Gorampa [go rams pa]

First published Mon May 2, 2011; substantive revision Mon Mar 29, 2021

Gorampa Sonam Senge (Go rams pa bSod nams Seng ge, 1429–89) is one of the most widely-studied philosophers in the Sakya (sa skya) school of Tibetan Buddhism. A fierce critic of Tsongkhapa, the founder of what later came to be known as the Gelug (dge lugs) school, his works were so controversial that they were suppressed by Gelug leaders shortly after they were composed. Gorampa’s texts remained hidden until the early 20th century, when the monk Jamgyal Rinpoche received permission from the thirteenth Dalai Lama to collect Gorampa’s extant texts and have them reprinted in Derge. Today, Gorampa’s philosophy is studied widely in monastic colleges, not only in those affiliated with his own Sakya tradition, but also in institutions affiliated with the Kagyu (bka' brgyud) and Nyingma (rnying ma) schools.

Gorampa, like most Tibetan Buddhist philosophers, considers himself a follower of the Madhyamaka (Middle Way) school developed by the Indian philosopher Nāgārjuna in the second century, CE. His views with respect to particular issues within Madhyamaka, however, differ significantly from the views of scholars belonging to other sects of Tibetan Buddhism (e.g., Tsongkhapa and Dolpopa), and at times, his views even differ from those of other Sakya scholars (most notably Śākya Chokden). Gorampa’s particular brand of Madhyamaka philosophy is defined by his understanding of the relationship between the two truths, the use of negation, the role of logic, and proper methods of philosophical argumentation.

1. Life and Works

Gorampa was born in 1429 in eastern Tibet. At age nineteen, he traveled to central Tibet to pursue monastic studies. He briefly attended Nalendra monastery, one of the prominent Sakya monastic institutions in Tibet, where he studied Madhyamaka texts with the scholar Rongton Sheja Kunrig (Rong ston Shes bya Kun rigs, 1367–1449). Rongton passed away the following summer, and Gorampa began to travel throughout central Tibet, studying with a number of other teachers. In addition to becoming a skilled philosopher, Gorampa mastered a variety of Tantric practices, including the Lamdre (lam ‘bras), the defining practice of the Sakya School.

After completing his studies, Gorampa became a teacher, and in 1473 he founded Thubten Namgyal Ling Monastery, developing a curriculum that emphasized both rigorous philosophical education and thorough training in meditative practices. Gorampa later spent four years as the sixth abbot of Ewam Choden, the primary institution of the Ngor subsect of the Sakya school. He died in 1489.

Gorampa lived during a period of political instability in Tibet. From 1244 until 1354, the Sakya sect had held political control over Tibet, and was backed by the support of the Mongol army. Eventually the Mongolian court’s interest in Tibet weakened, and the Pagmodruk sect of Tibetan Buddhism ousted the Sakyapas from power in a violent confrontation. The Pagmodrukpas continued to rule over Tibet for over a century, but by the latter half of Gorampa’s life, they had fallen from power, resulting in a number of groups fiercely competing for religious and political dominance.

Gorampa composed his philosophical texts, therefore, at a time in which the Sakya sect was struggling to re-assert its dominance. Although verifiable information about the political motivations of the Sakyapas remains elusive, the unstable political situation in Tibet could have at least partially accounted for the overtly polemical nature of some of Gorampa’s philosophical writings. When the Gelugpas eventually ascended to political power in the sixteenth century, the fifth Dalai Lama ordered that Gorampa’s texts, which were so critical of Tsongkhapa, be destroyed or otherwise removed from monastic institutions. However, many of Gorampa’s texts continued to be studied in eastern Tibet, beyond the Central Tibetan government’s scope of influence.

