Metaphysical Grounding

First published Tue Nov 25, 2014; substantive revision Mon Dec 6, 2021

Consider the following claim: the truck drivers are engaged in a labor strike in virtue of picketing. What sort of claim is this? Well, it seems clear what sort of claim it isn’t. It isn’t an identity claim. For example, the property of striking isn’t identical to the property of picketing, as there are different ways of striking, such as carefully following all safety regulations so as to impede productivity. It isn’t a causal claim either, at least if by causation we mean what we normally mean when we use the term. The causes of the strike concern not the picketing of the truckers but, instead, antecedent events such as how their employer has allotted payroll deductions and benefits. Finally, the claim isn’t purely modal in character either—it isn’t merely the claim that there is a necessary connection between picketing and striking. Perhaps this behavior together with the satisfaction of other conditions suffices for there to be a labor strike, but the former suffices for any number of things, such as the fact that \(2+2=4\).

What sort of claim is it, then? Some suggest that this and similar claims are grounding claims, where grounding is understood to be a form of constitutive (as opposed to causal or probabilistic) determination or explanation. The point of departure for theorizing about grounding is that there are a variety of claims—claims we make in ordinary life as well as ones we make in the context of doing philosophy—that are best interpreted as being claims about what grounds what. As for metaphysics in particular, some claim that grounding plays a central role in the enterprise properly conceived. Schaffer, for example, writes that “metaphysics as I understand it is about what grounds what” rather than what exists (2009: 379). And, according to Fine, questions about what grounds what are central to what he calls realist metaphysics, which concerns not just the nature of things but whether they are real; “Indeed”, Fine writes, “if considerations of ground were abolished, then very little of the subject would remain” (2012a: 41).

We begin by addressing some preliminary issues, including how best to formulate grounding claims. Then we address the following general questions: What is the nature of grounding? Why think that there is grounding in the first place? And how does grounding interact with other notions of philosophical interest, such as necessity?

1. Preliminaries

In this section we address five preliminary issues: the distinction between determination- and explanation-based conceptions of grounding, the formulation of grounding claims, the distinction between full and partial grounding, cases that are thought to illustrate the general concept of grounding, and historical discussions of grounding.

1.1 Determination and explanation

An important initial choice point in theorizing about grounding concerns the theses of unionism and separatism (Raven 2015: 326). Proponents of unionism work with an explanation-based conception of grounding, stipulating that grounding is a form of explanation, what we will call explanationG (Dasgupta 2017; Fine 2012a; Litland 2015; Rosen 2010). For unionists, to say that the bowl’s brittleness is grounded in the ionic bonds of its constituent atoms is, in the first instance, to say that the bowl is brittle because these bonds are ionic, that it’s brittle in virtue of the ionic bonding, or that the brittleness is accounted for by the bonding.

Separatists, on the other hand, work with a determination-based conception of grounding. The guiding idea here is an analogy between causation and grounding. Causation, while itself a form of determination rather than explanation, nevertheless backs explanations. So too separatists claim with grounding: grounding, rather than being a form of explanation, is a form of determination—what we will call determinationG—that backs explanations (Audi 2012a; Schaffer 2009, 2012, 2016a; Trogdon 2013a). For separatists, to say that the bowl’s brittleness is grounded in the ionic bonds of its constituent atoms is, in the first instance, to say that these bonds non-causally generate, produce, or bring about the bowl’s brittleness. Just what the intuitive notion of backing ultimately comes to in the context of causation and grounding isn’t an entirely settled matter—some understand backing in terms of representation (Trogdon 2018a), while others suggest that backing itself is to be given a grounding-theoretic treatment (Kovacs 2020; Wirling 2020). (The “explanationG” and “determinationG” terminology is borrowed from Skiles and Trogdon (2021)).

Unionists, as we understand them, are committed to there being instances of a certain form of explanation and to providing an account of what it’s like; they don’t have a corresponding commitment regarding any form of determination. For separatists, the reverse is the case. Hence, unionism and separatism are importantly different theses (cf. Dasgupta 2017: fn. 8; Kovacs 2020). And note that, even if we agree that there is both explanationG and determinationG, there still may be substantive reasons to go with one view rather than the other. For example, if, say, explanationG is conceptually prior to determinationG, then perhaps we should, all other things being equal, interpret grounding claims as targeting in the first instance the former rather than the latter. Compare: Strevens (2008: Ch. 6) claims that we ought to interpret causal claims (e.g., “The stone striking the glass caused the window to shatter”) as targeting in the first instance causal explanation rather than causation understood as a form of determination, as the former is conceptually prior to the latter.

1.2 Regimentation

To regiment grounding discourse is to adopt a formal language in which we can precisely formulate grounding claims. A regimentation includes various linguistic policies, including ones specifying which syntactic forms we should use to express grounding relationships. There are two general approaches to regimentation. On the first approach, regimentation is chiefly pragmatic in nature. In this case, we might regiment in one way rather than another merely because doing so will, say, make a certain complicated argument or idea easier to follow or understand. On the second approach, our choices concerning regimentation are guided by the goal of accurately describing the structure of reality.

As for the regimentations themselves, two general frameworks have emerged: predicationists formulate grounding claims with a relational predicate, one corresponding to the English predicate grounds (Audi 2012a; Schaffer 2009; Rosen 2010). Connectivists use a non-truth-functional sentential connective instead, one corresponding to the English operator because (Fine 2012a; Correia 2010; Schneider 2011). Full blown connective regimentations will include a logic of grounding, which on Fine’s (2012a, 2012b) development includes structural rules and properties (e.g., transitivity) and logical rules including introduction and elimination rules. (See Poggiolesi 2020 for a general discussion of the logic of grounding.) Note that each of these approaches to regimentation is compatible with both separatism and unionism (Kovacs 2018: note 28). For further context, note that there is corresponding discussion regarding the proper formulation of truthmaking claims (Melia 2005).

Some claim that a potentially relevant consideration here concerns ontological commitment (Correia 2010). All other things being equal, if one way of formulating grounding claims has fewer ontological commitments than another, then the former is preferable to the latter. Suppose that the connectivist’s connective is understood to be non-committal, so as not to commit us to a grounding operation. And suppose that the predicationist’s predicate is understood to commit us to a grounding relation between facts. In this case, it may be that connectivism has an advantage over predicationism—this depends on whether there are countervailing considerations (e.g., the connective treatment may be relatively cumbersome to work with). But note that the predicationist, of course, might claim that their predicate is non-committal (nominalists, for example, dispute that relational terms commit us to properties and relations), and perhaps there are reasons to think that the connectivist’s connective commits us to a grounding operation. The moral is that we need to establish which terms are committal before any claims of minimizing commitment can be made. (Also, note that, with respect to the potential commitments of predicationism, we may have different attitudes about relations and facts—you might be happy to countenance facts but not relations or vice versa.)

