Concepts of Disease and Health

First published Mon Sep 22, 2008; substantive revision Wed Mar 18, 2020

Health and disease are critical concepts in bioethics with far-reaching social and political implications. For instance, any attempt to educate physicians or regulate heath insurance must employ some standards that can be used to assess whether people are ill or not. Concepts of health and disease also connect in interesting ways with issues about function and explanation in philosophy of the biomedical sciences, and theories of well-being in ethics.

1. Introduction

Doctors are called on to deal with many states of affairs. Not all of them, on any theory, are diseases. A doctor who prescribes contraceptives or performs an abortion, for example, is not treating a disease. Some women cannot risk pregnancy for health reasons, and historically both pregnancy and childbirth have been major killers. Nevertheless,they are not disease states, and modern women typically use contraception or abortion in the service of autonomy and control over their lives. In addition, it is very difficult to find a philosophically or scientifically interesting cleavage between diseases and other complaints (Reznek 1987, 71–73).

One dominant strand in modern medicine sees a disease as essentially a process that recurs across individuals in slightly different forms: a disease is an abstract kind that is realized in different ways (Carter 2003: Whitbeck 1977). But since a disease is a biological insult, distinguishing it from injury is very difficult. Perhaps injuries are not processes in the relevant sense but events. This essay assumes that the conceptual issues raised by illnesses, injuries and other medical conditions are similar enough to let us put this demarcation problem aside. Disability is another important and neglected topic in health and well-being. It will be addressed here only slightly, since the contemporary debates on disease and disability tend to go on in isolation from each other. Only rarely do authors such as Glackin (2010) tackle both. It is worth noting, though, that the disability debate is typically framed in a way that closely resembles the debate over disease. Medical model adherents judge disability to be the product of a functional impairment or failure in human physiology. This resembles what will be called below the naturalistic model of disease, at least as regards assessment of bodily impairment. It contends that people with disabilities, like people with diseases, are rendered worse off in virtue of these functional impairments, and the explanatory burden of their disadvantage is borne chiefly by the failure of their physiology or psychology to perform a natural function. A concept of disability as dysfunction has been resisted by rival pictures of disability that have made headway in recent decades.

According to the rival “social model”, disability is not a departure from normal or healthy human functioning which makes an atypical condition a “bad difference” from the norm; rather it is a “mere difference” (Barnes 2016). Although disabilities may make people worse off in general, this is due to the way society is set up, rather than any physical impairment. Disability in itself is just variation, analogous to features like sexuality, gender and race. The social model was pushed by disability activists who defined disability as “the disadvantage or restriction of activity caused by a contemporary social organisation which takes little or no account of people who have physical impairments and thus excludes them from participation in the mainstream of social activities” (UPIAS 1975, quoted in Shakespeare 2010). The scientific basis for this position appeals to the idea that “the partitioning of human variation into the normal versus the abnormal has no firmer footing than the partitioning into races. Diversity of function is a fact of biology” (Amundson 2000, p. 34). The resulting partition, it is held, is a reflection of social norms rather than underlying physical impairments. This position resembles what will here be termed the constructivist position with regard to health.

Health has received less philosophical attention than disease, and this essay will correspondingly have less to say about it. The conceptual terrain in the case of health is a little more complex than that of disease; one way of thinking about health says that it is just the absence of disease, so if disease is biological malfunction or abnormality, it follows that a healthy person is someone whose biological systems are all in order. But another way of looking at health insists that it is not just the absence of disease but the presence of something more; a positive state. The constitution of the World Health Organization (WHO) defines health “a state of complete physical, mental and social well-being and not merely the absence of disease or infirmity” (WHO 1948). According to views like this, we should think in terms not of health and disease alone, but in terms of health, disease and normality. This essay will look at theories of health after first discussing disease. The focus throughout is on individuals, although some theorists (e.g. Inkpen 2019) have argued for a seeing humans and their associated microbiomes as part of an ecosystem that can be evaluated, like other ecosystems, as healthy or not.

2. Naturalism and Constructivism

The tendency in recent philosophy has been to see disease concepts as involving empirical judgments about human physiology and normative judgments about human behavior or well-being (Bloomfield 2001, Boorse 1975, Ereshefsky 2009, Culver and Gert 1982, Thagard 1999). First, we have beliefs about the natural functioning of humans – both our common sense expectations about the body and scientific theories of human biology. Second, we make judgments about whether some particular condition or way of life is or is not undesirable, in some relevant way. This second set of concerns obviously involves normative criteria, to do with the extent to which a life is unnatural, undesirable or failing to flourish in some way. (There is not a clear consensus among writers here.) One important and controversial question is whether the judgments we make concerning our biology are also normative in some way. A further large question concerns the relationship between the two types of judgments, in both medicine and common sense.

Another strain in recent scholarship suggests that our normative judgments alone determine who falls under the concepts of health and disease. This view has been less influential in philosophy, but commands widespread adherence in other areas of the humanities and social sciences (e.g. Kennedy 1983, Brown 1990). Kitcher (1997, 208–9) summarizes the debate as follows:

Some scholars, objectivists about disease, think that there are facts about the human body on which the notion of disease is founded, and that those with a clear grasp of those facts would have no trouble drawing lines, even in the challenging cases. Their opponents, constructivists about disease, maintain that this is an illusion, that the disputed cases reveal how the values of different social groups conflict, rather than exposing any ignorance of facts, and that agreement is sometimes even produced because of universal acceptance of a system of values.

Kitcher’s objectivism is nowadays more often called naturalism, and that usage is followed here. The simple naturalist/constructivist opposition has also been complicated by more recent work and some of those nuances will be introduced here. The next section starts with forms of constructivism and the difficulties they face. Then naturalism will be similarly treated, before the discussion moves to health.

Kitcher’s claim that an objectivist analysis, as he puts it, is “grounded” on facts about the human body is perhaps not as clear as it might be. Before arriving at some qualifications, then, we should have straightforward statements of naturalism and constructivism in hand. (Although, since the qualifications are not yet in place, perhaps no theorist would fully endorse these bald versions of the positions.) There are also taxonomies that cut finer. Broadbent (2019, p.93) argues that naturalism and normativism are only two of the distinctions we need to inform the debate. He thinks of them as “diagonal opposites on a 2×2 matrix of possible positions, being Value-Independent Realism and Value-Dependent Anti-Realism respectively.” Broadbent also recognizes Value-Dependent Realism and his own Value-Independent Anti-Realism. Whether or not constructivist analyses should really be seen as anti-realist in a metaphysical sense is not always clear, though. For reasons outlines below, the philosophical commitments of constructivist views are sometimes hard to grasp.

At the bottom of the naturalist conception of disease (most influentially stated by Boorse (1975) and defended in Boorse (1997, 2014) is that the human body comprises organ systems that have natural functions from which they can depart in many ways. Some of these departures from normal functioning are harmless or beneficial, but others are not. The latter are ‘diseases’. So to call something a disease involves both a claim about the abnormal functioning of some bodily system and a judgment that the resulting abnormality is a bad one. Boorse uses‘illness’ to describe the concept of a disease that causes one’s life to deteriorate. This language is not universal, but the distinction between bodily malfunction and normative judgement is widely used. Naturalists contend that the determination of bodily malfunction is an objective matter to be determined by science. They may also argue (Boorse 1997) that determining whether a malfunction is detrimental to human well-being is also an objective matter, but often they concede that normative considerations are the basis for that judgment. So the naturalist position is that a disease is a bodily malfunction that causes one’s well-being to lessen. This malfunction could take many forms: it is not a necessary part of the naturalist case that diseases constitute a natural kind.

Rather, they could be a set of naturally occurring processes that are held together in virtue of our interest in grouping them as a class. Kinds that work like this include “weed” or “vermin” (Murphy 2006): the existence of the superordinate class depends on human interests but the subordinate members are natural kinds whose natures can be investigated scientifically.

