First published Mon Jul 18, 2011; substantive revision Wed Apr 17, 2024

Tsongkhapa Losang Drakpa (1357–1419) is a well-known Tibetan religious philosopher and one of the most influential and innovative scholars and practitioners in the history of Tibetan Buddhism. He added to the Tibetan Buddhist traditions more globally by setting a paradigm to integrate theory and practice while maintaining focus on ethics, monastic discipline, and the traditions of scholarship and meditation within the esoteric Buddhist tradition. His main contribution to Buddhist philosophy was to show how to develop a robust realism about the conventional world, and how to make sense of epistemology and the possibility of knowledge in the context of global illusion. He does this through the vehicle of commentary, focusing on how to make sense of the Madhyamaka doctrine of the two truths in a way that vindicates Chandrakīrti and does not fall into a nihilism.

The historical Tsongkhapa lived during the period immediately following the final redaction of the Kangyur (bKa’ ’gyur; Buddhist canon into the Tibetan language). He proposed a distinctive Middle Way (Madhyamaka; dbu ma pa) philosophy which differentiated between Chandrakīrti’s (fl. ca. 600) correct Consequentialist (prāsaṅgika; thalgyur pa) interpretation of the works of the Indian philosopher Nāgārjuna (third-fourth century), and an incorrect Autonomist (svātantrika; rang rgyud pa) interpretation by Bhāviveka (also known as Bhavya and Bhāvaviveka, fl. ca. 550). He is strongly influenced by the Indo-Tibetan Buddhist logico-epistemological tradition (pramāṇa; tshad ma), founded by the Indian epistemologists Dignāga and Dharmakīrti (fifth to seventh century). Tsongkhapa strikes a balance between knowledge and praxis, what we might term orthodoxy and orthopraxy. He explains that the emptiness of intrinsic existence (Svabhāvaśūnyatā; rang bzhin gyis stong pa nyid) is the ultimate truth (paramārtha-satya), but that even this is only true conventionally. At the same time he develops a hermeneutics to help retain the authority of correct moral statements on both a covering (saṃvṛti) or conventional (vyavahāra) level. Tsongkhapa was a prolific author who wrote over 300 works, which were collected into 18 volumes. His most influential writing reconciles the philosophy of emptiness with the imperative of praxis, as embodied in a universal altruistic principle (bodhicitta). He reconciles antinomian tantric praxis with ordinary moral life, and also develops a distinctive analysis of dependent origination (pratītya-samutpāda) to support his assertion that entities represent both conventional and ultimate truths. Upon his passing in 1419, Tsongkhapa gave his yellow hat to Gyaltsab Dharma Rinchen (rGyal tshab dar ma rin chen) as a symbolic gesture that the disciple had been chosen to succeed him.

1. Tsongkhapa’s Life

1.1 Overview

Biographical information about Tsongkhapa comes from clues hidden in his own writing, and primarily from the hagiography written by his student Kedrup Pelzangpo (mKhas grub dpal bzang po, 1385–1438) called Stream of Faith (Dad paijug ngog) (a partial translation can be found in Thurman 1982).[1]

Tsongkhapa’s life can be roughly divided into an earlier and later period. The later period is defined by a series of publications, beginning in about 1400 CE, which systematically present his by this point fully mature philosophy. Tsongkhapa, influenced by the divisions used by the editors of the Kangyur, treats exoteric and esoteric sources separately. His philosophical views on the esoteric school, of tantra, and, to a certain extent his work on ethics fall naturally into separate categories. The later period of his life includes a period of institution building, work which eventually led to the founding of a new school tradition.

The most influential of Tsongkhapa’s works include The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment (Lam rim chen mo), completed in 1402; his masterpiece on Buddhist hermeneutics the Essence of Eloquence (Legs bshad snying po) authored in 1407; the Ocean of Reasoning (Rigs pai rgya mtsho), a commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle composed in 1408; and his last important treatise, the Illuminating the Intent (Dgongs pa rab gsal), a commentary on Chandrakīrti’s Entering the Middle Way (Madhyamakāvatāra) completed in 1418, all of which are fundamental to an understanding of his philosophy.

1.2 Detailed account

Tsongkhapa was born in the tenth month of the Fire Bird year of the traditional Tibetan calendar, which corresponds to October 1357 CE, in Tsongkha, the Land of Onions, from which he acquired his name. Tsongkha was an ancient name for a part of what is now the Amdo region of Greater Tibet (Bod chen), today included as part of Qinghai Province of the People’s Republic of China. Born to his father Lumbum Ge and his wife, Shingsa Achoe, he was the fourth of six children—one daughter and five sons. His given name was Losang Drakpa (bLo bzang grags pa). He is also known by the honorific title Je Rinpoche (rJe rin po che, Precious Lord).

Starting from his birth, the young Tsongkhapa’s development was followed closely by the learned Choje Dhondrup Rinchen (Chos rje don grub rin chen) who came from the nearby Jakjyung Monastery (Bya khyung dgon) to pay regular visits to the family as the boy’s primary instructor. With him, Tsongkhapa learned how to recite the mantras of Mañjuśrī and the goddess Sarasvatī—meditation deities in the Tibetan Buddhist tradition associated with knowledge and poetic eloquence. Soon after Tsongkhapa’s tutor Choje had formally taken custody of him, as is the tradition with young Tibetan Buddhist acolytes, he received the lay Buddhist precepts from the fourth Karmapa Karmapa Rolpai Dorjé (1340–83), the head of the Tibetan Karma Kagyu tradition. During this ceremony, which took place in 1360, the name Kunga Nyingpo (Kun dgasnying po) was also bestowed upon him. At the age of six, the young Tsongkhapa moved into his tutor’s residence to begin his formal education, which would include reading, writing, and memorizing the scriptures. Even before his novice ordination of the same year, Tsongkhapa was thus introduced to the esoteric traditions of Tibetan Buddhism. Upon receiving his novice vows, he received the name Lobsang Drakpa (Blo bzang grags pa), which he would use throughout the rest of his life.

By age sixteen, Tsongkhapa had mastered much of what his tutor Choje had to transmit to him, which led him to further his studies by memorizing the most important texts passed on from the great Indian monastic centres of Nālandā, Vikramalaśīla, and Jagaddala. He also showed a natural aptitude for being able to retain the mantras and sādhanas, as well as the meditative practices connected to the esoteric teaching corpus. In his teens (1372–73), Tsongkhapa undertook the thirteen hundred mile journey from Tsong kha to Central (dBus) Tibet (Bod), where he remained until his death in 1419. He arrived in the fall of 1373 as a young man at the famous monastery of Drikung Thil (’Bri gung mthil) (Jinpa 2019).

Central Tibet at this time was nearing the end of a long and fruitful period of intellectual activity known as the Later Diffusion [of Buddhism] (spyi dar), which began with the works of translator Rin chen bzang po (958–1055) and the scholar-saint Dīpaṃkāra-śrījñāna Atiśa (980–1054), and ended with the most important editor of the Kangyur, Butön (Bu ston rin chen grub, 1290–1364). According to Kedrup, Tsongkhapa first studied Tibetan medicine here, then a traditional Buddhist curriculum of abhidharma, tenet systems (Grub mtha’) focusing on the Middle Way and Mind Only (Cittamātra, also called yogācāra) philosophy, Buddhist ethics (sdom gsum), and epistemology (pramāṇa). His early studies were pursued mainly in institutions affiliated with the two dominant scholarly traditions (lugs) of the time: the Sangphu (gSang phu neu tog) tradition founded by Ngok Lotsawa Loden Sherab (rNgog bLo ldan shes rab, 1059–1109), and the Sakya (Sa skya) epistemological tradition based primarily on the works of the Sa skya paṇḍi ta (1182–1251). He also studied and practiced tantric Buddhism.

Shortly after his arrival to Central Tibet, Tsongkhapa rerouted to one of the most important centres of learning in the region, the Dewachen Monastery (bDe ba can dgon pa) in Nyethang (mNyes thang). Nyethang was known to be one of the six major learning centers at that time, the others being Sangphu (gSang phu), Kyormolung (sKyor mo lung), Gadong (dGa gdong dgon), Zulphu (Zul phu), and Tsal Gungthang Monasteries (Tshal gung thang) (Jinpa 2019). After two years of study at Nyethang, in 1375, at the age of nineteen, Tsongkhapa sat for his first formal philosophical debate. From then, he continued to move around Central Tibet, rotating his visits across these sites.

