First published Thu Jun 18, 2020

Gaṅgeśa, the “Great Professor” (mahôpādhyāya), lived in the fourteenth century in northeastern India. In Sanskrit, he wrote a philosophic masterpiece called the “Jewel” solidifying several centuries of advances in epistemology and logic within the classical school of “Logic,” Nyāya. By all counts, Gaṅgeśa is one of the major figures not only in Nyāya but in the whole long and complex history of classical philosophy. Gaṅgeśa is traditionally taken to inaugurate “New” Logic, Navya Nyāya. However, the distinction between “Old” and “New” Nyāya is problematic, since over the tradition’s almost two-thousand-year history there are both numerous developments and solid lines of continuity. At no time is there a decisive revolution, not with Gaṅgeśa, and also not with Udayana, the eleventh-century Naiyāyika whom Gaṅgeśa follows more closely than any other thinker and whom scholars sometimes identify as the originator of Navya Nyāya. However, Nyāya’s methods of investigation and argumentation on a wide range of topic, and against opponents’ views—Buddhists in the early years, others later—do indeed become increasingly refined, and Gaṅgeśa’s work can in several ways be counted pivotal.

Nyāya is a multi-dimensional system of interlocking views that belies the stereotype of Indian philosophy as idealist and mystical in orientation. The school’s founding text is the Nyāya-sūtra (c. 100 CE), which had elicited tomes of commentary long before Gaṅgeśa. Nyāya is broadly realist about objects talked about and experienced everyday. Gaṅgeśa advances what may be called a reliabilist theory of knowledge and justification, indeed a super-reliabilism, an infallibilism for externalists in the sense that sources of knowledge—perception, inference, analogy, and testimony, his main focus—are conceived factively. Among his most major accomplishments are definitions of knowledge in general and of natural “pervasions” as underpinning inference as well as analyses of conditions governing meaning in knowledge-transfers through testimony. He is also known for crisp treatments of the major types of fallacy and epistemic defeater. Gaṅgeśa presents, defending in long passages, (a) an argument for a self as a special type of substance, (b) a theistic argument that illustrates his theory of debate and reasoning in great detail, and (c) a defense of the possibility of “liberation,” mukti, that both enlivens the views of very early Nyāya—in particular Vātsyāyana (c. 400 CE)—and becomes influential in several other traditions and schools. Nyāya itself has a lively literature that extends to the modern period and, among the traditionally learned, to our own day.

1. Historical particulars

Gaṅgeśa lived in the first half of the fourteenth century, in Mithilā, in northeastern India, where he was a prominent teacher, both of Nyāya, including logic and critical reasoning, and of Mīmāṃsā, the school known for Vedic interpretation and ritual. Gaṅgeśa endorses Nyāya in his Jewel, but he was also a great master of Mīmāṃsā. Mīmāṃsā is a long-running tradition which, like Nyāya, pronounces on almost every topic imaginable, along with Vedic ritual, the school’s specialization, as Nyāya’s is critical reasoning. Gaṅgeśa knew well Mīmāṃsaka positions in both of its major branches, the Bhāṭṭa (after Kumārila Bhaṭṭa of the seventh century), and the Prābhākara (after Kumārila’s renegade student, Prabhākara). And Gaṅgeśa may be supposed to have learned the standard curricula in the grammarian literature, the epic poems, etc., some of which he cites, for example, Pāṇini (c. 500 BCE), and, in several places, the Bhagavad Gītā.

Bhattacharya cites data from literary and other sources, and in about a dozen pages devoted to Gaṅgeśa (1958: 96–109) provides termini a quo et ad quem—1300 and 1350 for his period of flourishing—from evidence that has not been corrected to date. Genealogical records kept in Mithilā suggest that he had a wife and three sons and a daughter. One child was the famous Nyāya author, Vardhamāna. Gaṅgeśa apparently achieved quite some fame during his lifetime, referred to as “jagad-guru,” which would be the rough equivalent of “Distinguished University Professor” for the educational institutions of his time.

About the person little more is known. About Gaṅgeśa’s reputation, Bhattacharya says (1958: 109): “The work of Gaṅgeśa became highly popular very soon and was studied and commented upon in various centers of culture of India. It not only cast the works of the old school of logic into oblivion but the neo-logical works of his predecessors also faded into insignificance and were gradually were forgotten due to its overwhelming popularity and all-embracing character.” Concerning the part on inference, the learned sanskritist writes (1958: 107, 108): “The second part on Anumāna (Inference) is by far the most popular, though the most intricate of the whole book. … The latest phase of Navyanyāya studies in India for about two centuries flowed through a large number of channels cut by single sentences or phrases of this part of Gaṅgeśa’s work and by far the widest channel emerged from the general definition of Fallacy. It has now assumed proportions through the efforts of all the best Indian brains in Navyanyāya, which is a world’s wonder in the field of intellectual feats … .”

The Jewel has four chapters, each devoted to a source of knowledge: perception, inference, analogy, and testimony. Within a chapter are clearly delineated sections on various subtopics including long reflections, mainly in the first chapter, concerning knowledge in general and how it is known. Gaṅgeśa is lucid and precise, leading the reader into a preferred position by careful examination of alternatives.

2. Categories of possible referent in causal relationship

Gaṅgeśa’s central focus is epistemology, not ontology or metaphysics, but his analyses rely on a centuries-old ontological system. In all four chapters of the Jewel, he addresses ontological issues, especially the topics of universals and of the ontological relation of qualification that is reflected in knowledge of something as qualified by a qualifier, “That’s a cow,” for instance, which would be an instance of knowledge of something qualified by the universal being-a-cow.

The system that Gaṅgeśa takes over is inherited in particular from his “teacher” Udayana. In a dozen treatises, Udayana merges the separate literature and worldview of Vaiśeṣika—its advocates sometimes called “Atomists” —with Nyāya’s. Udayana also added the category of absence to the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra’s six, so that there are seven basic types of things possibly referred to in technical works as in everyday life:

  1. Substance: four atomic substances, earth, water, fire, and air atoms and their combinations; a “material” substance that is non-atomic, ether, the medium of sound; time; space; mind (manas); self (ātman)
  2. Quality: properties that dwell in, qualifying substances such as color, weight, shape, and so on along with relational properties such as conjunction
  3. Motion: movements such as going-up which, like qualities, dwell in substances
  4. Universals: recurrent properties, and meta-properties, that qualify qualities, blueness, for example, and motions, going-up-hood as a class characteristic, as well as substances, for example, earthenness and mountainhood
  5. Individualizers: properties inherent in individual atoms and selves (individualizer is not a category discussed by Gaṅgeśa)
  6. Inherence: ontic glue binding qualities, motions, and universals to the things they qualify
  7. Absence: four general types admitting further subdivisions and innumerable instances: prior absence (the pot the potter contemplates before producing it in the clay, with the pot as the “counterpositive,” i.e., what is absent), destruction (for example, of a pot), mutual absence (the distinction of one thing from another: a pot is not a cloth), and locatable (called “absolute,” atyantâbhāva, as a pot’s not being on the floor, or as my glasses not being on my desk, where the glasses are the “counterpositive” and the desk the locus): ‘\(\neg Ha\)’ means \(H\) is absent at \(a\), where “\(H\)” is the counterpositive to the absence (an absence of all pots on a floor would have pothood as the counterpositive)

There are also properties and entities that do not fit very well into the typology. Some philosophers after Gaṅgeśa rework the system, but Gaṅgeśa himself is ontologically conservative, presenting arguments for its expansion in various ways without endorsement.

Gaṅgeśa also inherits a causal schema that is crucial to his causal theory of knowledge. Perception and the other sources generate knowledge instances, in the sense of being the “chief instrumental cause.” To understand this, we have to know that there are most generally three varieties of cause-effect relationship:

  1. Inherent, as blue in a lotus, cowhood in cows
  2. Co-inherent, “emergent,” as the color of threads determining the color of a cloth
  3. Instrumental, including both agential causes, such as a potter for a pot, and non-agential, such as the stick used to turn the wheel

Gaṅgeśa, like other Naiyāyikas, also works with the distinction between the necessary and the sufficient, sufficient causality being a whole bundle of causal conditions, including general ones such as time and space. A source of knowledge is a process of knowledge generation, and each has a distinct “trigger.” A trigger is that instrumental cause which, when all the other causal conditions necessary for an effect are in place, brings it about. The trigger of perceptual knowledge is said to be connection of a sensory organ with an object to be known. The trigger of knowledge by inference is said to be reflection on a property of an object as pervaded by—invariably associated with—another property, the former called the prover—the pervaded—and the latter the probandum—the pervader. The trigger of testimonial knowledge is said to be the statement of a trustworthy expert as comprehended by the hearer, a trustworthy expert being defined as someone who knows the truth and wants to communicate it faithfully, without lying or deceiving. Causal relations are especially important because knowledge of the occurrence of an effect allows the knower to infer any one or more of its necessary conditions, as perception of smoke rising from a mountain allows one to infer fire. Furthermore, recognizing a particular knowledge source by its trigger is one way to certify a result, an instance of testimonial knowledge for instance.

Gaṅgeśa often utilizes a simpler ontological schema in his analyses of the generation of knowledge: an instance of knowledge is about, at a minimum, a qualifier-qualificandum, the hyphen standing for the qualificative relation, also discussed, with qualificanda as property-bearers, anything we can talk about, including universals and supervenient properties such as similarity, and qualifiers as qualities or universals or even mind-imposed properties that, as suggested, do not seem to have a place in the traditional layout. No matter, we can deal with these later, seems to be Gaṅgeśa’s attitude, as he proceeds to focus on knowledge and its generators.

Gaṅgeśa’s Nyāya embraces realism along several dimensions, realism in the sense of commitment to entities that exist independently of consciousness. There are, however, exceptions in the properties of a self along with some others that do require consciousness to occur. Knowledge itself and other mental phenomena are counted as reals and knowable intersubjectively, for instance. Realism leads Naiyāyikas to embrace fallibilism from very early, because the transcendence, so to say, of a physical object to the instruments of knowledge is seen to mean that the possibility of error cannot be ruled out—except in the case of apperception, according to Gaṅgeśa (see below). The Jewel is filled out with numerous definitional projects where the definienda (instances of knowledge, for example, as well as physical objects), are realities. And all individuals of whatever fundamental type (substance, quality, motion, universal, inherence, individuator, and absence) are viewed as reals, although the mind can create fictions. Against Buddhist subjectivists, it is argued that the components of false and fictional awarenesses themselves indicate reals. Gold and mountains are real but maybe not a gold mountain. More about illusion and other instances of non-knowledge in practically every subsection below.

