Human Enhancement

First published Tue Apr 7, 2015; substantive revision Wed May 15, 2019

At first glance there does not seem to be anything philosophically problematic about human enhancement. Activities such as physical fitness routines, wearing eyeglasses, taking music lessons and prayer are routinely utilized for the goal of enhancing human capacities. This entry is not concerned with every activity and intervention that might improve people’s embodied lives. The focus of this entry is a cluster of debates in practical ethics that is conventionally labeled as “the ethics of human enhancement”. These debates include clinicians’ concerns about the limits of legitimate health care, parents’ worries about their reproductive and rearing obligations, and the efforts of competitive institutions like sports to combat cheating, as well as more general questions about distributive justice, science policy, and the public regulation of medical technologies.

As usual in practical ethics, an adequate discussion of any specific debate under this heading quickly requires orientation to the science underlying particular enhancement interventions and an appreciation of the social and political contexts in which it unfolds. At each turn in these discussions, wide vistas of background philosophical topics also appear for exploration. Rather than providing a detailed account of this whole landscape, this entry hikes a narrow ridge between the different dimensions of the topic, pointing out the side trails but not following them into their respective thickets. Instead, it traces a path of core concerns that winds through all the current debates on the ethics of human enhancement, as guide for those interested in exploring further. To look ahead, our claim is that three sets of philosophical considerations are key to navigating this literature: first, conceptual concerns about the limits of legitimate health care, then moral worries about fairness, authenticity and human nature, and finally political questions about governance and policy.

1. Introduction

1.1 Terminology

As our preface suggests, the ordinary use of the phrase “human enhancement” covers a wide range of practices, most of which are not explored in the enhancement ethics literature. To orient our tour, both “human” and “enhancement” merit some initial clarification, even before we pursue the ways they are interpreted and debated in the literature. For example, as section 2.3 below shows, equivocations between biological and evaluative senses of the term “human” are rich sources of many superficial disagreements in these debates. Is there anything special about being a member of the biological species homo sapiens that enhancements could threaten, or are those who criticize enhancement as “dehumanizing” really thinking about the loss of other markers of the moral status we confer on persons? To look ahead, we think it will become clear in the sections below that the ethical issues at the heart of the debate about human enhancement are not about policing the biological boundaries of the species homo sapiens. At this point, however, it is enough to note that we are foreclosing neither sense of “human” from the start, but will stay alert to both until it becomes important to distinguish and relate them.

With “enhancement”, on the other hand, it is helpful to specify a working definition from the start. We understand the practices that are being debated in the enhancement ethics literature to be biomedical interventions that are used to improve human form or functioning beyond what is necessary to restore or sustain health. This broad definition flows from and reflects the foundational literature in this area (Parens 1998), but it also has several implications that are sometimes forgotten.

First, it means that simple line-drawing exercises aimed at isolating “enhancement technologies” from other biomedical interventions for special precautionary regulation or oversight are destined to be ineffective (pace Anderson 1989). There are no “enhancement technologies” per se. Whether a given biomedical intervention counts as an enhancement depends on how it is used. When ankle-strengthening surgery is used to improve a bicyclist’s competitive edge, it might raise enhancement concerns, but as a treatment for a bicyclist’s ankle injury, it does not. This means that the developers of even the most outré enhancement interventions will almost always be able to appeal to some correlative therapeutic uses to justify their research, testing, and release into the market (Mehlman 1999). On the other hand, simply pointing out that biomedical technologies can have both therapeutic and enhancement uses does nothing to collapse the logical distinction between those uses, or to defeat the claim that those distinguishable uses might warrant different ethical responses (Buchanan 2011).

Second, the definition of “enhancement” used in this entry restricts the term to biomedical interventions, even though other methods of increasing normal human capacities raise ethical issues as well. Electronic and robotic tools that enable us to listen, observe, help or harm at a distance, lifestyles designed to maximize particular talents, and social practices that foster new forms of human relationship all come with their own trade-offs and moral concerns. But the focus of the enhancement ethics literature is overwhelmingly on interventions that make biological changes in human bodies and brains, using pharmaceutical, surgical, or genetic techniques (Clarke, Savulescu, Coady, et. al., 2016). Standard examples include:

  • cosmetic surgery and the use of biosynthetic growth hormone to increase stature (Miller, Brody and Chung, 2000; Little, 1998; White, 1993; Conrad and Potter, 2004),
  • “blood doping” and steroid use to improve athletic endurance and strength (Miah 2004; Murray 2009; Tolleneer, 2013),
  • psychopharmaceutical approaches to increasing memory, elevating mood, and improving cognitive capacities (Elliott 1998; Whitehouse, et. al., 1997; Sandberg 2011; Glannon 2008; Levy, Douglas, Kahane, et. al. 2014a; Duncan 2016; Earp 2018), and
  • potential genetic and neurological manipulations to increase the human life span, acquire new sensory-motor abilities, and, through “moral enhancement”, live together in more peaceable, generous, and just ways (cf. Savulescu, ter Meulen and Kahane 2011; Harris 2016; Wiseman 2016; Johnson, Bishop and Toner 2019).

Of course, the line between biomedical and other enhancements is often blurry. Caffeine is a drug that can heighten alertness, but coffee drinking is a social practice outside the biomedical sphere. Meditation and prayer can have the same physiological effects as drugs. The “cyborgs” of science fiction blend human bodies with electronic and mechanical tools (Hughes 2004). The prospect of uploading minds into computers to create bodiless human life is sometimes characterized as “radical enhancement” (Agar 2013). But as important and intriguing as these mixed cases are from ethical and conceptual perspectives (Hogle 2005), this essay will only engage them in two ways. The first is when they help advance our understanding of core issues raised by the enhancement uses of the emerging biomedical technologies. The second is when, inevitably, our discussion of biomedical enhancements uncovers insights that reflect back upon the ethical dimensions of these other practices.

Finally, our definition implies that enhancement interventions attempt to improve specific human capacities and traits, rather than whole persons. Unlike such comprehensive personal-improvement strategies such as prayer, psychoanalysis, or “the power of positive thinking”, biomedical enhancements are, at best, a piecemeal approach to human perfectibility. As a result, most biomedical enhancements involve trade-offs. If extended life span comes with prolonged frailty, or if enhanced altruism compromises survival skills, the overall value of the enhancement can be called into question (Shickle 2000).

