Supplement to Kurt Gödel

A Philosophical Argument About the Content of Mathematics

The bold extraction of philosophical observations from mathematical facts—and, of course, the converse—was Gödel's modus operandi and professional trademark. We present below an argument of this type, from draft V of Gödel's draft manuscript, “Is Mathematics a Syntax of Language?” though it also appears in the Gibbs lecture.

The argument uses the Second Incompleteness Theorem[1] to refute the view that mathematics is devoid of content. Gödel referred to this as the “syntactical view,” and identified it with Carnap. Gödel defined the syntactical view in the Gibbs lecture as follows:

The essence of this view is that there is no such thing as a mathematical fact, that the truth of propositions which we believe express mathematical facts only means that (due to the rather complicated rules which define the meaning of propositions, that is, which determine under what circumstances a proposition is true) an idle running of language occurs in these propositions, in that the said rules make them true no matter what the facts are. Such propositions can rightly be called void of content. (Gödel 1995, p. 319).

Under this view, according to Gödel:

…the meaning of the terms (that is, the concepts they denote) is asserted to be man-made and consisting merely in semantical conventions. (Gödel 1995, p. 320)

A number of arguments are adduced in the Gibb's lecture against the syntactical view. Continuing the last quote but one, Gödel gives the main argument against it:

Now it is actually possible to build up a language in which mathematical propositions are void of content in this sense. The only trouble is 1. that one has to use the very same mathematical facts (or equally complicated other mathematical facts) in order to show they don't exist.

The mathematical fact Gödel is referring to is the requirement that the system be consistent. But consistency will never be intrinsic to the system; it must always be imported “from the outside,” so to speak, as follows from the Second Incompleteness Theorem, which states that consistency is not provable from within any system adequate to formalize mathematics.

The paper “Is Mathematics a Syntax of Language?” paper is an extended elaboration of just this point. It is more specific, both as to the characterization of the syntactic view and as to its refutation.

In version V of it, Gödel identifies the syntactical view with three assertions. First, mathematical intuition can be replaced by conventions about the use of symbols and their application. Second, “there do not exist any mathematical objects or facts,” and therefore mathematical propositions are void of content. And third, the syntactical conception defined by these two assertions is compatible with strict empiricism.

As to the first assertion there is a weak sense in which Gödel agrees with it, insofar as he notes that is possible to arrive at the same sentences either by the application of certain rules, or by applying mathematical intuition. He then observes that it would be “folly” to expect of any perfectly arbitrary system set up in this way, that “if these rules are applied to verified laws of nature (e.g., the primitive laws of elasticity theory) one will obtain empirically correct propositions (e.g., about the carrying power of a bridge)…” He terms this property of the rules in question “admissibility” and observes that admissibility entails consistency. But now the situation has become problematic:

But now it turns out that for proving the consistency of mathematics an intuition of the same power is needed as for deducing the truth of the mathematical axioms, at least in some interpretation. In particular the abstract mathematical concepts, such as “infinite set,” “function,” etc., cannot be proved consistent without again using abstract concepts, i.e., such as are not merely ascertainable properties or relations of finite combinations of symbols. So, while it was the primary purpose of the syntactical conception to justify the use of these problematic concepts by interpreting them syntactically, it turns out that quite on the contrary, abstract concepts are necessary in order to justify the syntactical rules (as admissible or consistent)…the fact is that, in whatever manner syntactical rules are formulated, the power and usefulness of the mathematics resulting is proportional to the power of the mathematical intuition necessary for their proof of admissibility. This phenomenon might be called “the non-eliminability of the content of mathematics by the syntactical interpretation.”

Gödel makes two further observations: first, one can avoid the above difficulty by founding consistency on empirical induction. This is not a solution he advocates here, though as time passed, he would now and then note the usefulness of inductive methods in a particular context.[2] His second observation is that empirical applicability is not needed; it is clearly unrelated to the weaker question of the consistency of the rules.

Copyright © 2015 by
Juliette Kennedy <>

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