When work began on the republication of Gorampa’s writings in 1905, thirteen volumes of texts were recovered from monasteries throughout Tibet. In addition to his works on Madhyamaka philosophy, Gorampa composed a number of treatises on Abhidharma, several commentaries on the Indian text the Abhisamayālaṅkāra, and various practice texts based on Tantra. Gorampa’s complete Madhyamaka texts comprise only two of these thirteen volumes. These are:

  1. Distinguishing the View (lta ba’i shan ‘byed), a polemical text distinguishing Gorampa’s own view from those of Tsongkhapa (Tsong kha pa bLo bzang Grags pa, 1357–1419) and Dolpopa (Dol po pa Shes rab rGyal mtshan, 1292–1361);
  2. Elucidating the View (lta ba ngan sel), a commentary on the Indian scholar Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra;
  3. Synopsis of Madhyamaka (dbu ma’i spyi don), an encyclopedic text outlining Gorampa’s views on the major points of Madhyamaka, as well as the views of a number of Indian and Tibetan scholars with whom he both agrees and disagrees.
The main difference in these texts concerns the ways in which Gorampa presents his philosophical view. Distinguishing the View is a polemical text in which Gorampa focuses on the metaphysics of Madhyamaka, positioning his own interpretation as a sort of middle way between other interpretations that cast Madhyamaka in terms of nihilism or eternalism. Elucidating the View focuses on the process through which a follower of Madhyamaka transforms her mind as she progresses toward complete awakening. Synopsis of Madhyamaka presents Gorampa’s interpretation of Madhyamaka in three ways: ontologically, in terms of its grounding (bzhi) in the two truths; ethically, in terms of the path (lam) that a Buddhist must follow; and epistemologically, in terms of the mental content that a Buddha experiences as a result (‘bras bu) of complete awakening.

Despite the different emphases of these three texts, Gorampa’s general presentation of Madhyamaka remains consistent throughout his writings. This is especially striking when compared to Gorampa’s rough contemporaries, including Tsongkhapa and Śākya Chokden, whose views evolved over the course of their careers. The relative stability of Gorampa’s views over his lifetime is one reason why he is held in such high regard among proponents of the Sakya tradition.

2. Gorampa’s Madhyamaka

Gorampa, like all of his Mādhyamika interlocutors, appeals to the authority of Nāgārjuna. As such, most disagreements between Gorampa and his opponents primarily concern the correct ways to interpret the works of Nāgārjuna and his commentators. While Gorampa and his opponents generally agree that a Buddhist must understand the nature of reality by eliminating ignorance and realizing emptiness, what sets Gorampa apart from other Mādhyamikas is the way in which he articulates reality, and the processes by which he argues that one must eliminate ignorance and realize emptiness.

With this in mind, there are four defining characteristics of Gorampa’s philosophy that set him apart from other Tibetan philosophers. They are his understandings of: (1) the two truths; (2) negation and the tetralemma; (3) the role of logic and reasoning; and (4) proper methods of argumentation on the path to awakening.

2.1 The Two Truths

The theory of the two truths, or two realities, is fundamental to Madhyamaka philosophy. Reality can be classified in terms of the conventional truth (or conventional reality), which corresponds to the way that things appear to ordinary persons, and the ultimate truth (or ultimate reality), which corresponds to the way that things really are. While Mādhyamikas tend to disagree about the nature of and relationship between the conventional and ultimate truths, the final goal of Madhyamaka philosophy involves realizing the ultimate truth – seeing things not just as they appear, but as they really are.

Gorampa argues that the distinction between the two truths is made based on the ways in which a subject (yul can) apprehends an object (yul). That is, the way in which one engages with the world determines whether one perceives things conventionally or ultimately. Broadly speaking, the conventional truth is mediated by concepts, logic, and reasoning, while the ultimate truth is outside of the realm of conceptual thought. As long as one is engaged in concepts, one is interacting with conventional reality. Once all concepts have been eliminated by following the Buddhist path (as will be explained below), one is said to have realized the ultimate reality.

Gorampa defines “conventional truth” as that which appears to ordinary beings with ordinarily functioning sense faculties. Objects, words, smells, and ideas are all sorts of things that can be conventionally true, or conventionally real. They are true or real in the sense that they appear to be true or real to ordinary persons, without any sort of philosophical analysis. Most people in Paris, for example, can point to the Eiffel Tower and agree, “That is the Eiffel Tower.” The existence of the Eiffel Tower is thus conventionally true. It appears to ordinary people with fully functioning sense faculties, and these ordinary people identify it by means of the linguistic convention, “Eiffel Tower.”