While we will introduce some symbols for expressing facts below, we won’t adopt any particular formal language for expressing grounding relationships, so we needn’t adopt either predicationism or connectivism. For ease of presentation, however, we will formulate grounding claims with the predicate grounds and speak as if this predicate expresses a relation—the grounding relation—such that collections of one or more facts ground particular facts. (See, however, Dasgupta 2014b and Litland 2018a for bicollective conceptions of grounding according to which collections of facts can be non-distributivity grounded.) Where P is an English sentence, let \([P]\) be a function from P to the fact it corresponds to. So [Gomer is a good dog] is the fact that Gomer is a good dog. (We will also indicate propositions in the same manner using angle rather than square brackets.) We assume that grounding is factive in the following sense: \([P],\) \([P'],\) … grounds \([Q]\) only if \([P],\) \([P'],\) … and \([Q]\) obtain. Much of what we go on to say can be captured without recourse to relations and facts, but we won’t attempt to provide such translations.

Before proceeding, we should note that some formulate grounding claims in such a way that all manner of things potentially ground one another, not just facts (Cameron 2008; Schaffer 2009; Wilhelm 2020). The theses of separatism and unionism are relevant here (see §1.1). Given unionism (grounding is explanationG), the restriction to facts seems quite reasonable. While it makes sense to say, for example, that [The truck exists] explains something, it’s unclear what it might mean to say that the truck itself does so (Raven 2015; Trogdon 2013a). But, given separatism (grounding is determinationG), the alternative view is a genuine option. We can coherently maintain that the truck determines its particular redness (a mode), and this, in turn, backs an explanation of the existence of the mode in terms of the existence of the truck.

Moreover, some treat grounding as a quaternary rather than binary relation. One such view is that the grounding relation includes two slots for facts and two slots for modes of presentation of those facts (Jenkins 2011). Another such view is that grounding is contrastive in nature, so it includes two slots for facts and two slots for contrasts of those facts (Schaffer 2012). Consider, again, the claim that [The truckers are picketing] grounds [The truckers are striking]. Depending on the context, we might read the claim as follows: [The truckers are picketing] rather than [They’re working as normal] grounds [The truckers are striking] rather than [It’s not the case that they’re striking]. Schaffer argues that his version of the quaternary view is preferable to the binary view insofar as we can reasonably maintain that grounding is transitive given the former but not the latter (see §2.3 for further discussion of transitivity). Schaffer also suggests that the contrastive treatment of grounding is plausible insofar as it casts grounding in an apt form to back explanation, which is itself contrastive in nature.

1.3 Full and partial grounding

There is a distinction between full and partial grounding. Suppose \([P],\) \([P'],\) … grounds \([Q]\). Speaking in unionist terms, for a preliminary characterization of the distinction we can say that \([P],\) \([P'],\) … partially grounds \([Q]\) when the former facts contribute to explaining the latter; and \([P],\) \([P'],\) … fully grounds \([Q]\) when nothing needs to be added to the former to get a fully adequate explanation of the latter fact. Separatists might instead initially characterize the distinction in terms of partial and full determination.

Sticking with unionism for the moment, we can say that, as any ground contributes to explaining what it grounds, any ground is a partial ground. But not all partial grounds provide fully adequate explanations of what they ground, so not all partial grounds are full grounds. A merely partial ground is a partial ground that isn’t a full ground. By grounding we henceforth mean partial grounding. The example of the truckers picketing above illustrates the notion of merely partial grounding—we would need to add facts about the trucking company and relations between the picketers and the company (e.g., that the picketers work as drivers for the company) to get a fully adequate explanation of the fact that they’re striking. As for full grounding, a common view is that conjunctive facts are fully grounded by their conjuncts—the collection consisting of [The bowl is brittle] and [The truckers are striking], for example, is thought to fully ground [The bowl is brittle and the truckers are striking].

According to the standard definition of partial grounding, \([P],\) \([P'],\) … partially grounds \([Q]\) just in case \([P],\) \([P'],\) … either on its own or together with other facts fully grounds \([Q]\) (Audi 2012a; Litland 2015; Loss 2017; Raven 2013; Rosen 2010; Skiles 2015). You might initially view this definition as being a purely stipulative matter. But it’s actually substantive in nature, as we have a pre-theoretic grip on both partial and full grounding. In fact, Leuenberger (2020) and Trogdon & Witmer (2021) argue that the standard definition is false, proposing cases in which mere partial grounds can’t be supplemented with further facts to yield full grounds. The latter recommend reversing the direction of the standard definition, proposing a definition of full grounding in terms of partial grounding together with other notions.

1.4 Illustrative cases

So far, we have considered four grounding claims, namely:

  • [The truckers are picketing] grounds [The truckers are striking].
  • [The truck exists] grounds [Thus-and-so particular redness exists].
  • [The bowl’s constituent atoms are bonded in thus-and-so way] grounds [The bowl is brittle].
  • [The bowl is brittle], [The truckers are striking] grounds [The bowl is brittle and the truckers are striking].

Now, you might think there is something to grounding, yet at the same time, think that these claims aren’t true. As for the second and fourth examples above, perhaps there are no modes or conjunctive facts. But these are illustrative cases—these claims, whether true or not, help communicate the relevant notion of grounding and thus contribute to fixing the topic of discussion. Let’s try to get a better sense of what the range of illustrative cases looks like.

While there are perhaps different ways of usefully typing illustrative cases, here we focus on three categories. Importantly, this taxonomy isn’t intended to be exhaustive, and it may be that these categories aren’t exclusive either. First, there are metaphysical cases, cases in which entities that \([P],\) \([P'],\) … concern are metaphysically linked with entities \([Q]\) concerns. Our initial example of the truckers picketing is such a case. In this case, [The truckers are picketing] concerns the property of picketing, and the [The truckers are striking] concerns the property of striking. Plausibly, the property of striking is a functional property (a property whose nature is exhausted by its causal role), one functionally realized by the property of picketing on this occasion (as opposed to, say, the property of engaging in a work slowdown). The brittleness and mode examples look like metaphysical cases as well, where mereological realization and mode determination yoke the relevant entities in these cases, respectively. For other cases of this type, consider the following sentences, where "{Beijing}" refers to the set whose sole member is Beijing, and <The truck is red> refers to the proposition that the truck is red:

  • [Beijing exists] grounds [{Beijing} exists].
  • [The grains of sand exist] grounds [The heap of sand exists].
  • [The truck is red] grounds [<The truck is red> is true].

Plausibly, Beijing stands in the set formation relation to {Beijing}, the grains of sand compose the heap, and the truck is a truthmaker for <The truck is red> (i.e., the former makes the latter true).

Second, there are logical cases, grounding claims that correspond to certain logical inference rules, particularly introduction rules (cf. McSweeney 2020 and Merlo 2020). Just which introduction rules are relevant here will depend, in part, upon whether grounding is worldly in nature (see §2.1 for discussion). The conjunctive case concerning the bowl being brittle and the truckers striking above is such a case, which of course corresponds to conjunction introduction. For other examples, consider the following two cases, which correspond to disjunction and existential introduction, respectively:

  • [The truck is red] grounds [The truck is red or the bowl is brittle].
  • [The truck is red] grounds [Something is red].