1.2 Background

An important part of the orientation for those new to thinking about enhancement ethics is the ways in which current debates are shaped by the history of earlier efforts at perfecting people. At one level, perfectionist and meliorist impulses have deep roots in Western philosophical and religious thinking, which both modern science and medicine have inherited (Keenan 1999; Comfort 2012). Most advocates and critics of biomedical enhancement share these cultural commitments, but have disagreeing visions of the ideal (Roduit, Baumann, and Heilinger 2013; Parens, 2005). Other scholars, recalling the historical imposition of hegemonic religious and political visions of salvation and citizenship, fear the elevation of any canonical account of existing human virtues, in favor of visions that prize people’s capacity to shape their own ideals through reason, autonomy, and democratic deliberation (Sparrow, 2014; Buchanan 2011). Others, pointing to the consequences of modern individualism for the common good (Persson and Savelescu 2012), feel confident about being able to name the constellation of existing human traits that should either be preserved (Kass 1997; Annas 1998; Agar, 2013) or enhanced (Bostrom 2003). However, almost no one in this literature eschews the development and use of new medical tools for healing purposes (Kamm 2005; Kass 2003). Because of this, a first step in our discussion is to scrutinize the distinction between treatment and enhancement, to see if it can help demarcate where different melioristic ideals diverge.

Another, perhaps more visible, backdrop for the enhancement ethics literature is the history of the 20th century eugenics movement, which attempted to “breed better people” and “improve the human gene pool” through socially biased reproductive controls and inducements (Wikler 1999). This background prompts questions about the cultural authority of science and the social values it can perpetuate, and raises fears of slippery slopes that can lead to egregious forms of oppression, by providing a vivid recent counter-narrative to endorsements of enhancement as a way to fulfill our obligations to future generations (Sparrow 2011; Selgelid, 2013). The eugenics backdrop tends to skew the burden of proof the other way in the debate, towards a more “precautionary” stance that gives advocates of enhancement the burden of distinguishing their proposals from old style eugenics in order to defend the parts of that ideology that they share (Kitcher 1997; Harris, 2007; Agar 2004).

Finally, in the historical foreground for enhancement ethics are contemporary critiques of the commercialization (and homogenization) of beauty through “aesthetic medicine” (Bordo 1993), the evolving history of pharmaceutical performance enhancement in sports (Hoberman 1992), and the scientific career of human gene transfer and ‘genetic engineering’ (Friedman 1998). Each of these stories supports a literature of its own, which has contributed important insights to the broader discussion of enhancement ethics. From feminist and disability studies come critiques of the medicalization of human beauty, focusing on complicity with unjust social norms that can turn ordinary welfare meliorism on its head to prioritize the enhancement uses of biomedicine over standard therapeutic applications (Silvers 1998). Meanwhile, discussions of “doping” in sport have illuminated the ways in which enhancement interventions can undermine communal social practices that depend on presumptions of equality, lifting the discussion above the level of individual choices and transactions (Murray, 1987; 2009). Similarly the checkered career of human gene therapy has kept on the table the need to anticipate the physical risks of putative improvements, and how daunting they would make the foreseeable prospect of any intergenerational “germ line” enhancement intervention (Walters and Palmer, 1997; Kimmelman, 2009).

All of these contextual “back-stories” to the contemporary enhancement debates are worth exploring further. They have shaped contemporary thinking about and reactions to enhancement proposals and provide important cautionary tales to keep in mind when evaluating those proposals. At the same time, these back-stories bring their own assumptions and biases into the discussion, and can thereby complicate a fresh philosophical assessment.

2. What are the Proper Limits of Health Care?

While much of the enhancement ethics literature leans towards thought experiments set in the future, it is grounded in a set of important debates about how health care should be defined today. In these debates, the claim is often made that the distinction between using biomedical tools to combat human disease and attempting to use them to enhance human traits can provide practical guidance on a range of issues, including the limits of health professionals’ obligations (Miller, Brody and Chung 2000), the scope of health care payment plans (Daniels and Sabin 1994), and the prioritization of biomedical research protocols (Mehlman, Berg, Juengst and Kodish 2011). In each of these cases, the line between treatment and enhancement is drawn to mark an upper boundary of professional and social obligations. Just as the concept of futile treatment is used to indicate the limits of a doctor’s obligations when further intervention no longer can achieve therapeutic goals, enhancement interventions are thought to fall outside health care’s proper domain of practice by going “beyond therapy” in pursuit of other non-medical goals. This means that patients have no role-related right to demand such services from health professionals, fair insurance coverage plans may exclude them, and those who do provide them bear a burden of justification for doing so that does not apply to “medically necessary” interventions.

As a biomedical boundary marker, the distinction between treatment and enhancement has been enshrined in policies at both professional and governmental levels, and continues to inform much of the public discussion of new biomedical advances. However, this distinction is explicated in several different ways, which have different merits as boundary markers for biomedical research and practice. In fact, with philosophical scrutiny, the distinction often seems in danger of collapsing entirely under conceptual critiques even before the question of its moral merits is entertained.

When it is used as a medical boundary concept, enhancement, like futility, plays both descriptive and normative roles. To use these concepts, we need to be able to identify our efforts as either futile or enhancing and we need to know what the boundary means for going further. Part of the practical challenge for policy-makers is that for enhancement interventions, these descriptive and normative implications seem to be at cross-purposes. While futile treatments do no good, enhancements are by definition and description improvements in personal welfare. Yet, the boundary function of calling them “enhancements” in health policy settings is to place them outside of sanctioned interventions. For a field dedicated to pursuing improved welfare for its patients, the fact that enhancements often look just like all the other improvements that health care strives to achieve makes it difficult to discern when an intervention transgresses the normative boundary that the concept purports to mark.

This has provoked three major ways of operationalizing the enhancement concept, each of which seeks to redress the weaknesses of its predecessor, which are covered in the next three subsections.

2.1 Professional Domain Accounts

The first approach to defining the line between treatment and enhancement appeals to the health professions’ conventional vision of their proper domain. Accordingly, “treatments” are any interventions that the professional standards of care endorse, while “enhancements” are any interventions that the professions declare to be beyond their purview. Attempts by professional societies to police their own frontiers by discouraging particular practices as “enhancement” rather than “treatment” reflect this approach, as do appeals to “community standards” by health care payers seeking to distinguish “elective” from “medically necessary” interventions for payment.

For those committed to a particular account of the goals of health care, this approach can offer normative guidance for internal criticism of suspect professional practices (Kass 1985). But of course, there are numerous competing philosophies of health care, none of which command universal allegiance within the health professions. In fact, this approach also resonates well with those who argue that the health professions have no intrinsic domain of practice, beyond that which they can negotiate with patients (Good 1994). For those influenced by this libertarian view of professional autonomy, the normative lesson for professionals concerned about their obligations in specific cases can be simple: whatever interventions their patients will accept can be considered “treatments”, while “enhancements” are simply those interventions which individual health professionals refuse to provide (Engelhardt 1990). Unfortunately, medical historians and sociologists point out that the health professions have always been adept at adapting to the cultural beliefs and social values of the institutions and communities they serve. This is done by ‘medicalizing’ new problems so that they come to be seen as a legitimate part of medicine’s jurisdiction (Conrad 2007). Given the health professions’ philosophical pluralism and political autonomy, their own conventions seem to provide no principled way to exclude new interventions from their domain. To the extent that useful “upper-boundary” concepts are required at the policy level (e.g., for societies making health care allocation decisions) this impotence is an important failing for this approach to drawing the distinction.

