Natural Philosophy in the Renaissance

First published Tue Apr 14, 2015; substantive revision Mon Sep 18, 2023

Natural philosophy, as distinguished from metaphysics and mathematics, is traditionally understood to encompass a wide range of subjects which Aristotle included in the physical sciences. According to this classification, natural philosophy is the science of those beings which undergo change and are independent of human beings. This vast field of inquiry was described in Aristotelian treatises such as Physics, On the Heavens, On Generation and Corruption, Meteorology, History of Animals, On the Parts of Animals, On the Generation of Animals, On the Soul (whose Renaissance reception is not discussed in the present entry); the so-called parva naturalia (other minor writings); and some apocrypha (e.g., the Problemata), which were taught in the universities in the Middle Ages and in the Renaissance. During the Renaissance, despite the enduring centrality of the Aristotelian paradigm for the discipline, natural philosophy was enriched and expanded by a number of further approaches. By the end of the sixteenth century natural philosophy was no longer purely identified with the Aristotelian system or a standard university curriculum. At the same time, the proliferation of new contexts and ways of learning did not automatically eliminate older ones, and this fusion contributed to the birth of modern science in a period of religious and political upheaval.

1. Defining Renaissance Natural Philosophy

Renaissance natural philosophy defies easy definition, since descriptions of it may oversimplify, either by reducing it to its connections with medieval science or, alternatively, forcing it into a teleology that culminates in the Scientific Revolution of the seventeenth century. Hence, there have been two opposing tendencies in scholarship: one which conflates the natural philosophy of the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries with the variety practiced in the Middle Ages, even going so far as to interpret the Renaissance as a period of conservatism in this regard; another which emphasizes the role of Renaissance natural philosophy as a “precursor” of modern science, even at the cost of ignoring or removing its connections to disciplines today considered pseudo-scientific, such as physiognomy, astrology, and magic. Recent contributions, however, have helped to outline the characteristics of Renaissance natural philosophy in their own terms. Medieval natural philosophy was usually based in the corpus aristotelicum and practiced in universities. Yet this did not mean that its approach was purely static or regressive; on the contrary, thinkers like Jean Buridan, Biagio Pelacani, and Nicole Oresme took Aristotelian physics and mechanics in new directions in medieval Europe. Nevertheless, the nature of medieval universities was such that teaching was heavily controlled by authorities, and especially outside of Italy both metaphysics and theology exercised a strong influence. This imposed some limitation to the directions in which scientific theorization could advance. Paradoxically, it was the return of another, rival school of thought—Platonism—that ultimately allowed for more freedom within the Aristotelian tradition. Though Plato’s philosophy had never completely disappeared during the course of the Middle Ages, the consolidation of a Neoplatonic school in the fifteenth century led to the clear distinctions between the spheres which properly belonged to the two great thinkers of the ancient world. While Plato was regarded as a theologian and master of the metaphysical realities, Aristotle was seen as an investigator of the sublunar world subject to generation and corruption. The recovery of this ancient dichotomy had the effect of undermining the longstanding ties between Aristotelianism and Scholasticism, and opened up new spaces for philosophy unimpaired by metaphysical limitations. Moreover, an open dialogue with the Platonic tradition, caused several professors to question Aristotle’s coherence and reliability. At the same time, also Platonism and other brands of ancient philosophy—Stoicism, Skepticism, and Epicureanism—stimulated reflection on the natural world in different ways, also in terms of method. The application of these ideas to various fields of inquiry gave Renaissance natural thought a distinctive identity, forged in continuous dialectic with Aristotelianism itself. Aristotelianism therefore represented the driving force behind Renaissance philosophy of nature, both because of its plurality of approaches and internal debates, and also because it served as the polemical target of those who challenged the traditional paradigm of university teaching: both followers and adversaries of Aristotle had constantly to negotiate with his authoritative legacy, and manipulate it. Finally, other factors of a non-speculative character also had an impact on natural philosophy: technological innovations such as printing, the telescope and the microscope, geographical discoveries, and developments within the universities themselves, such as the institution of botanical gardens.

2. Natural Philosophy and the Curriculum

2.1 Universities and Textbooks

The Aristotelian natural corpus covered a wide range of subjects in a number of separate texts: while the Physics was a sort of general work—which appeared to some fifteenth- and sixteenth-century authors more metaphysical, even overlapping with the Metaphysics—the other treatises represented different sections of natural philosophy on particulars. The success and influence of Aristotelian natural philosophy was due to its centrality to university teaching, where it was favored because it covered every topic, like an encyclopedia. Few attempts were made to reconsider which texts represented the core of the study of natural philosophy in the universities; one remarkable exception was Pierre de la Ramée (1515–1572), who put a distinctive emphasis on particular sciences at the expense of study of the Physics. Physics, along with On the Heavens, Meteorology, and On Generation and Corruption, was the main reference for natural philosophy in the traditional curricula of the Faculty of Arts. Universities—especially in Italy—appointed many lecturers in natural philosophy, who usually received high salaries. In the second half of the sixteenth century, separate chairs of botany, mathematics, and even chemistry (in Mantua and Germany), were established. Aristotelian texts were traditionally studied according to the commentaries by Averroes (which provided the internal partition of the texts into sections).