Third, there are conceptual cases, grounding claims that correspond to certain conceptually necessary conditionals (cf. Smithson 2020). For example, you might think that it’s conceptually necessary that if the truck is burgundy then the truck is red. The corresponding grounding claim:

  • [The truck is burgundy] grounds [The truck is red].

For further examples of this type, consider:

  • [Trucks are essentially artifacts] grounds [It’s necessary that any truck is an artifact].
  • [The figure is a rectangle with sides of equal length] grounds [The figure is a square].

The thought is that it’s conceptually necessary that if trucks are essentially artifacts, then it’s necessary that any truck is an artifact; and it’s conceptually necessary that if the figure is a rectangle with sides of equal length, then the figure is a square.

As mentioned above, these categories are aren’t intended to be exclusive or exhaustive. With respective to exclusivity, the example of the burgundy truck above is perhaps both conceptual and metaphysical, as burgundy and red stand in the determinate-determinable relation, a relation that plausibly underwrites metaphysical links between properties.

So far, we’ve focused on specific grounding claims (i.e., claims to the effect that this collection of facts grounds that fact), but various generic grounding claims are illustrative cases as well. There are illustrative generic grounding claims corresponding to the specific grounding claims discussed above, such as:

  • Facts concerning the instantiation of determinate properties ground facts concerning the instantiation of determinable properties.

Here’s another example, one not connected to any specific grounding claim we have discussed so far:

  • Chemical facts ground biological facts.

This last example speaks to the idea that grounding relations between different kinds of facts are that in virtue of which the world has a layered structure (see §3.2 for related discussion).

1.5 Historical connections

There are interesting and difficult questions about grounding, its history, and what its relationship to the history of philosophy is. On one view, the notion of grounding is old, perhaps as old as philosophy itself, with many of its most important thinkers engaging with questions related to grounding. On another view, the notion of grounding is decidedly new—it’s a recent development in contemporary analytic metaphysics.

Can we reconcile the grounding-is-old and grounding-is-new views? The distinction between questions of grounding and questions about grounding is helpful here (Raven 2019). To take but one well-worn example, when Socrates asks in the Euthyphro if someone is pious because they are loved by the gods, or if they are loved by the gods because they are pious, perhaps Plato is directing our attention to a question of grounding. When in the contemporary literature, philosophers are debating about whether grounding is, say, a strict order (see §2.3), this is the result of their asking questions about grounding. Historically, so the thinking goes, philosophers have been interested in questions of grounding, whereas the contemporary literature has been primarily focused on questions about grounding. There is a sense, then, in which the notion of grounding is as old as the hills, with the more recent focus in the literature being directed at the notion itself.

Although this characterization is appealing, it has its limitations. Clearly, contemporary philosophers are interested in questions of grounding in addition to questions about grounding. What might be less clear, however, is that, on the face it, the historical literature is by no means short of attempts at engaging with questions about grounding in addition to questions of grounding. Consider, for example, cosmological arguments. In broad strokes, the thought is that the totality of contingent entities, the cosmos, stands in need of explanation, and only considerations involving God understood as a necessary existent are up to the task. Central to such arguments is an assumption according to which we can’t explain why there are contingent entities by appealing to the existence of a contingent entity. Debate has raged for centuries over how exactly we ought to understand this assumption and whether or not we ought to believe it. Importantly, this assumption is generally understood as a kind of no circularity assumption. In debating whether the assumption is correct, historical figures are, albeit indirectly, debating whether or not the relation at issue can have reflexive instances. The same goes for discussions around God’s nature as a self-causer. If the relation at issue is that of grounding, then the history of philosophy is rich in discussions about grounding.

Ultimately, however, it seems that the “Is grounding old or new?” question should give way to nuanced and text-based discussions of structural similarities and causal continuities between specific thinkers. As this entry will make clear, contemporary figures don’t fully agree on the concept of grounding. Hence, it seems that there is little to be gained by asking whether thus-and-so historical figures used the same notion as the contemporary figures, as the contemporary figures aren’t using the same notion themselves! Beyond tracing out similarities and differences in content of various notions employed by historical figures and paths of historical development, the question of whether grounding is old or new will apparently always be a crude generalization over these similarities and continuities. And note that there is nothing special about grounding in this regard—the same could be said for virtually any philosophically interesting concept, such as causation or necessity. (For discussions of historical connections to the ancient period, see, e.g., Corkum 2016 and 2020, Evans 2012, and Malink 2020; for the early and late modern periods, see, e.g., Amijee 2020, Bliss 2019, Casati 2018, Mulligan 2020, Pearce 2017, Roski 2017, 2020, and Stang 2019.)

2. The Nature of Grounding

There are a variety of issues to address related to the nature of grounding. In this section we focus on objectivity, representation, hyperintensionality, non-monotonicity, whether grounding is a strict order, and whether grounding is well-founded. There are other interesting issues concerning the nature of grounding that we don’t have the space to discuss here. One such issue is that of meta-ground, viz. what if anything grounds the facts about what grounds what (see Litland 2020 for an overview).

2.1 Objectivity and representation

What are the central features of grounding? Grounding theorists routinely claim that grounding is fully objective. But, given that objectivity and related notions are used in a variety of ways in philosophy, it comes as no surprise that there are different ways of understanding precisely what is being claimed here. On one approach, the issue chiefly concerns the regimentation of grounding discourse. If grounding claims are to be formulated with a parameter for facts concerning human mental activity, then grounding isn’t fully objective (Dasgupta 2017). On a more “metaphysical” approach, the issue instead chiefly concerns the essence or nature of grounding, specifically whether grounding is essentially connected to subjects. Suppose, for example, that part of what it is to be grounding is that \([P],\) \([P'],\) … grounds \([Q]\) only if certain epistemic conditions obtain (e.g., actual subjects are in a position to understand certain propositions concerning \([P],\) \([P'],\) … and \([Q]\)). In this case, grounding isn’t objective.

What might speak in favor of objectivism about grounding? Perhaps our considered views about causation should guide our theorizing about grounding (cf. Bernstein 2015). Schaffer (2016a) conceives of grounding as being broadly analogous to causation and proposes to extend the familiar structural equation models for causation to grounding. And A. Wilson (2018) argues that grounding is indeed a type of causation, proposing an interventionist account of grounding. So, provided that it’s a bad idea to outfit causal claims with a parameter for facts concerning human mental activity, this is probably a bad idea for grounding claims as well (cf. Bernstein 2018). Subjectivism (the claim that, while some facts ground other facts, grounding isn’t fully objective), however, isn’t beyond the pale. One potential route to subjectivism is this: endorse unionism (grounding is explanationG) and argue that explanationG is by its nature subject involving (Maurin 2019; Thompson 2018).