It is not, however, necessarily the case that anything that can be identified or described in words is conventionally true. If a tourist in Paris drinks too much wine and starts seeing double, for example, this does not mean that the existence of two Eiffel Towers is suddenly conventionally true. The drunk person’s perception is skewed; he is no longer operating with ordinary faculties. After he sobers up, he will once again see that really, there is only one Eiffel Tower. To illustrate this point in his texts, Gorampa refers to Candrakīrti’s well-known Madhyamaka analogy of a person with an eye disorder (rab rib can) mistakenly thinking that the floaters in his field of vision are actually hairs on his dinner plate. But the truth of the matter – the conventional truth, that is – is that the hairs are not really there, as a person with normally functioning eyes can affirm.

The conventional truth, therefore, is true in the sense that it is something upon which all ordinary persons with normally functioning faculties can agree. The conventional truth is what allows for people to travel to Paris to visit the Eiffel Tower, to talk about the weather, and to engage in debates about politics. It is also, most importantly for Gorampa, what allows people to understand conceptually what a realization of the ultimate truth is like, and what enables Buddhist practitioners to correctly develop logical reasoning and engage in proper types of meditative practices. In other words, some features of the conventional – such as reasoning and language – can be used to approach an understanding of the ultimate, even though the ultimate itself transcends those features.

In contrast to the conventional, the ultimate truth is understood as the way things really are, independent of the concepts and conventions with which ordinary persons engage. Gorampa contends that the conventional truth is mired in ignorance – the cause of saṃsāra, which keeps sentient beings cycling from one birth to the next, lifetime after lifetime. When this ignorance is removed, one is capable of realizing the ultimate truth, and through that realization, one can attain freedom from the cycle of rebirth.

Based on this account, then, when philosophers attempt to describe or even label “the ultimate truth,” they fail to capture it in its entirety; when identifying and describing the ultimate truth, concepts and language must be used, and Gorampa’s definition of the ultimate truth is that it is beyond all concepts and language. Still, Gorampa argues that it is important to begin the process of realizing the actual ultimate truth by developing a conceptual understanding of the general features of the ultimate. In other words, forming a concept of the ultimate is not the final goal of awakening itself, but it gives one a sense of what awakening is like.

In order to explain the difference between a conceptual understanding and a nonconceptual realization of the ultimate truth, Gorampa divides it into two types: the ultimate that is taught (bstan pa'i don dam) and the ultimate that is realized (rtogs pa'i don dam). The ultimate that is taught corresponds to an ordinary person’s concept of the ultimate, while the ultimate that is realized is directly and nonconceptually ascertained by awakened beings.

When the ultimate is divided in this way, Gorampa makes the case that ordinary persons and awakened beings are capable of recognizing each of the two truths, but in different ways. An ordinary person can conceptually understand the ultimate that is taught, while still perceiving the conventional realm as true or real. From this perspective, the conventional is called “the conventional truth” (kun rdzob bden pa). But once an awakened being nonconceptually apprehends the ultimate that is realized, the conventional no longer appears as real or as solid as it once was. The awakened being, having had a direct experience of the way things really are, no longer experiences the conventional as true, but rather as merely conventional (kun rdzob tsam).

In other words, we can say that the conventional truth is that which is true for ordinary, unawakened beings. The merely conventional, however, is perceived after an awakened being realizes the ultimate truth. There merely conventional is not false; it is simply a mode of perception that is subordinated to the ultimate truth that an awakened being has directly experienced.

Unlike some other Tibetan philosophers, Gorampa stresses that the difference between conventional truth and mere convention is based entirely on the subject who apprehends these objects. The same table appears as truly existent to an ordinary being, and as a merely conventional imputation to an awakened being. The conventional and ultimate truths, similarly, are distinguished on the basis of the ways in which they are apprehended. (This approach differs from someone like Tsongkhapa, who distinguishes the two truths on the basis of the object, arguing that every appearing thing consists of conventional and ultimate aspects.)

In short, ordinary beings perceive the conventional truth, and understand the ultimate that is taught. Awakened beings experience the merely conventional, and directly realize the ultimate that is realized. Based on this model of the two truths, Gorampa argues that the Buddhist path involves a process of transforming one’s perspective. One begins by correctly identifying and understanding the conventional truth. Then, through logical reasoning and meditative practices, one gradually begins to realize that this so-called truth is merely conventional and that it is based entirely on concepts that are rooted in ignorance; in this way one comes to a conceptual understanding of the ultimate that is taught. Through more analysis and practice still, one eventually recognizes that the conventional truth is only merely conventional, and directly realizes the ultimate truth, which does not depend on ignorance and concepts.