2.2 Normal Function Accounts

There is another approach to interpreting the treatment/enhancement distinction that seeks to provide a firmer theoretical foundation for delimiting legitimate health care needs. On this approach, to be healthy is to be able to do all that appropriately matched members of one’s own species can do, in our case what human beings of similar age and gender can do. Legitimate health care needs or “health problems” or “diseases” or “maladies” are all characterized by a fall from that level of functional capacity. All proper health care services, therefore, should be aimed at getting people back to “normal”, e.g., restoring an individual’s functional capability to the species-typical range for their reference class, and within that range to the particular capability level which was the patient’s genetic birthright. Interventions which take people to the top of their personal potential (like athletic training) or beyond their own birth range (like growth hormone), or to the top of the range of their reference class, or to the top of the species-typical range, or beyond (!), are all to be counted as enhancements and fall successively further beyond the responsibility of medicine or health care.

The advantage of the normal function account is that it provides a single (relatively) unified goal for health care, towards which the burdens and benefits of various interventions can be relatively objectively titrated, balanced, and integrated. Normal functionalists can use physiology to determine when they’ve achieved the species typical range and clinical histories to determine when they’ve brought a patient up to the baseline of his or her personal capability range.

Some critics of the normal function approach take issue with its focus on the “species-typical range”, arguing that it is insensitive to the diversity of ways in which human beings can flourish in life. They point out that those born with disabilities may be wary of biomedicine’s “fatal attraction to normalizing”.( Silvers, 1998; Asch and Block, 2011) Moreover, even when no amount of treatment can give someone “species typical” functioning, there may be compensatory technologies that can actually expand their range of opportunities beyond the norm (Silvers 1998). Should powered wheelchairs be designed to slow and stop at the same distance that walking humans would succumb to fatigue, in order to keep them from “enhancing” their users’ abilities? By the same token, the naturally gifted may find that they have no claim to treatment for injuries or accidents that merely bring them down into the “normal range”. If our champion thinkers, athletes and saints can legitimately claim treatment for problems that impair their species-optimal functioning, bringing the rest of us up to their levels should count as proper health care as well. But that leaves only the most extreme improvements on the other side of the “enhancement” boundary: if our species champions are the benchmark, only interventions that create capacities no human has had before would fall beyond medicine’s proper domain. Individualizing the optimal functional range to individual genomic potentials will not resolve this problem, of course, to the extent that our genomes themselves become biomedically malleable. Establishing the “species-typical norm” for a particular human function is a difficult enough task, even where descriptive statistics can help. But when the boundary is “optimal” not “normal” functioning, the evidentiary foundations of the approach begin to come apart (Sculley and Rehman-Sutter 2008).

The second serious problem for the normal function approach is the challenge of prevention. While some efforts at health promotion, such as exercise, straddle the border of medical responsibility, many preventive interventions (i.e., vaccines) are widely accepted as legitimate parts of medicine’s mission and are located squarely on the treatment side of the enhancement boundary. One of the ways to prevent disease is to strengthen the body’s ability to resist pathological changes before any diagnosable problem appears. But to the extent that prevention attempts to elevate bodily functions above the normal range for the individual (and, in some cases, even the species typical range), it seems to slide into what the normal function approach would call enhancement. If the normal function account is taken seriously as a biomedical boundary marker, how does one defend this kind of prevention? Conversely, if preventive interventions like these are acceptable in medicine, what can it mean to claim that researchers and clinicians should be “drawing the line” at enhancement?

2.3 Disease-Based Accounts

Probably the most common rejoinder to the problem of prevention is to distinguish the problems to which they respond. Treatments are interventions that address the health problems created by diagnosable diseases and disabilities—“maladies” in the helpful language of Gert, Culver and Clouser (2006). Enhancements, on the other hand, are interventions aimed at healthy systems and traits. Thus, prescribing biosynthetic growth hormone to rectify a diagnosable growth hormone deficiency is legitimate treatment, while prescribing it for patients with normal growth hormone levels would be an attempt at “positive genetic engineering” or enhancement (Berger and Gert 1991). On this account, to justify an intervention as appropriate medicine means to be able to identify a malady in the patient. If no medically recognizable malady can be diagnosed, the intervention cannot be “medically necessary” and is thus suspect as an enhancement. This would clear the way for safe and effective genetic “vaccines” against predictable muscle damage (even if they provided better than normal damage resistance) but would screen out as “enhancements” efforts to improve traits that were at no diagnosable risk of deterioration (Juengst 1997).

These accounts have the advantage of being simple, intuitively appealing, and consistent with a lot of biomedical behavior. Maladies are objectively observable phenomena and the traditional target of medical intervention. We can know maladies through diagnosis, and we can tell that we have gone beyond medicine when no pathology can be identified. Thus, pediatric endocrinologists discourage enhancement uses of biosynthetic growth hormone by citing the old adage “If it ain’t broke, don’t fix it”. This interpretation is also at work in the efforts of professionals working at the boundary, like cosmetic surgeons, to justify their services. They claim to be relieving “diagnosable” psychological suffering (“mental maladies”) rather than satisfying the aesthetic tastes of their clients, and insurance companies insist on being provided with that diagnosis before providing coverage for such surgeries.

On the other hand, disease-based accounts also face at least two major difficulties. The first is one they share with the Professional Domain account: the problem of biomedicine’s infamous nosological elasticity. It is not hard to coin new maladies for the purposes of justifying the use of enhancement interventions (Carey, Melvin and Ranney 2008). Unless some specific (and usually contentious) theory of disease is employed to give this approach its teeth, it puts the power for drawing the boundary back into the profession’s hands, and raises the same worries about the social consequences of medicalization (Parens 2013).

The more important practical problem is that no matter how the line is drawn, most biotechnological interventions that could be seen as problematic if used as enhancements will not need to be justified as enhancements in order to be developed and approved for clinical use. This is because most such interventions will also have legitimate therapeutic applications. Indeed, most biomedical tools with potential for enhancement uses will first emerge as therapeutic agents. For example, general cognitive enhancement interventions are likely to be approved for use only in patients with neurological diseases. However, to the extent that they are in high demand by individuals suffering the effects of normal aging, the risk of unapproved or “off-label” uses will be high (Whitehouse, et. al, 1997).

