Gelukpa [dge lugs pa]

First published Tue Feb 4, 2014; substantive revision Tue Mar 1, 2022

The Gelukpa (or Geluk) tradition of Tibetan Buddhist philosophy is inspired by the works of Tsongkhapa (1357–1419), who set out a distinctly nominalist Buddhist tradition that differs sharply from other forms of Buddhist thought not only in Tibet, but elsewhere in the Buddhist world. The negative dialectics of the Middle Way (madhyamaka) is the centerpiece of the Geluk intellectual tradition and is the philosophy that is commonly held in Tibet to represent the highest view. The Middle Way, a philosophy systematized in the second century by Nāgārjuna, seeks to chart a “middle way” between the extremes of essentialism and nihilism with the notion of two truths: the ultimate truth of emptiness and the conventional truth of dependent existence. Drawing upon the presentation of the middle way from the seventh-century philosopher, Candrakīrti, the Geluk school’s unique presentation of the Consequence School (prāsaṅgika) of the Middle Way—a tradition that does not build foundational epistemological systems, but affirms existence merely in terms of transactional usage—is a hallmark of its philosophy.

1. Ultimate Truth and the Middle Way

The Geluk interpretation of the Middle Way offers a unique presentation of the Buddhist doctrine of two truths: the ultimate truth and conventional (or relative) truth. Geluk philosophers are concerned to avoid the reification of the ultimate truth and the deprecation of conventional truth, arguing that conventional existence and ultimate nonexistence are mutually implicative. In this tradition, the two truths are said to be “extensionally identical but intensionally distinct” (ngo bo gcig la ldog pa tha dad). That is, the two truths are not different entities, but are conceptually distinct aspects of all entities. Thus Geluk philosophers argue that (1) to exist is to be empty and (2) to exist is to exist conventionally (see Changkya in Cozort 1998, 429).

The ultimate truth is said to be emptiness because things are not found to exist separate from their parts, causes, or designations; this non-finding itself is the meaning of emptiness. Emptiness, too, is not “found” when sought (emptiness is empty, too). To be found (when an ultimate essence is sought) is to be intrinsically or ultimately real, and nothing has this status for the Geluk tradition, not even emptiness. Emptiness is interpreted in the Geluk tradition as a non-implicative negation (med dgag). As opposed to a negation that implies something else, a non-implicative negation is simply an absence, such as a lack of true existence. This mere lack or absence, as a negation of essence that does not implicate any other essence, is the meaning of the ultimate truth in the Geluk tradition. Nevertheless, the claim that there is nothing ultimately real—or that the ultimate truth is emptiness—is itself a (conventional) truth (Jinpa 2002, 46–48). It is expressed like this: “The ultimate truth is posited as solely the negation of truth [that is, inherent existence] upon a subject that is a basis of negation…” (Tsongkhapa, 396). Thus, on this view, nothing exists ultimately. This lack of essence in phenomena, or “emptiness,” does not annul their appearance or conventional reality. Rather, emptiness is held to be the condition for the possibility for any appearance. To be empty means to arise dependently—to lack independent, real existence. Since nothing can be found to be independent, everything is said to be empty. Thus, in the Geluk tradition, emptiness is the nature of all phenomena (or their lack of independent nature), and all phenomena are necessarily empty.

2. Conventional Truth and the Consequence School

Geluk philosophers take the radically anti-foundationalist, antirealist Consequence School (Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka), grounded in the texts of the Indian Buddhist philosophers Buddhapālita and Candrakīrti, to be the most sophisticated school of Buddhist philosophy. The Consequence School gets its name from the fact that it relies on reductio argument to demonstrate emptiness, in contrast to independent formal arguments. According to Tsongkhapa, no independent formal argument can prove the emptiness of phenomena to those not already convinced of that fact because these arguments presuppose a common understanding of the terms used. That is, this kind of formal argument presumes that a subject matter is objective or given and is understood in the same way by all parties to the debate, and he follows Candrakīrti in arguing that this cannot be the case when an antirealist (who understands emptiness) and a realist (who lacks an understanding of emptiness) engage in dialogue (Changkya in Cozort 1998, 451). This is because a proponent of the Consequence School consents to no such given, objective facts.