By working through this process to transform one’s mind, Gorampa argues that a Buddhist practitioner on the Madhymaka path will finally arrive at a state of freedom from conceptual proliferations (spros pa dang bral ba). This is a mental state in which conceptual thought does not occur, and one directly and immediately apprehends the ultimate that is realized. Gorampa is explicit in pointing out that this state of freedom from conceptual proliferations is different from a state of unconsciousness. In order to cultivate a state of freedom from conceptual proliferations, one must eliminate concepts gradually, through particular methods that involve both logical reasoning and meditative practices. As we will see below, Gorampa outlines a very specific fourfold process for eliminating concepts in order to arrive at this desired state of nonconceptuality.

2.2 Negation

In order to cultivate an awakened mind that realizes the ultimate truth, the Madhyamaka school of philosophy advocates a fourfold process of analyzing the conventional truth that is commonly referred to as a tetralemma (catuṣkoṭi, mtha’ bzhi). While this fourfold analysis is not unique to Buddhism, its use as a tool in Buddhist philosophical traditions can be traced to Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārika, in which he famously remarks, “Neither from itself, nor from another, nor from both, nor without a cause, does anything, anywhere, ever, arise” (MMK I:1). This fourfold rejection of one extreme, its opposite, both, and neither, is adopted and expanded upon by later Mādhyamikas, and is frequently used as a tool in order to demonstrate the Madhyamaka view.

Nāgārjuna’s commentator Āryadeva applies this fourfold negation to an analysis of existence in his Jñānasārasamuccaya, writing, “There is no existence, there is no nonexistence, there is no existence and nonexistence, nor is there the absence of both.” Gorampa frequently cites this passage in order to illustrate the Madhyamaka view as that which is free from conceptual constructs. He contends that a proper understanding and application of this passage allows a practitioner to successfully transition from the state of an ordinary person who sees conventional truth, to an awakened buddha who directly and nonconceptually realizes the ultimate.

Most Tibetan Buddhist philosophers agree that the tetralemma is a tool that can help one to realize the ultimate, but they differ in their explanations of the ways in which this tool functions. Gorampa argues that one must negate each of the four extremes in succession by using logic and reasoning, and then one must subsequently realize the negation of all four extremes simultaneously through meditative practices.

2.2.1 The Process of Refuting the Four Extremes

As Gorampa formulates the tetralemma, the process begins by analyzing and refuting existence. This is done by using the “Five Madhyamaka Reasonings” (dbu ma gtan tshigs lnga). These five types of reasoning are:

  1. Neither one nor many (gcig du dral), which analyzes the essence (ngo bo) of things.
  2. Diamond splinters (rdo rje'i gzegs ma), which analyzes causes.
  3. Refuting the arising of something existent or nonexistent (yod med skye ‘gog), which analyzes effects.
  4. Refuting the four possibilities of arising (mu bzhi skye ‘gog), which analyzes causes and effects together.
  5. Dependent arising (rten ‘brel), which shows that phenomena cannot exist independently.

These points are generally agreed upon by all Mādhyamikas, and entire essays can be devoted to each of these five types of reasoning, so they will not be discussed in detail here. The basic thrust of these five types of reasoning is that when we analyze the things that appear in the conventional truth, and try to find some kind of essential qualities that underpin those conventionally appearing things, nothing whatsoever can be found. In other words, if one searches for an ultimate truth that exists beyond conventional appearances, nothing whatsoever can be found.

After one has refuted the concept that things truly exist, Gorampa concedes that a person’s natural inclination might be to assume that things are therefore nonexistent. He argues, however, that if one were to affirm the nonexistence of things, this would amount to a view of nihilism, which is antithetical to the Madhyamaka position. In order to show that the acceptance of nonexistence is untenable, Gorampa argues that existence and nonexistence are concepts that depend upon each other, just like left and right, or big and small; one makes no sense without the other. So, once the concept of existence is eliminated completely, it makes no sense to conceive of nonexistence independently of that. Things cannot be nonexistent unless they stand in contrast to things that are existent.