This last point is critical for policy purposes, because it suggests that, in countries like the USA, the real challenge may not be regulation of the development of enhancement interventions, but rather the regulation of downstream “off-label” uses of therapeutic interventions for non-medical, enhancement purposes. The policy problems then become problems about controlling access and use of certain interventions, rather than their development. Of course, the fact that a certain type of intervention is declared illegal for physicians to dispense, does not immediately imply that it should be immoral for everyone to pursue or other competent professionals to provide. These realities have pressed those who would use the treatment/enhancement distinction for policy purposes to articulate the moral dangers of biomedical enhancement more clearly. Even if doctors eschew such use on professional ethical grounds, are there independent moral reasons why individual athletes, parents, students or other “consumers” of enhancement interventions, should turn away from their availability?

3. Is it Cheating to Use Enhancements?

One of the kinds of human enhancement that has received extensive philosophical attention in recent years is the use of biomedical interventions to improve the physical performance of athletes in the context of sports (Miah 2004; Murray 2009; Tolleneer 2013). One reason athletic performance enhancement garners so much attention is because of its currency, given the epidemic of “doping” scandals in contemporary sport. Another reason, however, is that it seems to serve as a paradigm case for teasing out important dimensions of the problem: it involves measurable improvements in biological capacities in a social context that is both well outside health care and defined by clear rules of engagement.

At first impression, the ethical problem with performance enhancement in sport would seem to be simply a problem of cheating (Schermer, 2008a). If the rules of sport forbid the use of performance enhancements, then their illicit use confers an advantage to users against other athletes (who either accept the rules of the game or do not have access to the enhancement interventions). That advantage, in turn, can create pressure for more athletes to cheat in the same way, undermining the basis for the competitions at stake and exacerbating the gap between those who can afford enhancements and those who cannot (Murray 1987, Sparrow 2015). Extrapolating from sports to a competitive view of society at large, critics argue that the social acceptance of enhancement interventions in other spheres would also create unfair advantages for those with access to them, and perhaps lead to the development of new social divides between classes of “genobility” and the “genpoor”, raising fundamental justice and human rights concerns (Mehlman 2003, 2009; Buchanan, Brock, Wickler and Daniels 2000; Sparrow 2011).

Much of the rhetoric about “doping” assumes the very claim that needs to be established by argument: that the rules of sport (or the norms of social advancement) ought to ban the use of biomedical enhancement. The rules of a game can be changed. In sports, novel forms of performance enhancing equipment and training are routinely introduced as athletic technology and expertise evolve. Where issues of athletes’ equitable access arise, they can be dealt with in one of two ways. Sometimes it is possible to ensure fair distribution, as for example, when the International Olympic Committee negotiated an agreement with the manufacturer of the new “FastSkin” swimming suit to provide suits to all the teams at the Sydney Olympics. In other cases, inequalities may simply come to be accepted as unfortunate but not unfair. This is, for example, how many people would view a story about an equatorial country that could not afford year-round artificial snow for its ski team, and so could not compete evenly with the ski teams of northern countries. If enhancement interventions can either be distributed fairly or the inequities they create can be written into the rules of the social game in question as part of the given advantages of the more fortunate, then individual users no longer face a fairness problem. For those who can afford it, for example, what would be ethically suspect about mounting a mirror image of the “Special Olympics” for athletes with disabilities: a “Super Olympics”, featuring athletes universally equipped with the latest modifications and enhancements? (Munthe 2000) For answers to that challenge, the critics of biomedical enhancement have to dig beyond concerns about the fair governance of games to a deeper and broader sense of “cheating”, in terms of the corrosive effects of enhancement on the integrity of admirable human practices (Loland 2002; Schermer 2008a).

On this view, to the extent that biomedical shortcuts allow specific accomplishments to be divorced from the admirable practices they were designed to reflect, the social value of those accomplishments will be undermined. If one’s good grades are gained by drug fueled “cramming” rather than disciplined study, their value as evidence of learning diminish. This means that for institutions interested in continuing to foster the social values for which they have traditionally been the guardians, choices will have to be made. Either they must redesign their games to find new ways to evaluate excellence in the admirable practices that are not affected by available enhancements, or they must prohibit the use of the enhancing shortcuts. However, knowing which way to go suggests that one has a theory of the social practice at risk and of the values that animate it. The case of sport again leads the way down this path in the literature, perhaps because, unlike most important social practices that might be susceptible to enhancement shortcuts (like child-rearing, education, love, politics, and spiritual growth), the stakes are low enough to allow for some deliberate policy-making at the international level.

For example, one prominent theory that has influenced the work of The World Anti-Doping Association (WADA), the international organization committed to policing performance enhancement in elite sport, is the view that “just as healing is the point or goal or end of surgery, so the virtuous perfection of natural talents is the point or goal or end of sport” (Murray 2009). This statement has several important features for the enhancement debate. Sport is concerned with celebrating differences in natural talents and the virtues that can be displayed in attempts to differentiate one’s own talents even further. The virtues that sport celebrates are socially admirable habits and traits in and of themselves, and their promotion is what gives sport social value as a practice. However, within the practice, the virtues are instrumental (as either side-constraints or facilitators) to the perfection of the athlete’s natural talents—i.e., to their differentiation from other people’s talents. Although the key role of hierarchical ranking in sport is often ignored in the rhetoric of sports organizations, philosophers of sport acknowledge that fixation with hierarchical ranking—with competition, contest, score-keeping, record-breaking, championship, victory and defeat—is pervasive in the everyday practice of sport (Coakley 1998) and that “comparing and ranking two or more competitors…defines sports characteristic social structure” (Loland 2002, 10). Sport creates a system of values, virtues, and practices that are designed to hierarchically grade people in terms of their (virtuously perfected) inherited traits and glorifies the best specimens as champions. What is unfair about enhancement, on this view, is that enhancement interventions undermine the ability of sport to distinguish those who passively inherited their talents from their progenitors from those who actively acquired them from their physicians (Sandel 2004).

But this outcome seems to display the very problem that the fairness critique of enhancement was meant to combat: the danger of fomenting distributive injustice by creating social hierarchies of advantage on arbitrary grounds (Tännsjö 2000; Tännsjö 2005). On one hand, of the many ways humans use inherited traits to create interpersonal hierarchies, athletic competition is amongst the most benign. When it is “just a game”, comparative interpersonal ranking in terms of genetic identity in sports is a welcome substitute for blood feuds, racism, and genocide. But when sport becomes a matter of national pride and a source of economic opportunity, athletic losers risk more than simply admiration and social status: like insurance applicants with genetic susceptibilities, less naturally talented athletes risk access to important social benefits and potential life plans. In this regard, the challenge that performance enhancement poses to sport is its indictment of the accepted social practice itself rather than its threat to undermine it. The availability of biomedical abilities to undermine competition simply raises the question: are there ways to enjoy, appreciate and even show off our bodies and abilities without requiring someone else to lose social standing on genetic grounds?