By invoking consensus as the mark of (conventional) reality, the Geluk school’s coherence theory of truth anticipates some of the insights of the later Wittgenstein (see Thurman 1980). There are no foundations in the Geluk tradition, neither ultimate nor conventional; there is only transactional usage—“what is renowned in the world.” Thus, unlike some other Middle Way philosophies, like the Autonomy School (svātantrika), the distinction between “correct” or “incorrect” relative truth itself depends upon our epistemic conventions and practices, not on a world of independent truthmakers. “What works” is the criterion; that is, what conforms to the ways of the world is a conventional truth in the way that a game works when you subscribe to its rules. Any further notion of a “correct” relative implicates a foundation, an essentialist presumption about the way things are (Changkya 1998, 321; Bötrül 2011, 141). Therefore, the measure of what is correct is simply what conforms to the world rather than based on any other warrant that would serve as a deeper structure or more fundamental layer of reality beyond what is simply conventional (Cozort 1998, 52).

Tsongkhapa identifies three criteria for conventional truth. A conventional truth is what (1) is acknowledged by a conventional epistemic instrument, (2) is not undermined by another conventional epistemic instrument, and (3) is not undermined by an analysis of its ultimate nature (Tsongkhapa 2000, 627). The third criterion underscores an important point in Gelukpa philosophy: that an object’s emptiness of intrinsic existence (its ultimate status) does not undermine its status as a conventional truth. Whether or not this is successful, or if this is even possible, is a strongly debated philosophical question. The first two criteria reflect the commitment that what counts as true or real depends upon our epistemic resources, which themselves are mutually supportive, and which both support and are supported by the entities they reveal, as well as the fact that there is a difference between being correct and incorrect regarding conventional truth. Because of this commitment to a robust sense of conventional truth, their rivals in Tibet have charged the Geluk interpretation of the Middle Way with being realist (about the conventional truth) and nihilist (about the ultimate truth), or even an incoherent mixture—full of contradictions—of Dharmakīrti’s foundationalist epistemology with Candrakīrti’s antirealist ontology. The Geluk philosophy continues to be engaged in the debate about the unique role that epistemology plays within the antifoundationalist Consequence School (The Yakherds, 2021).

Tsongkhapa and his Geluk followers insist is that nothing exists on its own even conventionally; that interdependence is universal (Tsongkhapa 1988, 585). Therefore, we cannot ground conventions in any deeper foundation. The fact that there is nothing but groundless conventions—all the way up and all the way down—is another way of seeing why the ultimate and the conventional are not distinct from one another; the two truths are none other than two aspects of the same thing.

Geluk philosophers argue that this explains the crucial distinction between the Middle Way (Madhyamaka) and the Mind-Only (Cittamātra or Yogācāra) schools of Buddhist philosophy which, on their reading, assigns the mind a privileged ontological status as the truly existent ground of an illusory external world. Rather than claim that the mind is independently real in contrast to unreal external objects, like a subjective idealist, Geluk theorists argue that a proponent of the Middle Way explicitly affirms the interdependency of minds and objects. Künzang Sönam (1823–1905), explains Tsongkhapa’s position as the thesis that minds and external objects are equally conventionally existent and equally ultimately nonexistent, and so of exactly the same ontological and epistemological status. He goes on to show how external objects are accepted conventionally in the Consequence School because the coextensive presence and absence of objects and cognitions undermines the claim that even conventionally there are no external objects. That is, when there are external objects, there are internal cognitions, and when there are internal cognitions, there are external objects; cognitions and objects are paired and thus rise and fall together. He reiterates this point by saying that not only does no conventional analysis negate external objects, but that conventional analysis undermines the absence of externality (Künzang 2007, 706–707). One might think that since Geluk philosophers take the existence of the external world to be affirmed in the Consequence School, that they are committed to external realism, and indeed some of their critics have accused them of this (The Yakherds 2021). But the affirmation of the existence of the external world is simply an affirmation of its conventional reality, and of its knowability using conventional epistemic instruments. So, while Geluk philosophers are not idealists, they are certainly not external realists, either.