Constructivism, however, argues that human interests do not just define the superordinate class of diseases. It is human interests, not biological malfunctions, that explain the judgments that subordinate members have the relevant biological character. Although constructivists accept that disease categories refer to known or unknown biological processes they deny that these processes can be identified independently of human values by, for example, a science of normal human nature. Constructivist conceptions of disease are normative through and through, although the precise account of the relevant norms will vary between scholars. Analytically, it seems that constructivism is distinct from the claim that disease is normative. However, constructivism and normativism do go together. One reason for this often a professed skepticism about the existence of a non-normative concept of malfunction. More broadly, constructivists may think of disease labels as instruments of social control and reflections of biologically ungrounded reactions to human difference. There may also exist, though this is less often brought to the fore, importantly different stresses on the kinds of value judgements that different theorists think are part of disease categories and their application. Typically, the relevant normative claim is taken to apply to the life of the person whose health is under discussion – it is bad for you to be that way. But in some contested cases the judgments are often held to be wider value-disvalue claims about society more broadly – it is bad for us if you are that way. To make things even more complicated, theorists will sometimes hold that the second type of judgement is what is really doing the work, but it masquerades as the first type. Arguments about disease concepts, as we shall see, are often bound up with political and social controversies in which diagnostic labels are impugned as instruments of oppression or social control.

The key constructivist contention, as seen in the remark by Amundson quoted above, is that there is no natural, objectively definable set of human malfunctions that cause disease. Rather, constructivists assert that to call a condition a disease is to make a judgment that someone in that condition is undergoing a specific kind of harm that we explain in terms of bodily processes. But the bodily processes are not objectively malfunctioning; rather, they are merely judged by us to be unusual or abnormal because they depart from some shared, usually culturally specific, conception of human nature. The crucial difference between the positions then is that for naturalists, diseases are objectively malfunctioning biological processes that cause harms. For constructivists, diseases are harms that we blame on some biological process because it causes the harm, not because it is objectively dysfunctional.

However, constructivism is hard to define satisfactorily, for two reasons. First, its core claim is a denial of the naturalist thesis that disease necessarily involves bodily malfunction. Since there are many views one might hold about the nature of the biological processes involved in disease that are compatible with the denial of malfunction, the positive constructivist claim varies across theories and is often elusive. Reznek (1987) for example, explicitly denies that malfunction is a necessary condition for disease. He does assert (ch 9) that diseases involve “abnormal” bodily processes, but he does not say what that means. Constructivists often, as we will see later, argue that disease judgments appeal to biological processes that are to be understood in terms of human practices rather than membership in some putatively biologically definable class of abnormalities or malfunctions. We have decided that some harmful conditions are the province of the medical profession, and those are diseases.

That brings up the second reason why constructivism can be an elusive target: it has often rested on (perfectly reasonable) claims about the role that value judgments have played in medical practice, or on the prevalence of culturally specific disagreements about abnormal human behavior or physiology. This means, as we shall see, that constructivists, especially in the social sciences, do not tend to offer necessary and sufficient conditions. Rather, they often seek to reconstruct the concept of disease as revealed by our practices. Constructivism, therefore, often looks like a thesis about how inquiry is carried on: first we identify a condition we disvalue, then we look for a biological process that causes it and say that, whatever it is, it is abnormal. This stress on our practices is a common constructivist trope, whereas objectivists more often seek to analyse a concept that will clarify what disease really is, however fumbling and biased our attempts to uncover it may have been.

That both medical practice and lay thought shape disease concepts is undeniable. Because of this, we need to introduce a second distinction. Both naturalism and constructivism can take either a revisionist or a conservative form. A conservative view says that our folk concept of illness should constrain a theoretical picture of health and disease worked out by scientists and clinicians. A revisionist thinks that our existing concepts should be amended in the light of what inquiry uncovers. One could be a conservative or revisionist naturalist, as well as a conservative or revisionist constructivist.

Health and disease, like many other concepts, are neither purely scientific nor exclusively a part of common sense. They have a home in both scientific theories and everyday thought. That raises a problem for any philosophical account: suppose we try to say what health and disease really amount to, from which it follows that the scientific concept should fit the facts about world. If the picture we end up with deviates too far from folk thought, should we worry? You might think that everyday language puts constraints on a concept of health that need to respected, and that if we move too far from ordinary usage we have stopped talking about health and started talking about something else. Furthermore, it is not really possible to argue that scientific and vernacular uses of the concepts are fully independent, since the development of science influences everyday thought, and many scientific concepts begin in pre-scientific contexts and carry the marks of those origins deep into their careers.

Although there is a thriving body of work that tries to analyse the concept of disease – as we’ll see in a moment – other theorists dispute the prospects for a successful analysis of the concept of disease. Schwartz (2007) contends that the biomedical sciences do not share a general concept of disease that is coherent enough to be analyzed. He recommends seeing the proposed analyses as introducing new concepts of disease that are related to existing usage but not bound by it. Concepts so introduced may work in some contexts but not others, and different concepts of disease could be needed for different medical purposes. Hesslow (1993) argues that diseases are not interesting theoretical entities in medicine and are irrelevant to most clinical decisions. These focus on how to improve a patient’s condition and do not need to depend on a judgment of disease.

Furthermore, the concept of disease that is currently employed in most areas of medicine has undergone a process of development. For much of the modern era there has been a dialectic between two concepts of disease. On the one hand, there has been the idea that a disease is just an observable suite of symptoms with a predictable course unfolding. This notion dates back to Sydenham in the late seventeenth century. Kraepelin applied it to psychiatry as the basis for differential diagnosis, for example between subtypes of what was later called schizophrenia (1899, 173–175). The approach was supplanted as medicine matured by the concept of diseases as destructive processes in bodily organs which “divert part of the substance of the individual from the actions which are natural to the species to another kind of action” (Snow 1853, 155; for discussion see Whitbeck 1977, Carter 2003, Broome 2006). This is perhaps still the core medical conception of disease. It seeks explanations that cite pathological processes in bodily systems. More recent medicine has tended to weaken this slightly by adopting what Green (2007, ch, 2) calls an ‘actuarial’ model of disease. This model takes the presence of elevated risk, for example as indicated by high blood pressure, to be a disease even in the absence of overt symptoms or a clearly destructive pathological process (see also Plutynski 2018, ch. 2).

Medicine recognizes illnesses like hypertension and Cushing’s disease that are the outcome of systems in a poorly regulated state that is stable, albeit suboptimal. The idea of a specific pathogenic process in medicine includes dysregulation, but this may not accord with folk thought.

Modern medicine looks naturalistic about disease. One question, then, concerns the extent to which common sense and biomedical concepts are related. Perhaps both have naturalist commitments, or perhaps common sense is driven by values and medicine is not, or perhaps physicians are really constructivists who are self-deceived or arguing in bad faith.

There is little reason to expect scientific and common sense concepts to agree in general, so if medicine and everyday thought disagree about disease, we may ask which concept should be adopted. If we wish to distil a concept that can play a role in medical inquiry, we may side with the scientists. But such proposals, which argue for a sharp separation between scientific and folk uses, are not neutral pieces of observation about the language. They are proposals for purging science from commonsense constraints that hinder its development. A revisionist view of this sort, in this case, says that our concepts of health and disease might be a necessary starting point but should not constrain where the inquiry ends up. Other forms of revisionism are possible. A revisionist naturalist argues that we should follow the science where it takes us and come up with concepts that further scientific inquiry, for example, even if that means that we eventually use the language in ways that look bizarre from the standpoint of current common sense. But a revisionist constructivist could argue that our thought, whether medical or lay, should be reformed in the service of other goals, such as emancipation for hitherto oppressed groups. Such revisionist thought was important in overturning the psychiatric view, dominant until the 1970s, that homosexuality is a mental illness. Activists argued that homosexuality was diagnosed for offensive moral reasons and not for medical ones and the classification of homosexuality as a disease was changed as a result of lobbying on moral grounds rather than on the basis of any new discovery. Naturalists will respond that this was not an example of using constructivism for emancipatory ends, but of bringing psychiatrists to understand that they were not obeying their own naturalist principles about mental disorder, and showing them that there was no good reason to retain the diagnosis. Much debate between naturalists and constructivists involves competing histories in just this way. Constructivists strive to uncover the role that moral and social values have always played in medical diagnosis and argue that our disease categories are hence not properly naturalistic. Naturalists, though they must concede that many diagnoses have been based on moral values that we would now renounce, still insist that the concept of disease, when correctly applied, as it often is, is thoroughly naturalistic and not impugned by past failures by the medical profession to live up to its own scientific ambitions.

