio, Alfonso (trans.), 1954, Dialogues Concerning Two New Sciences, New York: Dover Publications. This inferior translation, first published in 1914, has been reprinted numerous times and is widely available.
    • Drake, Stillman (trans.), 1974, [Discourses on the] Two New Sciences, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press; 2nd edition, 1989, reprinted 2000, Toronto: Wall and Emerson.

Collections of primary sources in English:

  • Drake, Stillman (ed.), 1957, The Discoveries and Opinions of Galileo, New York: Anchor Books.
  • Finocchiaro, Maurice A. (ed.), 1989, The Galileo Affair: A Documentary History, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Finocchiaro, Maurice A. (ed.), 2008, The Essential Galileo, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Shea, William R., and Davie, Mark (ed.), 2012, Galileo: Selected Writings, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

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  • –––, 2006, Galileo’s Instruments of Credit: Telescopes, Images, Secrecy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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  • Kepler, Johannes, 1610, Dissertation cum Nuncio Sidereo, Prague; translated as Kepler’s Conversation with Galileo’s Sidereal Messenger, E. Rosen (trans.), New York: Johnson Reprint Corporation, 1965.
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  • –––, 1998a, “Galileo’s Machines, His Mathematics, and His Experiments,” in P. Machamer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Galileo, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 53–79.
  • –––, 1998b, “Introduction,” in P. Machamer (ed.), Cambridge Companion to Galileo, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–26.
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  • –––, 2001, “The Obscurity of the Equimultiples: Clavius’ and Galileo’s Foundational Studies of Euclid’s Theory of Proportions,” Archive for the History of the Exact Sciences, 55 (6): 555–597.
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  • –––, 2004, “The Cognitive Development of Galileo’s Theory of Buoyancy,” Archive for the History of the Exact Sciences, 59: 189–222.
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  • –––, 2008, Reenacting Galileo’s Experiments: Rediscovering the Techniques of Seventeenth-Century Science, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
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Other Internet Resources

  • Galileo Galilei’s Notes on Motion, Joint project of the Biblioteca Nazionale Centrale, Florence; Museo Galileo, Florence; Max Planck Institute for the History of Science, Berlin.
  • The Galileo Project, maintained by Albert Van Helden; contains Dava Sobel’s translations of all 124 letters from Suor Maria Celeste to Galileo in the sequence in which they were written.
  • Museo Galileo, The Institute and Museum of the History of Science, Florence, Italy.


Thanks to Zvi Biener and Paolo Palmieri for commenting on earlier drafts of this entry.

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