For the case of sports, it seems like this line of fairness arguments ultimately backfires on the critics of enhancement. It opens the door to thinking about enhancements as means to render the practice more rather than less fair. Whether or not fairness arguments would have a similar effect in debates about enhancement in the realm of other social practices, like parenting or diplomacy, is still an open question. But the theme of “cheating” has also been taken in another direction by the enhancement ethics literature, into concerns about the authenticity of accomplishments achieved with the help of enhancements and the integrity of the enhanced individuals that claim their rewards.

4. Do Enhancements Compromise Authenticity?

The intuitive worry of authors who take this question seriously is that biomedical enhancements might not only create corrosive short-cuts within valuable social practices, but also rob those who use them of things they otherwise cherish about themselves—endurance, determination, growth, faith, even luck—by substituting “hollow victories” for authentic achievements. Losing the experience of authentic achievements, in turn, diminishes the character of the user (Sandel 2007), alienating them from themselves and those around them (Agar 2013), and diminishing bonds of solidarity with non-users (Sparrow 2014). Unpacking this intuitive concern into arguments can take multiple paths. It matters, for example, whether the actors are parents enhancing their children or adults enhancing themselves (Habermas 2003), and whether accepted therapeutic uses of the same tools should face the same critique (Elliott 2011).

In order to decide whether particular enhancements compromise authenticity in the ways that these authors suggest, it is important to be clear about what kinds of things are the appropriate targets of attributions of authenticity. Do enhancements undermine the authenticity of one’s self, agency, achievements or actions? Authenticity is widely understood to be a matter of being “true to oneself”. Many authors in these debates do not take the time to carefully explicate their assumptions about “the self” and what it takes to be “true to” it. It is, of course, a challenge to characterize the self to which authentic individuals are true (Trilling, 1971; Taylor 1991; Guignon 2004). If there is a self, then there are difficult synchronic identification questions (i.e., at a given time, what features are constitutive of an agent?) and diachronic identification questions (i.e., across time, what features must persist in order for the self to survive?) that must be resolved. Derek Parfit, working in a tradition of “bundle theories of the self”, articulated the influential position that a person is nothing over and above a series of person-stages that are linked across time by certain psychological continuity relations (Parfit 1984). Given the controversy surrounding these debates about the nature of persons and personal identity, it is no surprise that there is little consensus about whether enhancements undermine authenticity of the self.

In the enhancement debate it is important to distinguish the concerns and the arguments that are provided for and against the moral and ethical significance of various types of enhancement. In this particular domain, the rhetoric is often intense and feverish and it is important to be mindful of whether one is examining a concern or an argument about the moral permissibility of a particular kind of enhancement (Buchanan 2011). While evaluating these authenticity concerns, it is helpful to bear in mind the scope of the authenticity concern under scrutiny. That is, it is important to be clear about whether the authenticity concern that is being expressed purports to (1) show that all enhancements are immoral, (2) show that most enhancements are immoral, or (3) show that a particular enhancement is, or would be, immoral (Buchanan 2011).

One style of argument for the claim that enhancements undermine authenticity is to contend that we could claim no personal credit for accomplishments that are the result of biomedical enhancements, because the biomedical interventions that caused improvements in our capacities would supersede our own agency in authoring the achievement (Sandel 2007). Defenders of this perspective argue that while, for example, education, training, and practice proceed through “speech and deeds” that are comprehensible by those who are learning a new skill, when biomedical enhancements are used they have “their effects on a subject who is not merely passive but who plays no role at all. In addition, he can at best feel their effects without understanding their meaning in human terms” (Kass 2003, 22). One reply to this argument is that if one has freely chosen to use an enhancement on the basis of “speech and deeds”, it is unclear how those enhancements are passive or less authentic than traditional methods of improving one’s capacities (Kamm 2005). Moreover, just as we hold those with enhanced abilities to higher standards of responsibility for negligence and harm (Mehlman 2003), our expectations for enhanced achievements may be correspondingly high (Carter and Pritchard 2019). But in both situations neither the enhanced actors’ agency in improving themselves nor their authorship of the results seems to be in question (Cole-Turner 1998).

Other critics of biomedical enhancements that appeal to considerations of authenticity acknowledge that enhanced individuals do author their accomplishments, but question whether those successes carry the same value as “authentic” unenhanced achievements (Habermas 2003; Sandel 2007; Bublitz and Merkel 2009). They maintain that when a marathon runner gains endurance chemically rather than through training, or when a mystic gains Nirvana through psychosurgery rather than meditation, each misses the point of these types of accomplishments. In the cases of marathon running and meditation, the outcomes of the activity cannot be separated from the activity itself: the value of the accomplishment lies in the personal activities they reward as well as the benefits they bring (Schermer 2008a; Spitzley 2018). However, even if these criticisms show that authentic, unenhanced achievements are valuable for reasons that do not apply to the enhanced achievement, they do not show that the unenhanced approach is, overall, better. Such criticisms merely establish that the two are valued differently. It is still possible that the enhanced achievement may have its own distinctive type of value. As the history shows, the character-building struggles that we admire seem adept at keeping pace with our tools. Legend has it that Celtic warriors eschewed body armor (and even clothing!) in battle because they thought it diminished the glory of a true victory. Some authors used to insist that keyboards corrupt the writing process. According to this historical narrative, biomedical enhancements have provided humans with important tools for self-creation that should be embraced (DeGrazia 2000; Agar 2004).

Another set of authenticity concerns arises in arguments that focus on enhancement interventions performed by parents in conceiving and raising their children (Habermas 2003). Here, the claim is that offspring who have no agency in deciding whether or not to be enhanced are (existentially) cheated of their authentic identities and the autonomy to create themselves as others normally do. Taken literally, this argument runs into the logical problems of identity that plague “wrongful birth” suits in the law (these children have no prior identity to lose), and depends on too extreme a version of genetic or biological determinism to be credible, given the plausible causal efficacy of any of the possible enhanced interventions under discussion (these children’s futures are no more restricted than any other participant in the natural genetic lottery) (Buchanan 2011). As a result, a more common approach is to use such claims to draw attention to parental or social attitudes about procreation and parenting that seem morally problematic, whether or not their offspring are directly harmed or wronged by being enhanced (Davis, 2010) Evaluating these arguments also requires one to get clear about the nature and scope of the moral right to be a parent and the duties of parents to their children (LaFollette 1980; Liao 2006a).

5. Are Enhancements Dehumanizing?

In the background of the debates over both the boundaries of medicine and the ethics of self-improvement looms a third important set of philosophical concerns, which are about the implications of new biomedical enhancement interventions for our common understanding of human nature and the future of our species. Critics emphasize “dystopian nightmares” and worry that enhancement interventions may rob us of central normative features of our identity as human beings (Mehlman 2012). Enhancement enthusiasts, on the other hand, embrace the possibility that biomedicine might change human nature for the better, and some even look forward to the emergence of the trans-humans or post-persons as the next step in (intentionally directed) human evolution (Bostrom 2003; Harris 2007). At stake in these debates is whether, or how much, normative weight to assign features of the human condition that have traditionally been taken as given (e.g., the families into which we are born and our natural talents and abilities) or inevitable (such as, pain and ageing).