Naturalists tend towards conceptual conservatism. They typically appeal to our intuitions about illness as support for their own emphasis on underlying bodily malfunction. This assumes that our current concept is in good shape, that common sense and medicine share a concept of disease, and that medicine should respect lay intuitions about what is or is not a disease. Like many philosophers who think about other concepts with both scientific and common sense uses, conservative naturalists about disease think that folk concepts specify what counts as health and disease. The job of medicine is to look at the world and see if anything in nature falls under the concept as revealed by analysis (cf the “Canberra plan” of Jackson 1998) For revisionists, this understanding of common sense in its relation to science is needlessly submissive to folk intuitions. A more revisionist view takes the relevant concepts to be defined by their role in scientific theories – Boorse (1997) has argued that disease is a term of art in pathology.

Revisionist naturalists argue that facts about physiological and psychological functioning, like other biological facts, obtain independently of human conceptions of the world. Our intuitions might tell us that a condition is not a disease. But scientific inquiry might conclude that people with the condition are really suffering from a biological malfunction. In that case, a conservative would recommend finessing the analysis to ensure that the concept of disease does not cover this case. A revisionist would say that we must bite the bullet and judge that this case falls under the concept even if that judgment is counterintuitive. A revisionist naturalist regards health and disease as features of the world to be discovered by biomedical investigation, and therefore loosely constrained, at best, by our everyday concepts of health and disease. Lemoine (2013) argues that conceptual analysis always involves a stipulative element concerning controversial or borderline cases. Because contending parties will be led by their intuitions to see different stipulations as reasonable, conceptual analysis will be very unlikely to decide between competing analyses that are all reasonably successful at capturing core cases. He suggests that instead philosophers should aim to naturalize disease by trying to first understand general features of theories in the medical sciences and then looking for perspicuous and coherent accounts of different disease types, with a view to eventually establishing an overall picture of the role disease thinking plays in medicine. This approach treats diseases as putative natural kinds and could be highly revisionist, while also leaving open the possibility that some diagnoses represent contingent historical outcomes that have left us with an incoherent category. Fuller (2018) follows Lemoine in dissenting from traditional conceptual analyses. He argues that we should try to work out what kinds of things diseases are rather than worrying about the concept. Fuller reviews the ontological options and asks first about instances of disease – what kinds of things are they? – rather than the concept, but, looking at chronic disease, he goes ‘bottom-up’, by attempting to work out what instances of chronic disease have in common and making inductive generalizations about them. Fuller thinks of diseases – at least chronic ones but perhaps acute cases too – as dispositions (cf Hucklenbroich (2014).

Lange (2007) starts his account of disease from a similar impulse, insisting that diseases play an absolutely essential role in explaining a patient’s symptoms. He argues that this explanatory role is characteristic of natural kinds elsewhere in science, and warrants thinking of diseases as natural kinds. Lange views diseases as natural kinds of incapacities. Stegenga (2018, ch.2.5), discussing Lange’s urging that we dissolve broader disease categories in favour of finer-grained biological descriptions, argues that we should see this as an eliminativist position, since it dispenses with the concept of disease altogether and replaces it with diverse successor concepts. Any theory of disease could advocate for descriptions at finer grains, while retaining a broad category, as Stegenga says, for education and public communication even if it has no real scientific application. The extent to which we should see a theoretical reform as eliminativist or merely very revisionist is hard to answer. In both cases we might secure an epistemic advance, but one might worry that our new vocabularies will deprive people of their ability to understand themselves by replacing a familiar vocabulary with a remote, scientific one tailored to the demands of experts.

Constructivists are usually revisionists. They tend to say that concepts of health and disease medicalize behavior that breaks norms or fails in some way to accord with our values; we don’t like pain, so painful states count as diseases: we don’t like fat people or drunks, so obesity and alcoholism count as diseases. Constructivists will often make this case with special vigor when it comes to mental disorder. The critique of the concepts that guide disease applications is central to constructivism.

Constructivists are often social scientists and their interests may not map neatly on to philosophical concerns. They are not usually interested in conceptual analysis so much as in tracing the social processes by which categories are formulated and changed over time. Conrad (2007, 7–8), for example, says he is “not interested in adjudicating whether any particular problem is really a medical problem… I am interested in the social underpinnings of this expansion of medical jurisdiction”.

But constructivists often present their theories as unmasking common sense or medical conceptions of disease, and hence as a kind of revisionism. They may accept that diagnoses of ill-health involve objective facts that people appeal to, or presume that they can appeal to, when they say that somebody is sick. The assumption might be that germs or other medically relevant causal factors are present in a person and have given rise to visible phenomena that indicate ill-health. But a constructivist will claim that the actual, often unacknowledged, judgments driving the initial assertion that someone is unhealthy are derived from social norms. We may discover facts about obesity and its relationship to blood pressure or life expectancy. But the constructivist says that our search for the relevant biological findings is undertaken because we have already decided that fat people are disgusting and we are trying to find a set of medically significant properties in order to make our wish to stigmatize them look like a medical decision rather than a moral or aesthetic one. The crucial constructivist claim is that we look for the biological facts that ground disease judgments selectively, based on prior condemnations of some people and not others. Because they claim that social norms rather than disinterested inquiry drive medicine (and especially, psychiatry), constructivists tend to be revisionists about folk concepts, seeking to bring to light the unacknowledged sources of our concepts of health and disease. But constructivism could be a conservative view, aimed at uncovering our folk theory of health and disease. A constructivist who takes this view says that our folk concept of disease is that of a pattern of behavior or bodily activity that violates social norms.

The most philosophically sophisticated recent constructionist view is Glackin’s (2019, p.260). He distinguishes the constitution question, which asks for the physical basis of a person’s condition, from the status question, which asks what makes a physical configuration a disease? This way of carving the terrain, and the importance of both status and constitution, is standard among most people who write about disease. The distinctive feature of social construction, in Glackin’s sense, is the priority of value judgements. Glackin uses the grounding relation to supply an answer to the problem of the relation between constitution and status. That is, the frame for grounding is fundamentally evaluative; the normative has a metaphysical priority. As Glackin (p. 262) puts it, disease states are grounded by the underlying biology or behaviour, but this grounding relation exists in virtue of a set of normative facts that provide the frame (in the sense of Epstein 2015: a set of possible worlds that fix the grounding conditions for social facts).

One could be a constructivist about some diseases, and a naturalist about others. For example, one could be a naturalist about bodily disease but a constructivist about psychiatry. Thomas Szasz (1960, 1973, 1987), for instance, is usually read as a constructivist who denies that mental illness exists. But in fact Szasz has a very strict objectivist concept of disease as no more than damage to bodily structures.

Szasz argues that mental disorders cannot exist because they are not the result of tissue damage. He is a naturalist about disease, which leads him to deny that mental illness is real and to offer a critical analysis of our psychiatric practices. And indeed claims that we are merely taking conduct we don’t like and calling it pathological are more plausible in psychiatry than in other parts of medicine, since there is a long history of psychiatrists who have done just that. Samuel Cartwright argued in 1843 that American slaves who tried to escape were afflicted with “drapetomania” or the “disease causing slaves to run away” (Cartwright 2004, 33); slaves were also found uniquely prone to “dyesthaesia Aethiopica”, which made them neglect the property rights of their masters (Brown 1990). Nineteenth century physicians regularly practiced cliterodectomy to cure women of sexual desire, which everybody knew never afflicted normal females of good family (Reznek 1987, 5–6). More recently, Soviet psychiatrists found that political dissidents suffered from “sluggish schizophrenia”. And Horwitz and Wakefield (2007) have suggested that depression has been severely overdiagnosed by recent generations of American psychiatrists, leading to the pathologizing of ordinary sadness.

Our current taxonomy of illness could involve both naturalist intuitions about some conditions and constructivist rationalizations about others. You could use this depiction of everyday thought as a premise in an argument for revisionism, on the grounds that our folk concepts are too confused to serve as constraints (Murphy 2006 makes this argument with respect to psychiatry).

3. Problems for Constructivism

Constructivism seems correct about some putative diseases; that is, societies have at times thought that some human activities were pathological because of values rather than scientific evidence. However, it is another task to show that constructivism is correct about our concept of disease. And this would be true even if there were no diseases; it might still be the case that our concept of disorder is naturalist even if nothing falls under it.