At Shalu Monastery (Zha lu dgon), he met with Rinchen Namgyal (Rin chen rnam rgyal, 1318–88), the foremost student of Butön (Bu ston) and his successor at Shalu. Tsongkhapa took the opportunity to receive important tantric transmissions connected with the meditation deity Cakrasaṃvara from this renowned master. His next stop was the great and important monastery of Sakya (Sa skya dgon), situated to the west of the town of Shigatse (gZhis ka rtse) and famous for having taught Sakya PaṇḍitaIn Sakya, Tsongkhapa met his future principal master, Rendawa Shonu Lodro (Red mda’ ba gzhon nu blo gros, 1349–1412) (Jinpa 2019). From Sakya Monastery, Tsongkhapa traveled on to Jonang, the residence of the renowned master Dolpopa Shreab Gyaltsen (Dol po pa shes rab rgyal mtshan, 1292–1361), where he received initial instructions on the Kālacakra tantra. The next station after Jonang was Bodong E monastery (Bo dong e dgon), another important center of learning, where he sat for formal debate before moving onto Narthang Monastery (sNar thang dgon), after having spent some time at the monastery at Sangpu, one of the most important centers of philosophical learning associated with Atiśa’s Kadam (bKagdams) school. He was very eager to study the Vasubandu (fourth to fifth century CE) Abidharma. Upon hearing that the Indian commentaries were being taught by the masters from the monastery at Nyawon (Nya dbon dgon), Tsongkhapa headed there next. The lead teacher at Nyawon, Master Nyawon himself, referred him to Rendawa, a visiting teacher at the monastery, who was an expert on the Indian commentaries and also the Abhidharma material. Rendawa would become one of the most influential teachers of the period, and would later also become a colleague of Tsongkhapa. Tsongkhapa’s formal study of monastic discipline was conducted at Kyormolung Monastery (sKyor mo lung dgon). In 1377, at age twenty, Tsongkhapa started to teach formally. His first classes were on Asaṅga’s Compendium of Abhidharma (Abhidharmasamuccaya), a text he had studied with his teacher Rendawa only a year earlier.

As can be seen from the above biography, it would be one of Tsongkhapa’s defining traits to alternate between intellectual and contemplative phases, as he had done during his training period. Thus, in 1378, Tsongkhapa entered a strictly solitary cloistered retreat. In the spring of 1379, at age twenty-two, Tsongkhapa emerged from his period of seclusion to prepare for his formal debates on the remaining disciplines he was yet to be examined on: logic and epistemology, Abhidharma, and Vinaya. After having successfully passed these philosophical debates at Narthang Monastery in 1380, he was from then on considered a master of the four primary disciplines of Buddhist scholarship, thus enabling Tsongkhapa to formally begin accepting his own students.

During the period of Tsongkhapa’s training, the study of the Madhyamaka, mainly Nāgārjuna’s Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way (Mūlamadhyamakakārikā) and Chandrakīrti’s Entering the Middle Way Madhyamakāvatāra) did not form part of the formal curriculum. To further his study of Madhyamaka, Tsongkhapa deepened his studies under Rendawa’s careful tutelage, leading to his final formal debate which took place at Tsethang Monastery (rTsed thang dgon), the place where Tsongkhapa also received the complete ordination vows as a now fully ordained monk.

In his early years after this formative period of seclusion, he wrote a number of essays on topics surrounding Abhidharma (Apple 2008), a detailed investigation of the ālaya-vijñāna (The Foundation, Storehouse, Basis-of all Consciousness) (Sparham 1993), and an important treatise, Golden Garland of Eloquence (Legs bshad gser phreng), on the Perfection of Wisdom (prajñā-pāramitā) literature based on the codification of its topics in the Ornament for the Clear Realizations (Abhisamayālaṃkāra) in two volumes (Sparham 2007–2013). He concluded this first publication at the age of thirty-one.

After completing his Golden Garland of Eloquence in 1388–89, Tsongkhapa spent a period of some ten years removed from the hub of intellectual activity. And yet, when looking at his later literary production, it is clear that Tsongkhapa must have spent an extensive period of time with the most important Indian Buddhist texts which formed part of the Tibetan Buddhist canon, all of which helped him to develop his unique critical understanding of the key Indian Buddhist source texts. He further engaged in meditation and ritual religious exercises in Southern Tibet (Lho kha) where, as evidenced in his short autobiographical writing from this transitional period (Thurman 1982), and corroborated by traditional sources (Kaschewsky 1971; Vostrikov 1970), he reports that he entered into a communion or dialogue with Mañjuśrī—the iconographic representation of perfect knowledge in the Buddhist pantheon. Through the voice of Mañjuśrī he articulated a hierarchical system of philosophies, culminating in what he characterized as a pristine, Middle Way, Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka (dBu ma thalgyur pa) that avoided both over-reification (of the absolute) and over-negation (of the conventional).

Tsongkhapa framed his insights not as original contributions, but as a rediscovery of meanings already revealed by the Buddha. In all his works he characterizes his philosophy as being identical to the Buddha’s. Further, he says that his philosophy is based on Nāgārjuna’s and Nāgārjuna’s follower Āryadeva’s (third-fourth century) explanation of what the Buddha said. His philosophy gets its name Prāsaṅgika (“those who reveal the unwelcome consequences [inherent in other’s assertions]”) from the importance it gives to Buddhapālita’s (late fifth century) explication of Nāgārjuna’s work, and to Chandrakīrti’s defense of Buddhapālita’s explanation, in the face of criticism by Bhāviveka.

Tsongkhapa presented his mature philosophy in a series of volumes during the later period of his life, beginning with the publication of his most famous work, The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment in 1402, at the age of forty-six. This was followed by Essence of Eloquence (Legs bshad snying po) and Ocean of Reasoning (Rigs pa’i rgya mtsho) (1407–1408), the Middle-Length Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment (Lam rimbring) in 1415, and, in the last years of his life, his Illuminating the Intent (Jinpa 2021).

Together, in this series of works written over a seventeen year period, he succeeded in setting the agenda for the following centuries, with later writers taking positions both for and against his arguments. As is so often the case, his stature pushed much of earlier Tibetan intellectual history into the shadows, until its rediscovery by the Eclectic Movement (Ris med) in Derge (sDe dge) in the late eighteenth century.

Tsongkhapa wrote his major works on tantra and ethics at the same time as his major philosophical works. His Collected Works (gsungsbum), contained in 18 or 19 volumes, deal with topics based on tantric sources in volumes 3–12. In 1405 he completed his Great Exposition of Tantra (sNgags rim chen mo) (Hopkins 2016; Yarnall 2013) a companion volume to his Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment, where, in harmony with his philosophy, he argued that tantra is defined neither by special insight (vipaśyana) nor Mahāyāna universal altruism, but solely by deity yoga (lhai rnalbyor) (Hopkins 2016).

In 1402, Tsongkhapa, with his teacher Rendawa (Roloff 2009) and others, convened a gathering of monks at the temple of Namstedeng (rNam rtsed ldeng/lding) with the intention of reinvigorating the Buddhist order. From this came Tsongkhapa’s short but influential works on basic Buddhist morality (prātimokṣa) that in turn laid the foundation for the importance some Gelukpa monasteries would place on a stricter adherence to the monastic code. In 1403 his influential works on ethical codes for bodhisattvas (Byang chub gzhung lam) (Tatz 1986) and for tantric practitioners (rtsa ltung rnam bshad) (Sparham 2005) appeared. His separate explanations of the three ethical codes (sdom gsum) are distinguished by the centrality they give to basic morality, the importance the bodhisattva’s code retains in tantra, and in the antinomian tantras, the presence of a separate prātimokṣa-like ordination ritual built around a codification of ethical conduct specific to tantric practitioners.

By 1409, at the age of fifty-two, his place in Tibetan society was sufficiently established that he could garner the support and sponsorship necessary for a successful rejuvenation of the central temple in Lhasa, for the establishment of a new-year prayer festival (smon lam chen mo), and for the completion of a large new monastery, Ganden (dGaldan), where he lived for much of the rest of his life, until his death there in 1419. He inspired two of his students, Tashi Palden (bKra shis dpal ldan, 1379–1449) and Shakya Yeshe (ShAkya ye shes, 1354–1435), to found Drepung (’Bras spungs) Monastery in 1416, and Sera Monastery in 1419, respectively. These, with Ganden, would later become the three largest and most powerful Gelukpa monasteries, and indeed, the biggest monasteries in the world. In 1407 and 1413 the Ming dynasty Yongle Emperor recognized Tsongkhapa’s growing fame and importance by inviting him to the Chinese court, as was the custom.