Moral philosophy has a long history of making normative appeals to human nature. There are thorny philosophical issues about whether such appeals are ever legitimate. Even since David Hume warned us not to derive an “ought” from an “is”, philosophers have been wary of making strong inferences about what ought to be done directly from claims about human nature. However, the tradition of virtue ethics is much more comfortable with adopting a naturalistic approach that holds that human nature is the basis for what constitutes human well-being and the virtues (for human beings) (Fitzgerald 2008; Keenan 1999). Explaining what is worth cherishing about being human is an intuitive starting point for making sense of ourselves, our relationships with other human beings, and the world around us. The task of getting clear about what we do and should value about being human has important implications for the ethics of biomedical enhancements.

Three features of human nature are at the center of many debates about the ethics of biomedical enhancement. The first feature is human vulnerability. According to one prominent view, human beings are creatures that suffer, age and die, and our struggle to deal with this vulnerability is a central aspect of what makes human life valuable (Parens 1995). There are several sub-groups within the group of theorists that emphasize the value of vulnerability in understanding the value of being human. The first group consists of “life cycle traditionalists” who criticize ambitions to control the human ageing process and extend the human life span (Callahan 1995). The second group consists of the “personalists”, who valorize the way in which human limitations are humbling and encourage modesty (Fitzgerald 2008). The third group consists of “psychopharmaceutical Calvinists” who discourage easy fixes to melancholy and sadness (Elliot 1998). The second feature of human nature that is emphasized in these debates is discussed by species preservationists and environmentalists who stress our embodiment and place in nature alongside other organisms: “by nature”, we are biological creatures of a particular family, defined by painfully evolved “species barriers”, and enhancements that blur or bend those boundaries by “directing evolution” do so at our peril (McKibben 2004). The third feature of human nature that is often discussed in these debates is our sociality. According to these theorists, human beings are social creatures that relate to one another through a complex nexus of interpersonal commitments and hierarchical structures (Liao 2006a; Liao 2006b). Many sports theorists see the “virtuous perfection of natural talents” as the goal of athletic competitions. If one accepts this view, then victories fueled by biomedical enhancements that subvert the natural interpersonal hierarchies that genetic disparities in talent create can literally “dehumanize” sport (Tolleneer, Steryck and Bonte 2013).

Each family of theories described above that emphasizes a feature of human nature as the basis for its position in the enhancement debate utilizes a tool that is double-edged. As defenders of trans-humanism point out, each feature of human nature that can produce positive value for humans can just as easily be a source of human misery, which the history of technological progress has been legitimately concerned with alleviating (Juengst 2004). In fact, the enthusiasts argue, there are no static features of the human condition: human vulnerabilities to our environment have steadily decreased over history, our moral kinship communities have expanded, and our tolerance for oppressive forms of social organization has dwindled (Bostrom 2003). Accordingly, to appeal to these features of human nature in abstraction cannot be helpful in deciding which vulnerabilities to honor, which family loyalties to respect, and which social arrangements to defend and develop. Where a biomedical intervention alters one of these dimensions of human nature, this is a signal that the moral stakes are high. But those stakes are not always about what might be lost from the human experience. There are also moral dangers in what might be perpetuated, if we allow the preservation of these hallmarks of human nature to overshadow our other values.

One popular response to the enthusiasm of the trans-humanists is to draw a line against interventions that might take their recipients out of our biological species altogether. This is usually framed as a minimal proposal to ban the clearest possible cases of immoral manipulation, on which everyone could agree. From proponents of “responsible genetics” (Council for Responsible Genetics 1993) to defenders of our “genetic patrimony” as the “common heritage of all humanity” (Knoppers 1991), to the “anti-post-humanist” life cycle traditionalists, the prospect of “species altering experiments” which might “direct” human evolution is provoking resistance (Mehlman, 2012).

A classic example of this resistance is the appeal for a UN convention on genetic technologies framed in terms of “the preservation of the human species” (Annas, Andrews, and Isasi 2002). Its advocates claim that any intervention that would “alter the essence of humanity itself by taking human evolution into our own hands and directing it toward the development of a new species sometimes termed the “post-human” should be considered a “crime against humanity” because it would undermine the “foundation of human rights” and set the stage for human extinction.

Of course, species are not static collections of organisms that can be “preserved” against change like a can of fruit; they wax and wane with every birth and death and their genetic complexions shift across time and space (Robert and Bayliss 2003; Juengst 2017). In our case, almost everything we do as humans has ramifications on that process. To argue that everyone has the right to inherit “an untampered genome” only makes sense if we are willing to take a snap-shot of the human gene pool at some given instant, and reify it as the sacred “genetic patrimony of humankind”—which some come close to doing (cf. Mauron and Thevoz 1991).

There is a risk here of confusing the biological sense of “human” as an taxonomic term (like “canine” or “simian”) and the word’s normative use, as in “human rights”. In the biological sense, ‘human’ refers to the biological species homo sapiens and to be human is to be a member of this biological species. In the evaluative sense, ‘human’ refers to a property that is the basis for having certain moral rights and a particular kind of moral value. Obviously it is not enough to be biologically human to enjoy human rights: human tissue cultures and human cadavers show us that. Is it even necessary to be biologically human to enjoy what we call human rights? There are many candidates for the natural qualities that are the basis for moral rights, but none hinge on a biological designation. So why is it that interventions that “alter the species” “might cause the affected children to be deprived of their human rights”?

Other opponents of directed evolution extend the argument further. They acknowledge that post-humans may be capable of claiming the same natural rights as humans by virtue of their capacities, but argue that creating such a species would challenge the notion that being human is sufficient for claiming those rights, in the same ways that discovering rational extraterrestrials would. This, in turn, would potentially disenfranchise the humans, like infants or the mentally disabled, who cannot show adequate functional capacities to qualify for equivalent species-neutral moral status. At the same time, they argue, if the post-humans actually have expanded capacities, they may claim natural rights to a proportionately expanded range of opportunities and freedoms, beyond those to which normal humans are entitled. This runs the risk of creating the kinds of oppressive hierarchical society against which human rights are supposed to be the antidote, and, potentially, to the return of coercive eugenic programs aimed at the eventual extinction of the human species (Fukuyama, 2002; Mehlman, 2012).