Once he has shown that existence and nonexistence are each untenable, Gorampa refutes the third possibility of the tetralemma, that things can somehow simultaneously both exist and not exist. He dismisses this possibility quite succinctly, stating that if existence and nonexistence have each been refuted individually, then it makes no sense that they could somehow exist together.

The refutation of the fourth lemma, neither existence nor nonexistence, yet again depends upon the successful refutation of the previous three. Gorampa argues that to conceive of something as “neither existent nor nonexistent” is to conceive of something that is somewhere between the two extremes of existence and nonexistence. He contends, however, that if one has any concept of anything at all – even if it is some sort of concept of quasi-existence – this is still a wrong view. Once the extremes of existence, nonexistence, and both have been completely refuted, there is no viable position left. To somehow claim that things are neither existent nor nonexistent after having refuted the first three possibilities is illogical.

With the refutation of these four positions in succession, Gorampa shows that any possible way of conceiving of the ultimate reality of a thing is impossible. Gorampa stresses the importance of understanding the refutation of each of these four lemmas in succession; the logic that refutes the concept of nonexistence depends upon the successful refutation of the existence, the refutation of the third concept (both existence and nonexistence) depends on the refutation of the first two, and the refutation of the fourth (neither existence nor nonexistence) depends upon the refutation of the first three concepts. Existence, nonexistence, both, and neither are the only possible ways of conceiving of the ultimate status of a thing, so once each of these possible ways is eliminated, there is no way to conceive of things that remains.

The refutation of each of the four extremes of the tetralemma is a logic-oriented process that helps a follower of Madhyamaka to cultivate a conceptual understanding of the ultimate truth that is taught. But Gorampa argues that logic alone will not bring about a realization of the actual ultimate truth. For this, one must also incorporate meditative practices. Gorampa argues that through repeated meditation on the refutation of each of the four lemmas in succession, one will eventually come to realize all four refutations simultaneously. We might describe this style of meditative practice as a kind of “turning off” of concepts. After one conceptually understands the negation of existence, for example, one meditates on this negation and eventually stops having concepts of things existing altogether. This process continues through all four possibilities in the tetralemma, until one no longer conceives of things at all. Again, it is important to note that this is distinct from simply arresting the process of thought.

2.2.2 The Role of Negation and the Function of the Tetralemma

According to Gorampa, the tetralemma is a tool that is used to investigate the ultimate status of appearances. Through the logic of this fourfold negation, one cultivates a conceptual understanding of the ultimate that is taught, and then, through subsequent meditative practices, one eventually cultivates a direct, nonconceptual realization of the actual ultimate truth. In short, the logical reasoning involved in the fourfold negation is implemented by ordinary persons in order to understand what the ultimate truth is like, but logic alone is not sufficient to arrive at a direct realization of the ultimate.

Although tetralemmic analysis is employed by all Mādhyamika philosophers, Gorampa’s interpretation of this fourfold negation is unique in that it amounts to a complete eradication of conceptual thought. Other Mādhyamikas, such as Tsongkhapa, qualify each of the negations in the tetralemma in ways that eliminate only certain kinds of concepts. For someone like Tsongkhapa, the tetralemma is a tool that can be used to eliminate wrong concepts; for Gorampa, however, it is a tool that eliminates all concepts.

Gorampa’s particular interpretation of the tetralemma is based on the ways that he understands negation to function within this fourfold analysis. For him, the negations of existence, nonexistence, both, and neither are each complete and total non-affirming negations (med dgag); that is, each limb of the tetralemma is negated in its entirely, without the existence of anything else being affirmed in its place. The result of this process is, again, the complete eradication of any concepts of existence, nonexistence, both, or neither.

Some of Gorampa’s opponents – again, including Tsongkhapa – understand negation differently. Tsongkhapa and his supporters adhere to the law of double negation, and understand the negations within the tetralemma to be qualified in certain ways. As such, while the negation of existence is interpreted to mean that nothing exists ultimately, the negation of nonexistence is interpreted to mean that something does, nevertheless, exist. For Tsongkhapa, this “something” is the conventional truth. Because of this, Tsongkhapa’s understanding of the tetralemma involves a complex system of logical statements, each qualified according to one of the two truths. If one accepts double negation elimination, then it makes no sense for both existence and nonexistence to be negated, unless these negations are qualified in certain ways.