2. Early Period

2.1 Explanation of the Difficult Points (Kun gzhi dka’ ’grel)

Tsongkhapa’s most important works from his early period are his Explanation of the Difficult Points (Kun gzhi dka’ ’grel) and Golden Garland of Eloquence.

In the former he gives a detailed explanation of the ālaya-vijñāna (foundation consciousness)—according to Tsongkhapa the distinctive eighth consciousness in the eight-consciousness system of Asaṅga’s (fourth century) Indian Yogācāra Buddhism.

Tsongkhapa opens his work with a brief discussion of the relationship between the views of Nāgārjuna and Asaṅga. Tsongkhapa then reveals in the different usages of the term ālaya-vijñāna and its near synonyms a negative connotation conveying the cause and effect nature of repeated suffering existences (saṃsāra). He surveys the relevant literature, limiting his discussion of gotra (lineage, in the sense of the innate ability a person has to grow up into a fully enlightened being) to the presentation given in Asaṅga’s Bodhisattva Levels (Bodhisattva-bhūmi). There the “residual impression left by listening [to the correct exposition of the truth]” (śruta-vāsanā) is the seed (bīja) that matures into enlightenment. It is little more than the innate clarity of mind when it is freed from limitation-by-habituation to a correct vision of reality.

Tsongkhapa limits the sources for his explanation to non-tantric works, almost all by persons he will later describe as Indian Yogācāra writers, thereby demonstrating the influence the categories used in the recently redacted Kangyur and Tengyur (bsTangyur, the name for the commentaries in Tibetan translation included in the canon) had on his thinking.

When Tsongkhapa arrived in Central Tibet, the pressing philosophical issue of the day was Dolpopa’s Great Middle Way (Mahā-madhayamaka; dbu ma chen po) philosophy. Dolpopa propounded a hermeneutics based on the principle that a Buddha will always state clearly what he means. Based on a wide array of sources, and without making a clear distinction between tantric and non-tantric works, the central tenet of the Great Middle Way is that an absolute, pure, transcendental mind endowed with all good equalities exists, one which is radically other than the ordinary world of appearance. It is the archetypical Tibetan Buddhist gzhan stong (pronounced shentong, emptiness of other) philosophy.

Dolpopa, stressing the hermeneutic stated above, says Nāgārjuna and Asaṅga, who wrote their treatises during the golden age, share the same philosophy, the Great Middle Way which was clearly articulated by the Buddha. Dolpopa distinguishes a pure, transcendental knowledge (kun gzhi ye shes) that is quite other than the defiled foundation consciousness (kun gzhi rnam shes), and equates the former with his single absolute, endowed with all the qualities of a Buddha.

Later, in his mature period, as explained below, Tsongkhapa will be explicit, stating categorically that Asaṅga’s Yogācāra Buddhism is distinct from, and less definitive than, Nāgārjuna’s Middle Way school (D. Wangchuk 2013), going so far as to remove all references to a Great Middle Way school from his work. He will state that the ālaya-vijñāna, that which is devoid of subject-object bifurcation, provides the essential mind-stuff for defilement (saṃsāra) and carries seeds for purification (nirvāṇa) in a Yogācāra system that is fundamentally wrong, and at odds with the way things actually are. He will give the ālaya-vijñāna only a heuristic value, and insist that a correct view (the Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka view) of the workings of psycho-physical reality (the Buddhist skandhas) totally invalidates it. As Jeffrey Hopkins (2002, 2006) has shown, such statements constitute an explicit rejection of Dolpopa’s view, a position Tsongkhapa is still in the process of formulating in earlier works such as the Explanation of the Difficult Points.

In his Explanation of the Difficult Points, Tsongkhapa does not accept the view of Dolpopa, but does not say what exactly he will put in its place. He ignores Dolpopa’s pure, transcendental knowledge called ālaya, mentioning it obliquely, only in passing, during a final brief survey of views based on Chinese sources; he leaves unanswered the question of the final ontological status of the eighth consciousness, but appears to accept it as having a provisional reality; and he allows the views of Asaṅga set forth in the Bodhisattva-bhūmi to retain an authority at this stage, an authority he will later explicitly deny.

2.2 Golden Garland of Eloquence (Legs bshad gser phreng)

Tsongkhapa’s Golden Garland of Eloquence is his most important early work. It takes the form of a long explanation of the Perfection of Wisdom sūtras, given pride of place in the Kangyur as the foremost words of the Buddha, after the Vinaya section (the codifications of ethical conduct). It systematically reviews the twenty-one Indian commentaries on the root text, highlighting their correspondences as well as their differences. It is a meticulous commentary on the topics in the Ornament for the Clear Realizations, as well as on the commentaries by sixth-century scholar Ārya Vimuktisena and eighth-century scholar Acharya Haribhadra’s short but influential commentary The Clear Meaning (Abhisamayālaṃkāravivṛti). Maitreya’s work is a verse summary of the extensive Perfection of Wisdom sūtras which focuses on both the medium-length and concise versions of the Perfection of Wisdom sūtras, namely the sūtras in Twenty-Five Thousand Lines and Eight Thousand Lines. The root text was initially translated into Tibetan by Ngok Lotsawa Loden Sherab in the eleventh century, supplementing his translation with his topical outline and his own commentary.

Tsongkhapa’s exegesis represents a novel approach to Tibetan hermeneutics for several reasons. First, it disentangles for the reader the complex and multi-layered relationship between Maitreya’s root text, based on the Perfection of Wisdom sūtras, and its later commentaries. It cites almost exclusively Indian sources and does not refer to Tibetan thinkers as source authorities. According to Thupten Jinpa (2019), the work demonstrates a surprising methodological approach, which blends approaches based in textual critiques, philological analysis, well-placed contextualizations, as well as conscientious inclusions of the work’s commentators’ individual philosophical positions. It sets the groundwork for a philosophy that the philosophical scholars in the Geluk tradition will follow, which is further developed in the mature works of Tsongkhapa, a taxonomy known as the Yogācāra-Svātantrika-Madhyamaka, in essence, a Middle Way that incorporates many of the categories of Yogācāra Buddhism, but which lacks the authority of Chandrakīrti’s Prāsaṅgika interpretation.

A great deal has been written on the difference between Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika (see Dreyfus & McClintock 2003). Historically, the Gelukpa’s Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka is another name for the mainstream philosophical school that developed in Tibet, based primarily on the teaching of Śāntarakṣita and his student Kamalaśīla (both fl. end of the eighth century), the most influential of all the Indian paṇḍitas involved in the dissemination of Buddhist ideas to Tibet. Later Gelukpa scholastics, based on the mature works of Tsongkhapa, deny that Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka represents the most sophisticated Buddhist view. At the same time, they acknowledge its centrality to the development of Buddhist thought in Tibet.

In the Golden Garland of Eloquence, Tsongkhapa, following Śāntarakṣita’s school as it developed in Tibet, asserts that all bases (vastu) (the psycho-physical factors locating the person as they begin their philosophical career), all mental states along the course of the path (mārga), and the final result, are illusory, because they lack any essential nature. In this work, however, it is not yet clear how the basis relates to the final outcome (the result). As explained below, Tsongkhapa will solve the problem in his mature works by taking the clear, radical, nihilistic leap of denying any essential nature whatsoever, anywhere, to anything, thereby implicitly and explicitly devaluing (in absolutist terms) the ontological status of the final, pure, unified state, relegating it to just one more conventional, dependently-originated thing.

In the Golden Garland of Eloquence, Tsongkhapa has not yet fully developed his mature, systematic philosophy. He uses Yogācāra terminology. The primary object of philosophical inquiry in the Golden Garland is the unity of the perceiving subject-in-enlightenment, a topic that reflects the language and concerns of the Yogācāra-svātantrika-Madhyamaka school.