The chief problem for constructivism is that we routinely make a distinction between the sick and the deviant, or between pathological conditions and those that we just disapprove of. Our disease concepts cannot just be matter of disvaluing certain people or their properties. It must involve a reason for disvaluing them in a medical way rather than some other way. Illness has never been the only way to be deviant. So Szasz is just wrong to claim that “when a person does something bad, like shoot the president, it is immediately assumed that he might be mad” (1974, 91). Most of the time when people do bad things nobody doubts their sanity, just their morals. Physically or mentally ill people, even if they are seen as norm-breakers, are seen as a distinctive class of norm-breakers. What’s distinctive about them?

The problem is that we routinely judge that people are worse off without thinking they are ill in any way – for example, the ugly, the poor, people with no sense of humor or lousy taste or a propensity for destructive relationships. We don’t treat these judgments of comparative disadvantage as a prelude to medical inquiry, so why do we do so in some other cases?

Notice that the problem is not just one of establishing that someone is badly off or is in some other disvalued state. Rather, the trouble is caused by the requirement that someone is badly off in a specific, health-related or medically significant way. Rachel Cooper, for example (2002, 272–74), analyzes the concept of disease as a bad thing to have that is judged to require medical attention. She deals with the objection that specifying when someone is badly off is very difficult. Cooper admits that it is a hard problem, but replies that it is a widespread problem, one which crops up in many areas of moral philosophy.

This response is correct as a general point but does not touch the present objection. The objection is not that it is hard to say when someone is badly off, but that it is hard to isolate the specific class of ways of being badly off that we regard as medically relevant without relying on a notion of natural malfunction. Glackin (2019, p.272–3), however, denies that this is a problem at all. He argues that to justify treating some conditions as medical issues, and "others as social or legal, rather than medical, all a normativist needs to say is that this is morally speaking the right thing to do." For Glackin, we can defend the claim that someone is sick by saying that according to our values they are sick, and no more need be said.

Other scholars do think there is more to say. John Harris, for example, posits an “ER test” (2007, 91) according to which we can think of a disorder as a condition that makes someone worse off and is such that emergency room personnel would be negligent if they did not remedy it if they could. But as it stands the ER test is much too broad. Taken literally the ER tests requires medical personnel to teach the local language to immigrants whose lives are worsened by a lack of competence in it. A general theory of ill-being would be as desirable as a theory of well-being. But without further elaboration it would not discriminate between medical and non-medical forms of ill-being. Like Cooper, Harris faces the difficulty of specifying what is distinctively medical about the conditions that we expect medical personnel to treat: of course, a thesis about what counts as a medical intervention that was put in terms of combating disease or pathology would be circular. Reznek (1987, 163) argues that we can delimit a purely medical sphere “enumeratively without reference to the concept of disease – in terms of pharmacological and surgical interventions.” However, as we saw at the start of this essay, a lot of medical attention is directed at conditions which we do not call diseases. Prescribing contraceptive pills is a pharmacological intervention, but it is not directed against a disease; going on the pill is not like beginning a course of anti-malarial tablets.

The naturalist answer to the question what makes some medical interventions directed against disease is that conditions which doctors treat are diseases in so far as they involve natural malfunctions. The constructivist view is that the class of what we call malfunctions is picked out by its involvement in medical practice, and not the other way round. Cooper and Harris try to base their analysis on our practices, but they are unable to distinguish medical practices from non-medical ones.

Broadbent (2019) has a value-independent account, but it is also avowedly anti-realist about disease and so can be treated here. Broadbent calls his view of disease subjective but he has a different way of dealing with the problem of specifying the human response that is characteristic of disease judgments. His theory is that health and disease are secondary qualities like color “that depends on, or perhaps is partly constituted by, the dispositions of observers or thinkers to have certain perceptual or cognitive reactions” (p.108). What human observers bring to physiological states of affairs is not value judgments, but a disposition to track them as making characteristic contributions to survival and reproduction. Broadbent is alert to the issue that there might be cross-cultural differences in judgments about health and disease, but regards these as compatible with very broad agreement on the extension of healthy and diseased states, just as he thinks there is sufficient agreement on spectral phenomena to speak of color in different contexts. The same treatment would need to be given with respect to judgments within a society that vary over time, assuming that objects can change color as a society alters its color categories.

So apart from Glackin there seems to be agreement that the constructivist needs to explain how the judgments that we direct at putative sick or healthy people form a special class of judgments. And that explanation has to show, in addition, why we think the conditions that we single out as diseases with those special judgments are candidates for a particular set of causal explanations. It’s all very well to point out, as Reznek does (p.88) that an etiology only explains a pathology if we have already decided that it is a pathology. This is correct, but it dodges the conceptual question of why we first decide that only some people or conditions are pathological. The naturalist says this: we think some people are worse off because of a special kind of causal process, namely a disturbance of normal physical or psychological function. It is that causal judgment that has conceptual priority, even if, as a matter of timing, the violation of a norm is what is detected first. Note that it does not refute naturalism to point out that the concept of disease is sometimes misapplied, so that we think people are sick but discover that they are not. In such cases (e.g. homosexuality) the explanation for why it happened may be that our values caused the initial judgment, but that does not show that the concept of disease is constructivist, rather than naturalist. No concept is correctly applied every time.

Reznek, for instance, argues that to judge “that homosexuality is a disease we first have to make a value-judgment. We have first to judge that we would be worse off being homosexual” (1987, 212). Reznek then says that we could discover that homosexuality is not a disease if we find out that it develops by a normal psychological process. Reznek calls this is a form of constructivism (or normativism, in his terms) because value judgments have conceptual priority: but in fact in the case he describes it seems that value judgments are actually only heuristics, drawing our attention to whether something might be wrong with someone. If the initial judgment can be overturned by a biological discovery, then it seems that biological facts are necessary for a final judgment. That is to say that our concept of disease necessarily involves both biological and evaluative judgments. That is a version of naturalism, since the biological facts are the ultimate foundation for the judgment. Indeed, naturalism seems to explain why constructivist interpretations are sometimes correct. We say now that homosexuality was never a disease, and was just diagnosed on moral grounds, because it was not caused by malfunctions according to any even moderately correct theory of human biology or psychology. Values stopped people from getting the science right, but homosexuality was correctly understood, and no longer seen as a disease, when the science was done in a properly disinterested way.

Naturalism embodies the important insight that we do in fact think that disease involves a causal process that includes biological abnormalities. It does not mean, however, that all diseases have to receive the same biological explanation. The class of diseases will include a variety of different conditions that receive different causal explanations. That is, even if diseases are natural kinds, the superordinate category of disease may not be. Not just any sort of story about the causes of abnormal behavior will do, and it is difficult to reach a satisfactory specification of the sorts of causes that common sense might recognize. We also distinguish, based on our common sense understanding of human biology, between pathological and non-pathological versions of the same outward phenomena. Because aging is normal we acknowledge that an elderly person will differ from a young adult, so our assumptions about normality are sensitive to background conditions. But when aging is abnormal, we call it a disease. Hutchinson-Gilford progeria syndrome, for instance, causes children to undergo all the stages of human aging at a bizarrely accelerated rate. They nearly always die by seventeen, far gone in senescence. Even though we don’t know much about it, we think of Hutchinson-Gilford as a disease not just because we don’t like being old but because we think it is different from getting old in a way that must be caused by some underlying pathology. The concept of disease necessarily requires, just as naturalism insists, that a condition have a causal history involving abnormal biological systems. So let’s turn to naturalism, and see whether it should be a conservative or revisionist position.

4. Naturalism

4.1 Forms of Naturalism

When we have decided that someone’s biological systems do not function properly, we still face the question, how should we think about that person’s condition? Naturalists usually admit that there is more to the concept of disease than biological malfunction even if they think that biological malfunction is a necessary condition for disease. This involves a two-stage picture (Murphy 2006, ch 2) which inverts the constructivist portrayal of our practice. Naturalists who buy the two stage picture think that, first, we agree on the biological facts about malfunction. At the second stage we make the normative judgment that the person with the malfunction is suffering in some way. (This is the order of conceptual priority, not the chronological sequence in which judgments are made.) Spitzer and Endicott (1978, 18) for example, say that disease categories are “calls to action”; assertions that something has gone wrong within a person’s body in a way that produces consequences we think we need to remedy (see also Papineau 1994).