3. Knowledge and certification

The target of epistemological evaluations in classical India is not belief but rather cognition, which, however, like belief in the West, is viewed as propositional. Buddhists, Naiyāyikas, Mīmāṃsakas, and others address the issue of how a proposition-laden cognition is known to be true, or false, for that matter. Against Mīmāṃsakas in particular, Gaṅgeśa advances an “extrinsicality” position. Although presumptive presentations of “fresh news” through any of the sources—perception and the others—are naturally and automatically taken to be veridical, according to Gaṅgeśa’s Nyāya, it takes a separate cognitive act to determine whether a cognition is knowledge or “non-knowledge.” An awareness, an “experience” (anubhava, a term used technically in the system), defined as what a person takes to be presentation of news—i.e., takes automatically to be new information—is presumptively knowledge but on occasion is either false or not produced by a genuine knowledge source, perception, inference, or testimony (analogy is, for Gaṅgeśa, restricted to learning the meaning of words). According to Mīmāṃsā, certification is intrinsic to the apparent presentation. Gaṅgeśa’s refutation centers on an alleged phenomenology of doubt and knowing that one knows. If the Mīmāṃsaka position were correct, it would not be possible to doubt the veridicality of, for example, a perception that is indeed an instance of knowledge, both veridical and produced in the right way. But it is possible, he says.

Certification happens through source identification, and the sources are known mainly by inference from certain tell-tale signs called “merits,” guṇa, while falsification occurs through recognizing tell-tale signs of pseudo-sources called “flaws,” doṣa. Various fallacies, for example, are flaws with respective to putative knowledge as determined by way of inference. In certain cases, however, in contrast to the norm, there is practically self-certification, as the Mīmāṃsakas claim. For example, perception is like that with knowing that there is a small piece of āmalaka fruit in the palm of your hand. Much discussion throughout the Jewel centers on certification conditions, some of which figure in the definitions of the several sources. There is also much concern with specification of the trigger, or triggers, of the workings of the sources, which not only can serve to define them but whose identification is one way certification proceeds.

3.1 Awareness as presumptively knowledge

The processes of perception, inference, analogy, and testimony generate “awareness,” anubhava, a technical term, as mentioned, meaning “presentation of fresh news.” No non-veridical awarenesses are produced from the sources, but there are of course occasions when we are fooled. There are pseudo-sources, processes closely resembling the true ones, but flawed in some way and generating wrong results. Consonantly, there are awarenesses that at the time we take to be telling us something true in the usual fashions—by perception and the rest—but are actually false or not produced correctly. These are instances of “non-knowledge,” apramā, contrasting with pramā, “knowledge,” entailing truth and right production.

Pragmatic considerations reinforce our natural tendency to take the deliverances of the sources to be veridical. We couldn’t get along in the world without knowledge, as Naiyāyikas as early as Vātsyāyana stress (1996: 2). This is a recurrent theme. Gaṅgeśa relies on “pragmatic contradiction” to refute a skeptic about inference in the Jewel’s “Hypothetical Reasoning” section (2020: 647–51):

When there is doubt, there is no regular pattern of behavior. When there is a regular pattern, doubt does not occur. Thus it has been said (by Udayana): “That is doubted concerning which as doubted there occurs no contradiction with the doubter’s action.”

For it is not possible at once to resort regularly to fire and the like for smoke and the like and to doubt that fire causes it. This is how we should understand the saying.

Thus we may reject the argument that contradiction—understood as natural opposition (virodha), governing precisely which F cannot occur along with precisely which G—cannot block an infinite regress. It is the doubter’s own behavior that proves the lie to the doubt, that blocks it (pratibandhaka).

It may be true that repeated observation (“even hundreds of times”) is insufficient to guarantee knowledge of a pervasion (pervasions underpin the natural entailments on which inference depends). Not all things made out of earth are scratchable by iron; diamonds, recently discovered, are a counterexample. Defending pervasion-knowledge nevertheless, Gaṅgeśa cites this case in admitting that the possibility of a counterexample cannot be eliminated, at least generally speaking. But we do grasp pervasions, and often meaningful doubt can be done away with. Absolute freedom from doubt is not required to have knowledge. And knowledge guides action. We may be wrong in any particular case, but we act on the basis of the regularities in nature we take ourselves to be aware of, automatically making inferences producing knowledge.

The same goes for perception, analogy, and testimony. With testimony, for example, we may be aware of a defeater, a speaker’s being a liar, for instance, but in such a case we do not take ourselves to be presented with news. Perceptual and other awarenesses do not occur when blocked, when defeated in this way. A good example is the fallacy called bādhita, “defeated in advance.” No inference purporting to show that fire is cold can be successful because we already know it’s hot. But of course some defeaters occur to us only later, and for a time we are fooled. In the market, we learn that the piece of shell we thought was silver is really only mother-of-pearl. Awarenesses are presumptively knowledge, but are also defeasible. The exception concerns certain matters known by apperception (see below), which, Gaṅgeśa argues, are known without the possibility of being wrong.

In sum, the defeasibility character of Gaṅgeśa’s theory of knowledge centers on the fact that apparently trustworthy sources of information at times mislead. But in those cases it is not really the knowledge sources, perception, and the rest, that are at work but rather close imitators. Knowledge sources (pramāṇa) themselves are inerrant. This makes the concept of the apparent source central (pramāṇâbhāsa): “You can't really see John from this distance.” Awareness naturally taken to be informative is presumptively true but the presumption can be defeated. It can also be certified. Defeating and certifying belong to a second-level of knowing where we are self-conscious about justification. But there, too, we give the benefit of the doubt, bādhakam vinā, “unless there is a defeater.” In this way there is no justification regress as feared by Western foundationalists and alleged by the second-century Buddhist Nāgārjuna (1978).

3.2 How knowledge is known

It is difficult to appreciate Gaṅgeśa’s reflection on certification without knowing something about the Mīmāṃsaka positions, called in general “self-certification,” which he attacks. Self-certification is embraced also by Yogācāra Buddhist philosophers, but Gaṅgeśa focuses mainly on the arguments of Prābhākaras as voiced in particular by the ninth-century author Śālikanātha (1961). It seems that Mīmāṃsakas would secure the authority of Vedic testimony for rituals and various rules of everyday life effortlessly, one suspects in overview, by maintaining that knowledge is self-certifying. Gaṅgeśa focuses, however, on perceptual knowledge, which, he maintains, can, in certain circumstances, both be doubted and later certified as knowledge. “I wouldn’t now be drinking water, if the awareness had not been knowledge. But I am now drinking, satisfying my thirst, and the awareness was knowledge indeed” (translator’s comments, Jewel 2020: 109). In this case, the certification comes by way of an inference. Source identification is another way of capturing the point. It is by inference that one determines that an awareness-generating process is indeeed perception, perception that is factively conceived. A genuine source never misleads. Only “pseudo-sources” do.

There are different signs whereby one knows that an instance of inferential knowledge is both true and produced in the right way. Do we really know the premises, in particular the alleged “pervasion,” vyāpti? For testimony, certification conditions are the speaker’s being a trustworthy expert along with conditions governing what it is to be a proper statement and of course certain hearer conditions (such as knowing the language). And in certain cases there is, admittedly, self-certification. But the Mīmāṃsakas are wrong to take that to be the general rule.

4. Perception

As with the English word ‘perception’, the Sanskrit ‘pratyakṣa’ so translated is used for both the process of sensory connection with an object perceived and as the resultant awareness. In common Sanskrit, the word ‘pratyakṣa’, etymologically “before the eyes,” means something like “experientially evident” when used as an adjective and “immediate experience” or “sense experience” as a noun. Internal perceptions as of thought and emotion, pleasure and pain, and indeed of a “self,” ātman, are considered in Nyāya to be mediated by a “mind” or, in a better translation, an “internal organ,” manas. A perception that targets a preceding perception or another cognition or mental event is given a special word, ‘anuvyayasāya’, “apperception,” literally an “after-cognition,” a type of perception that is especially important in cross-school controversy. The internal organ, manas, also serves the function of channeling information from sense organs and bringing it together in perceptual knowledge for a self. Such a mental organ is denied by Buddhist adversaries and others in other schools, and is hotly debated within Nyāya.

4.1 Perception as producing knowledge

The processes of production of sensory awarness vary with modality and with the type of thing perceived, earthen, watery, etc., universal or particular, a group of things, something external or internal, and in ways peculiar to perceivers. Neverthelesss, there are commonalities, especially when it comes to the questions of epistemology, most prominently that innumerable instances of knowledge are sensorily produced. But awareness produced by the senses is not how Gaṅgeśa defines perceptual knowledge. If what was considered an instance of knowledge is discovered to be in fact a false belief, then we say in English that there was no knowledge in the first place, only a belief that was considered true and warranted. The same logic holds for Gaṅgeśa’s ‘pratyakṣa’: if what was considered a perceptual awareness is discovered to be in fact non-veridical, then it is said that there was no perception in the first place, only an awareness that was considered veridical and produced by an organ of sense.

Thus there may be here only a verbal unity achieved cheaply, but it is important to know that Gaṅgeśa works with this understanding of the term. Perhaps this is why he spends section after section in his “perception” chapter examining particular problems with objects known such as air, the sound of one’s own son’s voice in a “tumultuous racket,” universals and the types of sensory relation occurrent in knowledge thereof, apparent simultaneous perception, and perception of perception itself. His chapter is full of phenomenological insights, but the science he relies on to understand the operations of the several sense organs is obviously antiquated. Epistemologically, however, the goal is to separate the pseudo-source that generates non-knowledge (awareness that appears to to be true but is not or is not produced in the assumed way) from the genuine, and the science is often not relevant considering the signs of knowledge and non-knowledge. The longest section of the chapter is devoted to a general account of illusion as “appearance of something as other than as it is,” anyathā-khyāti-vāda.

In illusion, Gaṅgeśa says, the presentation of F-hood—silverhood, for example, in the illusion of “seeing” a piece of shell as silver, and saying, “Silver,” when it’s really mother-of-pearl—originates in things’ really being F, through previous knowledge of F-hood, real bits of silver in the world. The silverhood predication in the verbalization of the perception-like experience is available to become illusory predication content through previous experience of silver. It gets fused into a current perception-like event by means of a foul-up in the normal causal process through the arousing of a silverhood memory-disposition (saṃskāra) formed by previous experience of silver, or, possibly, by testimony. The content or intentionality of an illusion is to be explained causally as generated by real features of real things just as is genuine perception although they are distinct cognitive types. To repeat, genuine perception is factive; illusion is a perception-imitator (“You don’t really see Maitra because that’s Chaitra”).

