Ibn Rushd’s Natural Philosophy
Philosophy has been divided into theoretical and practical since the time of Aristotle’s distinction of the sciences, and within theoretical philosophy, the enquire on nature was of major import in Ancient and Medieval times. Most of its contents later developed into modern natural science as the seeds of physics or chemistry, but its founding concepts are still worth reflecting upon. Concepts such as those of body and extension, motion and change, time and place, finiteness and infiniteness, and of nature itself have kept their philosophical gist.
The Iranian philosopher Ibn Sina [Avicenna] (d. 1037 CE) organized his philosophical encyclopedia “The Healing” in four sections: Logic, mathematical, and natural sciences, and sciences of the Divine; the doctrine on the human soul was part of the natural sciences. The Andalusian Ibn Rushd [Averroes] (d. 1198 CE) was a faithful disciple of Aristotle and he stuck to the organization of the Aristotelian corpus implemented by Andronicus of Rhodes (fl. 1st century BCE), a scholar of the Peripatetic school who gave the science of the soul a place of its own, as would Averroes. On the Soul belongs to the physical works, but it is devoted to living natural beings with considerable focus on humans and their capacities for sensation and thought, and Andronicus placed it after the first four physical treatises and before metaphysics. The mentioned treatises are the Physics, On the Heavens, On Generation and Corruption, and the Meteorology.
We may say that the Physics, which is the first and the longest treatise on natural philosophy (184a–267b in Bekker’s numbering) contains a number of Aristotelian books that deal with key issues of this science, but Averroes was not aware of this fact that modern research has brought to light. His work was based on the belief in the unity of the treatise, so that he always strove for a coherent, unified reading and interpretation of Aristotle.
Averroes composed Long, Middle, and Short commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics and some essays, masā’il, quaestiones, on physical matters. The Middle and Short commentaries were revised by Averroes himself, and the Long Commentary shows traces of revision, but in general, the Long Commentary represents the last stage of his thought. The Middle Commentaries were favored by later Jewish philosophers, but, as S. Harvey has shown, the Long Commentary on the Physics was soon translated into Hebrew and also drew their interest (Harvey 1985). The Long Commentary was the most influential of the three in the Latin West and a recent collective publication highlights its influence in the field of natural philosophy (Bakker 2015). For this reason the research for this article will rely mainly on the Long Commentary, but additionally on his Middle Commentary on Coming-to-be and Passing-away (De generatione et corruptione). The Physics focuses on one kind of change, namely, local motion, while the latter deals with three othe kinds: changes in substance, quality and quantity. Occasional references to the other commentaries, or to other works, will be made.
- 1. Place and Division of Natural Philosophy
- 2. Four Causes and Three Principles
- 3. Nature and Human Form
- 4. Nature against Fortune
- 5. Absolute or Conditional Necessity in Nature
- 6. Change or Motion
- 7. Infiniteness
- 8. Place
- 9. Void, Motion in the Void
- 10. Time
- 11. Continuum
- 12. Change in Substance
- 13. Substantial change as coming-to-be
- 14. Alteration, Growth, Nutrition
- 15. Movable and Mover
- 16. Qûwa as Force
- 17. First Movable, First Mover, Eternal Motion
- 18. The Incorporeal First Mover
- Final Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Place and Division of Natural Philosophy
Natural philosophy, according to Averroes (following Aristotle), embraces the study of all sensible beings that undergo change and possess the principle of motion and rest in themselves (LC 1G Proemium). The philosophy of natural beings divides into various branches, for instance, psychology or astronomy. Physics is the first and most important branch and since it is scientific knowledge physics has to inquire about causes, and its distinctive causes are “the causes common to all natural entities” (LC 1G). Averroes follows Aristotle and distinguishes four causes—matter, form, purpose and agent—in all natural beings. Physics extends the inquiry on matter and agent to their outmost limits, that is, Prime Matter and the First Mover. Another part of philosophy deals with primary form and first purpose, and this is metaphysics. Averroes adds other aspects to the subject matter of physics, he calls them “accessories”, “necessary concomitants” (lawāḥiq, consequentes) or properties common to all natural beings, namely place, time and the like (LC 1GH; MC 434AE).
However, an important distinction between Aristotle and Averroes is found in the latter’s approach to the value of natural philosophy. Averroes follows the arrangement that Andronicus made of Aristotle’s writings and, therefore, after the propaedeutic study of logic, the study of philosophy begins with the physics in the proper sense of the term. In addition, he remarks that physics belongs to the theoretical dimension of philosophy and that philosophy has a practical dimension too, namely ethics. The practical sciences have taught that “the perfect acquisition of the theoretical sciences brings man to his ultimate perfection and entire essence” (LC 1H). It is the only way man can attain true happiness.