Tsongkhapa outlined three types of “intrinsic characteristic” (rang mtshan) that convey important features of the different metaphysical systems of the Abhidharma, Dharmakīrtian epistemology, and the Consequence School, respectively. Through this threefold distinction he sets up his presentation of what uniquely defines the ultimate truth, and by implication, the conventional truth, in the Consequence School, while incorporating a range of metaphysical systems into his comprehensive interpretative scheme. Firstly, Tsongkhapa says that an “intrinsic characteristic” is distinguished from a “general characteristic” in the Abhidharma context of metaphysics, where an intrinsic characteristic distinguishes a particular trope from a general type. That is to say, an intrinsic characteristic marks a contrast that delineates, for instance, the heat of fire (intrinsic characteristic) from its being a member of the larger class of material form (general characteristic). Tsongkhapa conveys another meaning of “intrinsic characteristic” found in Dharmakīrtian epistemology that distinguishes the “intrinsic characteristic” that is the unique particular from that which is an universal. In contrast to the second meaning of “intrinsic characteristic”—which marks a contrast of a more real kind of entity (a particular) from another, less substantially real counterpart (an universal)—the third meaning of “intrinsic characteristic” represents a subtle kind of reification that is a problem. This third type of intrinsic characteristic is presupposed by distorted cognitions that impute things to have independent existence. This kind of intrinsic characteristic, as the imputation of things existing on their own, even conventionally, is what Tsongkhapa describes as the subtle reification that is uniquely eliminated in the philosophical system of the Consequence School (Tsongkhapa 2008, 425–426).

Geluk philosophers emphasize the interdependence — the relational nature of things (the internal and external, and the ultimate and conventional). Indeed, the argument for universal emptiness from the premise of interdependence is often called “the king of arguments.” Künzang Sönam says that it is “the king” because it can simultaneously induce certainty in emptiness and appearance from the side of emptiness; there are no other Middle Way arguments that do this. That is, demonstrating that the objects we encounter are (mere) appearance eliminates the reification of (intrinsic) existence, while showing that emptiness is the emptiness of intrinsic existence—as opposed to empirical existence—eliminates the misconception that things are utterly nonexistent. The fact that the interdependent world exists (dependently, without intrinsic existence) reveals how the conventional and ultimate truths are paired in this philosophy. There is no hierarchy of a transcendent, ultimate world contrasted with the immanent world of conventions that lacks any value. Rather, the ontological unity of the two truths in the Consequence School erases this dichotomy, and arguably erases the dichotomy of the domains of ontology and ethics, too. That is, the system of this antirealist “ground” of emptiness and interdependence arguably supports an ethical system in a more seamless way than an instrumental notion of ethics can, with its associated notion of a means or “path” that results in a qualitatively different, transcendent goal. Indeed, the Geluk (lit. “way of virtue”) appeals to this ethical feature in its name.

3. Unique Assertions of the Consequence School

Tsongkhapa contends that the superiority of the Consequence School to all other Buddhist philosophical schools is reflected in a series of theses unique to this school, each of which reflects a deeper understanding of the nature of reality and cognition. We now turn to several of these. The Consequence School squarely rejects idealism: neither objects nor minds have a privileged status in this tradition, and so there is no privileged level of consciousness, and no self-validating awareness. While the Mind-Only school asserts that all thought and all appearances are grounded in a “foundational consciousness” (kun gzhi rnam shes) and that each moment of consciousness is reflexively aware (rang rig), the Consequence School rejects these claims. The foundational consciousness, he argues—posited as a ground for sensory consciousness—represents a mistaken attempt by other Buddhists to understand personal identity, one that ends up reifying the self. Tsongkhapa dispenses with this notion of a substrate consciousness and sees it as simply another reification.