Between the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, the works of other, more ancient commentators on Aristotle were also adopted: those of Alexander of Aphrodisias and Simplicius were particularly popular, the first because of its radical mortalism, the second for its Neoplatonic and conciliatory tendencies. The rediscovery of the ancient commentators was accompanied by an increasing reliance on the Greek texts in universities, despite the enduring predominance of medieval Latin material. New commentaries also appeared alongside the ancient ones: practically all of the most prominent professors composed their own commentaries to the Aristotelian natural texts, in particular between the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Usually these commentaries followed the texts according to the Averroistic divisions, but sometimes they were organized in quaestiones.

Furthermore, the advent of printing made a large selection of textbooks more widely available: some of them were very short introductions for younger students, others were compendia, others paraphrases (like those by Jacques Lefèvre d’Etaples (1455–1536), printed for the first time in 1492), and still others dialogues (again, Lefèvre d’Etaples created some of the most significant examples). Other popular works used for teaching were abridged versions of the Aristotelian treatises reduced to conclusiones, like the popular Textus abbreviatus philosophiae naturalis by the French theologian Thomas Bricot (d. 1516). There were also many different textbooks, which generally followed canonical organizations: either they explained the Aristotelian works according to their order in the corpus, or they highlighted subjects like principles, causes, movement, infinity, place, void, and time. The famous Commentarii Conimbricenses, which from 1594 on became the standard text in the Jesuit curriculum, contains a whole course on natural philosophy organized as a commentary of the Aristotelian corpus. Particularly after the second half of the sixteenth century, vernacular treatments of Aristotelian natural philosophy also began to circulate, such as the translations by Antonio Brucioli (1498–1566), the paraphrases by Alessandro Piccolomini (1508–1579), the summaries by Jean de Champaignac (fl. 1595) and Scipion Dupleix (1569–1661), and the works by Cesare Crivellati (1553–1640), the latter explicitly addressed to university students.

2.2 Natural Philosophy’s Rivalries and Interactions

Natural philosophy interacted with many other disciplines. The close relationship between natural philosophy and medicine had already been stressed by Aristotle himself at the beginning of On Sense and Sensible (436a19–436b2). Medicine often competed with natural philosophy within the universities: philosophy was a curricular requirement for those who wanted to study medicine in the Italian universities and many of the greatest Renaissance natural philosophers were also physicians (e.g., Alessandro Achillini (1463–1512) and Simone Porzio (1496–1554); there were also professional physicians who wrote on natural philosophy, such as Balthassar Pisanellus (fl. 1559) and Daniel Furlanus (d. 1600)). Ubi desinit philosophus (or physicus), incipit medicus (“where the philosopher ends, the physician begins”): so went a proverb which implied an ambiguous boundary between the two disciplines: on the one hand, it reflected the need to move beyond the theory represented by philosophy and into the actual practice of medicine; on the other, it affirmed the idea that natural philosophy was necessary in order to prepare for medical studies. From this perspective, natural philosophy represented either a mere preparatory stage on the way to the more perfect and concrete knowledge of medicine, or, alternatively, medicine was subordinate to natural philosophy (others, like the philosopher Jacopo Zabarella (1533–1589), preferred to distinguish natural philosophy from medicine because these two disciplines did not share subject and method).

The Renaissance debate over the superiority of Aristotle or Galen was part of this rivalry: Aristotle was regarded by physicians as an important authority because of his philosophical system, but Galen had offered in his works more precise observations of the human body. Nonetheless, since many points of their disagreement (e.g., the localization of the brain functions) were merely founded on speculation, some doctors preferred to demonstrate the harmony between Aristotle and Galen in order to overcome this impasse.

Another discipline often compared to natural philosophy was astrology. The Jesuit Benito Pereira (1536–1610) stated that natural philosophy is different from astrology because, among other reasons, the former studies things a priori, the latter a posteriori. Pereira also claimed that natural philosophy was not capable of delineating its own sphere of inquiry, something which was possible for other disciplines such as logic and metaphysics.

University courses on the Physics traditionally began with a lecture on ethical themes. This arrangement was inspired by Averroes’ proem to the text, which argued for the moral perfection of the speculative man. The connection between ethics and natural philosophy also appeared in discussions of subjects like the immortality of the soul or the human will, and consequently ethical discussions could occupy large sections both in reportationes of lessons and commentaries.