Perception gets content not only from the object in connection with the sense organ but also from the classificational power of the mind or self. With the perceptual awareness, “That’s a pot,” for instance, the pot as an individual in connection with a sensory faculty is responsible for the cognition of a property-bearer, for what is called the qualificandum portion of the perception, without admixture of memory, but the sensory connection is not by itself responsible for the qualifier portion, the pothood, also identified as the “predication content” (prakāra, the verbalizable “way” something appears), the thing’s classification as a pot. The classificational power of the mind should not, however, be understood as innate so much as the product of experience over the course of a lifetime. Repeatable features of reality get impressed on the mind or self in the form of memory dispositions. That is, in perceiving a as an F, normally an F-saṃskāra formed by previous knowledge-source-produced bits of awareness of things F would be a causal factor. The perception’s own content includes the repeatable nature of the qualifier through the operation of this factor. We see the tree as a tree, and it is a tree in fact.

4.2 Indeterminate cognition of a qualifier

The idea of indeterminate perception is a latecomer in Nyāya tradition. Gautama, Vātsyānana, and Uddyotakara, whose writings form the core of the early school, do not recognize an indeterminate type of perception. The tenth-century author Vācaspati introduces the notion into the system (1996: 111). Gaṅgeśa is clearly aware of this history, for he opens his discussion by echoing Vācaspati's commentary on Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4 where, in considering the Nyāya-sūtra’s definition of perception, Vācaspati takes the two words ‘avyapadeśya’ (“non-verbal”) and ‘vyavasāyâtmaka’ (“definite”) as indicating two types of perception, indeterminate and determinate. Udayana and Gaṅgeśa follow him, but there seems to have been some dissension among later Naiyāyikas (Sibajiban Bhattacharyya 1990: 172–6).

Determinate perception, i.e., perceptual knowledge, is concept-laden, a cognizing of a qualificandum through a qualifier. Things have multiple properties some of which normally go undetected on any given occasion of experience. One can see Devadatta without seeing his back. Wholes are implicit in their parts, the very notion of which makes no sense cut off from that of the whole: parts are parts of a whole. If the ontological layering of things having qualifiers were not reflected in a causal ordering of an indeterminate perception feeding, so to say, the determinate, then perception of a qualificandum should entail that the “thick” particular be presented, i.e., the thing with all its properties, and, as Gaṅgeśa argues, a blind person in touching a yellow piece of cloth would know its color as yellow (2020: 359–60). The idea of indeterminate perception picking up just one or another feature of things is thus tied to Nyāya realism. The idea historically, however, was taken over from Buddhists, it seems (Perrett: 2016).

In a thought experiment, Gaṅgeśa imagines a child encountering a cow for the very first time (2020: 560). He argues that the child can grasp the concept of cowhood and, had she the right words, could say, correctly, “That’s a cow,” even though she has had no previous experience of cows. The cowhood predication content is supplied by what is called “indeterminate” cognition of the qualifier, a first stage, so to say, of the sensory information flow. According to Gaṅgeśa, such indeterminate cognition has to be positied to understand how we have, on the whole, workable concepts of things. The argument is that in a typical case of a first-time perceptual awareness of, for instance, a cow, there is a prior stage in the causal process that is an indeterminate cognition, indeterminate in that cowness is cognized but not as related to the particular cow, the qualificandum of the ensuing determinate perception. All other cases of cognition of an entity as qualified have a prior cognition of the qualifier as a causal factor. It is thus reasonable that the case of a first-time perception does as well. But since here clearly we do not have a mental disposition (saṃskāra) at work, indeterminate cognition has to be posited.

Something like indeterminate perception is posited by moderate foundationalists in analytic epistemology as helping to solve the problem of a justification regress, it seems (Phillips 2012: 50). A mental state not embedding an assertion and so immune to questions whether it is true or false is proposed. BonJour (2003: 20): “ … such a state is, as it were, semi-assertive or semi-judgmental in character: it has a kind of content or cognitive significance, but not in a way that would raise a further issue of justification.” Such a comparison could be misleading, however. Perception, according to Gaṅgeśa, is a doxastic justifier. The foundations of our worldly beliefs are doxastic in that determinate perceptions embed propositions that say at a minimum that something is some way or another. Concept-free perception may be thought of as Nyāya’s way of rendering our ability to form concepts merely from perception’s phenomenological side. It is a theoretical posit made to explain how our concepts originate in reality—a problem that is epitomized in cases of a first-time perception of something as an F, the concept F-hood being previously unavailable to the perceiver.

4.3 Apperception

“Apperception,” anuvyavasāya, is defined as a perception taking a preceding cognition or another psychological property as its object, typically a scoping cognition in relation to another scoped (Phillips 2012: 48–50). Efforts and desires can be similarly targeted. Through apperception, Gaṅgeśa claims, one knows infallibly the intentionality, the “objecthood,” viṣayatā, of the cognition scoped, in its qualificandum, qualifier, and relational portions. One knows, in other words, what the scoped purports to be about, and one knows this independently of a determination of the target’s being knowledge or not. Gaṅgeśa argues that since the sensory connection in this case is not mediated by a material organ, apperception is infallible about the contents of the scoped, but not of course about its truth. He devotes a long section of his perception chapter to defending this and other views about apperception in the face of opponents claiming he is giving up central planks of his theory.

Apperception makes certification possible because it sets up the item to be certified, showing the type of cognition the scoped is. Our apperceptive ability to determine whether the scoped cognition is putatively perceptual, inferential, analogical, testimonial, or of another character has epistemic relevance, since, as with all perception, there would be a presumption in favor of its correctness. Thus there would also be restoration of a presumption of the truth for a scoped cognition that had been brought into doubt were it judged to be perceptual, inferential, analogical, or testimonial in character, although further examination might prove the identification wong. Note that if further examination were called for, its direction would be determined by the apperception of cognitive type. For, the criteria of genuine perception, inference, and the rest vary according to origin. The characteristic epistemic merits and flaws (guṇa and doṣa) are very different for each knowledge source and there are also significant differences within species of perception in particular. Thus apperceptive judgment of putative type directs inquiry, telling us what to check.

Corollary to Gaṅgeśa’s thesis of the apperceptibility of cognitive types is his view that illusion can be scoped such that there too we find, abstractly, a cognition of an object as qualified by a qualifier, for example, of a piece of tin appearing to be silver. He also presents the argument that the fact that we can later see the same thing as really the tin it is shows that the illusion is a single cognition and not, contra the Prābhākara, two cognitions, a perception and a remembering along with a failure to notice their difference. But scoping an illusory awareness is supposed to show this, too, and in a particularly dramatic way when one knows that the cognition is illusory while it continues, such as apparent sight of a double moon or a person with hepatitis seeing a wall she knows is white as yellow. Although apperception is said not in itself to be able to determine the veridicality of an awareness, in such a case the subject practically sees one thing (the wall) appearing to be something it is not (yellow), anyathā-khyāti.

5. Inference

Gaṅgeśa’s contributions to understanding the knowledge source called “inference,” anumāna, and “inferential knolwedge,” anumiti, come on top of a long history of advances both within Nyāya and outside, from Yogācāra Buddhist logicians and epistemologists, in particular, but also others. Gaṅgeśa was a great student of philosophy. Most of the technical system can be found in his near predecessor, Maṇikaṇṭha Miśra (1953), and discussions of fallacies echo the seventh-century Buddhist Dharmakīrti (1993) and others. However, his treatment of inference is, arguably, more elaborate than that of any predecessor, and, as is his ususal practice, he examines a host of similar definitions of key items, such as “pervasion,” as well as many opponent positions before defending one or more of his own.

Considering the development of logic in the West, it important to keep in mind that inference throughout Nyāya is part of epistemology. Something about the world is known by any veritable inference. An inference must have premises that are themselves known. Nyāya philosophers do not distinguish between a formally valid deductive argument (which may or may not have false premises) and deductive arguments that are “cogent” (with no unjustified premises and no errors).

A set of logical terms is standard across Nyāya and most of the other classical schools, and Gaṅgeśa both uses them and provides his own precise definitions:

pakṣa (a) inferential subject; a mountain in a stock example
sādhana (\(H\)) prover (‘hetu’ is a synonym); smokiness
sādhya (\(S\)) probandum, the property to be proved; fieriness
vyāpti \(\forall x (Hx \to Sx)\) inference-grounding pervasion;
“Wherever smoke, there fire”

For example, he characterizes an inferential subject, pakṣa (2020: 734):

An inferential subject (pakṣa) occurs where there is no knowledge source that has positively established something in coördination with an absence of a desire to know. Thus, that is not an inferential subject if there is a knowledge source that has already positively established whatever and no desire to know (it by inference). … This is what it is to be an inferential subject (as a factor in the generation of inferential knowledge). Admittedly, this definition does not differentiate it from anything, since to be an inferential subject is a property with universal scope (anything can be an inferential subject, qualities as well as substances, universals as well as particulars, and so on). Nevertheless, the way the word ‛pakṣa’ is used has been explained.

A stock example of an inference:

  1. \(Ha\) (The mountain is smoky.)
  2. \(\forall x (Hx \to Sx)\) (Whatever is smoky is fiery.)
  3. \(Sa\) (The mountain is fiery.)

Gaṅgeśa devotes several long sections of the chapter to issues surrounding the inductive support that inferential knowledge presumes, a basis for the proper formation of the inference-informing saṃskāra or “mental disposition” responsible for a subject’s being able to remember (in a crucial mental event called “reflection,” parāmarśa) a vyāpti or inclusion of all things \(H\) as also things \(S\). This is the “example.”

dṛṣṭānta \(Hb,Sb\) & \(\neg Hc, \neg Sc\) pervasion-supportive example, a location known to possess both the prover and the probandum (a fiery kitchen hearth); also, a known absence of the prover where there is a known absence of the probandum.

Inference-grounding “pervasions,” vyāpti, are of different sorts, but they all obtain in nature, such as that between smokiness and fieriness. Gaṅgeśa and all Naiyāyikas are much occupied with pervasions, their nature and how they are known.

5.1 Natural entailment, vyāpti, “pervasion”

After rejecting twenty-four attempts—close attempts—to define the natural relation of pervasion such that the presence of a pervaded property at a location proves that another, the pervader, is there, too, Gaṅgeśa endorses the following characterization (2020: 623):

Pervasion, vyāpti, is a prover \(H\)’s having its locations shared by a probandum \(S\) so long as \(S\) when specified as the counterpositive of an absolute absence (i.e., as \(\neg S\)) has shared locations, shared with the absence of the prover (i.e., with \(\neg H\): no \(\neg S\) occurs on anything that is not also a \(\neg H\)), and if shared with something that is the counterpositive of such an absence (\(H\)) also does not share it there (in the case of a non-locus-pervading property).

All \(H\) are \(S\) so long as there are no \(\neg S\) that share a location with something that is not a \(\neg H\). That is, there will be pervasion given co-locatedness so long as what the \(S\) is, according to the definition, is not something that in serving as the counterpositive of an absence—specifically a counterpositive having shared locations, a universal, a class character, a repeatable property and not a particular instance (firehood as opposed to, say, kitchen fire)—does not share any location that does not also house a \(\neg H\). Goekoop (1967: 111) has a nice paraphrase that makes the point a little clearer: “There is a pervasion of \(H\) by \(S\) if and only if \(H\) has a common locus with \(S\) in such a way that \(S\) is none of the things that qua class are completely absent from some locus of \(H\).”