Gorampa, on the other hand, does not adhere to double negation in the context of the tetralemma. Instead, he understands the tetralemma as a succession of four negations that are applied to the four possible ways of conceiving of the status of the ultimate truth. Because the ultimate truth is nonconceptualizable, Gorampa contends that Tsongkhapa’s understanding of the tetralemma is incomplete, because it doesn’t negate enough – literally, it underpervades (khyab chung ba). While Tsongkhapa’s model successfully refutes the extreme view of existence at the ultimate level, Gorampa argues that it does not eliminate all extreme views ultimately and in their entirety.

Tsongkhapa argues that a negation of all four extremes at the ultimate level defies logic, but Gorampa contends that a transcendence of logic is specifically the tetralemma’s purpose. By negating all possibilities for logical, conceptual thought, the only recourse is to abandon concepts completely. True freedom from conceptual proliferations lies outside of the scope of conceptual thought, and is therefore inexpressible. Gorampa maintains, however, that because ordinary persons utilize conceptual thought, they necessarily construe the ultimate truth as an object of conceptual constructs (that is, they construe it as the ultimate that is taught). As such, one must first use conceptual reasoning to refute each of the four extremes, but these concepts must eventually be abandoned.

In other words, because all four extremes are negated under the analysis of the tetralemma, Gorampa concludes that a correct realization of the ultimate truth must be something that is other than these conceptualizations of and dichotomizations into existence and nonexistence. As such, the ultimate truth cannot be described using these terms. And, since these are the only possible ways of speaking of or conceptualizing the status of the existence of things, once they are all negated, one is forced to conclude that the ultimate truth cannot be described linguistically or conceptually. The ultimate truth that is realized transcends the boundaries of language and conceptual thought. However, Gorampa still maintains that logic and analysis are essential in arriving at a state of nonconceptuality.

2.3 The Role of Logic

Gorampa’s understanding of the relationship between the two truths and the use of negation in the tetralemma reinforce his understanding of the ways in which a practitioner should proceed on the Buddhist path toward awakening. Through the logic of the tetralemma, Gorampa demonstrates that the final goal of awakening is beyond conceptual thought.

Conceptual thought comes from ignorance, so by eradicating ignorance, one eradicates conceptual thought. In other words, since an awakened being is completely free from ignorance, she has no concepts whatsoever. This claim is quite controversial for obvious reasons: buddhas are understood as consisting of perfect wisdom, and are described in scriptures as omniscient beings. How, then, can a buddha have no concepts at all, but still be considered omniscient?

Tsongkhapa and his fellow Gelugpa opponents criticize Gorampa for this very reason. They contend that Gorampa’s philosophy negates too much – it “overpervades” (khyab che ba). They argue that if the final goal of awakening is really a complete elimination of concepts, then one ought to be able to attain awakening by simply falling asleep or otherwise becoming unconscious. Gorampa contends, however, that in order to successfully eliminate all concepts in their entirety, it is absolutely essential that one begins by using logic and reasoning. The end result is indeed nonconceptual, but it differs from the quietism that is a result of simply not-thinking, without any prior analysis.

The issue underlying this debate concerns the status of conceptual content in the minds of fully awakened buddhas. Gorampa contends, citing Candrakīrti, that fully awakened buddhas have no conceptual content whatsoever; they have completely eliminated ignorance in its entirety, and therefore do not actively engage in the conventional world. They do not conceive of things as existent, nonexistent, both, or neither. In fact, they do not conceive of things at all. They do, however, appear to be omniscient from the perspective of ordinary beings, and because of their previous karma and the compassion that they have cultivated on the path to enlightenment, they continue to function in the world for the benefit of ordinary unenlightened beings for a period of time.

The implications of Gorampa’s view are significant. While Tsongkhapa’s model stresses the eradication of only certain kinds of concepts – e.g., concepts relating to the ultimate existence of things – Gorampa’s model shows that all concepts must be eliminated, first through the logical reasoning of the tetralemma, and then through subsequent meditative practices. Because Gorampa is not concerned with the preservation of certain kinds of concepts, he is more tolerant of variations in styles of argumentation that might be used to arrive at a state of freedom from conceptual proliferations.