3. Revising the Curriculum: Academies, Philology, and Botanical Gardens

Outside of universities and schools, there were also other places where natural philosophy was cultivated, particularly in academies and learned societies. Even in literary societies such as the Accademia Fiorentina (1541), patronized by Duke Cosimo de’Medici and his descendants, scientific matters (e.g., alchemy or spontaneous generation) were occasionally debated, often in the context of commentaries on the poems of Dante and Petrarch. The Accademia dei Lincei, founded in 1603, on the other hand, was exclusively interested in the sciences: as their statute dictated, the Lincei had no interest in any controversy which was not scientific or mathematical, and they avoided involvement in political matters. The Accademia dei Lincei, like the Accademia del Cimento after it (1657), was founded and patronized by members of the aristocracy, but never became as well-grounded as other learned societies, such as the Royal Society (1661) or the Académie Royale (1666), which were directly sponsored by the state (the Académie Royale even received financial support from the treasury). Both of these latter institutions developed out of more informal associations and they encouraged collaboration among their members; they also explicitly endorsed the open and public exchange of ideas, as opposed to the secretive practices of groups like the Lincei. Their members gave public demonstrations of their work, and the secrecy which had characterized scientific pursuit for centuries was eventually abandoned in favor of a new empirical approach.

Nonetheless, even when they did not sponsor academies, Renaissance lords and patrons often had a particular interest in scientific works and treatises, especially those devoted to subjects of military value (such as the works on metalworking by Vannoccio Biringuccio and George Agricola, or Niccolò Tartaglia’s treatise on ballistics, in the mid-sixteenth century), or booklets dedicated to parva naturalia, which were intended as forms of intellectual entertainment and usually contained descriptions of miranda naturae or astrological predictions. Exceptional natural events such as earthquakes—a famous one occurred in Pozzuoli in 1537—led to the publication of a number of short treatises that interpreted the calamity as either a natural phenomenon or as a sign sent by the celestial influences: these works were particularly sought after by powerful men, who wanted to be reassured about the significance of natural events and their possible consequences. Several Renaissance rulers cultivated an interest in sciences like alchemy, and patronized or participated first-hand in investigations of the natural world: disciplines like zoology, which depended on the collection of material, information, and drawings, relied particularly heavily on the sponsorship of the wealthy and powerful. The zoological and botanical works and catalogues which, though composed by university professors, started from the 1540s to circulate around Europe, were often addressed to or sponsored by rulers, who had the means to employ artists and other specialists needed to complete these costly volumes. Drawings were not simply ornaments to a text, but a necessity for accurate classification of plants and animals.

The same desire for accuracy that motivated the production of scientific images also led to more rigorous editions and translations of classic scientific texts, whose impact was magnified by the printing press. Between 1495 and 1498 Aldus Manutius printed the “Greek Aristotle” in Venice, an edition prepared by a team which included the humanist-physicians Niccolò Leoniceno and Thomas Linacre under the guidance of another physician, Francesco Cavalli. Consequently, Manutius’s edition, which incorporated significant improvements of the Aristotelian texts such as those proposed years before by Theodor Gaza for the Historia Animalium, favored the scientific works by Aristotle and did not include, for example, either Rhetoric or Poetics. Yet the scientific text that received the most attention from philologists was Pliny’s Natural History. Between the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries Pliny’s work was emended by philologists such as Ermolao Barbaro, Angelo Poliziano, and Niccolò Leoniceno—and also translated several times in the vernaculars—in increasingly sophisticated versions. Both the editions and the translations were intended to allow for a correct understanding of the text, which was often used by doctors and apothecaries. The same thing happened with Dioscorides’ Materia medica, a text that unlike the encyclopedic Natural History was plainly addressed to a medical audience, and which was then repeatedly emended and translated by professional physicians and natural philosophers. Yet, also authors like Virgil, Horace and Ovid were common presences in discussions about botany, and even a philological evaluation of the text of the Bible could provide material to natural philosophers.

The foundation of botanical gardens in Pisa, Padua, and Florence (1544–1545), and then in Bologna, Leiden, Oxford, Montpellier, and Germany testify to the fact that empirical knowledge was increasingly considered a necessity even in the universities, despite the fact that even at the end of the sixteenth century chairs in botany, such as the one occupied by Andrea Cesalpino (1519–1603) in Pisa, came with lower salaries than the ones given to their “speculative colleagues” who taught natural philosophy or medicine. The aforementioned catalogues of animals and plants, like those published by Pierre Belon (1517–1564), Guillaume Rondelet (1507–1566), and Ulisse Aldrovandi (1522–1605), were thus a combination of received authority and empirical observation, based on 1) a philological and critical knowledge of the classical texts, not a passive reading of them; and 2) direct observations and conversations not only with erudite peers and colleagues, but also with the so-called “invisible technicians”—fishermen, sailors, and peasants who had first-hand knowledge of the relevant subjects and provided scientists with important pieces of information. Not by chance, in a little-explored field like the study of minerals, the most significant contributions came from self-described “men without letters” (meaning not Latinate), such as Leonardo da Vinci (1452–1519) and the potter Bernard Palissy (1510–1589), who identified fossils as the result of organic processes rather than abstract virtues.