Gaṅgeśa’s definition is supposed to solve a problem concerning inferences about non-locus-pervading properties, such as a monkey-conjunction in a tree, a case on which many of the rejected definitions floundered. “This tree possesses a monkey-conjunction, since it is this tree (which always has monkeys)” is a good inference even though the tree at its roots has the ruled-out sort of counterpositive according to the definition. Inferences involving conjunctions are ruled in if the \(S\) is a property that while not present at \(l\) along with the \(H\) in some specified portion of \(l\) is not so overall, that is, at or in all portions of \(l\). The location \(l\) would be something that is indeed \(S\) in some portion, as a tree does have a monkey in its branches though not at its roots.

5.2 How entailments are known

Inferences put forth for others (parârtha) make plain the conditions that work with oneself (svârtha) automatically, and in texts of philosophy little is automatic. Thus built into the conception of the operation of inference are the inductive procedures whereby a pervasion is known. Putatively similar instances, sapakṣa, are defined as cases known to possess the probandum and thus should also, at least in one (as first insisted by the Buddhist Dignāga), exhibit the prover (e.g., \(Hb\) and \(Sb\))—while putatively dissimilar instances, vipakṣa, are defined as cases known not to possess the probandum and thus should lack the prover, too (e.g., \(\neg Sc\) and \(\neg Hc\)). The example, dṛṣṭānta, is normally a single instance of sapakṣa where the prover also occurs (\(Hb\) and \(Sb\)), its citing thus indicating that there is inductive support. In other words, by reference to cases that are sapakṣa —i.e., known instances of the probandum—where the prover is also found, positive evidence is marshalled to support an inference-underpinning pervasion (anvaya, “positive correlation”). And by reference to cases that are vipakṣa —i.e., known instances of the absence of the probandum—further support is garnered by our not finding the prover (vyatireka, “negative correlation”). Citing an example is shorthand to indicate that such a procedure supports assertion of a vyāpti, “pervasion” or general rule. Gaṅgeśa devotes several sections of the Jewel’s inference chapter to elucidating inferences based on both sapakṣa and vipakṣa, as well as those based exclusively on sapakṣa (“positive-only inference”) and exclusively on vipakṣa (“negative-only inference”). In general, it is “wide experience,” bhūyo-darśana, that is responsible for pervasion-knowledge. But this term, championed by Udayana, and others, is vague, and Gaṅgeśa devotes several sections to inductive method.

There is also “hypothetical reasoning,” tarka, which, although not itself a knowledge source, is said to be able to shift the balance of what it is rational to accept. Its main role is to help people grasp pervasions, and is an important supplement to the inferences that are central to philosophic controversies. Gaṅgeśa explains tarka as a hypothetical argument revealing a fallacy or defeater with respect to a position ∼p opposed to another position p that is to be accepted so long as p has independent evidence in its favor, technically called, pratikūla-tarka. There is, however, also anukūla-tarka, “supportive reasoning,” such as economy of conception, that is positive in character. The types of tarka that Gaṅgeśa recognizes are: (1) ātmâśraya, “self-dependence” (begging the question), (2) anyonyâśraya, “mutual dependence” (mutual presupposition), (3) cakraka, “circularity” (reasoning in a circle), (4) anavasthā “infinite regress,” (5) aniṣṭa-prasaṅga, “unwanted consequence” (contradiction), (6) prathama-upasthitatva, “being presupposed by the other,” the “first established” (a form of anukūla, “favorable,” tarka), (7) utsarga, “hasty generalization,” (8) vinigamanā-viraha, “differentiation failure,” (9) lāghava, “economy of conception,” “theoretic lightness” (another form of favorable tarka), and (10) gaurava, “lack of economy of conception,” “theoretic heaviness” (Bagchi 1951: 151).

Gaṅgeśa devotes a section of his inference chapter to tarka where he shows “pragmatic contradiction” also to be included, which was mentioned above in connection with his rejection of skepticism and defense of knowledge as the default for awareness. That passage begins (2020: 649):

As an example, consider the particular doubt about smoke as pervaded by fire. If smoke is not produced from a set of causes excluding fire, then smoke, as not produced from a causal complex including fire, would not be produced (a conclusion in contradiction, presumably, with the doubter’s belief that smoke is produced). Now doubt (against this hypothetical reasoning): Could the smoke come to be from something that is not fire? Or just in some instances could it come to be without fire? Or could it come to be simply by chance (ahetuka, “without a cause”)?

Were a subject \(M\) who has ascertained thoroughgoing positive correlations (\(S\) where \(H\)) and negative correlations (where no \(S\), no \(H\)), to doubt that an effect might arise without a cause, then—to take up the example of smoke and fire—why should \(M\), as \(M\) does in a rulewise manner, resort to fire for smoke, to food to allay hunger, and to speech to communicate to another person?

Gaṅgeśa argues that tarka is useful for—as we might say these days—reëstablishing a presumption of truth in favor of one or another thesis brought into doubt. For example, by supposing the truth of an opponent’s thesis and showing how it leads to unacceptable consequences, one repossesses a presumption of truth, provided one’s own thesis is supported by at least the appearance of a knowledge source and, further, that it has not itself been ruled out. Thus tarka comprises arguments that are not in themselves knowledge-generators but capable nonetheless of showing what we should and should not believe. In particular, reasoning can show “untoward ramifications” (prasaṅga) of not accepting a conclusion that is evidenced, Gaṅgeśa says. Forms of tarka such as self-contradiction, infinite regress, and circular reasoning are employed in the dialogic exchanges constructed in the Jewel and other works of later and indeed early Nyāya philosophy and, for that matter, all the philosophic schools.

5.3 The “additional condition,” upādhi, and other fallacies

Inferential awareness, like the other types, is defeasible, and while we have every right to accept, and act on, undefeated inferences, we are sometimes wrong. In particular, knowledge and justification do not pass from premises to conclusion if we become aware of an upādhi, an “additional condition,” which would be a blocker of “reflection” through undermining the generalization on which such reflection depends. Thus awareness of an upādhi is a preventer of inferential knowledge, a “defeater,” leading to belief relinquishment by someone who has hitherto not noticed the condition and who has erroneously arrived at a conclusion on the basis of a falsely induced, pseudo-pervasion. A rough (and non-classical) example: I know that Al has a temper that will flare up in certain circumstances from having witnessed many tantrums such that I expect that Al will explode by making an inference when I see that the circumstances obtain, but having overlooked that it is only with Belle that Al is so irascible and Belle not being present in the circumstances where I expect, by pseudo-inference, Al’s temper to flare, Belle would be the upādhi, the “additional condition.” Discussion of the concept occupies more than a tenth of Gaṅgeśa’s long inference chapter.

The upādhi (\(U\)) has a negative character, serving, at least in the first place, to undermine a putative inferential conclusion by showing that the pervasion—all \(H\) as \(S\), a prover (\(H\)) as pervaded by a probandum (\(S\))—on which it depends does not hold. But an upādhi may also serve as positive restorer of knowledge in that when it occurs together with an original prover (\(H\)) that it undercuts (thus \(H \ \&\ U\)), the inferential conclusion is reestablished.

According to a traditional definition which, although refined by Gaṅgeśa, suits most purposes, an upādhi is a property \(U\) such that

  1. \(U\) pervades the probandum, the sādhya, \(S\) (i.e., anything that is an \(S\) is a \(U\), sādhya-vyāpaka): \(\forall x (Sx \to Ux)\)
  2. \(U\) does not pervade the prover, the sādhana or hetu, \(H\) (i.e., there is something that is an \(H\) but not a \(U\), sādhana-avyāpaka): \(\exists x(Hx \ \&\ \neg Ux)\)

It follows then that there is “deviation” (the prover is said to “deviate,” being somewhere the probandum is not) and no relation of pervasion.

  1. \(\exists x(Hx \ \&\ \neg Sx)\)

There are lots of other fallacies that Gaṅgeśa discusses. The Nyāya-sūtra lists five “pseudo-provers,” hetv-ābhāsa, which Gaṅgeśa examines at length:

  1. “Deviation,” in three varieties:
    1. the “common,” which is knowledge of a counterexample (\(Hb, \neg Sb\))
    2. the “unique,” defined as a putative prover’s not being known to occur in places where the probandum is known to occur or not to occur (for example, the “prover,” being-sound, with respect to an inferential subject, sound, since only sound has the universal being-a-sound which then cannot prove anything)
    3. the “inconclusive,” where the property specifying the inferential subject is universally locatable such that there can be no evidence outside it (nothing is outside it) without begging the question (thus, with a few exceptions, no inference beginning “Everything is \(F\) (momentary, material, etc.)” is acceptable since nothing could count as evidence if the inferential subject is everything)
  2. the “contradictory,” where \(Ha\) proves the absence of a putative probandum, i.e., \(\neg Sa\)
  3. “counterinference,” which is a putative prover that would establish a conclusion \(Sa\) except that its evidence base consisting of correlations, positive and negative, between things \(H\) and \(S\), is matched by an opponent's inference to \(\neg Sa\) complete with correlations between a counterprover \(J\) and \(\neg S\) (this fallacy reveals a social dimension to knowledge)
  4. the “unestablished,” which Gaṅgeśa views as three separate fallacies:
    1. a putative prover as unestablished with respect to location or property-bearer, e.g., \(Ha\)?
    2. its being unestablished with respect to essential nature (e.g., “The lake is fiery since it is smokey”)
    3. the unestablished by way of not being pervaded by the probandum (said not to be a separate fallacy but reducing to deviation, the contradictory, or the defeated)
  5. the “defeated,” the “defeated in advance,” as it were, a kind of “patent falsehood.”

These “flaws of the prover,” hetu-doṣa, are also called “constant flaws,” nitya-doṣa, as opposed to puruṣa-doṣa, “flaws of a person,” which are anitya-doṣa, “occasional flaws.” Admittedly, Gaṅgeśa contends that sometimes even “failure to grasp a pervasion is (not a logical flaw but) a flaw belonging to a person or subject” (2020: 884). Nevertheless, the five pseudo-provers are separated out from other defeaters called clinchers from the Nyāya-sūtra on, because they highlight logical—or in the case of (3) epistemological—rules as opposed to personal failures such as failing to pay attention. The upādhi fallacy, too, entails a counterexample and so is a “constant flaw,” although failure to notice one on occasion can be a personal error.