Roughly speaking, the representational approach to grounding has it that grounding is intimately tied to representation (Fine 2012a; Rosen 2010), while the worldly approach denies this (Audi 2012b; Schaffer 2012). While the representational/worldly distinction is somewhat hazy, we understand it to be orthogonal to the objective/subjective distinction. One way to sharpen the distinction between the representational and worldly approaches is as follows: on the former, the relata of grounding have concepts among their constituents; on the latter, this isn’t the case (Krämer & Roski 2015; Correia 2017). So understood, the representational approach comes in two varieties: either facts are composed entirely of concepts or they’re a mixture of concepts and non-representational items like objects and properties. On the former view, facts are akin to Fregean propositions; on the latter view, they’re instead akin to ordered sets of concepts and non-representational items. (See Correia 2010 for a discussion of the distinction between the representational and worldly approaches where it isn’t assumed that grounding is a relation.)

What hinges on whether grounding is representational or worldly? This isn’t entirely clear. You might think that grounding being worldly ensures that the relata of grounding are relatively coarse-grained, and grounding being representational ensures that the relata of grounding are relatively fine-grained. Consider the following two facts: [The liquid is H2O] and [The liquid is water]. Representationalists, so the thinking goes, might claim that we have distinct facts here, as they have different concepts as constituents. And proponents of the worldly approach might claim that we have only one fact here, as there is no difference in constituents or manner of combination. And this, of course, is potentially relevant to theorizing about grounding—if [The liquid is H2O] and [The liquid is water] are the same fact, then the claim that the former grounds the latter or vice versa is false provided that grounding is irreflexive (see §2.3). Note, however, that representationalists can coherently maintain that facts are relatively coarse-grained—perhaps they think that, while facts are Fregean propositions, concepts are relatively coarse-grained (Correia 2020). And proponents of the worldly approach can coherently maintain that facts are relatively fine-grained—perhaps they think that, while facts are true Russellian propositions (ordered sets of non-representational items including properties), properties are relatively fine-grained (Dorsey 2015).

You might also think that if grounding is worldly then unionism is false. The idea is that, if grounding is worldly, then grounding can’t be a type of explanation, as explanation itself is representational. There are, however, conceptions of explanation relative to which explanation is non-representational, and a worldly unionist is free to appeal to explanation so conceived (Skiles and Trogdon 2021).

2.2 Hyperintensionality and non-monotonicity

Grounding theorists also routinely claim that grounding is hyperintensional (Bader 2013; Leuenberger 2014; Schaffer 2009). This issue concerns what linguistic distinctions grounding is sensitive to. It will be helpful to begin by considering the hyperintensionality of belief. Consider the following belief attribution:

  • Amy believes that Mark Twain was a humorist.

Note that, were we to replace

  • Mark Twain was a humorist

as it appears in this belief attribution with a necessarily co-extensional expression such as

  • Samuel Clemens was a humorist

the resulting belief attribution may have a different truth-value than the original one. This is the sense in which belief is thought to be hyperintensional.

We can understand the claim that grounding is hyperintensional in a similar way. Consider again the following grounding claim:

  • [Beijing exists] grounds [{Beijing} exists].

Were we to replace

  • [Beijing exists]

as it appears in this grounding claim with a necessarily co-extensional expression such as

  • [{Beijing} exists]

the resulting grounding claim may have a different truth-value than the original one. In this case, it seems that the two grounding claims do in fact differ in truth-value—while the original grounding claim is true, the resulting one is presumably false. (See Duncan, Miller, & Norton 2017 for discussion of the relationship between grounding and various senses of hyperintensionality.)

Grounding theorists also normally claim that grounding is non-monotonic (Audi 2012a; Guigon 2018; Rosen 2010). Logical entailment is monotonic in the following sense: if one sentence logically entails another, then the first sentence together with any other sentence logically entails the second. Returning to grounding, suppose that \([P],\) \([P'],\) … grounds \([Q]\). And suppose that \([R],\) \([R'],\) … obtain. Grounding is non-monotonic just in case these suppositions are compatible with it not being the case that \([P],\) \([P'],\) … together with \([R],\) \([R'],\) … grounds \([Q]\). To take an example, consider again [Beijing exists] grounds [{Beijing} exists]. Rather than replacing [Beijing exists] in this sentence with something else as we did above, let’s add some other nominalized true sentence to it such as [Gomer is a good dog]. The resulting sentence (i.e., [Beijing exists], [Gomer is a good dog] grounds [{Beijing} exists]) is clearly false, while our original grounding claim (we’re supposing, anyway) is true.

2.3 Strict ordering

Some claim that grounding is a strict order—it’s transitive, irreflexive, and asymmetric (Correia 2010; Fine 2012a; Raven 2013). One way to argue that grounding has some or all of these features is to embrace separatism (grounding is determinationG) and argue that determinationG or determination in general has some or all of them (Audi 2012a). Another option is to embrace unionism (grounding is explanationG), focusing on the features of explanationG or explanation in general (Raven 2015). Another way, still, is to argue that, given either separatism or unionism, grounding plays the theoretical roles normally assigned to it only if it has some or all of these features (Kovacs 2018). These strategies can be used to argue that grounding has further properties as well. For example, Litland (2013) and Raven (2015) claim that explanation in general is non-monotonic, so, given unionism, grounding is as well; and Audi (2012a) claims that determination in general is non-monotonic, so, given separatism, grounding is as well.

While the view that grounding is a strict-order is the prevailing view, what reasons might there be to think otherwise? (As Bliss & Priest [2018b] note, there are various possible combinations of formal properties that we may wish to ultimately consider.) Let’s begin with transitivity. Consider the following case, adapted from one that Schaffer (2012) proposes. Suppose that the following claims are true, where g is a metal globe:

[g is dented in thus-and-so way] grounds [g has determinate shape S].
[g has determinate shape S] grounds [g is more-or-less spherical].

If grounding is transitive, then the following is true as well:

[g is dented in thus-and-so way] grounds [g is more-or-less spherical].

You might think, however, that (3) is false—as Schaffer puts the idea, “The thing is more-or-less spherical despite the minor dent, not because of it” (2012: 127). Note that (1) concerns merely partial grounding, while (2) concerns full grounding. But, as any merely partial ground is a partial ground, and any full ground is a partial ground, we can read (1)–(3) as targeting partial grounding, so there is no equivocation here.

How might proponents of transitivity respond? Litland (2013) proposes that we can add a fact to the merely partial ground for [g has determinate shape S] to get a full ground:

[g is dented in thus-and-so way], [g elsewhere has determinate shape \(S'\)] fully grounds [g has determinate shape S].

Given that (2) also concerns full grounding, the transitive inference from (4) and (2) is the following:

[g is dented in thus-and-so way], [g elsewhere has determinate shape \(S'\)] fully grounds [g is more-or-less spherical].