These empirical approaches were also stimulated by the European discovery of the Americas and other continents, which contained plants and animals never known or never described by classical authorities like Aristotle and Pliny. The new knowledge brought by travelers and explorers helped debunk erroneous doctrines advocated by Aristotle, such as the uninhabitability of the torrid zone from Meteorology 362b 6–9: a major exponent of Renaissance Aristotelianism, Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), publicly mocked the Philosopher during his classes when discussing this passage, and supported his position by referring to the direct, recent observations of the navigator Antonio Pigafetta.

The shift from a text-based approach to the study of nature founded on the study of a limited number of authors, to a new one based on an enlarged encyclopedia and, above all, direct observation, reached its full expression at the time of Galileo Galilei; but it was already perceptible in the writings of Lorenzo Valla (circa 1406–1457)—who appealed to common sense against the absurdity of some of the Aristotelian tenets—and in those of Leonardo da Vinci, who invoked a virtuous interaction between science and practice. When Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639) stated that he learned more from the anatomy of an ant or an herb than from any book ever written, he was simply expressing in a beautiful and poetic form a shared methodological creed.

4. Aristotelian Tenets, Platonic Tenets, and More

The principal tenets of the Aristotelian natural philosophy were: the doctrine of form and matter, the four causes, the rigid separation of the world into opposed spheres, and the finite nature of the universe. During the Renaissance, these precepts were both defended and revised by Aristotelian professors, or challenged by others who sought to dismantle traditional philosophy. While these new philosophers could rely on new evidence, methods, and observations to define the nature of the universe, in other cases the rejection of Aristotelian doctrines and their substitution with new paradigms was mainly based on speculative arguments.

4.1 Principles and Matter

4.1.1 Principles

According to Aristotle, if the sublunar world was characterized by mutability, the supralunar world was—on the contrary—absolutely immutable. The fundamental principles of Aristotelian physics were in fact matter, form, and privation, and the natural sublunar world was therefore the location where according to these principles generation and corruption took place. Independent philosophers offered alternatives to these principles and to the Aristotelian hylemorphic apparatus. In order to describe nature within its own limits, Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588)—a staunch opponent of Aristotelianism—defended a different set of principles which had already been proposed by authors such Girolamo Cardano (1501–1576) and Girolamo Fracastoro (circa 1476–1553), and which he argued was based on data gathered from experience rather than on arbitrary constructions. These alternative principles were passive matter and active force, the latter distinguished into heat and cold. It was the interplay—or rather, the battle—between these opposite forces that brought about the natural world. Since every natural being depends on the interaction between cold and heat, it must know what is necessary for its survival: therefore everything, including the forces themselves, possesses sensation, which was not related to the faculties of the soul, as in Aristotelian psychology. This connection between sensus and self-preservation was also advocated by Tommaso Campanella, who emphasized its importance for natural magic. Telesio’s polemical refusal of Aristotle and his call for physical inquiry made within natural limits was appreciated and praised even by those who recognized the contradictions in his theories. Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597), who attacked Aristotle from a Platonic perspective in his Nova de Universis Philosophia (1591), rebuked Telesio for the latter’s claim to have relied exclusively on the senses and rejected reason: he pointed out that, in reality, Telesio did rely on metaphysical arguments, though he claimed to deny them (for his part, Patrizi believed that natural philosophy requires metaphysical tools to fill in its gaps). The same recognition of too much reliance on metaphysics drove Francis Bacon (1561–1626) to reject Telesio’s views in favor of experimental empiricism and of a full endorsement of the testimony of sensory perception.

4.1.2 The Nature of Matter

Most Aristotelian interpreters believed matter to be prope nihil, pure potentiality, while others believed that it possessed a certain degree of reality and actuality. The discussion on the nature of matter was further complicated by the suggestions offered by other traditions of thought, Platonism above all. According to Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499) in his Platonic Theology, prime matter had an existence which is not dependent upon form. Closely following the Timaeus, he claimed that matter can therefore be intelligible, though in a weaker way. Giordano Bruno (1548–1600) proposed an even more radical departure from traditional views of the passivity of matter. In the De la causa, principio et uno, Bruno affirmed that matter is an active principle, not passive. Matter contains within itself every form, both corporeal and incorporeal, and can be described as a kind of infinite life. Bruno’s conception of matter also served as the basis for his cosmological views (see below), and in particular for his claim that the universe is infinite. A few years later, Tommaso Campanella returned to a more traditional position. In the Del senso delle cose e della magia (printed in 1620) he argued for the synonymity between matter and body, and against the identification of matter with the Aristotelian prope nihil, though he did emphasize its passivity: matter receives forms from external agents and does not produce them from within itself.