The Mind-Only school is committed to the reality of a special kind of reflexive awareness (rang rig), by means of which the mind knows itself, a way that is different from the way a mind knows any other object. Geluk scholars deny that there is any such distinctive mode of reflexive awareness; the mind is simply a dependently arisen phenomenon, just like any other, and is known in just the way that other phenomena are known. Moreover, nothing appears the way it really is to an ordinary being (Jamyang Zhepa in Hopkins 2003, 930). For this reason, this philosophy does not partake in ordinary phenomenology. Instead, it is primarily concerned with critical ontology, or what we could call a form of “ontological deflationism,” in that it aims to undermine the foundations of the entire ontological project (MacKenzie 2008, 197). Philosophers in the Geluk tradition also point out that the posit of reflexive awareness attributes to the mind a special status as an independently existent, self-knowing entity. Yet a unique, first-personal access to self-awareness, being simply given in experience, presumes immediate access to truth. Tsongkhapa and his followers take this as a further reason to reject this view, since according to those in the Geluk tradition, conventional truths are interdependent, and knowledge is always mediated and contingent. Moreover, they argue, reflexive awareness offers no explanatory power in the realms of either the conventional or ultimate truth. Indeed, Tsongkhapa argues that in the Consequence School, neither this kind of foundational consciousness nor reflexive awareness are taken to exist even conventionally—they are simply philosophical errors.

Tsongkhapa argues that another distinctive feature of the Consequence school is its recognition of the existence of “disintegration as an entity” (zhig pa’i dngos po) to account for causality (Hopkins 2003, 934–35). The impetus for the theory that disintegration is a distinct entity is to provide an account for causality in the absence of substance. Tsongkhapa argues that an entity’s disintegration—which many other Buddhist philosophical systems take to be a non-entity—is just as real as any positive entity, and so itself is as causally efficacious as any other entity or event. While attributing causal power to disintegration is an attempt to preserve a non-substantialist theory of causality, this theory invites other problems, such as the reification of absence (i.e., treating emptiness as a “thing”), which has been a frequent target for critics of the Geluk tradition.

The Geluk tradition also sees the Consequence School as offering an unapologetic affirmation of conventional reality, including the reality of the person. The Geluk tradition holds that transformation and liberation do not require us to deny the reality of the world, but rather to cease the superimposition of essences onto the entities we encounter and onto ourselves as subjects. This is another way of saying that emptiness—the absence of essence—is a negation not of existence per se, but rather of intrinsic existence, or essence. That is, this analysis in terms of emptiness in a significant way leaves conventional phenomena intact, and merely refutes the claim that they exist ultimately. Significantly, the denial of self, too, does not mean the denial of the “mere I” (bdag tsam), or the conventionally existent person (Jinpa 2002, 71). The mere I or the conventional person is also accepted as conventional existent in the Geluk tradition. Only its reification or true existence is denied.

4. Buddhist Context of Geluk Philosophy

It is important to recognize how Geluk philosophy is embedded within a distinctively Buddhist soteriology. That is, the truth of no-self is liberating because understanding this is held to free one from the mistaken idea of a self that binds one to suffering. Knowledge of emptiness is key to this emancipatory process, as Tsongkhapa claims, for one must realize emptiness as it is articulated in the Consequence School, the lack of true essence, to be free from the subtle sense of self and achieve nirvāṇa (Cozort 1998, 316). This view is also maintained to be a prerequisite for the esoteric practices of tantra. Tantra is an important part of the path to liberation in the Geluk tradition. It is a path to liberation that is held to involve distinct, esoteric methods, but without diverging from the philosophical view of emptiness, which is indispensable. For this reason, Geluk philosophy is located squarely within the immanent world and the exoteric domain of discourse: the intersubjective spaces of dialogue and debate.