Litland claims that (5) is plausible, or at least as plausible as (1) and (2). And, provided that any collection of facts that is a full ground is such that any fact among that collection is a partial ground, (3) follows from (5). (See Raven 2015 for a similar treatment of this case; see also Rodriguez-Pereyra 2015 and Tahko 2013 for potential counterexamples to transitivity involving truth.)

Turning to irreflexivity, Bliss (2018) critically assesses the general theoretical motivations for thinking that grounding is irreflexive. Lowe (1998: 145) suggests that self-explanatory states of affairs are epistemically possible, so perhaps a characterization of grounding shouldn’t rule this out. Historically, certain influential thinkers have thought that the fact that God exists, for example, is a self-explanatory state of affairs. Fine (2010) and Krämer (2013) also discuss various cases that seem to involve violations of irreflexivity. Here is a case along the lines of those they discuss—consider the following fact: [Some fact or other obtains]. Some facts do indeed obtain, so of course [Some fact or other obtains] itself obtains. And it seems that any fact that obtains is something that grounds this fact. Since [Some fact or other obtains] is itself a fact that obtains, it follows that this fact grounds itself!

In response to cases like this, Woods (2018) distinguishes between what he calls vacuous and non-vacuous grounding. Woods suggests that cases like [Some fact or other obtains] involve vacuous grounding, and, while vacuous grounding isn’t irreflexive, non-vacuous grounding is. Roughly speaking, \([P],\) \([P'],\) … vacuously grounds \([Q]\) when the former grounds the latter, yet the identity and nature of the constituents of \([P],\) \([P'],\) … aren’t explanatorily relevant to \([Q]\) obtaining. Perhaps [The truck is red] is a vacuous ground for [Some fact or other obtains]—while the former grounds the latter, it seems that the identity and nature of the truck and the property of being red don’t contribute to explaining why [Some fact or other] obtains.

Turning to asymmetry, Bliss (2014) and Thompson (2016, 2018) critically assess the general theoretical motivations for thinking that grounding is asymmetric and propose potential counterexamples. Thompson suggests that, given the functional relationship between mass, volume, and density (the density of a substance is its mass divided its volume), we should accept that, say, [g has 3cm3 volume] grounds [g has 2g/cm3 density] and vice versa. It’s worth noting, however, that many reciprocal functional relationships don’t involve symmetric grounding. As Alexander Skiles has suggested to us in conversation, there is, for example, a reciprocal functional relationship between how many things are Socrates and how many members Socrates’ singleton has, but it’s clear in which direction the grounding runs in this case.

2.4 Well-foundedness

Another issue is whether grounding is well-founded. Different authors mean different things in claiming that grounding is well-founded. According to Schaffer, grounding is well-founded in the sense that downwardly non-terminating chains of grounds are impossible. In conceiving of grounding as a relation between entities in general and not just facts, Schaffer’s rationale concerns the notion of reality inheritance. Schaffer claims that, were there downwardly non-terminating grounding chains, the being of any object in such a chain would be “infinitely deferred, never achieved” (2010: 62). Something “…cannot be real merely by having a limitless sequence of ancestors, each claiming reality from its parents”; instead, “There must actually be a source of reality somewhere” (2016a: 95). This echoes Leibniz, who claims that in the event that every object is a being of aggregation, “one never arrives at any real being” (Adams 1994: 333).

Others claim that grounding is well-founded in the sense that any grounded fact is ultimately grounded by ungrounded facts (Dixon 2016; Rabin & Rabern 2016). Note that this conception of the well-foundedness of grounding, in contrast to the one above, allows for infinitely descending grounding chains. How so? Following Bliss (2013) and Rabin and Rabern (2016), consider Euclidean space, which is comprised of points and regions that include those points. Suppose that regions are gunky in that every region has a region as a proper part. And suppose that the existence facts concerning regions are grounded by the existence facts concerning their sub-regions, the existence facts concerning sub-regions are grounded by the existence facts concerning their sub-sub-regions, and so on, ad infinitum. Hence, the fact that region R exists is a member of an infinitely descending grounding chain. But suppose that the existence facts concerning regions are also grounded by the existence facts concerning points. Suppose, moreover, that the existence facts concerning points lack grounds. Hence, while the fact that R exists is a member of an infinitely descending grounding chain, this fact nonetheless is grounded in facts that themselves lack grounds. The same applies to all the other facts that are links in the grounding chain in question.

It may be that, if considerations involving reality inheritance are relevant here, they ultimately support the idea that grounding is well-founded in the second sense rather than the first. While there may be something wrong about reality inheritance in the absence of a source of reality, perhaps there is nothing wrong about endless reality inheritance per se. (See Puryear 2020 for discussion of the historical context of reality inheritance and Trogdon 2018b for further discussion of reality inheritance in the contemporary context.)

3. Why Think There is Grounding?

3.1 Arguments from theoretical utility

That grounding figures in ordinary and philosophical thinking (and perhaps other domains as well) and that many grounding claims are fairly easy to evaluate (e.g., [Beijing exists] grounds [{Beijing} exists]) gives us defeasible reason to think that there is grounding (deRosset 2020). What else can be said on behalf of grounding? Proponents of grounding tend to think that it’s a justified posit on the basis of its theoretical utility. In this section we set out three theoretical utility arguments for grounding that involve unity, explanation, and the direction of priority.

The unity argument says that grounding is a justified posit because of its unifying role (Audi 2012a; Rosen 2010; Schaffer 2009). On one way of casting the argument, it has three premises. First, there is substantial unity among the metaphysical relations (relations familiar from metaphysics such as functional realization and set formation that resist analysis in purely modal terms). Second, where there is substantial unity, plausibly there is a unifier, something that explains why the relations in question resemble one another in the manner they do. Third, if there is a unifier for the metaphysical relations, the best candidate is grounding.

The explanation argument says that grounding is a justified posit because of its explanatory role (Audi 2012a; Dasgupta 2014a; Fine 2012a; Litland 2017; Schaffer 2016a). Recalling the distinction between unionism and separatism (see §1.1), the argument proceeds differently depending on which view is in play (Kovacs 2017). Given separatism (grounding is determinationG), one way to cast the explanation argument is as follows: there is a form of explanation—what we can call ontic explanation—such that explanations of this form are backed by worldly relations; and, among the ontic explanations are ones such that the best candidate for the relation that plays the backing role is determinationG. Given unionism (grounding is explanationG), one way to cast the argument is as follows: there is a form of explanation, what we can call metaphysical explanation, such that the connections in metaphysical explanations are best expressed in terms of explanationG.

The priority argument says that grounding is a justified posit because of its direction-fixing role—it fixes the direction of priority between facts, where one fact is prior to another only if the former is more fundamental than the latter. (See §4.3 for further discussion of fundamentality; J. Wilson (2014) initially proposes the priority argument but rejects it—more on this below.) Let a priority case be one in which some fact is prior to another and entities these facts concern are yoked by metaphysical relations. One way to cast the priority argument is as follows: there are priority cases in which the direction of metaphysical relations doesn’t determine which fact is prior to the other; and the best candidate for that which fixes the direction of priority in such cases is grounding.