Closely related to these problems was Aristotle’s doctrine of prime matter, which had controversial implications: as matter was eternal, so was the world, and therefore the Christian dogma of the creation of the world was untenable. Scholastic philosophers had long struggled with this subject during the Middle Ages, and the most interesting developments during the Renaissance were driven by the confrontation between Aristotelianism and Platonism. Plato, in the Timaeus, had clearly spoken of a God-creator, and once again his doctrines were adopted by authors anxious to establish a new philosophical foundation for Christianity. Bessarion (d. 1472), for example, admitted that according to Plato matter was eternal, but that he distinguished it clearly from the creator, who possesses a superior eternity. In similar fashion, Marsilio Ficino expressly described prime matter as created and therefore not subject to generation and corruption. Aristotelians were not always afraid, however, to argue for the eternity of the prime matter: Francesco Vimercato (1512–1569), in his posthumous De rerum principiis, is the most remarkable example. As late as the beginning of the seventeenth century, the debate continued: Cesare Crivellati composed a dialogue (1617) between Plato and Aristotle in which the master rebukes his unfaithful student for teaching such an impious doctrine. On the other hand, there were also authors who attempted to establish an accord between Plato and Aristotle on this sensitive issue: a good example is the De naturae philosophia seu de Platonis et Aristotelis consensione (1554) by Sebastian Fox Morcillo (1526–1560), in which the Spanish philosopher compares the doctrines of the Timaeus and the Physics, and emphasizes the limits of both in front of the perfection of religion.

Other thinkers instead had a pragmatic approach to prime matter: alchemists like the Swiss physician Paracelsus (1493–1541) sought to find a principle to which every substance could be reduced. Though openly challenging traditional university teaching, Paracelsus did not reject canonical motifs. For example, he relied on the four elements (air, fire, water, earth), but he also proposed a new triad: sulfur, mercury, and salt. Yet, even this proposal was not as iconoclastic as it appears, since it was partially founded on the Aristotelian doctrine of the formation of metals contained in the Meteorology (341b 6ff.). Nonetheless, by emphasizing the processes of association and dissociation of substances, Paracelsus offered an important contribution to the transformation of alchemy into chemistry (even if the two terms were often intended as interchangeable). Gradually chemistry separated from physics, understood as the science of bodies subject to movement, and positioned itself as the science of bodies associated and dissociated. Johann Baptist Van Helmont (1579–1644), who opposed the Paracelsian principles, developed a corpuscular doctrine of matter, a variant of atomistic theory. Atomism in the Renaissance was typically related to the Neoplatonic concept of semina and to the Epicurean philosophy, and was usually advocated by radical anti-Aristotelian thinkers like Giordano Bruno. And while it is true that Aristotle rejected atomism and the existence of the void, there were ways to argue for a Peripatetic version of atomism.

Some medieval philosophers admitted the existence of minima naturalia, the limits beyond which form is not conserved. The doctrine of the minima was intended to resolve a problem raised by Aristotle in On Generation and Corruption (327a 30–328b 24), namely, that of the necessity of finding a philosophical justification for combination, an intermediate phenomenon between generation and corruption. Over the course of the Renaissance the doctrine of minima naturalia was further elaborated by authors like Agostino Nifo (circa 1469–circa 1539) and Julius Caesar Scaliger (1484–1558). Scaliger granted a consistency to the minima, making them not mere limits, but real physical components that cannot be further divided. Furthermore, he rejected traditional atomism, because it did not achieve the continuity of the corpuscles which constitute a body. Despite their opposition to Peripateticism, the corpuscularism of Van Helmont and Daniel Sennert (1572–1637) was rooted in this tradition. Sennert, in particular, was unable to reject the Aristotelian concept of form, and aimed instead to establish a concord between Aristotelianism and atomism. Even in a work programmatically entitled Philosophia Naturalis adversus Aristotelem (1621), Sebastian Basson—who defended corpuscularism—denied the existence of the void and rejected a mechanization of the natural world. It was Galileo Galilei who made a bold departure from the qualitative background of Aristotelian matter, defending a mechanistic form of atomism in which atoms did not have dimensions. Despite the attempts of Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655) to conciliate it with Christianity, atomism bothered traditionalists also for its theological implications, both large (the teleological vision of the world) and small (transubstantiation). Even René Descartes (1596–1650) came under attack for this reason. Debate over the existence of the void was also lively throughout the seventeenth century, largely because of the experimental work of Evangelista Torricelli (1608–1647), Valeriano Magni (1586–1661), Otto Von Guericke (1602–1686), and Robert Boyle (1627–1691), who opposed the traditional views of the so-called “plenists”.