Two further types of defeater or pseudo-defeater identified in the Nyāya-sūtra are, first, jāti, “false analogies,” which seem dismissed by Gaṅgeśa (in the voice of an opponent) saying that they are not good responses in a debate or controversy (2020: 949), in contrast with, second, “clinchers,” nigraha-sthāna, whose importance in debate is acknowledged but not in any detail taken up (perhaps Gaṅgeśa sees the Nyāya-sūtra’s list, as explained by Vātsyāyana, as satisfactory). But jāti are dismissed because, it seems, however they may have been conceived in early years (Prets 2001), long before Gaṅgeśa they come to be understood as misleading analogies and classified as tricks of debate or philosophic conundra, not really worthy of inquiry. A jāti is a pseudo-defeater in the broad sense of a misleading analogy, and there is less agreement about them across school than about pseudo-provers, clinchers, and, we must add, types of tarka, “hypothetical reasoning,” which were reviewed above.

5.4 Three philosophic inferences

Gańgeśa advances three contentious inferences in his inference chapter, two of them—a theistic inference and one about the possibility of “liberation,” mukti—defended at considerable length (all three are reconstructed and examined in Phillips 2012: 65–71). As much as supporting longstanding positions of Nyāya on (a) “self,” ātman, (b) “Lord,” īśvara, and (c) mukti, his treatments illustrate his inferential system including defeating and hypothetical reasoning. Indeed, illustration of the system sometimes seems to be the main goal.

Although Gaṅgeśa accepts the position of early Naiyāyika Uddyotakara (c. 600) that one knows oneself perceptually as expressed by the word ‘I’ in perceptual judgments such as “I am seeing a pot” (Taber 2012), presumably he sees proving a self by inference as useful because Buddhists, for one, deny it (famously). And at least in Yogācāra Buddhism perception is accepted as a knowledge source, with the insistence that no self is known by it or indeed by any other means.

The Nyāya-sūtra has two arguments: diachronic synthesis and synchronic. The former is illustrated by the recognition, “This is that Devadatta I saw yesterday,” which could not be an expression of knowledge (and of course it is) if the self of the recognizer had not endured (the recognition is fed by a memory of Devadata as seen the day before, and one person does not have another’s memories). The latter is illustrated by, “I am touching what I see” (a self is needed to bring together the information across sensory modality). In the Jewel’s perception chapter, Gaṅgeśa at times refers to or echoes these arguments, but the argument for a self in the inference chapter is different.

Gaṅgeśa follows Vātsyāyana under Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.5 (the “inference sūtra”): “Every living body (the inferential subject) has a self (the probandum), since every living body has breath (the prover), unlike a pot (the example, a pot being qualified by both absence-of-self and absence-of-breath).” My sense is that here the main point is as much to illustrate “negative-only” inference as to endorse Vātsyāyana’s reasoning, but it is endorsed. The inferential subject includes all living bodies, and so there is no sapakṣa, no examples of the probandum known outside the set of things that are living bodies. Thus the inference has to be negative-only, based solely on correlations of absences, “unlike a pot,” a pot having neither breath nor self. Fundamental truths of things (tattva), which are captured by philosophical definitions, seem accessible only through fundamental distinctions being known through negative-only inferences, for example, this inference to self (ātman) as a fundamental category of substance.

In a slightly more more elaborate version, Gaṅgeśa puts forth two steps. First, desires and the like are proved to have a locus, like all qualities. In step two, self is proved to be that locus, a distinct substance, different from earth, water, tejas, and so on down the traditional list, by eliminative argument. Defeaters for the proposition that desire and the like belong to earth or any of the rest of the items on the ontological list consists of hypothetical reasoning such as the following. If desire were a property of earth (or water and so on), then like the color that exists in earthen things, it, too, would be perceived. Surveying pots and the like, we find that nothing material has desire, cognition, etc., outside of living bodies. He writes (2020: 803):

Given that desire has been proved to have an inherent cause (by the inference previously stated, “Desire has origins in an inherent cause, since it is an effect,” we formulate a second inference), being-a-desire occurs in that (namely, desire) which has as emergent cause a connection, since being-a-desire is a universal directly pervaded by the qualityhood-that-occurs-in-specific-qualities-grasped-by-an-eternal-organ (i.e., manas or the organ of hearing), like being-a-sound (soundhood, the universal of sound). And this emergent cause, which is a connection, is specified by something, since it is a connection. (That “something” is the living body.) If merely connection with a self were the origins of desire (without requiring something else delimiting it), then ramifications would overextend. Therefore, having-a-self, which is the specifier of the connection that gives rise to desire, is proved with respect to the living body. (That is, every living body is “enselved.”)

The inference for positing an īśvara, the “Lord,” is a little less system-bound than this one for an ātman, but its history stretches through several earlier Nyāya efforts, in particular by Vācaspati (c. 950). It is an inference to a creator based on both positive and negative correlations: “Earth and the like have a conscious agent as an instrumental cause, since they are effects, like a pot and unlike an atom (whatever is an effect has a conscious agent as an instrumental cause).” Buddhists point to counterexamples, such as growing grass. Growing grass has the prover property, being-an-effect, but not the probandum, having-an-agent-as-an-instrumental cause. The Nyāya reply is to point out that growing grass and all such examples are in dispute, that is to say, fall within the domain of the inferential subject (pakṣa), here “earth and the like,” to wit, anything that is an effect but whose agential cause is not apparent, unlike the comparison class, a pot, for instance, which is clearly both an effect and has an agent as an instrumental cause. Nothing that falls within the domain of the subject can be used either as an example supporting the rule of vyāpti inclusion or as a counterexample, since that would beg the question. The whole point of inference is to make something known that was not known previously, and here, as with the existence of atoms, the conclusion could not be known perceptually. The theological inference has the purpose of showing that things like the earth and growing grass have an agent within the causal complex that brings them about. This is not something that we know without making the inference.

So, by the rules governing proper inference, the putative counterexample is rejected, and the proof looks pretty good. For, cleverly it divides all things into three categories, as Vācaspati remarks (1996: 563). There are uncreated things, atoms, for instance, created things that clearly have an agential cause, such as pots, and things such as the earth and growing grass that do not clearly have an agential cause. This last set becoming the inferential subject is bracketed such that no examples can be pulled from it.

However, another refutation refined by Buddhist philosophers over the centuries is not dismissed so easily (Mokṣākāragupta 1998: 98; Patil 2009). The Nyāya argument falls to an upādhi, in this case the property, having-a-perceptible-body. As we have seen, an upādhi is defined as a property that pervades the probandum while failing to pervade the prover, that is to say, that is entailed by the presence of the probandum while not being instanced in at least one case of the prover. Having-an-agent-as-an-instrumental-cause, which is the \(S\) or probandum property of the target inference, is pervaded by the agent’s-having-a-perceptible-body, which is the \(U\) or upādhi property: all agents have bodies. But there is something that is an \(H\) but not a \(U\); something that is an effect but does not have within its causal complex an agent with a perceptible body, e.g., growing grass. The two conditions being met, it would follow that there is something that is an \(H\) but not an \(S\), something that is an effect but does not have an agent as an instrumental cause. Thus the upādhi defeats the apparent inference by showing that the required pervasion and entailment do not hold.

Gaṅgeśa’s response is to deny that the putative upādhi, an-agent’s-having-a-perceptible-body, pervades the probandum of the target inference, having-an-agent-as-an-instrumental-cause, and several rounds of objection and response centering on Nyāya’s conception of the Lord as an agent without a body are aired. The Lord’s creative activity requires, like that of any agent, familiarity with the material to be shaped, like the potter’s knowledge of clay and of what to do to make a pot. The Lord’s knowledge is to be conceived as appropriate to the tasks to be undertaken, such as originally combining atoms, and if the Lord, like us, had to have a body to have knowledge, including the knowledge required to combine atoms, then, since bodies are combinations of atoms, there would have to be some earlier Creator to make the necessary combinations—ad infinitum. Simpler than this conception is that of a bodiless Creator whose knowledge is appropriate to the material forming earth and the like but, unlike our knowledge, is not generated. This seems to be the core of Gaṅgeśa’s reasoning, which is complex tarka targeting simplicity and following Vācaspati in particular.

An inference to the possibility of “liberation,” mukti, brings the Jewel’s inference chapter to a close. It is particularly dense (2020: 1142) and cannot be unpacked in a short space, but its central analogy is noteworthy.

Then the justification (the inference to the conclusion that suffering can come to an end for an individual), well, it is that suffering in general, or the suffering in general of Devadatta (i.e., of any individual), is the counterpositive of a non-simultaneous destruction existing in the same locus, since it is a property that occurs only as an effect, or since it is continuous until its end, like the light of a lamp. This continuity is its being a property that occurs only as an effect at distinct times. And in this way the probandum, the property to be proved (viz., being the counterpositive of a non-simultaneous destruction existing in the same locus), is also applicable to pleasure in general and the like: liberation is the breaking up of the causal chain along with its source.

Translator’s comments (2020: 1142) bring out that the crucial point seems to be that something destroyed has no causal power, existing only as an effect, in connection with the destruction for which it is the counterpositive. The destruction that is mukti is not of current but of future suffering, thus a “non-simultaneous” destruction. The destruction exists in the same locus as the suffering that would occur were it not blocked. The suffering does not really occur—it never comes about—and so its ontological status is problematic. Clearly, it does not cause anything. It comes about only as an effect in connection with the bringing about of the destruction in relation to which it is the counterpositive. And any destruction is of something (the counterpositive) at a place or locus: \(cDl\). Note that the example appears to work only with the second of the two provers mentioned: like a lamp’s stream of light that can cease absolutely, the suffering of an individual goes on continuously (through life, death, and rebirth)—in the sense of regularly if not without occasional spells of pleasure—until its absolute end. Pleasure is similar.

6. Analogy

Different schools of classical philosophy have very different understandings of “analogy,” upamāna, and, unlike with perception, inference, and testimony, cross-school controversies seem often at cross-purposes. For example, Mīmāṃsakas, worried about the criteria for substitutes for materials enjoined to carry out rituals, talk about similarities as objective, whereas Naiyāyikas are concerned principally with word meanings, although Vātsyāyana (1997: 170–1) does show the usefulness of analogy to indicate something new, a medicinal plant, for instance, similar to one with which an interlocutor is familiar. Gaṅgeśa sees the working of analogy to result solely in learning the meaning of words. Nevertheless, appreciation of similarity, which he sees as a supervenient property, is, he says, crucial in the operation of the knowledge source. The Jewel’s chapter on analogy is quite short and lacks subsections, hardly a “chapter” in comparison with the other three.