Therefore, rather than overcoming mistaken concepts by circumventing them in a mystical flash of insight or an ecstatic experience of union, the Geluk tradition offers a more sober way to overcome misconceptions, one based on clear, rational analysis and a direct appeal to this world. That is, this tradition holds reasoned analysis to be necessary to understand the nature of phenomena (or rather, their lack of nature). This is because an ascertainment of the lack of true existence is held to be necessary to counteract the directly opposed notion—the apprehension of true existence—which is the misinterpretation of reality (as more than simply conventionally existing) that binds one to suffering. To do this, it is not sufficient to simply “let be,” stare into space, or ignore the cause of misinterpretation in some tranquil “nonconceptual” meditation; rather, one must have insight induced by reason that counteracts the habit of holding onto true existence.

Thus, in Geluk philosophy, we can say that insight into reality is not held to be beyond thought, or attributed to some third category beyond the world that is neither existent nor nonexistent, but is simply insight into a world that is neither (ultimately) existent nor (conventionally) nonexistent. Even though Geluk scholars consent to the fact that emptiness can be perceived nonconceptually—in the rarified case of a highly developed meditation—they maintain that the emptiness that is known nonconceptually is no different from the emptiness that is conceptually known. The sharp distinction between conceptual and perceptual arguably falls away when there is nothing beyond conceptual designation. It is not a surprise then that it is the conceptual ascertainment of emptiness that is a principal element of the Geluk school’s philosophy. Moreover, their emphasis on the practice of insight is not based on an appeal to a direct, unmediated access to what is beyond concepts, but to reason. Reason is also given priority over scriptural authority, which is subjected to the scrutiny of analysis and is adjudicated by reason (Tsongkhapa in Hopkins 1999, 71).

5. Geluk Education

Following Tsongkhapa’s lead, the Geluk tradition came to establish large monastic institutions that set the standard for scholastic education in Tibet. The curriculum at Geluk monastic institutions involves five primary topics: metaphysics (abhidharma), epistemology (pramāṇa), negative dialectics (madhyamaka), path structure (Abhisamayālaṃkāra), and ethics (vinaya). Buddhist metaphysics instills the contours of a Buddhist view, including causality, impermanence, and an event-metaphysics that ties these two together. The path structure also plays a central role in traditional Buddhist philosophy: it provides the philosophy with a telos, a narrative arch toward liberation and complete enlightenment. Ethics, too, is integral to this path and to Buddhist philosophy in general, yet some of the most distinctive and interesting features of Geluk philosophy are found in its epistemology, and in particular, negative dialectics.

Geluk monks who train in philosophy study epistemology early in their careers, and debate is a primary means by which this tradition is internalized and enacted. Buddhist epistemology, as codified in Dharmakīrti’s Commentary on Epistemology (Pramāṇavārttika), lays out a systematic presentation of the means of knowledge and the rules for valid inference. Dharmakīrti’s epistemology can be said to be antirealist or conceptualist, in that he denies that language directly relates to the contents of perception, which are ineffable particulars. Yet to account for the relationship between real particulars and unreal universals, the Geluk tradition develops what has been dubbed a “semi-realist” position, whereby it asserts that there are universals that are real entities in contrast to the antirealism that denies that universals are entities (Dreyfus 1997, 173). Here again we see a collapse of duality; this time, the concept-percept duality that underwrites Dharmakīrtian epistemology.

Straddling the delicate line between a realist view that affirms the reality of universals and an antirealist one that denies the reality of concepts, a Geluk account of epistemology holds that universals are real, but that they do not exists separately from their particular instances. For instance, the universal “cow” and the particular instances of cow are held to be not utterly distinct, as antirealists would have it, nor are they held to be the same, as a strict realist would claim, but are rather said to be “extensionally identical but intensionally distinct” (Dreyfus 1997, 174–78). In the epistemological context, articulating this relationship is an attempt to account for the efficacy of concepts without giving universals an autonomous existence apart from their instances. Given that the Geluk tradition claims that Dharmakīrti’s epistemological project represents an inferior philosophical position, it is arguably studied for didactic purposes, whereas the nominalism of what Geluk thinkers consider their own tradition—the view of the Consequence School of the Middle Way—is the hallmark of their philosophy.


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