4.2 Old Cosmologies, New Cosmologies

The rigid peripatetic division of the universe into two different parts—one immutable and made of crystalline spheres, situated between the fixed stars and the moon, the other mutable, under the moon—was also related in the Aristotelian paradigm to the concept of the natural sublunar world formed by the four elements: fire, air, water, and earth. Every element behaves differently, according to its so-called “natural movement”. Light elements, such as fire and air, always tend to go upward, while heavy elements, such as water and earth, move downward following a rectilinear movement. Every element aims, in fact, to reach its own natural place, unless an external force causes a movement opposite to its nature—a “violent movement” (e.g., a stone thrown into the air). In both cases, Aristotelian theory considers movement as a quality common to all natural things because of the elements which compose them. By contrast, the heavens, since perfect and composed by a single element (aether), are immutable and travel in constant circular motion around an immovable center represented by Earth. An important corollary to the theory of natural places was the finite character of the world, because it implied the existence of a unique center (the Earth), while evidently it would not be possible for an infinite universe to have a center.

These longstanding paradigms were destined to be challenged from the sixteenth century onward, both from a speculative and an empirical perspective. Observation of stellae novae and comets condemned the crystalline spheres and raised doubts regarding the doctrine of the immutability of heavens. According to the traditional Aristotelian account, comets were phenomena in the sublunar atmosphere. The great astronomer Johannes Regiomontanus (1436–1476) did not challenge this vision of the cosmos when he calculated the distance of the 1472 comet by considering the angle of parallax, but about a century later, the Jesuit Christopher Clavius (1538–1612), observing a nova (1572), and Tycho Brahe (1546–1601), observing a comet (1577), both demonstrated that the suddenly bright star and the comet must lie beyond the moon, and that therefore the doctrine of the spheres was false. The demonstrated fluidity of heavens also compromised, more crucially, the doctrine of their immutability. Two factors made possible such an achievement: the availability of better measuring instruments, and a stronger emphasis on mathematics. This emphasis on mathematics was probably the most important contribution of Platonism to the development of natural philosophy, and in particular astronomy, during the Renaissance. Though it is true that Neoplatonic philosophers had proposed alternatives to the Peripatetic theories on the heavens (e.g., Marsilio Ficino argued that the heavens were made of spiritus and rejected the division of the universe into spheres), it was their insistence on the importance of geometry and mathematics that helped opening the way to the quantitative vision of the world, which gradually replaced the qualitative paradigm connected to the Aristotelian tradition.

The decision of Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543) to propose a heliocentric system, remove the Earth from the center of the universe, and establish a relationship between the distances of the different planets from the sun and the amplitude of their orbits was based on mathematical reasoning and the weaknesses of Aristotelian-Ptolemaic system in this regard. Johannes Kepler (1571–1630) defended the Copernican theory by re-utilizing geometrical arguments from Plato’s Timaeus, and he also developed other theories (such as the elliptical form of the planetary orbits) founded on the geometrical structure that he attributed to the universe. Despite the fact that aspects of his method, and in particular the regressus, were essentially Aristotelian, Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) has been often described as a Platonist, insofar as Platonism endorsed a mathematical approach. Galileo denied the reality of the physical elements of the Aristotelian world and the theory of their natural movements, and replaced them with corporeal matter, whose properties and motions could be described in mathematical terms. Furthermore, by relying on new instruments such as the telescope, Galileo was also able to make new observations which revealed the imperfections of the supralunar world. Galileo and the Copernican theory met with the resistance of the Church, but also of the universities, whose professoriate was not eager to renounce one of the central pillars of its teaching. On the other hand, the Tychonic system elaborated by Brahe, which attempted to conciliate the traditional Aristotelian-Ptolemaic cosmology with Copernicus, encountered support even among Jesuit scientists.

However, neither mathematics nor fresh observations were capable of resolving the problem of the nature of the universe: was it finite or infinite? Is there only one world or do multiple worlds exist? According to the Aristotelians the universe must be finite, because it is impossible to have an infinite body in act, and Copernicus and his followers also endorsed the finitude of the heavens. Theology, however, offered arguments against the finitude of the universe: Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464) connected the infinity of God to the infinity of heavens, and Palingenio Stellato (or Pierangelo Manzolli, 1500/3–1543 ca.), in his Zodiacus Vitae, compiled themes from different traditions (e.g., the Aristotelian spheres and the Platonic ideas), describing a universe made of infinite light in order to celebrate the glory of God. Francisco Suarez (1548–1617), and a few years later the Conimbricenses, also defended the existence of an infinite space, even if it was only an imaginary one, combining Peripatetic doctrines with theological ones (above all the omnipresence of God, which cannot be limited by a finite space). Giordano Bruno used the relationship between God and His creation to argue for the infinity of the world. Bruno’s position was in complete opposition to the Aristotelian cosmology: the spheres are broken, there is no hierarchy between the different parts of the world and no center, and therefore the natural movements are rejected. Bruno developed his theory of infinity not only by relying on metaphysical arguments, but also on a radical revision of the Aristotelian definition of space, which he understood as a continuous quantity. Bruno’s proposal provoked reactions all over Europe: Kepler rejected it several times in different ways. Nevertheless, Kepler agreed with Bruno’s belief in the plurality of worlds—a problem which raised theological issues because of the question of salvation. Tommaso Campanella—an author who denied the infinity of the universe—resolved it by arguing that the inhabitants of the other worlds were not men, and therefore did not need to be saved by God.