Tsongkhapa in this early work is still comfortable with characterizing the ultimate as an absence of elaboration (niṣprapañca; spros bral) beyond the four extremes, later set forth as the orthodox view of the Sakya tradition. Tsongkhapa’s rejection of this characterization in his later work gives rise to sustained critique of his views by writers like Gorampa Sonam Senge (Go rams pa bsod nams sge ge, 1429–1489) (Cabezon & Dargyay 2007; Yakherds 2021).

The Golden Garland of Eloquence of Eloquence is driven in no small measure by an agenda dedicated to discrediting Dolpopa’s Perfection of Wisdom commentaries. This is evident from a comparison of Dolpopa and Tsongkhapa’s sources and views. While Dolpopa excoriates Ārya Vimuktisena and Acharya Haribhadra and says they belong to the degenerate age, propounding doctrines harmful to Golden Age Buddhism, the Golden Garland of Eloquence privileges the commentaries by Ārya Vimuktisena and Acharya Haribhadra. Dolpopa says the Detailed Explanations of the Perfection of Wisdom Sūtras (Bṛhaṭṭīkā; Yum gsum gnodjoms) by “the foremost, Great Middle Way master Vasubandhu” stand as the primary scriptural authority for the Great Middle Way doctrine, superior even to the partial truths revealed by Nāgārjuna. The Golden Garland of Eloquence disputes that Vasubandhu is the author of the two Detailed Explanations, and says, regardless of their author, they are simply restatements of Nāgārjuna’s Middle Way. Finally, Dolpopa propounds a doctrine which holds that the basis, path, and result are eternally the same, and all else is thoroughly imaginary, whereas the Golden Garland of Eloquence is certain that such a view is wrong, and directly cites a passage from Dolpopa’s work, albeit without naming its author, saying,

since no other great path-breaker, [i.e., founder of an original philosophy] besides him has ever asserted [what Dolpopa says], learned persons are right to cast out [what he says] like a gob of spit. (Sparham 2007–2013: vol. 1, 425)

3. Mature Period

After completing the Golden Garland, Tsongkhapa formulated the philosophy for which he is best known, and further intensified his focus to include the study, contemplation, and eventual mastery of the esoteric Vajrayāna teachings. His aim from then on was the apprehension and development of a more systematic approach to the esoteric corpus. His mature period was also marked by touring the most important scholastic centers of the time, exchanging ideas with his learned contemporaries, as well as spending prolonged periods in meditation. Tsongkhapa also commenced his teaching career during this period. At Monkhar Tashi Dong Monastery (Mon mkhar bkra shis ldong dgon), for instance, he was asked by the monks of both Monkhar Tashi Dong and its surrounding monasteries to give an extensive teaching program, for which he taught 17 texts, focusing mainly on Indian authors. During the following summer of 1389, at the age of thirty-three Tsongkhapa spent time in solitary retreat in the Yarlung Valley (Yar klung). He focused on the Cakrasaṃvara tantra by respecting a disciplined schedule of four meditation sessions per day, and would supplement these by performing the self-empowerment rites of the tantra. He also meditated on the six yogas of Niguma (Ni gu ma), an essential instruction to the Shangpa Kagyu (Shangs pa bka brgyud) tradition stemming from teachings by the Indian yogini Niguma . He would continue to repeat those tantric retreat sessions at regular intervals throughout his life. During these years he also sought out mystics, tantric teachers, and hermits to converse with. One such encounter, which took place some time around 1390–91, was with the mystic Umapa Tsondrue Senge (dBu ma pa brtsongrus seng ge). It was also during this period that Tsongkhapa began to formulate his theory on the relationship between knowledge and meditation. His method for incorporating the Buddhist view into daily practice was threefold, involving listening and studying, contemplating and critical reflection, and meditation (thos bsam sgom gsum). Tsongkhapa also began to look into the extant discursive literature on the meaning of meditation. He was therefore able to distinguish, following the Indian Buddhist masters, two kinds of meditation: analytic or discursive meditation (dpyad sgom) and resting or placement meditation (’jug sgom).

Central to Tsongkhapa’s insights is his insistence on the emptiness at the heart of all relationships and the doctrine of dependent origination. For him, the first question we must ask to understand the Madhyamaka view of emptiness is whether we can reconcile the apparent consistency we observe in our everyday experiences, particularly the predictability of cause and effect, with the intellectual understanding that nothing possesses any inherent objective existence, not even at the smallest scale.

Reflecting on his insight, Tsongkhapa would write in his In Praise of Dependent Origination (brTenbrel bstod pa) (translation by Jinpa, undated)

Nonetheless, before the stream of this life
Flowing towards death has come to cease
That I have found slight faith in you—
Even this I think is fortunate.
Among teachers, the teacher of dependent origination,
Amongst wisdoms, the knowledge of dependent origination—
You, who’re most excellent like the kings in the worlds,
Know this perfectly well, not others.

Tsongkhapa first sets forth this mature philosophy linking dependent origination and emptiness in a special section at the end of his Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment. There, in the context of an investigation into the effect of an authentic, intellectual investigation into the truly real (Tattva; de kho na), and into the way things finally are at their deepest level (Tathatā; de bzhin nyid),[2] he says that we can only identify the object of negation (dgag bya), i.e., the last false projection to appear as reality, by avoiding two errors: going too far (khyab che ba) and not going far enough (khyab chung ba) (Garfield & Thakchöe 2011).

This section of Tsongkhapa’s work is based on the opening verse of Nāgārjuna’s Root Verses on the Middle Way (Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā). Tsongkhapa’s Ocean of Reasoning (Ngawang Samten & Garfield 2006) is a detailed exegesis of this work. According to Tsongkhapa, Nāgārjuna’s statement is about a first moment in the continuum of the investigating person. Tsongkhapa’s choice of the opening line’s of Nāgārjuna’s work as a point of departure for his philosophy stems from his belief that he has gained a true insight into dependent origination (pratītya-samutpāda). This insight, he believes, resolves the paradox between his apparent nihilism and his insistence on the weight of authoritative statements and cognitions. Thus he says in his Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment,

Therefore, the intelligent should develop an unshakeable certainty that the very meaning of emptiness is dependent-arising… Specifically, this is the subtle point that the noble Nāgārjuna and his spiritual son Āryadeva had in mind and upon which the master Buddhapālita and the glorious Chandrakīrti gave fully comprehensive commentary. This is how dependent-arising bestows certain knowledge of the absence of intrinsic existence; this is how it dawns on you that it is things which are devoid of intrinsic existence that are causes and effects. (Lamrim Chenmo Translation Committee 2000–2004: vol. 3, 139)

Tsongkhapa set out the ramifications of his view in “eight points that are difficult to understand” (dkagnas brgyad), first enumerated in notes (rjes byang) to one of his lectures by his contemporary and disciple, Gyaltsab Dharma Rinchen (then also called Gyaltsab Jey (rGyal tshab rje), the regent). Tillemans (1998) has elegantly translated the opening of the text as follows,

Concerning the [ontological] bases, there are the following [three points]: (1) the conventional nonacceptance of particulars and of (2) the storehouse consciousness, and (3) the acceptance of external objects. Concerning the path, there are the following [four points]: (4) the nonacceptance of autonomous reasonings as being means for understanding reality and (5) the nonacceptance of self-awareness; (6) the way in which the two obscurations exist; (7) how it is accepted that the Buddha’s disciples and those who become awakened without a Buddha’s help realize that things are without any own-nature. Concerning the result, there is: (8) the way in which the buddhas know [conventional] things in their full extent. Thus, there are four accepted theses and four unaccepted theses.

These theses have in turn been discussed by a number of writers (Ruegg 2002; Cabezon 1992: 397; Cabezon & Dargyay 2007: 76–93, 114–201).

In Essence of Eloquence, Tsongkhapa argues that no datum that appears to (or is there but remains unknown to) thought or sense perception, has any essential reality. All are, equally, simply labeled by thought construction (rtog pas btags tsam). Only convention makes the actual sense-faculties, for example, real, and success or failure experienced in a dream, for example, false. This dependent origination (between a label and what is labeled) precludes the essential existence implicit in the Epistemologist’s sva-lakṣaṇa.