We can cast arguments for grounding in terms of theoretical roles in addition to those specified by the unity, explanation, and priority arguments as well. Some, for example, claim that the thesis of physicalism (roughly, the view that the world is ultimately physical in nature) is usefully formulated in terms of grounding (Block 2015; Dasgupta 2014a; Schaffer 2017b). With respect to physicalism about the mental in particular (roughly, the view that mental phenomena are nothing over and above physical phenomena), a simple grounding-theoretic formulation of the view is this: the mental facts are grounded by (non-mental) physical facts (perhaps together with other non-mental facts such as indexical and totality facts). It’s by now a familiar idea that purely modal formulations of physicalism are inadequate, as there are coherent versions of dualism that such formulations don’t rule out (Horgan 1993, 2006). Hence, one point in favor of appealing to grounding in this context is that grounding isn’t a purely modal notion. And Block (2015) argues that even physicalism formulated in terms of a priori entailment faces the same problem, pointing to a particular grounding formulation of physicalism as the way to resolve the issue.

As for further potential theoretical applications, some have proposed grounding-theoretic accounts of:

  • the nature of properties (Audi 2016; Carmichael 2016);
  • the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties—roughly, properties that something has just in virtue of how that thing is (e.g., being made of tin) vs. properties something has because of how it's related to wholly distinct things (e.g., being next to a tin cup) (Rosen 2010; Witmer et al 2005);
  • what it is for an object (e.g., Socrates) in contrast to a word (e.g., ‘Socrates’) to have a definition (Rosen 2015);
  • what it is for one claim to reduce to another (Fine 2001)
  • what it is for the world to be stratified into levels (Rabin 2018; Schaffer 2012);
  • how moral facts (e.g., facts about what we’re morally obligated to do) are related to natural facts (e.g., facts concerning what maximizes utility) (Rosen 2017);
  • the special explanatory gap between the experiential and physical truths (Rabin 2019; Trogdon forthcoming);
  • what it is for the existence of certain entities to depend on the existence of others (Schnieder 2020);
  • what it is for truths to be such that things in the world make them true (Correia 2014; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005; Schnieder 2006);
  • what it is for one theory to be more parsimonious than another (Schaffer 2013);
  • the nature of free will and moral responsibility (Sartorio 2013);
  • what it is for something (e.g., gender) to be a social construction (Griffith 2018; Schaffer 2017a);
  • the historically important view that everything has an explanation (Amijee 2020a; Dasgupta 2016; K. McDaniel 2019; Schnieder & Steinberg 2015);
  • how multiple objects can exist at the same place and time (Saenz 2015);
  • the view that only present things exist (Baron 2014);
  • the relation between being F (e.g., being blue) and having the property F-ness (e.g., having blueness) (Dixon 2018);
  • how mental events (e.g., pain) can cause physical events (e.g., wincing) given that such physical events have physical causes (e.g., C-fiber firing) (Clark & Wildman 2018; Kroedel & Schulz 2016); Stenwall 2021; Tiehen 2015).

This is by no means an exhaustive list—there is something of a cottage industry of developing grounding-theoretic accounts of items of philosophical interest.

3.2 Skeptical responses

Some are skeptical of grounding. A distinction can be drawn between what we might call first-wave and second-wave grounding skepticism (see Koslicki 2020, though she uses different terminology). First-wave skepticism is characterized by a general concern about the intelligibility of the notion. Daly (2012) argues that the notion of grounding doesn’t really make sense. In a similar spirit, Hofweber (2009) states that grounding theorists are guilty of engaging in a problematic form of metaphysics—while they make use of perfectly ordinary terms such as priority, fundamental and ultimately, they use them in a distinctively non-ordinary, metaphysical way. (For non-skeptical rejoinders to first-wave skepticism, see Audi 2012b and Raven 2012.) Second-wave skeptics, by contrast, generally grant that the notion of grounding is coherent, but they think that it doesn’t belong in our theoretical toolkit in any case, as the arguments in favor of positing grounding aren’t persuasive. What unites second-wave skeptics is a shared sense that grounding theorizing is simultaneously undermotivated and overreaching.

With respect to the unity argument, Koslicki (2015) and J. Wilson (2016a) challenge the second premise, arguing that, even if the metaphysical relations (or some sub-collection thereof) are substantially unified, this on its own wouldn’t give us a good reason to posit a generic relation of grounding as a unifier. J. Wilson (2014) challenges the first premise as well, arguing that there is a class of metaphysical relations, what she calls the small-g grounding relations, that are neither terminologically, formally, nor metaphysically unified. Relatedly, Turner (2016) describes various differences in the way certain kinds of grounding claims behave, ultimately distinguishing between two forms of grounding, dependence-grounding and realization-grounding. (For non-skeptical rejoinders to these challenges, see Raven 2017, and Schaffer 2016b.)

Roughly speaking, monists claim that there is ultimately just one core type of grounding, while pluralists claim that there are different types and no core type. It’s important to note that being a pluralist about grounding doesn’t necessarily make you a grounding skeptic, at least given how we understand the usage of the terms. It’s true that some pluralists, as we’ve just seen, are skeptics. But not all of them are. For example, Fine (2012a), a proponent of grounding if anyone is, stresses the differences between various forms of grounding, rejecting the idea that they are unified in a way that might motivate positing a genetic form of grounding. Just what might make it fitting to call one pluralist view a version of skepticism about grounding and another pluralist view non-skeptical instead is perhaps worth further thought. (For further discussion of monism and pluralism about grounding, see Berker 2018, Cohen 2020, Griffith 2014, Litland 2018b, Rettler 2017, and Richardson 2020 and 2021.)

As for the explanation argument, Kovacs (2017) objects to both the separatist and unionist versions set out above. For example, Kovacs argues that, with respect to the former version of the argument, worldly relations such as necessitation taken together with facts about their relata, rather than determinationG, back ontic explanations. Relatedly, Miller and Norton (2017) propose an explanation of why you might judge, say, that {Beijing} exists because Beijing exists that doesn’t appeal to grounding. And Norton and Miller (2019) propose an account of the truth conditions for statements of such explanations that doesn’t appeal to grounding.

Returning to the priority argument, there are two types of priority cases to consider: cases in which the prior fact is fundamental, and cases in which neither the prior nor posterior facts are fundamental. J. Wilson (2014, 2016a) develops a proposal according to which a primitive notion of fundamentality plays the direction-fixing role in priority cases of the first type. And this primitive notion and other grounding-free considerations (e.g., modal considerations) play the direction-fixing role in cases of the second type. (For non-skeptical rejoinders, see Cameron 2016 and Raven 2017.)