4.3 Miracles, Magic, and Physiognomy

In the Middle Ages authors like Pietro of Abano, Nicolas Oresme, and John Buridan argued that any phenomenon, in particular those which were usually believed to be supernatural or miraculous, could be explained according to natural principles as the result of hidden causes. A number of Renaissance thinkers also adopted this approach, including Pietro Pomponazzi. In his De incantationibus, Pomponazzi stated that men tend to consider phenomena wondrous when they are not able to identify their causes as the work of demons or miracles. Pomponazzi attributed apparently miraculous events to the power of imagination, to psychological states or to the influence of the stars, since according to the Peripatetic paradigm the immutable first mover cannot have direct contact with the mutable sublunar world, and therefore moves through secondary causes. Nonetheless, despite his claim to speak purely secundum Aristotelem, Pomponazzi relied on a wider range of readings, including Marsilio Ficino. And in making these claims, Pomponazzi encroaches on very sensitive questions of religious faith. In his view, Christian miracles can be understood in the context of a sort of philosophy of history, founded on the horoscope of religions: when a religion begins, miracles occur, which are caused by starry influences, and when a religion declines, miracles disappear, because starry influences are weaker. This paradigm involved a rigid organization of the universe, which left little or no space for free will. Pomponazzi took this doctrine to its logical extreme in his De fato, a work in which he claimed to endorse Stoicism, while in reality exposing the determinism embedded in the Aristotelian doctrine of causes. Other Aristotelians who sought to avoid this determinism usually relied on the moderate position of Alexander of Aphrodisias, who Pomponazzi attacked in the first part of his treatise. While Pomponazzi reached these conclusions drawing on multiple sources, other authors, such as Gerardus Bucoldianus, Simone Porzio, and Ludovico Boccadiferro preferred to rely solely on Aristotle in order to explain wondrous events like cataclysms or the appearance of monstrous creatures, like those described by Ulisse Aldrovandi (1522–1605), who interpreted them as deviations from the course of nature, or Fortunio Liceti (1577–1657), who preferred to link the appearance of monsters to ingenious experiments of nature.

Nevertheless, this approach, which reduced the supernatural to the natural, was not always coupled with Aristotelianism. On the contrary, it was often directed against Peripatetic doctrines, particularly when it relied on experimental and empirical observations. The search for the occult causes of things, which was often related to magical beliefs and practices, effectively stimulated new empirical approaches: Giovanbattista della Porta (1535–1615) was among those who offered natural explanations for exceptional events while discarding the Aristotelian paradigm in favor of direct experience, in works such as the Magiae naturalis sive de miraculis rerum naturalium. Della Porta insisted on the sympathy and the antipathy of things, which are influenced by celestial virtues, when dealing with topics like optics and magnetism. And the De magnete of the anti-Aristotelian William Gilbert (1544–1603) mixed experimentation (aimed at the demonstration of the rotation and the magnetism of earth) with the belief in the existence of a soul belonging to the earth. The occult properties of things were also explored by other disciplines, such as medicine. Jean Fernel (1497–1558) and Girolamo Fracastoro argued that occult properties could be used to explain diseases and contagions.

The knowledge of the secrets of nature was in fact central to magic, a field which had an ambiguous relationship to natural philosophy. If a natural philosopher wanted to describe and understand nature, a practitioner of magic wanted to investigate it and its occult properties in order to master it. The Neoplatonic correspondences between macrocosmus—the world—and microcosmus—man—allow magic to exercise its power on a reality which was seen in vitalistic and transcendental terms: the book of nature for practitioners of magic was not the same one as that of the Aristotelians or of Galileo, but it was written with signs and allusions. Magical doctrines had a wide circulation throughout the Middle Ages, but were enriched in the fifteenth century by the rediscovery of the Corpus Hermeticum. The Corpus was a collection of heterogeneous texts, dealing both with practical magic and the mystical teachings attributed to Hermes Trismegistus, an Egyptian sage who purportedly lived at the time of Moses and was first in the lineage of a tradition of wisdom (the so-called prisca theologia). The alleged antiquity of the Corpus represented the strongest evidence of its authority and reliability, and thinkers like Marsilio Ficino in his De vita, and then Cornelius Agrippa (1486–1535) in his De occulta philosophia, proposed doctrines based on it. Their readers were encouraged to carve talismans and images, and surround themselves with precise colors or herbs connected to planetary influences in order to exploit the conjunction of the whole, a living being of which man is both part and lord. Magical treatises included recipes and empirical descriptions, and in his De augmentis Scientiarum even Francis Bacon described magic as an operative knowledge of hidden forms and the harmony of things, which displays the wonderful works of nature. The connection between micro and macrocosmus also underlay medical practice—as in the case of Ficino himself and later Paracelsus—and disciplines like physiognomy, which was considered part of the Aristotelian natural encyclopedia. Della Porta’s De physiognomia humana (1586), which was mainly a collection of past authorities that included ethical problems and was accompanied by illustrations, became the standard text on the topic until Lavater. There were also expressly hermetic approaches to the subject, including the one by Robert Fludd (1574–1637).