Tsongkhapa’s rejection of Yogācāra idealism leads him to assert the existence of external objects (the third point). His (discredited) Yogācāra school, based on either the works of Asaṅga or the Epistemologists, explains the absence of subject-object bifurcation as non-dual with thought or mind (citta). Realizing this in a non-conceptual, meditational state constitutes a liberating vision. Ultimately, therefore, external objects are projections of a deluded mind. Tsongkhapa rejects this, though he suggests only those who have understood the emptiness of inherent existence through reflecting on the natural workings of dependent origination can set it aside. As he says in Ocean of Reasoning,

The meaning of the statement that the conventional designation of subject and objects stops is that the designation of these two stops from the perspective of meditative equipoise, but it does not mean that the insight in meditative equipoise and the ultimate truth are rejected as subject and object. This is because their being subject and object is not posited from the perspective of analytic insight, but from the perspective of conventional understanding. (trans. Ngawang Samten & Garfield 2006: 26)

From the perspective of ordinary convention there are external objects, so it is sufficient, on that level, to assert that they are there.

Tsongkhapa does not accept svātantra (autonomous) reasoning (the fourth point). He asserts that it is enough, when proving that any given subject is empty of intrinsic existence, to lead the interlocutor, through reasoning, to the unwelcome consequences (prasaṅga) in their own untenable position; it is not necessary to demonstrate the thesis based on reasoning that presupposes any sort of intrinsic (autonomous) existence. This gives Chandrakīrti’s school, with which Tsongkhapa identifies, its name, Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka, i.e., a philosophy of a middle way (between nihilism and eternalism) arrived at through demonstrating the unwelcome consequences (in any given position that presupposes intrinsic existence).

In the context of this assertion, Tsongkhapa offers a distinctive explanation of the well-known Nayāyika objection to Nāgārjuna’s philosophy, namely, if the statements he uses to prove his thesis are themselves without any final intrinsic reality, they will be ineffective as proofs. Tsongkhapa says Prāsaṅgika-madhyamakas do not simply find faults in all positions and reject all positions as their own. They only deny any thesis that presupposes an intrinsic existence. They do hold a specific thesis, to wit, that all phenomena lack an intrinsic existence. They use reasoning and logic that lacks any essential reality to establish this thesis. Such reasoning derives its efficacity on a conventional level through the natural workings of dependent origination. This is one of the most contentious assertions of Tsongkhapa.

Tsongkhapa’s rejection of any form of self-referential consciousness (sva-saṃvitti, sva-saṃvedana) (the fifth point) is in essence a rejection of Śāntarakṣita’s position, that such self-referential or reflexive awareness is necessary to explain the self-evidential nature of consciousness, and to explain the privileged access the conscious person has to their own consciousness as immediate and veridical (Garfield 2006).[3] At issue is the status of the knowing subject engaged in the intellectual pursuit of the truly real. Tsongkhapa holds that such a knowing subject has no essential reality at all.

Such a position requires of Tsongkhapa an explanation of memory. His solution is to deny that when we remember seeing object X we also remember the conscious act of seeing it. (Were we to do so, there would have to be an aspect of the earlier consciousness of the object that was equally conscious of itself, i.e., self-referential.) Instead, Tsongkhapa argues, memory is simply the consciousness that earlier we saw an object and that we now regard that experience to have been in the past.

Tsongkhapa characterizes basic ignorance (avidyā), the root cause of suffering in Buddhist philosophy, not as a latent tendency, but as an active defiling agency (kleśāvaraṇa) that projects a reality onto objects that they do not in fact have. This ignorance affects even sense perception and explains the veridical aspect that is, in fact, just error. The residual impressions left by distortion (vāsanā; literally perfumings) explain the mere appearance of things as real. Beyond that, he asserts that habituation to this distortion prevents conventional and ultimate reality from appearing united in an appearing object. This explanation of the psychology of error differs markedly from earlier Tibetan explanations and constitutes the sixth difficult point.

In Tsongkhapa’s mature philosophy the universal altruistic principle is the sole criterion for distinguishing authentic Mahāyāna views and practices from non-Mahāyāna ones. By privileging the principle in this way he is able to assert that any authentic realization of truth is a realization of the way things are, namely, a realization of no sva-bhāva (own-being, own-nature, intrinsic identity). For Tsongkhapa, therefore, Hīnayānists (by which he means followers of the basic Buddhist doctrine of the Four Noble Truths set forth in the earliest scriptures), necessarily have the same authentic knowledge of reality. Were they not to have such knowledge, he argues, they could not have reached the goals they had (the seventh point).

Finally, Tsongkhapa has a robust explanation of the difference between true and false on the covering or conventional level. He denies any difference between a false object (a dream lottery ticket, for example) and a real one; as appearances, he asserts, both are equally false, only convention decides which is true. All phenomena equally lack truth. In Tsongkhapa’s mature philosophy, therefore, all appearance is false—to appear is to appear as being truly what the appearance is of, and the principle of dependent origination precludes such truth from according with the way things actually are.

Tsongkhapa holds that sentences and their content and minds and what appears to them function in the same way. Saying (1) of a set of “true” and “false” statements that they are all equally untrue, and (2) saying of unmediated sense-based perception or mistaken ideas that they are equally untrue is in fact to say the same thing. The truth in both is decided by convention, not by something inhering in the true statement (or its content), or the valid perception (or its object). Tsongkhapa, therefore, argues that since all appearance of true existence is false, the Buddha knows all phenomena, but that they do not appear to him as truly existent (the eighth difficult point).

Towards the very end of his life, in his Middle-Length Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment and Illuminating the Intent, Tsongkhapa defends his views against Rongtön’s (Rong stong shes bya kun rig, 1367–1449) criticism that his earlier and later works are inconsistent. Tsongkhapa extends his comparison of Chandrakīrti’sand Bhāviveka’s interpretations of Nāgārjuna to more clearly identify a less subtle object of negation in the works of Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka writers, particularly Jñānagarbha (eighth century) and Śāntarakṣita (Hopkins 2008: Part One; Yi 2015). Tsongkhapa finds in their works an analysis leading beyond the Yogācāra’s mere absence of a substantial difference between known object and knowing subject, but limited insofar as it negates the ultimate truth of all objects appearing to conventional awareness, while still allowing room for an object of negation that does not appear to sense perception.

Cowherds (2011) and Falls (2010) suggest parallels between the issues raised by the Svātantrika–Prāsaṅgika difference and more recent work in Western philosophy. They are helpful for those familiar with Western philosophy but unfamiliar with Tsongkhapa, giving an overview of questions that arise from the interaction of philosophical traditions from different cultures. Falls argues that Tsongkhapa’s philosophy is a therapeutea not a theoria, and draws parallels between issues raised by Tsongkhapa and John McDowell’s interpretation of Wilfrid Sellars in particular.

4. Hermeneutics

A distinctive feature of Tsongkhapa’s mature philosophy is the centrality he accords hermeneutics, and the particular stratification of the philosophical systems it creates. His focus on hermeneutics stems in no small measure from his acceptance of the Kangyur as a true record of authentic statements of the Buddha, and also from his wish to discredit Dolpopa’s views. According to Tsongkhapa, and worked out in detail in his Essence of Eloquence, the given record of the Buddha’s diverse statements seems to contain contradictions, so a reader must decide on their own criteria for interpreting them. No statement of the Buddha can serve as a primary hermeneutic principle, so that principle necessarily becomes human reason (yukti; rigs pa).

When human reason is brought to bear on the diverse statements of the Buddha, it concludes that all statements that an essential or intrinsic identity exists, or any statements that presupposes that, cannot be taken literally, at face value. This is because human reason, when it analyzes the ultimate truth of any object or statement, finds it empty of anything intrinsic to it that would make it true. According to Tsongkhapa, the line of reasoning that leads most clearly to this conclusion is dependent origination.

Statements that require interpretation Tsongkhapa groups into those of different Buddhist philosophical schools: in ascending order, Hearer (śrāvaka) schools based on older Buddhist sources (the Vaibhāṣika and Sautrāntika), Yogācāra schools following Asaṅga and Dignāga/Dharmakīrti, and non-Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka schools following Bhāviveka and Śāntarakṣita. The Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka school of Chandrakīrti alone captures the final intention of the Buddha. Tsongkhapa was certainly not the first doxographer, but his clear and definitive categories had immense influence on later writers, so much so they have anachronistically been read back into works that were written before his time.

Tsongkhapa’s particular hermeneutics, the primary means he employs to lead readers to his philosophical insight, allows him to characterize particular, authentic, Buddhist philosophies as wrong (because they are wrong from a Prāsaṅgika perspective), yet right from the perspective of those particular systems. They are right because the philosophies have particular roles to play in a larger, grander scheme. This scheme is part of the larger philosophy of a perfect person whose views are in perfect accord (tathāgata) with the way things are, i.e., dependently originated, and whose statements are motivated solely by the benefit they have to those who hear them.