What about additional theoretical applications of grounding? Returning to the application to physicalism discussed above, J. Wilson (2014) points out that, as there are importantly different approaches to grounding (ones disagreeing about, e.g., how grounding interacts with reduction, necessitation, and real definition—see §4), the bald grounding claim that the physical grounds the mental doesn’t on its own speak to even very basic characteristics of the mental-physical interface. A natural response, however, is to simply work in this context with an approach to grounding that is fleshed out to a degree that such issues aren’t left open (deRosset 2020; cf. J. Wilson 2016a). Still, questions about the theoretical utility of grounding-theoretic formulations of physicalism remain, including whether the nothing-over-and-above notion central to initial characterizations of physicalism is best captured in terms of grounding (Melnyk 2016; J. Wilson 2016b).

To take another example, Sider (2011: Ch. 8; 2020) questions whether grounding is apt to play the role of a level connector. Intuitively, the world has an overarching structure where entities occupy different levels of reality. One way to formulate the view that grounding is a level connector is this: different levels of reality are connected to one another by virtue of grounding relations between facts characterizing occupants of these levels. With this in mind, consider the fundamental physical level and a higher level, one occupied by cities. The grounding theorist might claim that these levels are connected partly in virtue of the fact that some quantum-mechanical fact, Q, grounds the fact, N, that New York is a city. But Sider asks: what is the grounding profile of this grounding fact? On the face of it, [Q grounds N] itself is ungrounded. Roughly speaking, the worry is this: provided that any entity that an ungrounded fact concerns is fundamental in nature, it follows that New York is a fundamental entity. Hence, it may be that in using grounding to explain how different levels of reality are connected, we get unacceptable results about which entities are fundamental. (See §4.3 for more on fundamentality; for an overview of views according to which facts like [Q grounds N] are grounded, see Litland 2020.)

For a different skeptical take on grounding related to its theoretical applications, Della Rocca (2014) and Tallant (2018: Ch. 5) argue, very roughly, that various metaphysical claims (e.g., material objects persist over time and truths have truthmakers) are false, as these claims are ultimately about what grounds what but there is no grounding.

4. Interaction with Other Notions

In this section we focus on how grounding might be related to the notions of necessity, essence, and fundamentality. There are interesting issues concerning the relationship between grounding and other phenomena that we don’t have the space to discuss here. In addition to the examples listed at the beginning of this entry (e.g., real definition and truthmaking), one such issue concerns the relation between grounding and degrees of reality. Indeed, K. McDaniel (2017: Ch. 8) sketches an account of the former in terms of the latter.

4.1 Necessity

How do grounding and necessity interact? Let \([P],\) \([P'],\) … (metaphysically) necessitate \([Q]\) just in case any (metaphysically) possible world in which the former obtains is a world in which the latter obtains. The broad consensus is that necessity isn’t sufficient for grounding—it’s not the case that if \([P],\) \([P'],\) … necessitate \([Q]\), then the former ground the latter. (B. McDaniel 2019, however, argues that a restricted form of necessitation is sufficient—as well as necessary—for grounding.) Consider a necessary fact such as [\(2+3=5\)]. While this fact might have grounds, facts about, say, German Expressivist art aren’t among them; yet the latter necessitate the former. Also, there are cases in which the direction of necessitation and grounding come apart. Plausibly, [{Beijing} exists] necessitates [Beijing exists], yet presumably the later grounds the former rather than the other way around.

There are, however, two other issues about the relationship between grounding and necessity that are less of a settled matter. The first is whether it’s necessary that (full) grounds necessitate what they ground—according to necessitarianism, necessitation is necessary for grounding. The second is whether grounding is an internal relation in the following sense: it’s necessary that if \([P],\) \([P'],\) … (fully) grounds \([Q]\), then any metaphysically possible world in which \([P],\) \([P'],\) … and \([Q]\) obtain is a world in which the former (fully) grounds the latter. According to internalism, grounding is internal in this sense. Internalism entails necessarianism but not vice versa. Due to limitations of space, we focus on necessitarianism in what follows. (See Bennett 2011, Litland 2015, Carnino 2017, and Lovett 2019 for discussion of internalism.)

Following Skiles 2020, there are at least three ways to go about motivating necessitarianism. One appeals to essences: every instance of grounding is mediated by essential truths that characterize the grounds and what they ground or entities these facts concern (see §4.2); these essential truths are themselves necessary; and grounds together with these essential truths suffice for what they ground (Audi 2012a; O’Conaill 2017; Trogdon 2013b). Another appeals to explanation: it’s necessary that grounds explain what they ground in a distinctive way; and, for any explanation of this type, its explanans suffices for its explanandum (deRosset 2010). And another appeals to laws: every instance of grounding is subsumed by a metaphysical law; the metaphysical laws are themselves necessary; and grounds together with the relevant metaphysical laws suffice for what they ground (Wilsch 2015).

What might a counterexample to necessitarianism look like? Following Skiles (2015), suppose that the following accidental generalization obtains:

[All Fs are Gs].

And suppose that exactly n things are F; let them be \(a_1\), \(a_2,\) … \(a_n\). While

\([a_1\) is G, \(a_2\) is G, … \(a_n\) is G]

clearly doesn’t necessitate (1), Skiles proposes that the latter fully grounds the former. Grounding necessitarians might reply that here we have mere partial grounding—to get a full ground for (1), to (2) we would need to add

[The only F things are \(a_1\), \(a_2,\ldots\) \(a_n\)].

Skiles considers this reply, noting that (3) is itself an accidental generalization, one that presumably has full grounds. Hence, this fact too stands in need a necessitating ground provided that necessitarianism is true. What then fully grounds (3)? A natural proposal is that

\(a_1\) is F, \(a_2\) is F, … and \(a_n\) is F.
\(a_{n+1}\) is not F, \(a_{n+2}\) is not F, … and \(a_{n+m}\) is not F.
For any x, \(x = a_1\) or \(x = a_2\), or … \(x = a_{n+m}\).

does so. And note that these facts together necessitate (3). But what is the grounding profile of (6)? Intuitively,

\(a_1\) exists, \(a_2\) exists, …. and \(a_{n+m}\) exists

grounds (6). You might claim that (7) is a non-necessitating full ground of (6). But one option for necessitarians is to argue that (7) is instead a special sort of merely partial ground, one that can’t be augmented with further facts to yield a full ground. This is how Trogdon and Witmer (2021) treat this case and, as a consequence, reject the standard definition of partial grounding (see §1.3). (See Chudnoff 2016; Ch. 6 and Leuenberger 2014 for discussion of other potential counterexamples to necessitarianism).

4.2 Essence

How do grounding and essence interact? On the relevant notion of essence, essence isn’t a purely modal matter—while all essential truths about some item (truths that characterize what it is to be that item) are necessary, not all necessary truths about some item are essential truths about it (Fine 1994). For example, anything that is identical to Beijing is a city, and this is a candidate essential truth about Beijing. But, while it’s necessary that Beijing exists only if {Beijing} exists, this isn’t a candidate essential truth about the city (though it’s a candidate essential truth about {Beijing}). Intuitively, you can know everything there is to know about what it is to be Beijing and not thereby know anything about sets.