2.4 Methods of Argumentation

Gorampa’s emphasis on the possibility for different acceptable styles of argumentation occurs in the context of his analysis of the so-called Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika subschools of Madhyamaka thought. These two subschools were understood by Tibetan thinkers as being developed by the Indian Mādhyamikas Buddhapālita and Bhāviveka, the former advocating the Prāsaṅgika position and the latter that of the Svātantrika. Candrakīrti is understood as upholding the Prāsaṅgika tradition, because he defended Buddhapālita’s views against Bhāviveka’s criticisms. It is important to note, however, that none of these Indian scholars labeled themselves as adherents of particular subschools of Madhyamaka, and that the terms rang gyud pa (Svātantrika) and thal ‘gyur ba (Prāsaṅgika) were coined centuries later by Tibetans.

Regardless of whether Buddhapālita, Bhāviveka, or Candrakīrti actually understood themselves to be advocating these distinct positions, the differentiation between Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika became reified in medieval Tibetan Buddhist discourse. Because Tibetans held Candrakīrti’s Madhyamaka in high regard, they purported to be Prāsaṅgikas themselves, and many constructed detailed explanations of the division between the Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika systems, always upholding Prāsaṅgika as the highest form of Madhyamaka.

Tsongkhapa famously composed a list of “eight difficult points” (dka’ gnad brgyad) distinguishing his own Prāsaṅgika view from that of the Svātantrika. Based on these eight points, Tsongkhapa concluded that the two schools to differ in terms of their views regarding the nature of the ultimate truth.

Gorampa also considers himself a Prāsaṅgika, but insists that the distinction between these two Madhyamaka subschools is a matter of method, not view. Because Gorampa’s interpretation of the two truths and negation informs a process by which the Mādhyamika begins with logic and analysis, and ends in a state of nonconceptuality, Gorampa contends that there can be no differences between Mādhyamikas with respect to their final view. There cannot be different types of nonconceptuality; the end result of any true Madhyamaka analysis is freedom from conceptual proliferations. Once one has successfully eradicated conceptual thought, the methods that she has used to arrive at such a state are no longer relevant. The differences between these Madhyamaka subschools, therefore, occur with respect to the ways in which they understand the conventional truth, and utilize logic and reasoning.

In short, Gorampa’s particular brand of Madhyamaka is characterized by his understanding of the two truths, and the ways in which negation functions within the logic of tetralemmic analysis. Because the ultimate truth is entirely free from concepts, one utilizes negation to eliminate all concepts in their entirety. The ways in which one employs Madhyamaka reasoning in order to negate these concepts are ultimately not as important as actually arriving at a state of nonconceptuality. Thus, unlike Tsongkhapa, who concludes that there is one correct final view, Gorampa contends that the final, ultimate view is actually no view at all.

3. Influence on Other Philosophers

Gorampa’s harsh criticisms of Tsongkhapa resulted in his works being banned throughout Tibet for centuries. When these texts were recovered and reprinted, however, Gorampa’s philosophy experienced a resurgence of sorts, not only among fellow Sakyapas, but also among some scholars belonging to the Kagyu and Nyingma schools. Gorampa’s emphasis on logic and reasoning, combined with his view that different methods can successfully be applied to arrive at the same result of freedom from conceptual proliferations, appealed to non-Sakya scholars who had historically placed more of an emphasis on meditative practices, but wished to counter Gelugpa-style logical arguments.

Just as Gorampa argues that the distinction between Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika is a matter of method, but not of a Mādhyamika’s final view, later Tibetan commentators have extended this reasoning to apply to other, non-Sakya schools within Tibetan Buddhism. Gorampa’s philosophy has become influential within what has recently come to be known as the “nonsectarian movement” (ris med) of Tibetan Buddhism.

Kagyu and Nyingma scholars managed to appropriate some of Gorampa’s philosophy and incorporate it into their own systems. Not only did Gorampa provide a compelling refutation of Tsongkhapa’s particular understanding of Madhyamaka, but his philosophical arguments also proved compatible with Kagyu and Nyingma styles of meditative practice. Today, Kagyu and Nyingma scholars study Gorampa’s philosophical texts at Sakya monastic institutions, and some even teach Gorampa’s philosophy in their own monasteries.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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Constance Kassor <constance.e.kassor@lawrence.edu>

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