In this way, Tsongkhapa’s hermeneutics lead to, or incorporate, a second principle, namely, bodhicitta. The word bodhicitta has at least six different, but interrelated meanings in different contexts (Wangchuk 2007). In his philosophical works Tsongkhapa uses it to mean a universal, altruistic principle (not unlike the logos) that explains, primarily, the genesis of the Buddha’s diverse statements, i.e., explains why a person with perfect intellect and powers of expression would make statements that seem to contain contradictions.

This principle plays a central role in Tsongkhapa’s assertion that all authentic attainments, without distinction, are based on an authentic insight into emptiness (the seventh of the eight difficult points listed above), and it leads him to assert that the origin of the Mahāyāna is located in bodhicitta, and bodhicitta alone

5. Ethics

Tsongkhapa is part of a long, shared, Indo-Tibetan Buddhist tradition that conceives of ethical conduct not in absolute terms, but in the context of different individuals in different situations. There is an unspoken presupposition that ethical statements are grounded in reality, in the sense that suffering (duḥkha) comes from actions (karma) that are not in accord with the way things actually are (dngos poi gnas lugs). The person is ultimately not present as an ethical subject, but is so, on a conventional or covering level, through the natural working of dependent origination.

Tsongkhapa groups such individuals into three separate categories (those who privilege basic Buddhist codes, bodhisattvas, and tāntrikas). Each is governed by an ethical code (sdom gsum), each superior code subsuming the points of the lesser. Beyond these three, his Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment suggests ordinary ethical conduct is codified as well, in the main, in the ten ethical points (daśa-kuśala-patha) basic to any human life that rises above the mere animal.

The first of the three specifically Buddhist codes, the basic code, primarily governs the behavior of monks and nuns. Since for Tsongkhapa each higher code incorporates all the rules in the lower code, he conceives of the seven (or even twelve) sub-codes making up the basic code as, in descending order, containing fewer and fewer of the rules that constitute the full code. Each of the sub-codes is designed for particular people in particular human situations. Tsongkhapa does not expect a butcher to be governed by the rule of not killing, for example, and he does not expect a lawyer to be governed by the rule of not lying. He avoids gross devaluation of the basic code by privileging spiritual elites. In this, he takes a pragmatic approach to ethics in line with his non-absolutist stance. For Tsongkhapa, it is axiomatic that human life is not ipso facto privileged above any other form of life, but his detailed explanation gives greater “weight” to the karmic retribution that comes from killing humans, and amongst humans, noble persons, for example, than less fortunate forms of life.

Tsongkhapa’s explanation of the bodhisattva moral code presented in the Bodhisattva-bhūmi (Tatz 1986) follows naturally from the importance he gives to the altruistic principle in his other writing. He reconciles rules in the bodhisattva code that enjoin behavior contradicting the basic code by positing an elite that, through a noblesse oblige of the spiritually advanced, are required to do things which would be unethical for an ordinary person. Their not doing so constitutes an ethical lapse. For example, the basic code prohibits actions that influence what food a donor puts in the begging bowl (with a few exceptions for human flesh and so on), and prohibits eating after noon. The bodhisattva code contradicts the basic code insofar as it prohibits eating meat, even though, by so doing, the donor does not get the opportunity to make charity. Tsongkhapa argues that if a monk at the bodhisattva stage of development eats meat it clashes with the dictates of the altruistic principle.

Tsongkhapa accepts that the diverse body of literature, including the historically latest Buddhist tantras (some of which are distinctly antinomian in character), are the work of a fully awakened being (buddha). The last of the three codes systematizes the conduct espoused in these tantras. Tsongkhapa’s presentation is distinctive for finding a code complete with a full ordination ceremony. The practical result of his presentation is to revalue the basic code for monks, and devalue the ritual of tantric consecration as it pertains to ethical conduct. It stresses ethical conduct even in the context of works that appear, in line with the nihilistic drift of Buddhist philosophy, to count ethical codes as a block to the highest spiritual and philosophical attainment.

Tsongkhapa argues that the tantric code is only for the very highest spiritual elite, mainly monks and nuns. Tsongkhapa divides tantras into two sections, and says the lower section is governed exclusively by the bodhisattva code, supplemented by specific ritual injunctions (vrata). He gives two interpretations of the rules for the higher tantras, reserving the truly antinomian behavior for a theoretical elite whose altruism is so strong, and whose understanding and status is so enabled, that they engage in what ordinarily would be condemned as gross immorality. According to this code, it is not always an ethical lapse to eat meat, perhaps even human flesh, the logic being that in certain specific and unusual circumstances, in a person at this stage of development, such behavior would constitute a skillful means to benefit others.

6. Tantra

Over the years, a number of Tsongkhapa’s closest disciples, who had moved from one monastery or hermitage to another with him, expressed their reservations about the nomadic way of life required by their community. As Tsongkhapa himself was growing older, he too began to succumb to the aches and pains of a life spent on the road, and thus, prompted by the pleas of his senior students, he decided it was time to create a more permanent base for his followers. In the pivotal year of 1409 CE, Tsongkhapa made another significant contribution to his legacy by establishing the mother monastery (ma dgon) for what would ultimately develop into Tsongkhapa’s Geluk school. The monastery would initially be called Ganden (dGaldan, the pure land of joy or God realm of Tuṣita). Ganden was situated on the slopes of Wangkur Mountain (bDang bskur ri; the coronation mountain), twenty-five miles to the northeast of Lhasa, at an altitude of about four-thousand meters. After the groundbreaking ceremonies and the laying of the foundations for the initial building were finished, Tsongkhapa assigned the responsibility of overseeing the actual construction to two of his most reliable senior disciples, Gyaltsab Dharma Rinchen and Dülzin Drakpa Gyaltsen (Dul’ dzin grags pa rgyal mtshan).

As the population of the new monastery began to swell, with monks from many different monasteries coming to join the new school, Tsongkhapa started to consolidate his vision for a lineage that would unite both Sūtra and Tantra while integrating both core concepts into the three spheres (’khor lo gsum) of study, contemplation, and meditative contemplation, as well as in the active daily engagement in the welfare of others (Jinpa 2019). These developments led to a notable shift in Tsonkhapa’s priorities, with the advanced Highest Yoga tantra becoming the central emphasis of both his writing and teaching. During a retreat period in 1411, Tsongkhapa wrote two of his most influential tantric works, namely Lamp to Illuminate the Five Stages (Rim lnga rab tu gsal bai sgron me) (Kilty 2013) and the Practical Guide to the Five Stages of Guhyasamaja Completion Stage in a Single Sitting (Blo bzang grags pa). The first of these works is the most important commentary on the Guhyasamaja Tantra which exists today. It leans heavily on concepts taken from Nāgārjuna’s Five Stages (Pañcakrama), Aryadeva’s Lamp that Unites the Practices (Caryamelapaka­pradipa), and a wide array of supplementary texts related to the perfection stage found in the Tibetan canonical collections (Kangyur and Tengyur).

Tsongkhapa’s second work on tantra, his Practical Guide to the Five Stages of Guhyasamaja Completion Stage in a Single Sitting, clearly differs from his first oeuvre in both structure and style. It is much more concise, and closely follows Nāropa’s Lucid Summary of the Five Stages (Pañcakramasaṃgraha prakāśa) as its main reference point. This text sets itself apart from contemporary works by providing a practice-oriented and experiential instruction on the key elements of the Guhyasamaja completion stages (Jinpa 2019).

Tsongkhapa conceives of tantra as a subset of the Mahāyāna, and to that extent all authentic Buddhist tantric activities are, necessarily, authentically altruistic. What differentiates tantric activity from other ordinary Mahāyāna activities is deity yoga (lhai rnalbyor), i.e., whether or not, from a first person perspective, the person is acting as a perfect, divine subject when engaging in (primarily ritual) behavior.