What comes to be a stock example of analogical knowledge according to Nyāya is elaborated in Nyāya-sūtra commentaries and textbooks preceding Gaṅgeśa, who fills in details. A subject \(S\) inquires of a forester about a gavaya, which is a kind of buffalo, having heard the word ‘gavaya’ used among her schoolmates but not knowing what it means, i.e., not knowing to what ‘gavaya’ refers. Questioned by \(S\), the forester replies that a gavaya is like a cow, mentioning certain specifics as also some dissimilarities. To simplify, Nyāya philosophers say that the forester makes an analogical statement (“A gavaya is like a cow”), whereby, according to Gaṅgeśa, our subject \(S\) now knows in general what the word means. But \(S\) does not yet know its reference, which he deems its principal meaning. Later encountering a gavaya buffalo, \(S\) says, “This, which is similar to a cow, is the meaning of the word ‘gavaya’,” a statement which expresses \(S\)’s new knowledge. Every instance of knowledge has a source, and this one has been generated by upamāna, “analogy.” Gaṅgeśa writes (2020: 1207):

The question [of the subject to the forester] concerns only the cause of her (eventual) knowledge (qua qualificandum). The answer gives its qualifiers.

Gaṅgeśa: No. Since she does not know the particulars (that would ground use of the word), she would be answered by the forester also with reference to a need for a sensory encounter: “If you go into the forest, you will see.”

Therefore, \(S\)’s questions would concern only the distinct grounds of employment: “What is a gavaya like? On what grounds does one employ the word ‘gavaya’?” Since the one asked (viz., the forester) would not be able to show immediately, directly (sākṣāt), what it is to be a gavaya buffalo, he would talk about similarity, indirectly indicating it (i.e., indicating what it is to be a gavaya buffalo). And then later, when an individual has been seen by \(S\) who remembers the meaning of the analogical statement, she acquires the knowledge: “This thing qualified by what it is to be a gavaya is the referent of the word ‘gavaya’.” \(S\)’s knowledge is of a particular that is the grounds for the employment of the word. It is the result of analogy (as a knowledge source).

7. Testimony

Gaṅgeśa begins his final chapter of the Jewel with a defense of the integrity of testimony as a knowledge source, following a long tradition beginning with an extended Nyāya-sūtra passage (2.1.49–56) that elicited much commentary. Like his predecessors, he resists an opponent’s contention that “testimonial” knowledge results from inference of a certain sort such that supposing an additional knowledge source is unnecessary. Gaṅgeśa’s response is to argue that testimony works uniquely through language, that without testimony the inferentialist’s premises in the substitute inference could not be understood. Furthermore, the certification conditions for testimony are different. The chapter includes much reflection on linguistic meaning, including sections on grammar near the end. How to understand reference is a chief concern, reference being viewed as the primary mode of meaning. But there is also “indirect indication,” lakṣaṇā, which works by way of a referent indicating something else, as when a poet says, “The moon,” meaning the face of the beloved. All these are standard topics in Nyāya literature. Injunctions, which are also talked about from the earliest by Naiyāyikas as well as their Mīmāṃsaka champions (the Veda is injunctive in character), command a lot of attention. Their supposed ethical force is wrestled with, as Gaṅgeśa shows his mastery of Mīmāṃsā and resists its view of a moral universe.

Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā are referentialist allies with similar agendas when it comes to knowledge from testimony, both opposed to a Yogācāra pragmatic theory of meaning. Although concerned mainly with Vedic hermeneutics, Mīmāṃsaka philosophers pioneer many of the best arguments and counterarguments against Buddhists and others who attack Vedic authority. But Gaṅgeśa does not accept the Mīmāṃsaka contention that the overall purport of a statement or sentence can in general, even in cases of secondary meaning, lakṣaṇā, be understood without an idea of the speaker’s intention. We do not have to understand the speaker’s intention to grasp a statement in all cases, although sometimes we do, for example, when multiple meanings are possible and with some statements employing lakṣaṇā. But the Mīmāṃsaka view that Vedic sentences have no author is false.

Gaṅgeśa apparently accepts the Nyāya-sūtra’s definition, 1.1.7: “Testimony is the (true) statement of an trustworthy expert” (Vātsyāyana 1997: 14), which indicates certification conditions centering on the speaker. He focuses, however, on the conditions wrapped up in what it is to be a (true) statement from the hearer’s point of view. The condition known as yogyatā, usually rendered “semantic fit,” is given by him a broad interpretation, where not only infelicitous statements such as “The gardener is watering the plants with fire,” are violations, as is commonly pointed out, but also the hearer’s knowing that the speaker is not an āpta, that the sounds are, for example, from a parrot.

7.1 An irreducible knowledge source

Yogācāra Buddhists have a pragmatic theory of concept-formation and view language as at best helping us get what we want and avoid what we want to avoid. The Buddha’s words are to be trusted because of his special experience and superior capacity as a reasoner as well as his compassion motivating his most excellent advice. Gaṅgeśa imagines an attack on testimonial knowledge from Buddhist skeptical quarters such that, in fact, there is no knowledge but only helpful or unhelpful advice because there is no truth, no veridicality. Statements do not correspond to facts. Gaṅgeśa’s rebuttal centers on knowledge production through words. Any instance of knowledge has a mode of production distinct from one that fails so to produce. The argument that erroneous utterances fail to generate knowledge cuts no ice, since erroneous utterances are not veritable testimony as we Naiyāyikas understand it, he says (2020: 1215). We are able to distinguish erroneous and true utterances by the processes that produce them, and thus meet the skeptical challenge.

A different line of rejection of testimony is attributed to the Vaiśeṣika school, which is said to admit testimonial knowledge but to see its generation as coming from inference of a certain sort. A hearer reasons: (1) Speaker \(S\) states p, (2) \(S\) is a “trustworthy authority,” āpta, (3) what such authorities state is true, and so, therefore, (4) \(p\) is true. And if challenged, S could say that she knows \(p\) because of the inference. Gaṅgeśa’s rebuttal centers on how premise (1) could be known. Testimony has to be admitted as a separate knowledge source to understand how the reductionist’s inference could get started. Just what is the knowledge source for (1)?

7.2 The meaning of a statement

In the long chapter on testimony, one would expect speaker certification conditions to be taken up, but they are not. Perhaps Gaṅgeśa sees them as satisfactorily elucidated by Vātsyāyana on Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.7 along with the later commentaries. In any case, the Jewel’s focus is on sentential conditions such as grammaticality and semantic fitness as remarked. Three conditions prominent in the grammatical literature are addressed, “expectation,” ākāṅkṣā, “semantic fit,” yogyatā, and “contiguity,” āsatti. Gaṅgeśa also takes up tātparya, “(speaker’s) intention,” disputing the views of Mīmāṃsakas and championing common sense. Throughout the chapter, two views of sentence meaning are in view, (a) a “Bhāṭṭa” radically referentialist theory (due to Kumārila) that a word refers independently of sentential context, and (b) a “Prābhākara” holistic view that has the sentence as a whole as informational, not words independently of sentential context. Although Gaṅgeśa endorses the Bhāṭṭa view that a factual relation, not directly expressed, accounts for sentential unity, often he frames a point using the Prābhākara theory.

Vātsyāyana and company discuss word meaning in terms of possible referents (Nyāya-sūtra 2.2.59–69), (i) the individual, for example, ‘cow’ used for a particular cow, (ii) the universal, cowhood, what all cows have in common, and (iii) “shape,” ākṛti, as with a cow-shaped pastry. The settled view is that all three are generally meant in a single usage, with predominance varying with context. Against this background, Vācaspati (1979) explores five views of sentential meaning including both (a) the “theory of the connection of the referents,” the radically, incrementally referentialist view espoused by Bhāṭṭas and Naiyāyikas, abhihitânvaya-vāda, and (b) the “theory of reference of the connected,” “holistic reference,” the Prābhākara view of reference as occurring at the level of the sentence, anvītâbhidhāna-vāda. In his Nyāya-sūtra work (1996), Vācaspati imports the Bhāṭṭa view, according to which sentence meaning is derivative from the reference of individual words and other semantic elements taken together, with the overall connection, anvaya, provided by the fact (if the statement is true) of the words’ referents being in relation, the “truth-maker.” Later Naiyāyikas such as Gaṅgeśa follow him, although, to repeat, Gaṅgeśa often talks about sentential unity presupposing the Prābhākara view that the component words do not individually have referential power but only as connected grammatically, with a complex object or fact as that which is referred to by the unifying sentence.

“Expectation,” ākāṅkṣā, “(verbal) expectation,” is the first of three sentential conditions taken up. After rejecting four attempts to define the phenomenon in its relevance for the epistemology of testimony, Gaṅgeśa endorses the following (2020: 1259):

Expectation amounts to incompleteness of reference, specifically, an incompleteness of \(Y\) with respect to \(X\); that is to say, without \(Y\) there would be, with respect to \(X\), no generation of awareness of an overall connection among the meanings of words and other factors taken in their native senses. Words (and other semantic units) used as nouns, case endings, verbal roots, verbal endings, finite verbs, and words in declension are such that, in a particular instance, without the one or the other, there would not be awareness generated of an overall connection among all the referents mutually, taking everything in its native sense.

Lists of words do not fulfill the “expectation” condition, for example, “Cow, being-the-object-of-an-action (as designated by a word in the accusative case), bringing.” Gaṅgeśa admits that it “could be an instance of knowledge of verbal meaning, but it would not produce knowledge of an overall connection” (2020: 1547). Nevertheless, with him the expectation is also something felt by a hearer, whose grasping the reference of one word with its case ending (which also refers, according to him) leads to expectation not just of another word but of its referent. Thus expectation is a psychological property mediated by words in reference to a fact. It is embedded in a subject’s understanding of words as united by their references comprising the fact that is captured by a statement. Sometimes Gaṅgeśa’s dialectic, particularly in several sections on verbal compounds and the like at the end of the chapter, trades on the difficulty of finding a factual item to which a word would correspond in its real-world relationality as implicated in the incorporation of the word grammatically into a declarative sentence. Thus while the “expectation” seems to work as a matter of grammar, the “grammar” is thought to reflect a fact that the words pick out.

Gaṅgeśa often refers to the problem of the word list that is not unified, several times appearing to reinstate a grammatical understanding of “expectation” as opposed to how objects—referents—are related in fact. And once (2020: 1547) this comes right at the heart of his endorsement of “incremental referentialism” as opposed to the connectivist, “holistic” variety of the Prābhākara. He says, “ … a word endowed with expectation and meeting the other requirements is what brings about a particular presentation of an overall connection.” This seems to be the answer to the problem of the list whose items do not show grammatical connections although they are just what the things themselves demand to constitute a fact, a truth-maker: “Pot, being-the-object-of-an-action (as designated by the accusative case), bringing, action.” The endings on the words in the list do not refer to relations that connect up the other things properly. This is the difference. Each item listed appears incomplete because, for example, reference to bringing demands not only the meaning of a word as something that could be brought but a word in the accusative case with the case ending indicating that it is in the right kind of relation objectively. Every base word is by itself “unsaturated,” to use the Fregean term, referring to something in the world that has to hook up with something else referred to, if there is to be a sentence and statement, abhihitânvaya.