Others point out that while the conceit that our human species could be preserved forever is as absurd as the hope of individual immortality, those facts provide no reason to accelerate either senescence or evolution (Robert and Baylis, 2003; Agar 2013). Even in the face of the inevitability of a post-human species, they argue, we are justified in protecting our (admittedly) “species-relativist” values by rejecting enhancements that would serve to alienate their recipients from their former selves, their families, and their communities. Normal evolutionary processes provide the luxury of time for human populations to “negotiate” their adaptations with the environments that provoke them. Leaving evolution to these normal processes can thus ensure that our evolution is both as deliberate and as tentative as our species’ technological history—and also that it is like technological history in that key “threshold” changes can only be seen retrospectively. From this perspective, the danger is the abrupt provocation of biological speciation which radical enhancements might provoke, if they created reproductive barriers between the enhanced and the unenhanced. However, given that almost none of the single capacity enhancement interventions under discussion—cognitive, physical, moral, etc. —are likely to immediately produce biological reproductive barriers in otherwise species-typical enhanced humans, it is not clear whether the introduction of even the most “alienating” enhancements would create this risk.

Finally, just as it is metaphysically impossible to “preserve” our species from further evolution, it is impossible for us to control the process “from the inside out”, because the genetic constitution of our species is shaped by environmental forces of selection beyond human abilities to control or even, as the phenomenon of emerging epidemics continues to illustrate, anticipate. Moreover, as disability studies scholars point out, humanity is in no better place to decide which human traits deserve promotion today than during the heyday of the Eugenics movement, even if society could tolerate the kinds of reproductive policies it would require to manage just the human part of the evolutionary equation. The striking correspondence between the aspirations of old style Eugenicists and some proposals of contemporary Transhumanists, unfortunately, provides some evidence to back up this claim (Sparrow 2011). Such proposals assume that some genotypes represent “jewels in the genome” (Sikela 2006) while others constitute a form of expensive “toxic waste” that could and should be cleansed from the gene pool (Buchanan, Brock, Wikler, and Daniels 2000). According to critics of transhumanism, this way of thinking reduces the identities of people to their genotypes, and undermines our commitment to the moral equality of people despite their biological diversity (Asch and Block 2011).

As hard as they are to rationally reconstruct, it is important to listen to concerns that some form of biomedicine violates human nature, even in public discussions of policy within a pluralistic society. Whether the concern is the distortion of some constant of the human condition, like senescence, or a “species altering” threat to our collective gene pool, or the corruption of practices designed to celebrate the inherited human traits we value most, these appeals all signal that the intervention in question has deep implications for who we want to be, given who we have been. However, respecting what we have (or have not) inherited from our parents does not in itself fulfill the need to decide which promises we would like to make to our children. Invocations of particular vulnerabilities, loyalties, or forms of sociality from the past can provide fodder for arguing over the positive visions of human nature that should guide those promises. But in communities that accept the possibility of a pluralism of promises, such invocations should also trigger another policy-making response: the need for policy-makers to protect the interests of those excluded from their visions, even while we discuss their merits. The natural human gene pool has no top, bottom, edges or direction: it cannot be “used up”, “diverted”, “purified” or “polluted”. The reservoir of human mutual respect, good will and tolerance for difference, however, seems perennially in danger of running dry. That is our human nature’s truly fragile heritage that we should seek to preserve—and some say even enhance—in monitoring biomedical research on behalf of the future.

6. Conclusion: Policy Perspectives

Nothing in the current debates over the ethics of human enhancement convincingly supports the conclusion that the impulse that drives interest in biomedical enhancement is inauthentically human or morally evil. To the extent that all technology is construed as an effort to extend and improve our inherited human capacities, the impulse to enhance ourselves is a hallmark of our species, as legitimate to celebrate as to disparage. On the other hand, just as specific technologies are never “value neutral” in their design or use, specific applications of biomedical human enhancement can be dangerous, unfair, or vicious. Thus, it is reasonable to endorse the generic claim that biomedical enhancement is morally acceptable as a human practice, and still argue that specific biomedical enhancements would be unethical to pursue.

As with other potent technologies, at some level the potential harms of unethical enhancements will also justify social efforts to formally control their development and use through regulation, law and public policy. Even though this topic moves quickly beyond the biomedical domain to fundamental tensions in political and social philosophy, it does preoccupy enough of the practical ethics literature on biomedical enhancement to warrant a brief concluding discussion here.

Some argue that firm lines should be drawn in public policy and professional practice, against particular degrees of enhancement, like “species-altering interventions” (Annas, Andrews and Isasi, 2002) or “radical enhancements” (Agar 2013). The assumption here is that the moral problems raised by enhancement intensify as the enhanced move away from the human norm, and that a threshold can be identified beyond which prohibition would be merited. Since drawing the line at all enhancement uses of medical technologies would founder against too many contentious borderline and benign cases, this threshold is usually set at the boundary of our species identity, between the human and the post-human. As we have seen, this leaves many problematic enhancements in particular settings—like “gene doping” in sports—unaddressed, and it is still not clear what moral salience sheer taxonomy can have, apart from other ethical considerations—especially when one recalls the pernicious policies other human taxonomies have supported in the past. In practice, such an approach would face all the classic line-drawing problems, and the classic challenges of policing and enforcing prohibitions in a pluralistic and globalized society. Most importantly, however, if it is only those alterations that literally produce new biological species that are of concern the vast bulk of potentially problematic enhancement modifications would not fall within the jurisdiction of this approach.

At the other extreme are those who support a libertarian position, eschewing any blanket public regulation of enhancement in favor of free markets involving those who would develop enhancement interventions and individuals who would use them (Engelhardt 1990; Flanigan 2017). But this extreme position suffers the familiar drawbacks of unregulated market economies: a toleration of severely harmful transactions (e.g., purchasing tickets to a match of gladiatorial combat), the exacerbation of economic inequalities, and a permissive stance to transactions with long-term adverse consequences, which lead to “tragedies of the commons” and environmental devastation. As a result, even the more permissive authors qualify their “utopian eugenics” proposals with the sorts of regulatory protections that surround other consumer products in free-market societies, in terms of safety, fraud, fair pricing and environmental protection (Bostrom 2003), and argue that the political justifications for those policies should support equivalent social controls for enhancement interventions (Kitcher 1997; Harris 2007). Even with minimal legal regulations in place to ensure that markets for biomedical enhancement technologies will be “free”, the libertarian emphasis on the legal permissibility of these transactions is a blunt instrument for dealing with the subtle ethical complexities involved in deciding whether to use a particular enhancement technology.