Tsongkhapa wrote works on the Vajrabhairava, Cakrasaṃvara (Gray 2017), and Kālacakra tantras, but is best known for his exposition of the Guhyasamāja tantra based on Indian commentaries associated with the names of Nāgārjuna and Āryadeva, particularly his short but influential Commentary on the Jñāna-vajra-samuccaya (Ye shes rdo rje kun las ’dus pai ṭī kā) (1410), and magisterial Clear Exposition of the Five Stages of Guhyasamāja (gSangdus rim lnga gsal sgron) (1411) (Thurman 2010; Kilty 2013). He accords great importance to esoteric yoga. In this respect, his work is firmly located in the mainstream Tibetan tradition, influenced in particular by the translator Mar pa (Mar pa Chos kyi blo gros, 1012–1097), who spread the Six Teachings of Nāropa (Nā ro chos drug), a later Indian synthesis of diverse tantric practices, in Tibet. Based on this Tsongkhapa gives detailed explanations of the nāḍī (channels for the energy or feelings that run through the tantric practitioner’s body), cakra (circles of channels in the heart, throat, and other central points up the center of the body from the bottom of the spine, or tip of the sex organ, to the top of the head) and caṇḍalī (an intense pleasure experienced as heat that spreads through the channels and fills the body). Tsongkhapa is praised, in particular, for his explanation of theory and praxis associated with the illusory body (māyā-kāya; sgyu lus) and clear light (Prabhāsvara; ’od gsal), a skillful adaptation of his understanding of the two truths to yogic praxis (Natanya 2017). This is summed up nicely in the statement,

The Pañcakramasaṃgrahaprakāśa (Illumination of the Summary of the Five Steps), a short treatise attributed to Nāropa (956–1040), combining the Six Teachings with the “Five Steps” (pañcakrama) of the Ārya tradition provided Tsong kha pa with the basic ideas of his Tantric system. (Tillemans 1998)

7. Death and Legacy

On 12 November 1419, Tsongkhapa passed away at Ganden Monastery. His most important works, including The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment, the hermeneutical The Essence of Eloquence, and his works on the Guhyasamāja tantra were published on woodblock prints to enable wider distribution. This meant that they were able to reach a broad readership from very early on, with all of his writings being published as Collected Works by the end of the fifteenth century. Later Tsongkhapa’s original publications were addended by the collected works of his two most important disciples and immediate successors, Gyaltsab Dharma Rinchen and Khedrup Gelek Pelsang (mKhas grub rje dge legs dpal bzang, 1385–1438), comprising eight and twelve large volumes, respectively. The combined collected works are known as the Father and Sons Collected Works (rJe yab sras gsum gyi gsungs bum) and constitute an essential canonical collection for members of Tsongkhapa’s Geluk tradition.

The first biography of Tsongkhapa appears to have been penned by his close student Jampel Gyatso (’Jam dpal rgya mtsho), a work which remains overshadowed by the aforementioned official biographies by Khedrup Gelek Pelsang, who would write a conventional biography called Stream of Faith (Dad paijug ngog), as well as a secret work which would further shed light on the more esoteric dimensions of Tsongkhapa’s life.

According to Tibetan historians, the precise beginning of the Ganden, or as it is more commonly known, the Geluk tradition, can be considered to begin with the founding of the mother monastery Ganden in 1409. Western historians, however, are less convinced, both about this exact founding date, and also as to Tsongkhapa’s intentions to found a new Tibetan Buddhist school in the first place. The emergence of an actual tradition can also be attributed to Khedrup Gelek Palsang and his attempts to unite and consolidate a new school within the Tibetan tradition (Jinpa 2019). What can be unequivocally stated, however, is that with the establishment of the three great monasteries of Ganden, Drepung, and Sera by the time of Tsongkhapa’s death, the infrastructure and the outer framework for the emergence of a new school was firmly put in place.

Most importantly, Tsongkhapa provided an independent and innovative approach to the Buddhist canon and its soteriological practices. His scholarship on the ultimate truth of emptiness, as expounded by Nāgārjuna and commented upon by Buddhapālita and Chandrakīrti, is based on a form of contemplation which is rooted in a critical engagement with these texts, and supplemented by a deep meditative practice for extended periods of time. In sum, both the theoretical and practical foundations for a new tradition were provided by Tsongkhapa’s exceptional emphasis on the development of an integrated understanding of the entire Indian Buddhist philosophical and spiritual heritage, both Sūtra and Tantra; his strong endorsement of Buddhist ethics as being foundational for Buddhist life, especially for the monastic community; and his espousal of meditative practice, supported by an overall understanding of the entire Buddhist path which can be acquired through focused study.


Primary Works

  • Golden Garland of Eloquence (Legs bshad gser phreng), 1388–89. Translation: Sparham, Gareth (trans.), 2007–13, Golden Garland of Eloquence, 4 volumes, Fremont, CA: Jain Publishing.
  • The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment (Lam rim chen mo), 1402. Translations: Lamrim Chenmo Translation Committee (trans.), 2000–2004, The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment, 3 volumes, Joshua W. C. Cutler (ed. in chief), Guy Newland (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion
    • Publications.
  • The Great Exposition of Tantra (sNgags rim chen mo), 1405. Translation: Yarnall, Thomas F. (trans.), 2013, Great Treatise on The Stages of Mantra (sngags rim chen mo): (critical elucidation of the key instructions in all the secret stages of the path of the victorious universal lord, Great Vajradhara): chapters XI-XII, the creation stage, Robert A. F. Thurman (ed.), (Treasury of the Buddhist sciences series), New York: The American Institute of Buddhist Studies.
  • Essence of Eloquence (Legs bshad snying po), 1407.
  • Ocean of Reasoning (Rigs pa’ i rgya mtsho), 1408. A commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle. Translations: Ngawang Samten and Jay L. Garfield (trans.), 2006, Ocean of Reasoning: A Great Commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • A Lamp to Illuminate the Five Stages of Guhyasamāja (gSangdus rim lnga gsal sgron), 1411. Translations:
    • Kilty, Gavin (trans.), 2013, A Lamp to Illuminate the Five Stages: Teachings on Guhyasamja Tantra (The Library of Tibetan Classics), Boston, MA: Wisdom Publications in association with the Institute of Tibetan Classics.
    • Thurman, Robert A. F. (trans.), 2010, Brilliant Illumination of the Lamp of the Five Stages: Practical Instruction in the King of Tantras, “The Glorious Esoteric Community”, Thomas F. Yarnall (ed.), (Treasury of the Buddhist Sciences), New York: American institute of Buddhist studies.
  • The Middle-Length Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment (Lam rimbring), 1415. Translations: Philip Quarcoo (trans.), 2021, The Middle-Length Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment. First. Somerville: Wisdom Publications, Inc.
  • Illuminating the Intent (dGongs pa rab gsal), 1418; a commentary on Candrakīrti’s Entering the Middle Way (Madhyamakāvatāra).
  • Ālaya-vijñāna (The Foundation, Storehouse, Basis-of all Consciousness). Translation: Sparham, Gareth (trans.), 1993, Ocean of Eloquence: Tsong kha pa’s Commentary on the Yogācāra Doctrine of Mind, (SUNY Series in Buddhist Studies), Albany, NY: State Univ. of New York Press.
  • Explanation of the Difficult Points (Kun gzhi dka’ ’grel).
  • In Praise of Dependent Origination (brTenbrel bstod pa). Translation:
  • Practical Guide to the Five Stages of Guhyasamaja Completion Stage in a Single Sitting Blo bzang grags pa, 2021, “rGyud kyi rgyal po dpal gsang ba ’dus pa’i rdzogs rim rim lnga gdan rdzogs kyi dmar khrud bzhigs so”, in rJe tsong kha pai gsungbum bzhugs so, second edition, nya:184–303. Bylakuppe: Ser byes rig mdzod chen mo’i rtsom sgrig khang.