Normative considerations, on this account, inform our judgments about disease but do not have the conceptual priority accorded them by constructivists. We make judgments that someone is suffering in ways we associate with inner malfunction. We also see people who are suffering but who we don’t think are ill or injured, because we do not regard their bodily dysfunction as symptoms of disease: vaccination, surgical incisions, ear-piercing or childbirth are examples. Or imagine a skin condition that in some cultures causes the sufferer to be worshiped as a god, or become a sought-after sexual partner. The two-stage picture is designed to distinguish between the physical abnormality and the difference it makes to the life of the person who has it. The idea is that whether someone’s body is not functioning correctly is a separate question from whether it is bad to be like that. Stegenga (2018, p.23) calls such a theory a hybrid account, as it argues both that "there is a constitutive causal basis of disease and a normative basis of disease." He also adds a fourth alternative, which he calls eliminativist, arguing for replacing the notion of disease with successor notions tied more closely to the science. This goes beyond what has here been called revisionist naturalism, in that it advocates getting rid of the disease concept altogether, rather than just liberating it from commonsense constraints. Hybrid accounts have been very popular among naturalists since at least the dissemination of Wakefield’s (1992) influential discussion of mental disorder

The second stage, the question about whether life is worsened by a malfunction, is omitted by simple naturalism. Simple naturalists say that all there is to disease is the failure of someone’s physiology (or psychology) to work normally. The view has fewer adherents, but as noted above, Szasz (1987) uses simple objectivism about disease to justify his claims that mental disorder is a myth, and Boorse has long advocated such a view, as does Williams (2007). The popularity of hybrid accounts, though, is a problem for scholars like Glackin (2019, p. 258), who argues that the debate exists between “normativists, who think the concept is inherently evaluative, and naturalists who think it is purely empirical”. But it is possible to think that there is an empirical question about the causal basis of disease and a further normative question about the judgments made on that basis, which hybrid theorists also think are necessary for disease.

4.2 Specifying Causes

We have arrived at a generic naturalism that says judgments of illness are sensitive to causal antecedents of the right sort, as well as to value judgments about the effects of those causes. What are the right causal antecedents? Culver and Gert’s (1982) requirement that the antecedents be a “nondistinct sustaining cause” is a biologically noncommittal criterion. Culver and Gert analyze the concept of a malady, which involves suffering evils, or increased risk of evil, due to “a condition not sustained by something distinct” from oneself (1982, 72). The cause can be physical or mental, (p.87), provided it is a sustaining cause that is not distinct from the sufferer (p.88). A wrestler’s hammerlock, because its effects come and go with the presence or absence of the cause itself, is an example of a sustaining cause. But because the wrestler is a distinct entity from the sufferer, someone in a hammerlock does not have a malady. If the cause is inside the body it is nondistinct just in case it is difficult to remove (e.g. a surgical implement left behind in the body) or it is biologically integrated in the body (e.g. a retrovirus). This is an attractively simple solution but it is too inclusive. Culver and Gert (p.71) say that loss of freedom, opportunity or pleasure count as evils. But if that is so, then black citizens of South Africa and Mississippi (among many other places) used to suffer from maladies, since they were unfree, unhappy and oppressed. And they suffered these evils because of black skin, which was a nondistinct sustaining aspect of their nature. But it wasn’t a disease. Of course, the presence of racism, backed up by coercive social structures, was also necessary, but aspects of the environment are implicated in many maladies.

This counterexample is instructive, however, since there are two ways of amending the proposal in the light of it. First, perhaps the principle of nondistinct sustaining causes fails to capture our intuitions about causes of disease. A second possibility is that the principle is a good causal condition, but that the account of evils is too broad, and needs to be restricted to a more intuitively medical set of evils, rather than the broader class of impediments to well-being. The section on health will go over the terrain that’s relevant for the second option; the current discussion is about the causal condition. Boorse (1975, 1976, 1977, 1997) and his followers have opted for a more restrictive view of the causes of disease. They contend that disease necessarily involves biological malfunction. Boorse distinguished “disease” from “illness”. The former is the failure to conform to the “species-typical design” of humans, and the latter is a matter of judgments that a disease is undesirable, entitles one to special treatment, or excuses bad behavior. An account of malfunction must be parasitic on a theory of function. Boorse thinks a function is a ‘species-typical’ contribution to survival and reproduction (1976, 62–63). Disease is failure to function according to a species design, in which functional efficiency is either degraded below the typical level or limited by environmental agents (1977, 550, 555, 567; 1997, 32). Boorse understands this as functioning “more than a certain distance below the population mean” (1977, 559) for the relevant set of humans. (Since not all members of a species have the same design in every respect, we need to specify reference classes according to biologically relevant subgroups.) This cutoff point, he thinks, can only be specified as a matter of convention, but this conventional element does not threaten the objectivity of diagnoses. Responses to Boorse since the original theory was formulated have concentrated on two issues. First is the apparent existence of states like tooth decay that are widespread, so apparently statistically normal, yet definitely pathologies. The second is the“line-drawing problem” Schwartz (2007) which comes in two related guises: how we are to reference classes and how we can distinguish between normal and abnormal levels of functional efficiency.

Boorse’s position has been very influential and shaped the entire recent literature. Williams (2007) retains the spirit of the proposal but departs from it in arguing that disease is realized not in systemic malfunctions but failures of interacting cellular networks; he regards applications of disease language to organs, for example, as not strictly speaking correct. Most theorists, though, have continued to emphasis malfunction in physiological mechanisms more broadly. In psychiatry, for instance, Wakefield (1992, 1997a, 1997b), follows Boorse (1976) in assuming that humans have a species-typical design, which he assumes is a product of natural selection. Wakefield applies the picture to both mental and physical illness: in Wakefield’s version we first judge that a psychological mechanism is not performing the function for which natural selection designed it; second, we judge that the malfunction is harmful. An appeal to natural function, by adding extra commitments to the idea of a cause of illness, rules out skin pigment as a cause of evil.

Cooper (2002, p.265) suggests that a straightforward appeal to dysfunction must be qualified in light of some apparent counterexamples. A woman taking contraceptive pills, for example, may be interfering with typical functioning, but ingesting contraceptives is not a disease. (Boorse would have to call it a self-inflicted disease that does not make the woman ill.) Cooper also raises the problem of individuals with chronic conditions that are controlled by drugs. She argues that these are cases of diseased subjects who nonetheless function normally and suggests that the analysis must be amended to talk of a disposition to malfunction. But, as Cooper sees, the big problem faced by Boorsian accounts is that of coming up with an acceptable conception of normal function in the first place.

There are two problems that we can distinguish here. The first is whether a non-normative account of malfunction is possible, about which much debate has taken place. A second problem has come into focus more recently. If there is a positive scientific account of function and malfunction that is pertinent to disease, which science owns it? The debate deriving from Boorse’s work has assumed that physiologists and pathologists have the last word here. Following Boorse, Hausman (2015, p. 9) is explicit that physiologists and pathologists are the relevant medical specialists whose judgments we care about. Lemoine and Giroux (2016) question the great stress on physiology to the exclusion of other medical specialties in Boorse – they think he has backed the wrong doctors. Lemoine and Giroux think we should see physiology as the science of how organisms work considered as assemblies of organ systems. But they think that the science of health and disease is defined by broader medical considerations that go beyond the physiological. Tied up with this is a broad consensus that the correct explanation of disease states is mechanistic, though this too has been challenged in the name of more abstract explanations from different parts of medicine (Darrason 2018).

4.3 Functions

The Boorsian analysis is of a commonsense concept of disease which bottoms out in a notion of malfunction as the cause of illness. The view is that conceptual analysis determines the empirical commitments of our disease concepts and then hands over to the biomedical sciences the problem of finding biological functions and malfunctions. Some recent theorists, notably Wakefield, have argued for an evolutionary account of function as that which has historically been spread by natural selection. Others have argued that the biomedical sciences employ a different conception of function. Besides identifying the right concept of function for the job, other problems affect the whole naturalist community. A reliance on scientific, functional decomposition as the ultimate justification of judgments of health and disease requires a revisionist, rather than a conservative, account. Also, it may not always be possible to settle contested cases by an appeal to a notion of normal human nature, because that notion is itself contested.