Between the extreme positions of prohibition or an open market is a moderate position, which grounds enhancement policy in three of the observations we have made in our conceptual and ethical analyses above:

First, policy will need to focus on governing the uses of technology rather than preventing its development in the first place. This is because of the conceptual flexibility of the boundary between enhancement and treatment. Almost all potential enhancement interventions will be developed first as interventions to treat or prevent human health problems, pursuing goals that will easily offset their potential unethical applications. Beyond that, even to assess the potential harms of enhancement applications of approved medical interventions will require research, even if it also helps pave the way for their use. This means that interventions capable of being used for enhancements will be inevitably invented and perfected as by-products of biomedical scientific progress, and their social control will have to focus on governing their dangerous, unjust or vicious uses (Mehlman 1999).

Second, there are at least two possible responses to harmful interventions, and policy-makers should keep both in mind. If one won’t work, the other approach may. On the one hand, one can try to police and punish unauthorized uses of technology, or alternatively one can focus on protecting the interests of those disadvantaged by those uses. Thus, in sports, authorities screen for and punish “doping” athletes, because they cannot fix the essential genetic injustice of the spirit of sport. In the workplace and in higher education, on the other hand, there may be more concern to reduce the competitive stresses that would tempt people to rely on stimulants rather than their native talents. In families and schools, moreover, allowances are often made for those less capable in some domains, like sports or music, in order to compensate for their disadvantages there by enabling them to flourish in others. Affirmative Action campaigns, the Americans with Disabilities Act, and other civil rights policies also attempt to “level the playing field” in ways that compensate for disadvantaging biological differences rather than attempting to regulate the differences themselves. If we are not interested in policing the enhancement uses of biomedical technology, we may want to explore whether strategies like these might work to undercut the incentives to enhance in unethical ways.

One trap that some authors have fallen into in pursuing this compensatory course is to try to use the enhancement shovel to dig out of the enhancement hole. Worried that an unregulated surge in biomedical enhancement might open the door to injustice and social harm, some are now arguing that the prerequisite for widespread access to enhancement should be the widespread enhancement of our moral faculties. Improved moral discernment and reasoning, keener senses of empathy and fairness, and deeper sense of solidarity, it is argued, will help mitigate the potential social harms by insuring that the users of enhancement are equipped to do so responsibly (Tennison, 2012; Persson and Savulescu 2012).

The irony of this argument, of course, is that accomplishing these prerequisite moral upgrades would require a social gate-keeping system as intrusive and draconian as any attempts to police the use of particular enhancements themselves (Sparrow 2014b; Harris 2016; Azevedo 2016). It would also open to debate the criteria by which such moral upgrades would be made (Joyce 2013; Craigie 2014; Wiseman 2016; Hauskeller and Coyne 2018; Johnson, Bishop and Toner 2019; Paulo and Bublitz 2019). Would we still allow the enhanced to follow normal views of when the obligatory becomes supererogatory, or expect more of them? Presumably, we need not aspire to require superhuman virtues, such as angels might possess. But should they at least be saints? Against whose account of sainthood? Once again, the panorama of alternative philosophical traditions opens up for exploration down this road, offering no quick resolution for policy.

However, it is worth remembering at this point that particular biomedical enhancements will never yield comprehensive improvements in moral character, if only because moral character is not reducible to its biological substrates in people’s brains and genes. Instead, enhancement will at best be able to change specific biological functions in ways that improve the chances that a person will act in a particular manner, like telling the truth, at the expense of reducing the chances of some other reaction, like lying, which, in particular circumstances, may actually be the more virtuous thing to do. This piecemeal, double-edged feature of biomedical enhancement means that every morally enhancing intervention runs the risk of being a morally disabling intervention at the same time.

This point suggests a third observation from our review: despite the claims of its defenders, biomedical enhancement is not a practice that is not always especially well-suited to a melioristic ethic aimed at improving human welfare. Often a step forward for some purposes is also a step back in other contexts. Many enhanced people are correspondingly disabled, and so by extension are their teams, families, communities, etc. Consider, for example, an enhancement that makes our reflexes faster. Such an enhancement might increase the risk of making mistakes in ways that would be considered an acceptable trade-off for military pilots on solo combat missions, but not for commercial pilots ferrying hundreds of passengers. If our policies were to focus on reminding us that most enhancements come with trade-offs, we might be able to orient our public policy away from either regulatory or compensatory approaches keyed to “enhancement” in the abstract, and towards the specific social and institutional contexts in which particular enhancement interventions might be considered too risky or unfair. Should, for example, the Air Force consider the post-service consequences of a hyper-reflex enhancement for pilots in deciding whether to adopt such an intervention? Should enhanced veterans be able to claim accommodation from employers for their service-induced hyper-responsiveness?

Focusing on trade-offs does not imply that no change is the best policy; there is nothing sacred about the biology we inherit. Some enhancements may well be worth attendant deficits in particular situations for particular individuals. But just as our inherited biology provides no definitive criteria for “human nature” that can be used to curtail enhancement, enhancement cannot take our future biology down any path that offers unequivocal improvement in the human condition.

But would a pluralistic and piecemeal approach to governing the enhancement uses of medical technologies serve the broader needs of distributive justice with respect to enhancement interventions that are deemed acceptable in particular settings? As the enhanced use their improved capacities to gain power, wealth and status, justice might require that access to those enhancements be afforded more broadly, at least for those willing to bear the corresponding deficits (Sparrow 2016). Some authors have argued that a fair system of allocating enhancement opportunities will require a centralized, global agency akin to the World Trade Organization or the International Monetary Fund, capable of adjudicating all the interests involved (Buchanan 2011). But the assumption behind such proposals remains that “enhancements” will always give people fungible advantages over others, like wealth does. It remains to be seen how true this is.

Understanding that enhancements are specific, often double-edged changes—beneficial in some settings for some purposes but not in others—suggests that a better analogy here may be the governance of health care itself. Good health care on the one hand and power, wealth and status on the other are positively correlated, through the expanded opportunity range that meeting specific health needs can provide. That correlation helps support the case for equitable access to health care. But not all health care needs are equally “profitable” in leveraging other social goods, and it is not the goal of a needs-based health care system to address that disparity. Just as a fair system of health care should be able to provide need-based access to specific therapeutic interventions, a fair biomedical enhancement allocation system should be geared to needs of people facing particular life challenges. In fact, in the end, as this tour of the enhancement literature suggests, with sufficient renegotiation of the boundaries of health care, it could be the same system. Again, the task of realizing such a system will continue to be daunting. But it is doubtful that this will require a Brave New World of centralized global moral enhancement schemes: instead, managing our emerging biomedical enhancement abilities begins with the tedious real world tasks of learning to live with human difference and meet human needs.


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Thanks to Allen Buchanan, Jennifer Hawkins, Jonathan Shear, Robert Sparrow, and Michael Tennison for helpful suggestions, and to Warren Whipple for valuable research assistance. Moseley would like to acknowledge funding from grant number 2T32NR008856 (Director, Barbara Mark) from the National Institute of Nursing Research at the National Institutes of Health.

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Eric Juengst <>
Daniel Moseley <>

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