We begin with an essence-to-grounding principle, one specifying a potential entailment from truths about essence to truths about what grounds what. According to Rosen (2010), for any x, if it’s essential to x that P, then [It’s essential to x that P] grounds \([P]\) (see also Dasgupta 2016 and Kment 2014: Ch. 6). Rosen points out that this principle, if true, may clarify the grounding profile of certain universal facts. For example, perhaps [It’s essential to triangularity that all triangles have three sides] grounds [All triangles have three sides]. (See Glazier 2017 and Zylstra 2019b for critical discussion.)

Turning to grounding-to-essence principles, some, such as Correia (2013), O’Conaill (2018), and Trogdon (2013b), focus in this context on putative essential truths that themselves don’t directly concern grounding (e.g., part of what it is to be the property of being maroon is that, for any x, if x is maroon, then x is red). Others, such as Audi (2012a), focus on corresponding essential truths that encode information about what grounds what (e.g., part of what it is to be the property of being maroon is that, for any x, if x is maroon, then [x is maroon] grounds [x is red]). Let’s focus on putative essential truths of the former, grounding-free variety, where these truths are understood to characterize facts rather than entities they concern.

You might think that, if \([P]\), \([P'],\) … grounds \([Q],\) then part of what it is to \([Q]\) is that if \([P],\) \([P'],\) … obtains then \([Q]\) obtains. As Fine (2012a) notes, however, there are potential counterexamples. While [Socrates is a philosopher] grounds [Someone is a philosopher], on the face of it no essential truth about the latter encodes information about Socrates in particular. One possibility is to weaken the proposal so that the essential truths may characterize either \([P],\) \([P'],\) … or \([Q]\). (A further consideration is whether we should understand this principle as allowing for the relevant essential truths to be irreducibly collective.) Fine (2012a) takes a different route, claiming that, whenever some facts ground another fact, there will be some true generalization of this grounding connection that

  1. doesn’t mention the grounds;
  2. suffices, together with the grounds, for the grounded; and
  3. is an essential truth about the grounded.

With respect to the case just mentioned, Fine proposes that this is the relevant generalization: for any x, if x is a philosopher, then [x is a philosopher] grounds [Someone is a philosopher]. Fine notes that this principle, if true, suggests a top-down approach to establishing what grounds what, one where we begin with those facts we take to be grounded and then work our way down to their grounds.

As Rosen notes (2010), however, these principles rule out so-called Moorean connections, grounding connections that aren’t mediated by essential truths. If, say, non-reductive physicalism about the mental is best formulated in terms of Moorean connections as Rosen suggests, then the above grounding-to-essence principle has the undesirable result of ruling out what is arguably the dominant view concerning the metaphysics of mind.

While we don’t have the space to explore these proposals here, some have proposed not just essence-to-grounding or grounding-to-essence principles but full-blown accounts of essence in terms of grounding or vice versa. deRosset (2013) and Gorman (2014) propose accounts of essence in terms of grounding. (See Zylstra 2018 for critical discussion.) Correia (2013) and Zylstra (2019a) instead propose accounts of grounding in terms of essence. Finally, some have proposed accounts of both essence and grounding in terms of some third item—Fine (2015) does so in terms of constitutively necessary and sufficient conditions, and Correia and Skiles (2019) in terms of generalized identity. (See Zylstra 2020 for critical discussion of each of the above accounts.)

4.3 Fundamentality

How are grounding and fundamentality related? Here we focus on fundamentality with respect to facts, as opposed to, say, entity or theory fundamentality. There are two general types of fundamentality, relative and absolute. As for relative fundamentality, the general idea is that some facts are more fundamental than others. A simple grounding-theoretic account of relative fundamentality is this: for each fact among \([P],\) \([P'],\) … to be more fundamental than \([Q]\) is for \([P],\) \([P'],\) … to ground \([Q]\). Turning to absolute fundamentality, the idea is that some facts are fundamental full stop. On one familiar conception of absolute fundamentality, to be absolutely fundamental is to enjoy a distinctive form of independence (Bennett 2017: Ch. 5). One way for a fact to be independent is for it not to be grounded by other facts. This suggests a simple grounding-theoretic account of absolute fundamentality: to be absolutely fundamental it to be ungrounded (Schaffer 2009).

You might think that the above account of relative fundamentality fails to identify a necessary condition, especially if you assume that, for any two facts, one of them is more fundamental than the other or they’re equally fundamental. For example, perhaps [There are hydrogen atoms in Phoenix] is more fundamental than [There are H2O molecules in Ithaca] even though the former doesn’t ground the latter (Bennett 2017: Ch. 6). (For more sophisticated characterizations of relative fundamentality that appeal to grounding, see Bennett 2017: Ch. 6 and Werner 2021.)

Returning to absolute fundamentality, you might worry that the above account leaves out an important dimension, specifically the fact that the absolutely fundamental facts are complete in the sense that, since they are the basic building blocks of reality, to describe them is in some sense to provide a description of everything (Tahko 2018). Note that absolute fundamentality conceived of as involving both independence and completeness seems to capture the notion of an unexplained explainer—the absolutely fundamental facts are independent and therefore unexplained, and these facts are complete and therefore explain (Bennett 2017: Ch. 5). Looking to the history of philosophy, we see that fundamental entities are regularly invoked as a means of meeting certain kinds of explanatory demands, demands that perhaps only independent entities could meet. This is typically evidenced by the arguments from vicious infinite regress that are commonly wielded in defense of them. It’s because we need to explain, for example, why there are any contingent things whatsoever that God must exist and, importantly, if God weren’t the terminus point of our regress—because independent—then the problem that God was invoked to solve wouldn’t be solved after all.

With this in mind, we might revise the simple account of absolute fundamentality above as follows: to be fundamental is to be a member of some collection of facts, F, such that

  1. each fact among F is both ungrounded and grounds some fact; and
  2. facts among F ground all the grounded facts.

We might wish to add further conditions ensuring that F is minimal (there is no proper sub-collection of F that grounds all the grounded facts) and F is uniqueF is the only collection that satisfies these conditions. Another option is to interpret completeness (or unique minimal completeness) as being characteristic but not definitional of absolute fundamentality (Bennett 2017: Ch. 5). (Whether definitional or not, the grounding role that absolutely fundamental facts play potentially makes the cost of positing such facts worth paying—see Bliss 2019 for discussion.) Still another option for the grounding theorist is to be a pluralist about notions of absolute fundamentality, characterizing independence, completeness, and perhaps further notions as well such as ineliminability, granting that they might (in special cases) pull apart. (See Raven 2016 for discussion of ineliminability in this context.)


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