First, why suppose that the relevant concept of function is an adaptive one, and that dysfunction is a failure of a biological system to fulfill its adaptive function? This analysis of function is often termed the etiological account, and although it is widespread in philosophy of biology it seems to be conceptually tied to fitness rather than health (Méthot 2011). Advocates of a thoroughgoing evolutionary approach to medicine (such as Gluckman, Beedle and Hanson 2009) can be read as providing a framework within which we can make sense of a number of processes that have an effect on health and disease, but not as offering analyses of health and disease that are tied to fitness. Gluckman et al. (p.5) consider the difference between lactose intolerance, which develops after weaning and is normal for most human populations, and congenital hypolactasia, a condition in which newborns cannot digest maternal milk. The former is a consequence of the absence of pastoralism in most historical human populations and does not affect fitness in those populations, whereas the latter would have been fatal in the past and thus was selected against. However, they do not define disease in terms of fitness-lowering: they note rather that an evolutionary perspective can make us sensitive to hitherto neglected causes of pathology and also sensitive to over-hasty judgments of pathology in cases where the condition is normal among populations with a given evolutionary trajectory.

Wakefield’s approach is not that of a thoroughgoing evolutionary theorist of disease in that sense. Rather, he plugs an etiological account of function into a Boorsian model, and his approach has been developed with little attempt to argue that medicine does in fact use an evolutionary, teleological account of function. In opposition, Schaffner (1993) has argued that although medicine might use teleological talk in its attempts to develop a mechanistic picture of how humans work, the teleology is just heuristic. It can be completely dispensed with when the mechanistic explanation of a given organ or process is complete. Schaffner argues that as we learn more about the causal role a structure plays in the overall functioning of the organism, the need for teleological talk of any kind drops out and is superseded by the vocabulary of mechanistic explanation, and that evolutionary functional ascriptions are merely heuristic; they focus our attention on “entities that satisfy the secondary [i.e. mechanistic] sense of function and that it is important for us to know more about” (1993, 390).

In effect, Schaffner is arguing that the biomedical sciences employ a causal, rather than a teleological, concept of function. This is in the spirit of Cummins’s (1975) systemic analysis of function as the causal contribution a structure makes to the overall operation of the system that includes it. Cummins’s concept of function is not a historical or evolutionary concept. According to Cummins, a component of a system may have a function even it was not designed or selected for. Wakefield has tied disease conceptually to an evolutionary concept of function as a naturally selected capacity. It is doubtful if this connection can be found in either science or common sense about disease. Perhaps in some areas of biology functional ascription is indeed teleological. However, most theorists who have attended to biomedical contexts agree with Boorse and Schaffner that the function of an organ or structure can be understood without thinking of it as an adaptation. Lange (2007) explicitly follows the systemic approach to function. He argues that diseases are incapacities that explain symptoms in causal-analytic terms.Medical understanding requires that functional structures can be identified and analyzed in terms of their contribution to the overall maintenance of the organism as a living system. However, it is also clear that the contribution of some systems – especially reproductive ones – have a purpose that is not tied to homeostatic regulation and organisation in this way, which complicates the picture. Theorists who prefer a causal-historical account to a teleogical one argue that explanation in medicine takes a model of the normal realization of a biological process and uses the model to show how abnormalities stem from the failure of normal relations to apply between components of the model. This requires a non-historical function concept, one that is at home in causal-mechanistic, rather than evolutionary, explanation. Proponents of a teleogical account can respond that those systems, even if they admit of mechanistic explanation, only exist in the first place because they have facilitated survival and reproduction, and that the etiological perspective provides an overall conceptual framework.

An evolutionary approach faces problems in specifying what the overall evolved function of a system might be and showing how functions contribute to it. First, it is very difficult to assess the relevant evidence that a given biological systems is — as in Wakefield’s treatment — the product of natural selection (Davies 2001, Chapter 5). Since many ailments do not prevent one from living and having children, it is even harder to show that a disease is necessarily the product of a malfunction that lowers fitness or — as in Boorse — interferes with survival and reproduction. Another problem for Wakefield is that if you regard evolutionary dysfunction as partly constitutive of disease then if an illness depends on structures that have no evolved function, it cannot really be an illness. A biological structure might be a spandrel or a by-product, or have some other non-selective history. Such a structure cannot malfunction in Wakefield’s sense, and so it cannot be diseased in the primary, evolutionary sense.The idea would have to be weakened to suggest that it is diseased in a derivative sense in virtue of its implications for other selected effects elsewhere in the system

Objections to an evolutionary notion of medical malfunction do not show that there is anything wrong with the general idea of basing judgments of health and disease on a scientifically established picture of the normal functional decomposition of human beings. However, on this account, it becomes harder to retain the conservative project that looks for the natural phenomena that fall under, and are therefore constrained by, our folk concepts of health and disease. Wakefield, for instance, thinks some psychiatric diagnoses flout our intuitions by attributing disorder on the basis of behavior alone without looking for malfunctioning mental mechanisms (1997a). He appeals to intuitions to derive necessary and sufficient conditions for the folk concept of mental disorder, and assumes that science should search for the psychological processes that fit the concept thus defined. But it is one thing to take intuitions as a starting point, and another to say that they are hegemonic. Boorse, too, adduces everyday linguistic usage and commonsense intuitions as evidence, even though he claims to be discussing the clinical concepts of health and disease.

A revisionist can say that a condition we currently disvalue but do not regard as a disease may turn out to involve malfunction and hence to be a disease, whatever our intuitions say. Conversely, we may think something is a disease but we might be wrong, just as we were wrong about drapetomania or masturbation, which do not causally depend on any biological malfunction. Conservatives resist this possibility. Wakefield claims that we have intuitions about human nature that make it “obvious from surface features” whether underlying mechanisms are functional or dysfunctional (Wakefield 1997b, 256). But it is an empirical discovery whether one’s physiology or psychology is functioning properly, not something to be decided from the armchair, or even from inspecting surface features. A conservative may, though, seek to distinguish debunked intuitions that can be explained away (perhaps as products of local norms, as in the masturbation case) from more resilient intuitions that survive debunking and can still feature as constraint on analysis.

However, once we hand over the task of uncovering malfunction to the sciences we can no longer make common sense the ultimate arbiter, unless we wish to explicitly import, into the concept of disease, considerations derived from folk theories of what normal human nature amounts to.

It seems that the analysis of disease as depending on malfunctioning biological components requires a functional decomposition of human biology. If that decomposition is to be independent of what we think people should be like, it should not be regulated by common sense theories of human nature, but discovered by science. We must be able to ascertain, within acceptable limits of variation, the biological standards that nature has imposed on humans. The goal of finding out how a biological system works is fixed by our interests in health and well-being, but the naturalist’s assumption is that the goal is met by discovering empirical facts about human biology, not our own, culturally defined, norms. So, we diagnose someone as suffering from mesenteric adenitis not just because they are in discomfort due to fever, abdominal pain and diarrhea, but because the lower right quadrant of the mesenteric lymphatic system displays abnormal inflammation. This thickening of the nodes is not just the objective cause of the discomfort, it is an objective failure of the lymphatic system to make its normal contribution to the overall system. For the naturalist’s program to work, the biological roles of human organs must be natural facts just as empirically discoverable as the atomic weights of chemical elements. That may result in the overturning of common sense.

This raises a further issue. It is widely believed that function concepts are intrinsically normative, since they are teleological (for a recent review see Barnes 2016). Therefore, the objection continues, claims about natural functional and malfunction introduce normative considerations into the foundations of medicine, which are supposed to be purely scientific.

A response might be to maintain that whether or not functional claims should be seen as normative, it is not the socially relative normativity appealed to by constructivists. The crucial point is that in the life sciences, some biological system can fail to behave as a theory predicts without impugning the prediction: we can say that the system is malfunctioning. This contrasts with other sciences, in which, if a system fails to behave as predicted, the fault lies with the science, not the system.

Griffiths and Matthewson (2018) attempt to rehabilitate an evolutionary account of function in this context. They tie a selected effects interpretation of function to life history theory, with the advertised aim of providing an explication of pathology that grounds it in a mature science rather than trying to recover some commonsense, or even medically prevalent, concept of disease. Their key contention is that this gives them a scientifically sound way to make discrimination that would otherwise be puzzling, such as the distinction between disease states and senescence, and the means to sort populations into principled reference classes. The resulting picture (Matthewson and Griffiths 2017) is one which generates a variety of evolution-based ways in which organisms can "go wrong". This sets up a taxonomy of opportunities for intervention: some organisms are malfunctioning; others are working properly but in the wrong environment; others are badly off because the environment is inhospitable even though it is normal for them and they are working as they have evolved to; still others generate a development pathway based on misleading information about what optimal development will require. This way of setting up the issues is strongly revisionist, and arguably is no longer an attempt to define disease at all as most of the scholars we have discussed would understand it. Matthewson and Griffiths argue for the congruence of this account with our best science and its stress on the continuity of human and non-human biology.