In addition to a section devoted to a second sentential condition, “semantic fit,” yogyatā, Gaṅgeśa provides a brief definition in other places in part because its violation is commonly taken to be the trigger to take a word in a secondary way, not directing us to a “native” referent (he also advances a slightly different view of the trigger which we’ll review later). For example (2020: 1228):

Semantic fit (yogyatā) amounts to there being no legitimate block to understanding a statement.

Included in this is the “Gettier case” of a parrot’s saying something that a hearer \(H\) would take as true if \(H\) did not know the sounds were from a parrot. In the scenario, \(H\) fails to put together the sounds as words and as a sentence and does not acquire testimonial knowledge. Knowing that the sounds are from a parrot is a block. The yogyatā condition is defined negatively and is commonly invoked as a kind a coherence check. And here Gaṅgeśa concurs.

He resists, however, the application of the principle to a Vedic injunction to perform a sacrifice whose result is supposed to be in the distant future, going to heaven, say, which wouldn’t make sense, the ritualists reason, without elliptical reference to apūrva, a magical “Unseen Force,” adṛṣṭa, that connects the completion of the sacrifice with its goal. According to Gaṅgeśa, no apūrva is thereby referenced (etymologically that which is “not understood before” comprehension of an injunction as applying to oneself, say Mīmāṃsakas) and if there is “Unseen Force” created by a sacrifice or another good work it, like all karma, inheres in the self of the performer, affecting, in particular, his or her next incarnation. Thus again he endorses a doctrine of the Nyāya-sūtra, which also rejects apūrva but accepts karma as popularly understood.

The Jewel’s section on “contiguity” is short, and special topics such as ellipsis, etymology versus reconventionalization (only lotuses are referred to in Sanskrit by the compound ‘paṅka-ja’, “mud-born,” although plants like the water-lily are also born in mud), homonymy, and others are treated more or less briefly. But the topic of injuction looms large in the chapter overall along with a concern with Mīmāṃsaka views of moral authority as fundamenally a matter of Vedic injunction.

Injunctions are commonly formed in Sanskrit through use of the optative verbal form, and a central question is just what does the optative affix mean. That one should do such and such seems to be the core meaning about which everyone agrees, but different analyses are given of the idea that one should do such and such. A central thesis is that a certain kind of knowledge both prompts and guides any action that is voluntary, pravṛtti, whether in everyday life or with a ritual. So now since rituals are actions, some of these action-prompting thoughts are prompted by comprehending Vedic sentences. Gaṅgeśa’s effort is often directed to integrating our understanding of Vedic and everyday language, and he uses his criticisms of Mīmāṃsā analyses of ritual actions to illumine the voluntary in general along with “desire to do,” effort, and the knowledge that directs action, including, especially, knowledge of a “means to what’s wanted,” iṣṭa-sādhanatā, an idea hotly debated by all factions of Mīmāṃsā. A basic division in the school occurs on the issue whether means of accomplishing what is enjoined, or contemplated because desired, iṣṭa-sādhanatā, is part of the content of an injunction (as itself implicated in any “desire to do” as the desire’s cognitive content). Bhāṭṭas insist that it is, but Prābhākaras demur, claiming that such is known by a separate intellectual act of “presumption,” arthâpatti. For Prābhākaras, it is simply that something “ought to be done,” its kāryatā, that is the meaning of an injunction, with the means to what’s wanted known by presumption. Gaṅgeśa rehearses extensive arguments on both sides, and seems generally to favor the positions of the Prābhākaras.

In the end, Gaṅgeśa champions an understanding of the injunction as expressing a certain kind of knowledge-prompting action, especially “what one ought to do,” kāryatā, which he sees, agreeing with the Prābhākara, as the meaning of an injunction. That is to say, for him, “what one ought to do” is the meaning in part. But he also agrees with the Bhāṭṭa that a means has to be known or made known, and he adds another factor, effort, and the requirement that the action be known as accomplishable by one’s own effort.

An ethical view centered on Vedic injunctions is embedded in Mīmāṃsaka attitudes, and Gaṅgeśa shows sympathy for the life regulated by ritual, in particular daily rituals that require no special qualifications. But his own ethical outlook is nowhere explicitly stated. At places he shows affinity for a soteriological ethics implicit in a mystical way of knowing the “truth” concerning the “self,” ātman, a self as experienced in a special kind of yogic meditation. At several places, he quotes the Bhagavad Gītā, apparently endorsing its karma-yoga teaching of benevolent action. Despite sympathy for Mīmāṃsaka positions, when it comes to the striking and longlasting conflicts, ethical and otherwise, between ritualists and mystics/yogins in the subcontinent, Gaṅgeśa seems to line up with the yogins—like, it should be noted, Gautama, the author of the Nyāya-sūtra and his commentators. Indeed, although airing Mīmāṃsā opinion apparently with much sympathy, Gaṅgeśa sees injunctions to perform rituals as trumped by yogic teachings of the way to self-discovery. But also like many Naiyāyikas before him, Gaṅgeśa appears to try to find middle ground in ethics as in other areas of theory. Surely, he is not a radical critic of the ritualists’ moral codes, more likely one of their number trying to nudge colleagues into broader points of view.

7.3 “Indirect indication,” lakṣaṇā

The longest section in the testimony chapter and indeed in the entirety of the Jewel is devoted to lakṣaṇā, which is a second mode of meaning dependent on the first or primary called “denotation,” abhidhāna, i.e. reference. Nyāya-sutra 2.2.62 gives about a dozen examples of semantic transference, for example, “The stands are shouting,” where it is not the stands but the people in them who are shouting. And with “Usher in the sticks,” it is ascetics who carry walking sticks who are to be ushered in. In this example, the primary, denotative meaning is not entirely transferred since the ascetics would carry their sticks in with them into the dining room, it is presumed. The most common example in the Jewel is “The village is in-the-Gaṅgā,” where we understand the village to be on the river’s bank (the indicated) because we know that no village is actually built in the Gaṅgā, which is very deep.

The inherited view is that a violation of yogyatā, “semantic fit,” triggers a hearer to understand a secondary sense. But one of the first comments Gaṅgeśa makes about lakṣaṇā rejects this view, bringing up the phenomenon’s relevance to the debate about sentential unity, anvaya. He writes (2020: 1250):

… [lakṣaṇā] is not triggered by a violation of semantic fit (as is commonly held) but rather by a violation of anvaya itself, of the overall connection of words, the overall construction. For example, by force of context we understand from a violation of anvaya with the word ‘stick’ in connection with ‘usher in’ (“Usher in the sticks”) that the speaker’s purpose is to feed certain ascetics (who typically carry walking sticks) who would be ushered in along with their sticks.

In a case where a secondary usage does not involve entire relinquishment of the primary meaning but retains it in part, as (with the previous example but also) in “The umbrella-holders are coming,” it is precisely the context that tells us that the coming is on the part of an umbrella-holder and also those who are not umbrella-holders (important people over whose heads a large umbrella is being held). Because of the violation, the agency of the movement is understood. There would be a violation of anvaya in taking the meaning to apply only to a holder.

Since it is entirely possible that several umbrella-holders are coming, it must be something broader than “semantic fit” that is violated in this and similar cases.

“Indirect indication” does a lot of work for referentialism, since there are many, many examples where no direct referent is meant but a hearer comprehends a statement and acquires testimonial knowledge. And although Gaṅgeśa resists overemployment of the notion, he uses it extensively. Further examples concern the meaning of certain Sanskrit compounds and grammatical number, when, for instance, a plural form is used while what is meant is a single something or other.

Naiyāyikas are hardly the only theorists who employ the tool. Some Mīmāṃsakas argue that reference is to the universal, the individual being indicated by lakṣaṇā. Gaṅgeśa considers the view that it is the universal that is known by lakṣaṇā, not the individual, the universal as specifying the character of the individual. On the dispute about reference to universals or individuals, Naiyāyikas want to agree with all parties, it seems. Importantly, Gaṅgeśa sees reference to an individual as invariably to an individual of a kind, for example “(A) cow,” would be to one qualified by cowhood: “the referent is an entity as qualified by a universal” (2020: 1576). To focus just on the cowhood would be “indirect indication,” he says, with the indicator being the individual cow referred to. Prābhākaras tend to find no use for lakṣaṇā, since according to them reference is holistic, a matter of the entire sentence, and the meanings of the individual words are united in the hearer’s mind. Thus it is the radical referentialists who seem to need it most.

In a remarkable passage, Gaṅgeśa puts forth a core argument for lakṣaṇā (2020: 1631):

Reference (śakti = abhidhā) is alone sufficient (with no need to posit an additional mode of meaning), since the conventional practice that supports anyone's understanding meaning is common to both (what you call) primary and indicated senses. For, the words (that make up a sentence and statement) having been put together, an etymological analysis can inform us of the overall connection because śakti, the power of reference, has accomplished a setting in mind, or settings in mind, produced by the words. Otherwise, there could be neither testimony as a knowledge source nor speaker’s intention, since this power governs and regulates them both.

Moreover, if the speaker’s intention is understood (by anyone hearing “The village is in-the-Gaṅgā”), then only reference need be imagined as accounting for the communication (no indirect meaning, lakṣaṇā), since that is the economical position. Like homonyms such as ‘akṣa’ (“eye/dice”) and company, multiplicity of meaning is alone the right view. No uneconomical additional mode need be supposed.

We answer. If we had to imagine that the word ‘Gaṅgā’ is used (as you claim) for the thousands of things that could be indicated by using the word for such a thing as a bank, then in order to understand a usage we would have to be familiar with another conventional practice of older persons (who have taught us the conventions of language) in each case among all the innumerable things that could be indicated. And so this view is uneconomical, and it is not borne out by experience.

Indirect meaning (lakṣaṇā), on the other hand, is single, unitary, by nature to be related to what is picked out. And it does not require us to be familiar with another conventional practice of of older persons having the indicated as intentional object. Thus to have an economical position, it alone is appropriately posited.

Without lakṣaṇā, reference would have to do too much work and could not tie use of a word to a certain type of thing. It is to save the fixity of the referential tie that lakṣaṇā has to be posited. Its usefulness as a concept depends on its flexibility.

Gaṅgeśa also swims against the mainstream by eschewing knowledge of speaker’s intention to explain the triggering of lakṣaṇā. He points out that typically one has to understand a statement before knowing the speaker’s intention in making it. A hearer’s knowing the speaker’s intention is not a necessary factor in the generation of the hearer’s testimonial knowledge through indirect indication, he says, but he admits that knowing a speaker’s intention could be sufficient.