4.4 Natural Philosophy and Religion

Many of the doctrines of natural philosophy contrasted with the teachings of religion, and there were a number of possible solutions to this problem. Some authors appealed to the radical difference between the realms of faith and philosophy, relying on the Averroistic (even if not formulated by Averroes himself) doctrine of the “double truth”. This was the case, for example, of Pietro Pomponazzi. Yet other authors, such as Bessarion or Simone Porzio, who came from very different backgrounds, rejected any confusion between philosophy and faith at the latter’s expense (even though Bessarion, like Ficino, argued for a greater compatibility between Platonism and Christianity). There were also others, like the Jesuit Pedro da Fonseca (1528–1599), who considered Plato’s natural philosophy too dangerously similar to Christianity and therefore preferred the Aristotelian paradigm. On the other hand, some thinkers tried instead to genuinely reconcile philosophy and faith, particularly during the periods of doctrinal conflict and religious warfare that followed the Reformation. This was particularly true in Protestant countries, where even at the end of the sixteenth century the problem of the double truth was a matter of intense debate. Reformed scholars displayed a clear bias against Aristotle, the philosopher who they held responsible for sustaining the scholastic edifice of Catholic theology, and in Wittenberg they even mounted a short-lived attempt to replace him with Pliny: but the disordered approach of the Natural History made it unsuitable for superseding the Aristotelian encyclopedia for teaching. Philipp Melanchthon (1497–1560) reconciled the distinction between religion and science of nature by arguing that nature was creation of God and everything in it had to be seen as the work of providence. Some philosophers, such as John Amos Comenius (1592–1670), supported the alliance between natural science and religion by arguing for a philosophy based on the biblical teachings, even though this position was often intended to combat the excess of natural philosophers rather than to offer an alternative system. However, both in Protestant and Catholic contexts, scientists like Rheticus (1514–1574) and Galileo denied that the Bible had any scientific value (yet, refusing tout court the divine role in the explanation of Biblical events such as the Genesis flood, in favor a of a fully natural account, as Camilla Erculiani suggested in 1584, was likely to cause the intervention of the Roman Inquisition). Scholars like John Case (d. 1600), who considered Aristotelianism compatible with Christian dogmas such as creation and divine providence, were particularly fond of searching for ways to syncretize theology with natural philosophy. Attempts to reconcile the Philosopher with the Christian religion, even at the cost of relying on forced or fanciful readings, were still being made in the seventeenth century. Descartes will solve the interferences between natural science and religion by limiting the former to the investigation of finite objects, the only ones accessible to human beings. Yet, by posing limits to human knowledge, he also rejected an anthropocentric view of the creation.

Nor were these problems confined to Christian learned contexts: they were the subject of a number of similar reflections within the Jewish tradition as well. Jewish thinkers often considered natural science a mere system of hypotheses, which was capable of grasping only the superficial appearance of things, and was subordinate to the absolute truth offered by the Torah. This position was defended by authors such as Judah Loew ben Bezalel (also known as Maharal, 1520–1609), who posited a radical distinction between the natural world and the teachings of Torah, as well as Azariah Figo (1579–1547). In particular, Loew claimed that while it was possible to illuminate and explain the natural order of the physical world, this was not true of the relationship between God and the creation. This attitude was probably in part due to Jews’ sense of exclusion and marginalization from the institutions where natural philosophy was taught and practiced (an important exception to this rule was Italy, where personalities like Elijah del Medigo (circa 1458–1493) took advantage of the separation between science and theology in the universities). Nonetheless, all of these Jewish authors—both the Italian “free-thinkers” and those who defended the superiority of the Torah—still relied on Aristotle as the main authority for natural philosophy, and there were multiple attempts by philosophers like Ioseph ben Shem Tov (circa 1400–circa 1480) and Abraham Farissol (1451–circa 1525) to integrate the Stagirite within the Hebraic philosophical tradition. A minority of Jewish authors, including Moses Isserles (1520–1572), considered natural philosophy a useful tool for demonstrating the glory of God.


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