Supporters of an evolutionary account of function advertise the ease with which an account of malfunction follows from the theory as one of its virtues. Their idea is that we can say when a system is malfunctioning by observing that it is not carrying out the job which natural selection designed it to perform. In contrast, it is widely believed that systemic accounts of function cannot deal with malfunction at all. The argument goes like this: what a system is taken to do is relative to our explanatory interests, and that a putative malfunction can just be understood as a contribution to a different property of the system. Davies (2001) argues that the first of these claims can be defeated by restricting functional ascriptions to hierarchically organized systems in which lower level capacities realize upper level ones. That gives us a characterization of function independent of our explanatory interests.

Godfrey-Smith (1993) argues that systemic concepts of function do permit attributions of malfunction. He argues that a token component in a system is malfunctioning when it cannot play the role that lets other tokens of the same type feature in the explanation of the larger system. Davies (2003, 212) denies this. He says that functional types are defined in terms of what they can do and that if a component cannot carry out its normal contribution to the overall system then it ceases to be a member of a type. However, Davies’ objection appears to fail, at least in medical contexts, if we can identify components apart from their functional roles. Suppose we can identify biological components in terms of their anatomical position and relationships to other organs. If so, we can say that an organ in the position characteristic of its type remains a member of that type even though it has lost some capacity characteristic of that type, and hence is malfunctioning. Reasoning like this permits doctors to identify organs as normal or abnormal during autopsies, even though every system in a corpse no longer possesses its normal function in Davies’s sense.

This leaves unaddressed the issue of how we determine what normal function is. Wachbroit (1994) argues that when we say that an organ is normal, we employ a biomedical concept of normality that is an idealized description of a component of a biological system in an unperturbed state that may never be attained in actual systems. Boorse (1977, 1997) insists that the notion of normality in biomedical concepts is statistical — how things usually are in a reference class, but this view faces the problem of specifying the reference classes in an informative way. But given the amount of variation within a species, it will always be hard to find reference classes which share a design. As Ereshefsky (2009) puts it, Boorse assumes that statistical normality coincides with the kind of normality that medicine cares about, but this looks wrong. Wachbroit (1994, 588) argues convincingly that the role of normality in physiology is like the role that pure states or ideal entities play in physical theories.

4.4 Normality and Variation

Statistically, a textbook heart, for example, may be very rare indeed. But it is the account of the organ that gets into the physiology textbook. The textbook tells you what a healthy organ is like by reference to an abstraction – an idealized organ. This concept of normality is not justified by appeal to a conceptual analysis that aims to capture intuitions about what’s normal. It draws all its authority from its predictive and explanatory utility: against the background of assuming normal heart function, for example, we account for variation in actual hearts (a particular rhythm, say), by citing the textbook rhythmic pattern (which may be very unusual statistically) and identifying other patterns as arrhythmic. The point of textbook depictions of human physiology is to identify an ideal system that enables us to answer “what if things had been different questions” (Woodward 2003, Murphy 2006). The role of an idealization, in this system, is to let us classify real systems according to their departure from the ideal. So normal human biological nature, in this sense, is an idealization designed to let us impose order on variation.

Variation in biological traits is ubiquitous, and so establishing whether a mechanism is functioning normally is difficult: nonetheless, biologists do it all the time. As Boorse notes, many objections argue that pathological states are aspects of natural variation and conclude that there is no clear distinction between the normal and the pathological. But he contends that is a non-sequitur, since the existence of widespread and extensive variation is compatible with the existence of pathological states. Boorse (2014, p. 696–8) and Matthewson and Griffiths (2017) both point out that biologists often judge that members of a species come in forms that are not normal variants but pathological states.

However, how we ascertain what is pathological remains to be determined. Not all diagnoses can be tied to a break between normal and abnormal functioning of an underlying mechanism, such as a failure of the kidneys to conserve electrolytes. Nor can we always discover some other abnormality, such as the elevated levels of helicobacter pylori bacteria that have been found to be causally implicated in stomach ulcers (discussed in detail by Thagard 1999). Some conditions, such as hypertension, involve cutting between normal and pathological parts of a continuous variation, even in the absence of clear underlying malfunctions that separate the populations. The Boorsian tradition has tried to deal with the problem of variation by tying assessments of function and malfunction to reference classes, which Boorse (1977) treated as natural classes of organisms that share a uniform blueprint. Kingma (2007, 2010) has recently argued that reference classes cannot be established without normative judgements, contra Boorse, who takes them to be objectively discoverable parts of the natural order. Kingma contends that Boorse’s account of function needs to capture not only the qualitative causal contribution made by a system to overall functioning, but also the quantitative features of its contribution: a healthy heart is not just a pump, but a pump that works at a given rate. In addition, a system must be capable of working in a variety of situations, including rare ones that require a physiological response to a crisis. Kingma argues that Boorse’s biostatistical theory cannot capture statistically unusual yet functional situations, and concludes that we need to appeal to situation-specific functions. (Cf. Canguilhem (1991 p. 196), who argued that disease is only abnormal relative to a clearly defined context.)

Kingma also points out that organs can become diseased even if they do act in a situationally appropriate way. Liver damage due to paracetamol overdose is obviously not healthy, she says, but the liver is not doing anything situationally inappropriate. That is, a reduced level of function in the context of paracetamol overdose is the situationally appropriate way for the liver to perform. Kingma offers Boorse a dilemma. First, he can either abandon the notion of situationally specific functions. This means failing to recognize the dynamic nature of physiology and leading to absurdities such as the claim that a gut which is not currently digesting because it is empty of food is, in fact, diseased. Or, second, Boorse can acknowledge situation-specific functions, in which case he must say that some systems are healthy (because they are acting as they should in that situation) even though our intuitions insist that they are unhealthy, because there are diseases that are statistically the norm in some situations. Hausman (2011) responds that from a Boorsian perspective the crucial question is whether the normal response – the organism doing its job under stress – renders the system incapable. The digestive system may respond appropriately to poison but in doing so it becomes incapable of normal function on average. If a victim of a poisoning were to a eat a large unpoisoned meal, her digestive system would function much less well than that of the average unpoisoned person in similar circumstances.

Following Boorse, Hausman assumes that there is an average range of performance within a normal population in normal circumstances that can tell us what physiological profile a healthy system ought to have. His reply is developed and expanded by Garson and Piccinini (2014). The issue is whether these normal circumstances can be specified without begging the question, or whether Wachbroit is correct to think of medical normality as an idealization that is unrelated to statistical normality. On any approach, a worry is that if we cite behavioral factors in establishing normality they will reflect contested conceptions of human flourishing. Distinguishing failures to flourish from functional abnormalities will always be a special problem for psychiatry. For example, judgments of irrationality are central to many psychiatric diagnoses, and our standards of rational thought reflect not biological findings but standards derived from normative reflection. The possibility of psychiatric explanation employing the methods and models of physical medicine, then, depends on how much of our psychology is like the visual system – i.e. decomposable into structures to which we can ascribe a natural function (Murphy 2006). Within medicine more generally, the prospects for a general naturalism about disease depend on our ability to understand human biology as a set of structures whose functions we can discover empirically, and our capacity to understand disease causally as the product of failures of those structures to perform their natural functions.

More could be said on all these topics, but the essay will now shift to discuss health. A simple account of health might hold it to be simply the absence of disease, so that if we agree everything is functioning as it should – subject to the complications outlined above, then one is healthy. But most discussions of health insist that health is not just the absence of disease but something more.