About the principles of transference, he has little to say other than to point to “relevant context” and “being set in mind quickly.” Indirect indication is preceded by comprehension of conventional meaning and is directed toward something that is related to the conventional meaning. But some cases, “frozen metaphors,” are reconventionalizations where the primary, original meaning has been forgotten. A “windfall” seems to be a good example in modern English. There is a long and intricate discussion of this. Can we refer to a water-lily by using the word ‘mud-born’? No, says Gaṅgeśa. The word has been reconventionalized to mean in a primary way only lotuses and if used for a water-lily we would have a case of lakṣaṇā.


A. Primary Literature


Tattva-cintā-maṇi, (“Jewel”), translated by S. Phillips, Jewel of Reflection on the Truth about Epistemology. 3 volumes, London: Bloomsbury, 2020.

  • Perception chapter.


    1. Ed. N.S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. 1972. With the Prakāśa commentary by Rucidatta Miśra and a subcommentary by Rāmakṛṣṇādhvarin. Kendriya Sanskrit Vidyapeetha Series 20. Tirupati.
    2. Ed. Kamakhyanath Tarkavagish. 1884–1901 (reprint 1991). With the Māthurī commentary of Mathurānātha. Calcutta: Asiatic Society.

    Translation. V.P. Bhatta. 2012. Perception, the Pratyakṣa khaṇḍa of the Tattvacintāmaṇi. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers.

    Translation of sections. The jnapti-vāda: Mohanty 1989. The abhāva-vāda: Matilal 1968. The nirvikalpaka-vāda: Sibajiban Bhattacharyya 1993. Gaṅgeśa’s Theory of Indeterminate Perception, Part Two. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.

  • Inference chapter.


    1. Ed. N.S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. 1982 and 1999. With the Prakāśa commentary by Rucidatta Miśra and a subcommentary by Dharmarājādhvarin. 2 vols. Kendriya Sanskrit Vidyapeetha Series 33. Tirupati.
    2. Ed. Kamakhyanath Tarkavagish. 1884–1901 (reprint 1991). With the commentary of Mathurānātha. 2 vols. Calcutta: Asiatic Society.

    Translation of sections. The vyāpti-vāda: C. Goekoop. 1967. The Logic of Invariable Concomitance in the Tattvacintāmaṇi. Dordrecht: D. Reidel. The vyāpti-graha-vāda: Mrinalkanti Gangopadhyay. 1975. “Gaṅgeśa on Vyāptigraha: The Means for the Ascertainment of Invariable Concomitance.” Journal of Indian Philosophy 3:167–208. The upādhi-vāda:

    1. Erich Frauwallner, Die Lehre von der Zusätzlichen Bestimmung in Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi. Vienna: Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Klasse, Sitzungsberichte, 266. Band 2. Abhandlung, 1970.
    2. Kisor Chakrabarti 2010. The pakṣatā-vāda: Dravid 2007. The kevalânvaya-vāda: Matilal 1968b. The īśvarânumāna-vāda: John Vattanky. 1984. Gaṅgeśa’s Philosophy of God. Madras: Adyar.
  • Analogy chapter.


    1. Ed. Gaurinath Sastri. 1983. With the Pragalbhī commentary by Pragalbhācārya. Varanasi: Sampurnanand Sanskrit University.
    2. Ed. Kamakhanath Tarkavagish. With the Dīpanī commentary by Kṛṣṇakānta (reprint 1990). Calcutta: Asiatic Society.
  • Testimony chapter.


    1. Ed. Kamakhyanath Tarkavagish. 1884–1901 (reprint 1990). With the commentaries of Mathurānātha and Jayadeva. 2 vols. Calcutta: Asiatic Society.
    2. Ed. S.R. Saha and P.K. Mukhopadhyaya, The Śabdakhaṇḍa of Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi, Calcutta: Jadavpur Univesity and K.P. Bagchi. 1991.

    Translation. V.P. Bhatta. 2005. 2 vols. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers.

    Translation of sections: The vidhi-vāda: V.N. Jha. 1987. The Philosophy of Injunctions. Delhi: Pratibha Prakashan. The apūrva-vāda: V.N. Jha, 1986. The Logic of the Intermediate Causal Link. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications. The section on yoga-rūḍhi: Subash Chandra Dash. 1992. Gaṅgeśa on Yogarūḍhi. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications. The ākhyāta-vāda: Toshihoru Wada, in four installments:

    1. 2007. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Suffixes 1,” in K. Preisendanz, ed. Expanding and Merging Horizons: Contributions to South Asian and Cross-Cultural Studies in Commemoration of Wilhelm Halbfass. Vienna: Austrian Academy of Sciences, pp. 415-29;
    2. 2012. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Suffixes 2,” in C. Watanabe, M. Desmarais, and Y. Honda, eds., Saṃskṛta-Sādhutā: Goodness of Sanskrit: Studies in Honor of Professor Ashok N. Aklujkar. New Delhi: D. K. Printworld, pp. 528-44;
    3. 2013. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Suffixes 3,” Nagoya Studies in Indian Culure and Buddhism: Saṃbhāṣā 30:1-14;
    4. 2014. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Suffixes,” Sanskrit Studies 3: 178-209.

    The dhātu-vāda: Toshihoru Wada, in two installments:

    1. 2115. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Roots (dhātu),” Indologica Taurinensia 41-42: 193-218;
    2. 2016. “Gaṅgeśa on the Meaning of Verbal Roots (dhātu),”Journal of UA Foundation for Indological Studies, vol. 2: Festschrift Professor Karl H. Potter, pp. 35-50.

Other Primary Literature

  • Dharmakīrti. Vāda-nyāya. Tr. Pradeep P. Gokhale. 1993. Vādanyāya of Dharmakīrti: The Logic of Debate. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • Gautama. Nyāya-sūtra.
    • Editions.
      1. Ed. Anantalal Thakur, 1997. Gautamīyanyāyadarśana with Bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana, New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.
      2. Ed. A.M. Tarkatirtha, Taranatha Nyayatarkatirtha, and H.K. Tarkatirtha, 1936–1944 (reprint 1985). Nyāyadarśanam (Nyāya-sūtra with four commentaries, the Nyāya-sūtra-bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana, the Nyāya-vārttika of Uddyotakara, the Nyāya-vārttika-tātpārya-ṭīkā of Vācaspati Miśra, and the Vṛtti of Viśvanātha), Calcutta Sanskrit Series 18.
    • Translations.
      1. Ganganatha Jha, 1919. With Vātsyāyana’s and Uddyotakara’s commentaries. The Nyāyasūtras of Gautama with the Bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana and the Vārttika of Uddyotakara, 4 volumes, reprinted Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
      2. Mrinalkanti Gangopadhyay, 1982. With Vātsyāyana’s commentary. Nyāya-Sūtra with Vātsyāyana’s Commentary, Calcutta: Indian Studies.
      3. Michel Angot, 2009. Le Nyāya-sūtra de Gautama Akṣapāda, le Nyāya-Bhāṣya d’Akṣapāda Pakṣilasvāmin: l’Art de Conduire la Pensée en Inde Ancienne; Édition, Traduction et Présentation, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
      4. Mathew Dasti and Stephen Phillips, 2017. The Nyāya-sūtra: Selections with Early Commentaries, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Kaṇāda, Vaiśeṣika-sūtra. Ed. (with the commentary of Candrānanda) Muni Sri Jambuvijayaji, Gaekwad Oriental Series 136, Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1961. Tr. Nandalal Sinha. 1911. The Sacred Books of the Hindus (Volume VI), Allahabad: Pâṇini Office.
  • Kumārila, Śloka-vārttika (commentary on part of the Mīmāṃsā-sūtra). Ed. Dvarikadas Sastri. 1978. Varanasi: Tara Publications. Translation, the perception chapter: John Taber. 2005. A Hindu Critique of Buddhist Epistemology: The “Determination of Perception” Chapter of Kumārila Bhaṭṭa’s Śloka-vārttika. London: Routledge. Other chapters: Ganganatha Jha. Slokavartika. 1900, 1908. Reprint. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • Maṇikaṇṭha Miśra, Nyāya-ratna. Ed. V. Subrahmanya Sastri and V. Krishnamacharya. 1953. Nyāyaratna of Maṇikaṇṭha Miśra. Madras: Madras Government Oriental Series.
  • Nāgārjuna, Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā. Ed. J.W. de Jong. 1977. Madras: Adyar. Translation (from the Tibetan): Jay Garfield. 1995. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Nāgārjuna's Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Nāgārjuna, Vigraha-vyāvārttinī. Ed. and tr. Kamaleshwar Bhattacharya. 1978. The Dialectical Method of Nāgārjuna. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass. See also Westerhoff 2010.
  • Śalikanātha Miśra, Prakaraṇa-pañcikā. Ed. A. Subrahmanya Sastri. 1961. Banaras Hindu University Darśana Series 4. Varanasi. (Partially) translated: K.T. Pandurangi. 2004. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.
  • Udayana, Ātma-tattva-viveka. Ed. Vindhyesvariprasada Dvivedin and Lakshmana Sastri Dravida. 1986 (reprint). Bibliotheca Indica 170. Calcutta: The Asiatic Society. Translation: N.S. Dravid. 1995. Ātmatattvaviveka by Udayanācārya. Shimla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study.
  • Udayana, Kiraṇâvali. Ed. Siva Chandra Sarvvabhouma. 1911 (reprint 1989). Kiraṇāvalī of Udayana. With the commentary of Vardhamāna. Calcutta: Asiatic Society. Translation: Tachikawa 1981.
  • Udayana, Nyāya-kusumâñjali. Ed. Mahaprabhulal Goswami. 1972. Mithila Institite Ancient Texts Series 23. Darbhanga: Mithila Research Institute. Tr. N.S. Dravid, Nyaya-kusumanjali of Udayanacarya. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research, 1996.
  • Udayana, Nyāya-vārttika-tātparya-pariśuddhi. Ed. Anantalal Thakur. 1996. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.
  • Uddyotakara, Nyāya-vārttika. (1) Ed. Anantalal Thakur. 1997. Nyāyabhāṣyavārttikam. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research. (2) See Gautama.
  • Vācaspati Miśra, Nyāya-vārttika-tātparya-ṭīkā (“Notes on (Uddyotakara’s) Intention in his Nyāya-vārttika Commentary”). (1) Ed. Anantalal Thakur. 1996. Nyāyavārttikatātparyaṭīkā of Vāchaspatimiśra. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research. (2) See Gautama.
  • Vācaspati Miśra, Tattva-bindu. Ed. and tr. Madeleine Biardeau. 1979. Le Tattvabindu de Vācaspatimiśra. Pondichéry: Institut français d'indologie.
  • Vātsyāyana, Nyāya-sūtra-bhāṣya (NySB). (1) See Thakur ed. under Gautama. (2) See Tarkatirtha et al. editors under Gautama.

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