Collected Works

  • Three sets of Collected Works of Tsongkhapa are available at the Buddhist Digital Resource Center in Tibetan language.
    • Kumbum Jampaling
    • Tashilhunpo Parnying
    • Lhasa Sho

Secondary Works

  • Apple, James, 2008, Stairway to Nirvāṇa: A Study of the Twenty Saṃghas Based on the Works of Tsong Kha Pa, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Bentor, Yael, 2014, “Interpreting the Body Maṇḍala: Tsongkhapa versus Later Gelug Scholars”, in Trails of the Tibetan Tradition: Papers for Elliot Sperling, Roberto Vitali (ed.), (Revue d’Etudes Tibétaines 31), Dharamshala, India: Amnye Machen Institute, 63–74. [Bentor 2014 available online (pdf)]
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  • Cowherds (Georges Dreyfus, Bronwyn Finnigan, Jay L. Garfield, Guy Newland, Graham Priest, Mark Siderits, Koji Tanaka, Sonam Thakchöe, Tom Tillemans, and Jan Westerhoff), 2011, Moonshadows: Conventional Truth in Buddhist Philosophy, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199751426.001.0001
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  • Dreyfus, Georges B. J., 1997, Recognizing Reality: Dharmakīrti’s Philosophy and Its Tibetan Interpretations (SUNY Series in Buddhist Studies), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
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  • Garfield, Jay L., 2006, “The Conventional Status of Reflexive Awareness: What’s at Stake in a Tibetan Debate?”, Philosophy East and West, 56(2): 201–228. doi:10.1353/pew.2006.0020
  • Garfield, Jay L. and Sonam Thakchöe, 2011, “Identifying the Object of Negation and the Status of Conventional Truth: Why the dGag Bya Matters So Much to Tibetan Mādhyamikas”, in Cowherds 2011: 73–88 (ch. 5).
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  • Hopkins, Jeffrey, 1999, Emptiness in the Mind-Only School of Buddhism: Dynamic Responses to D̄zong-ka-b̄a’s ‘The Essence of Eloquence’, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
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  • ––– (trans.), 2006, Mountain Doctrine: Tibet’s Fundamental Treatise on Other-Emptiness and the Buddha-Matrix, Ithaca, N.Y: Snow Lion Publications.
  • –––, 2008, Tsong-kha-pa’s Final Exposition of Wisdom, Kevin Vose (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion Publications.
  • ––– (trans.), 2016, The Great Exposition of Secret Mantra, 3 volumes, Boulder, CO: Snow Lion.
  • Jinpa, Thupten, 2002, Self, Reality and Reason in Tibetan Philosophy: Tsongkhapa’s Quest for the Middle Way (Curzon Critical Studies in Buddhism Series), London/New York: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • –––, 2019, Tsongkhapa: A Buddha in the Land of Snows (Lives of the Masters), Boulder, CO: Shambhala.
  • ––– (trans.), 2021, Illuminating the Intent: An Exposition of Candrakīrti’s “Entering the Middle Way” (Library of Tibetan Classics, 19), Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publications.
  • Kaschewsky, Rudolf, ed. 1971. Das Leben des lamaistischen Heiligen Tsongkhapa Blo-Bzan-Grags-Pa (1357-1419), dargestellt und erläutert anhand seiner Vita: Quellort allen Glückes. Aslatische Forschungen; Bd. 32. Wiesbaden: O. Harrassowitz.
  • Kay, David N., 2004, Tibetan and Zen Buddhism in Britain: Transplantation, Development and Adaptation (RoutledgeCurzon Critical Studies in Buddhism), London/New York: RoutledgeCurzon. doi:10.4324/9780203963623
  • Kensur Yeshey Tupden, 1994, Path to the Middle: Oral Mādhyamika Philosophy in Tibet: The Spoken Scholarship of Kensur Yeshey Tupden Commenting on Tsong-Kha-Pa’s Illumination of the Thought, Extensive Explanation of (Candrakīrti’s) “Entrance to (Nāgārjuna’s) ‘Treatise on the Middle Way’”: (Dbu Ma Dgongs Pa Rab Gsal), the Sixth Chapter, “Perfection of Wisdom” Verses 1–7, Anne C. Klein (ed.). Anne C. Klein and Jeffrey Hopkins (trans), (SUNY Series in Buddhist Studies), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Matsumoto, Shirō, 1948, “The Mādhyamika Philosophy of Tsong-Kha-Pa”, Memoirs of the Research Department of the Toyo Bunko, 48: 17–47.
  • Monier-Williams, Monier, 1889, Buddhism in Its Connexion with Brāhmanism and Hindūism and in Its Contrast with Christianity, Duff Lectures, University of Edinburgh, 1888, New York: Macmillan.
  • Napper, Elizabeth, 1989, Dependent-Arising and Emptiness: A Tibetan Buddhist Interpretation of Madhyamika Philosophy Emphasizing the Compatibility of Emptiness and Conventional Phenomena (A Wisdon Advanced Book. Blue Series), Boston: Wisdom Publications.
  • Natanya Rolf, Eva, 2017, “Sacred Illusion: On Purity and Creation in Je Tsongkhapa’s Philosophy of Tantra”, PhD thesis, University of Virginia. doi:10.18130/V3ZW5V
  • Newland, Guy Martin, 1992, The Two Truths in the Mādhyamika Philosophy of the Geluk-ba Order of Tibetan Buddhism, Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
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  • Roloff, Carola [Jampa Tsedroen] (trans./ed.), 2009, Red Mda’ba, Buddhist Yogi-Scholar of the Fourteenth Century: The Forgotten Reviver of Madhyamaka Philosophy in Tibet (Contributions to Tibetan Studies 7), Wiesbaden: Reichert.
  • Ruegg, David Seyfort, 2000, “On Epistemological-Logical (pramāṇa) Theory and the Ontic in Tsoṅ Kha Pa’s Madhyamaka Philosophy”, in his Three Studies in the History of Indian and Tibetan Madhyamaka Philosophy (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde 50), Wien: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien, Universität Wien, section III.
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  • Sparham, Gareth (trans.), 2005, Tantric Ethics: An Explanation of the Precepts for Buddhist Vajrayāna Practice, Boston, MA: Wisdom Publications.
  • Tatz, Mark (trans.), 1986, Asaṅga’s Chapter on Ethics with the Commentary of Tsong-Kha-Pa, The Basic Path to Awakening, The Complete Bodhisattva (Studies in Asian Thought and Religion 4), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
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  • Thakchöe, Sonam, 2007, The Two Truths Debate: Tsongkhapa and Gorampa on the Middle Way, Boston: Wisdom Publications.
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  • Wangchuk, Dorji, 2007, The Resolve to Become a Buddha: A Study of the Bodhicitta Concept in Indo-Tibetan Buddhism (Studia Philologica Buddhica. Monograph Series 23), Tokyo: International Institute for Buddhist Studies of the International College for Postgraduate Buddhist Studies.
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  • Williams, Paul, 1983, “A Note on Some Aspects of Mi bskyod rdo rje’s Critique of dGe lugs pa Madhyamaka”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 11(2): 125–145. doi:10.1007/BF00198620
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  • Yi, Jongbok (trans.), 2015, The Opposite of Emptiness in the Middle Way Autonomy School: Jam-yang-shay-pasGreat Exposition of the Middle’: Chapter Six, Object of Negation 1, in collaboration with Lo-sang-gyal-tshan, Jeffrey Hopkins (ed.), The UMA Institute for Tibetan Studies. [Yi 2015 available online (pdf), from.
  • Yoshimizu, Chizuko, 1989, Descriptive Catalogue of the Naritasan Institute Collection of Tibetan Works (Volume 1), Narita: Naritasan shinshoji.
  • Yotsuya, Kodo, 1999, The Critique of Svatantra Reasoning by Candrakīrti and Tsong-Kha-Pa: A Study of Philosophical Proof According to Two Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka Traditions of India and Tibet (Tibetan and Indo-Tibetan Studies 8), Stuttgart: Steiner.

Other Internet Resources

  • Buddhist Digital Archives. A repository of digitally preserved works in Tibetan, including a number or editions of Tsongkhapa’s collected works.
  • Tibetan and Himalayan Library, University of Virginia. A hub resource for Tibetan studies in universities worldwide.
  • Asian Classics Input Project. The ACE tool allows readers to browse and search a number of Tsongkhapa’s texts.
  • The Tibet Album, Collections of photographs of Tibet (British photography in Central Tibet 1920–1950). Excellent record of pre-1959 dGe lugs monasteries and other institutions influenced by Tsongkhapa.
  • UMA Institute for Tibetan Studies. UMA = Union of the Modern and the Ancient Institute for Tibetan Studies. Contains audio-files of explanations of works of Tsongkhapa by traditional Tibetan teachers, translated by Jeffrey Hopkins.
  • The Berzin Archives. The Buddhist Archives of Dr. Alexander Berzin. A non-academic, but sometimes informative site for dGe lugs pa explanations of Tsongkhapa’s ideas maintained by Alexander Berzin.

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Chandra Chiara Ehm <chandra.ehm@etu.ephe.psl.eu>

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