5. Health

5.1 Health and Biology

As noted above, conceptions of health, like conceptions of disease, tend to go beyond the simple condition that one is biologically in some state. In the case of health, one view is that a healthy individual is just someone whose biology works as our theories say it should. This is the counterpart, in theories of health, to simple objectivism about disease. It is defended at length by Hausman (2015) who calls it “functional efficiency”. As with disease, however, most scholars who write about health add further conditions having to do with quality of life. For instance, Hausman argues that what we are concerned to measure is the contribution that functional efficiency makes to overall well-being. We track not health but the things that make health important. Hausman thus distinguishes disease, health and the value of health. Other scholars draw a similar threefold distinction in different ways. One might have a partly evaluative view of health, like a hybrid view of disease, while also thinking that health should be distinguished from a broader concept like well-being or flourishing. Such views dispute the line we find in Boorse and Hausman that a non-evaluative conception of health is viable. Alexandrova (2018), for instance, argues that health is one of many partly normative concepts that give rise to what she calls “mixed claims“ in the social sciences, that relate, empirical variables to normatively derived variables. The definition and measurement of health, she insists, must depend on normative judgments about what it takes to be healthy.

What kinds of normative claims are relevant? Carel (2007, 2008) thinks that the important thing about health is one’s lived experience of one’s own body, and in particular, that one should not feel estranged or alienated from one’s body. Carel argues that health should be understood phenomenologically as the experience of being at home in one’s lived body, rather than merely the normal functioning of the body seen as a biological unit.

From the naturalist perspective, one problem with this proposal is that it ignores the fact that one can feel perfectly at ease with one’s lived body even if one harbors, unaware, a diseased system. Indeed, Carel argues that someone who is ill can be, in her sense, healthy, if they are adapted to their bodily predicament; from her perspective, objections like the one just mentioned miss the point, since they privilege a biological perspective rather than a phenomenological one. Her project is avowedly revisionist: she wishes to replace existing concepts of health with views that aim to capture the experience of being healthy (or unwell).

Carel’s stress on experience is directly challenged by views like Gadamer’s. He insists (1996, 113) that it is absurd to ask someone if they feel healthy, since health is “not a condition that one introspectively feels in oneself. Rather, it is a condition of being involved, of being in the world, of being together with one’s fellow human beings, of active and rewarding engagement in one’s everyday tasks”. Gadamer’s healthy person is someone who is in harmony with their social and natural environment, and disease is a disturbance of this harmony. Canguilhem (1991, 2012) thinks of health as flexibility, in the sense that a healthy organism can tolerate environmental impacts, adapts to new situations and possesses a store of energy and audacity. This is not something that can be measured by physiology (2012, p.49). Canguilhem’s approach suggests what is wrong with Gadamer’s objection to phenomenological accounts of health. A phenomenological account does not have to hold, as Gadamer seems to have supposed, that there is a special feeling that is the feeling of being healthy. Rather, for a view like Canguilhem or Carel’s, healthy people experience the world as an arena to express themselves in rather than a bunch of threats. Antonovsky (1987) puts this in terms of a sense of coherence which enables one to understand the environment and mobilize internal resources against external stressors. It may well be that perspectives like Carel’s are neglected in contemporary medicine, and that they are especially important in disability studies. However, it does not follow that the concepts of health and disease, rather than aspects of our practices that employ those concepts, should be reformed along the lines she suggests. In general, though, accounts of health, compared to those of disease, are less concerned with trying to capture a scientific or clinical concept.

5.2 Embedded Instrumentalism

Gadamer’s view is reminiscent of what Richman (2003) calls “embedded instrumentalist” theories, which claim that health is indexed to goals: how healthy you are depends on how well you can fulfill your goals. Such theories are very popular. Nordenfelt (1995) considered two versions of this approach. One version defines the goals relevant to health as needs, which are understood as having a biological basis. Another view defines goals in terms of the ambitions and desires of the individual. Nordenfelt (1995, 90) argues that a healthy person is one who can satisfy her “vital goals”, which are those that are necessary and sufficient for her to be minimally happy.

Embedded instrumentalist theories of health have an obvious appeal. Once we argue that health involves judgments about how well a person’s life is going, we need a way to evaluate that, and an immediately attractive idea is that someone’s life goes well if they can achieve their ambitions or satisfy their goals. An apparent difficulty, however, is that much the same terrain is covered by theories of well-being, and while people think that being healthy is important to their well-being (Eid and Larsen 2007), they do not identify the two. Rather, they think of health as a component of well-being or a contributor to it.

Some embedded instrumentalist theories, though, appear to be in danger of defining health in such a way that it is synonymous with well-being. Richman (2003), for example, develops his view, (the “Richman-Budson view”) to deal with objections that Nordenfelt raises against goal-based views, such as the worry that someone with very low ambitions will count as healthy just because she is easily satisfied. Richman (2003, 56–57) supposes that someone is healthy if she can strive for a consistent set of goals that would be chosen by an idealized version of herself if she were fully aware of her “objectified subjective interest” (p.45). That is, they are the goals she would choose if she had complete knowledge of herself and her environment and perfect rationality.

In this case it seems that a theory of health is in danger of becoming a general theory of well-being, and Richman does not discuss the relationship between the two. A further complication is the relationship between medical interventions designed to cure diseases, and other medical interventions which are “enhancement technologies” (Elliott 2003). The line between enhancement and therapy is very hard to draw: Harris (2007, 21) for example, uses the example of vaccination, which is both a therapeutic protection against infection and an enhancement of our natural immune system. Perhaps, too, many of us would benefit from a boost to our powers of concentration, or a lift in our mood, which pharmaceuticals might supply. But neurological enhancements, unlike vaccines, can help us to meet our goals without guarding against disease. Perhaps what is needed is a weaker view of the relation between health and goal-directedness, such as that offered by Whitbeck (1981, 620). Whitbeck defines health in terms of the psychophysiological capacities of an individual that support her “goals, projects and aspirations in a wide variety of situations”. This view loosens the tight Richman-Budson connection between health and goal-directed action, and suggests a view on which we can see biological capacities as at the core of health in so far as they help people’s lives to go better. So there seems to be a broad but not unanimous view that whatever one thinks about the value-ladenness of health we need a threefold distinction between disease, health (which may or may not be partly evaluative, and some properties of a person’s life that enable us to evaluate how well it is going for them. Not all such properties are health problems – someone who is oppressed is not unhealthy simply in virtue of being oppressed (though oppression can certainly cause health problems) – oppression itself can be distinguished from the health problems that may follow from the nature of oppression

Schroeder (2013) has taken issue with the whole idea of defining health as a property or state of an individual. He argues in contrast that “health” is a fundamentally comparative term like “tall”. Two human beings can both be tall even if one is taller than the other, whereas it makes no sense to think of two straight lines, one of which is straighter than the other. Schroeder argues that if we see health as fundamentally comparative or relational we can recast several conceptual, ethical and policy debates. For example, instead of thinking in terms of non health-related differences among the healthy we could think in terms of gradations of health. Schroeder also thinks that his approach makes intergenerational or cross-temporal comparisons easier, since we can say that a medieval serf was healthy in their time, but nonetheless less healthy than a modern person who is, by our standards, chronically ill. An approach like this might offer some traction on the reference class problem outlined above.

6. Conclusions

Naturalism and constructivism have been distinguished for analytic purposes in this essay but they are not always easy to tell apart in practice. The difficulty comes from the fact that there is widespread agreement that our thinking about disease pays attention to both human values and biological phenomena, and it is not always easy to tell how a theorist explains the interactions of these factors, nor whether a given analysis is descriptive or prescriptive. For naturalists the relevant biological processes are departures from good human functioning, construed in one of several ways about which controversy rages, but to be determined by the relevant science. These biological problems result in what we judge to be difficulties in living, which may or may not be partly constitutive of disease, just as positive qualities may or may not be partly constitutive of health. For a constructivist, it is the problems people face in their lives that take priority. Their biological underpinnings are ones we count as abnormal because we have judged them to be both relevant to the conditions we disvalue and also the subject matter of a specific, medical, class of interventions, therapies and other practices. The obstacle to a successful development of naturalism is the problem of establishing a satisfactory, science-based, distinction between normal and abnormal human functioning. Overcoming this difficulty will require a closer engagement by theorists of disease with the relevant debates in the philosophy of biology.

For constructivists, the big problem is to say why we judge some human phenomena to be symptoms of disease whereas others are taken as evidence that someone is criminal or ugly or possessed by demons or something else we do not admire. It is not generally true that we think that if someone’s life goes badly it is because he or she is unhealthy, so constructivists owe us an account of what makes a certain class of judgments distinctively medicalized.


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Other Internet Resources


The editors would like to thank Patrick S. O’Donnell for bringing several typographical errors in this entry to our attention.

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