The natural order requires man to cultivate the ethical virtues, justice, temperance, courage, etc., after he really possesses the speculative virtues. Averroes adduces Alexander of Aphrodisias’s preface to his commentary of the Physics to support his statement. Alexander’s commentary is lost and, although Marwan Rashed has published the extant scholia of it, they are limited to explaining Books IV–VIII (Rashed 2011) and no hint concerning the content of the preface is given. Our only source is therefore Averroes’ account:
Alexander explained there the reason why the natural order requires man to be morally virtuous in order that he becomes intellectually perfect. Once the sage is aware of the infinity of time and his individual finiteness, he has no fear, and moreover, once he knows that death afflicts him because of his bodily component, “ex necessitate materiae” (LC 2A) and that he is not going to be deprived of the intellectual perfection he has acquired, he has no fear of death, and some sages, like Socrates, have even preferred death to life because his country did not allow him to go the way of perfection.
The sage wants to be morally virtuous because he knows that both virtues, moral and theoretical, are inseparable. He knows the nature of justice existing in the substance of [created] beings and he aspires “to be similar to this nature and to acquire its form”. (LC 2C; cf. Harvey 1985: 66: 21–23)
Similar views are expressed in Averroes’ Short Commentary: Natural philosophy has a twofold dimension: it is knowledge of the material world and a speculative science but it is also essential in contributing to the happiness of those who possess this knowledge. (SC Variant reading to 7:8–8:12), although he later replaced the text with another of technical character.
2. Four Causes and Three Principles
Aristotle stated the four causes—form, agent, purpose, and matter—but he also added three principles, form, matter and privation in Phys. I.7–9. In 190a13–21 Aristotle stressed that in all cases of coming-to-be there must be something that underlies change, Averroes extensively comments on the need for a substrate and observes:
Aristotle and all the Ancients agree that nothing comes to be out of nothing, and I have seen some colleagues (socii) doubting on this question, but I entered into this in the treatise On the Substance of the Universe to some extent (LC 36E TC60).
The treatise On the Substance of the Universe is not extant in Arabic, but the Latin and the Hebrew translations are, as A. Hyman explains (Hyman 1986, 13–15). Averroes reminds that “modern thinkers”, i.e., Muslim theologians, have been insisting that coming-to-be does take place out of nothing because of the ‘custom’ of saying it again and again, and bad ‘custom’ has destructive effects. These theologians contend that one who first learns philosophy is then not capable of learning the religious law and that the other sciences are hidden to one who has learned the Sharīʻa (LC 36F TC60). Since Averroes’ colleagues hesitate, he wants to clear up their doubts and wants to comment on Aristotle’s arguments. Phys. 190b5–10 describes the various ways of generation and concludes that all need a substratum, an underlying matter. Averroes who explains that the logical procedure followed here by Aristotle is induction—reasoning from the particular to the general—concludes: “It is clear that coming-to-be necessarily requires a subject not only in natural but also in artificial things” (LC 37L TC63). This subject is numerically one and does not have any substantial characteristic (dispositio) but can receive all kinds of substantial characteristics:
It is called first matter, and first hyle, and it is evident that this matter is <not> deprived of corporeity because if it was, it would have a substantial nature, a name, and a definition. From this it appears that he who affirms that this nature (sic, natura) is a body, is wrong, and he is likewise wrong who establishes that which has dimensions as a subject possessing form in actuality, as Avicenna believes (LC 38D TC63).
No doubt Averroes is referring to the “corporeal form” of Avicenna. Since Prime Matter is a metaphysical notion and as such nothing empirically verifiable, questions arose about its kind of existence. The Greek commentators developed the concept of corporeal form, which Avicenna maintains mainly in his physics. The corporeal form, ṣūra jismīya, invests Prime Matter with corporeality and dimensions. Averroes, however, considers corporeality an attribute, not a form (SC 14: 10–11) and here in the LC he rejects the doctrine of the corporeal form.
The LC is concerned with the distinction between Prime Matter and privation. The bronze, matter, can become the statue, form, because it is not the statue and this negation is a third principle. Aristotle distinguished between absolute non-being and accidental not-being, and so matter is non-being accidentally, while privation is not-being per se (Phys. I.9, 191b34–192a5). In his interpretation of the Aristotelian passage, Averroes points to the privation of form as the nature of matter. Prime Matter is “almost composed of being and not-being” (LC 45C TC80). Because of the presence of not-being in material beings, coming-to-be and passing-away is possible in them but not in heavenly bodies which do not have matter, “as was explained in the treatise On the substance of the universe” (LC 45CD).
The Middle Commentary also deals with privation (MC 439K–440I; MC Kalonymos L 13vº–15rº) and insists on privation being a principle. Averroes indicates that the nature of Prime Matter is different from that of privation
for privation does not belong to the nature of coming-to-be in such a way that it becomes part of the generated thing but it is only some accident to the subject which is a [constituent] part of the generated thing. But it is necessary for coming-to-be and therefore, it is accidentally called principle. (MC 440E; MC Kalonymos L 14vº7–9)
Incidentally, it should be observed that in the SC Prime Matter is seen as containing all forms “in potentiality and possibility” (SC 15:7). The distinction between qūwa and imkān is not explicitly present in Aristotle, where we only read kata dynamin in the related text (Phys. 192a26), although he sketches the distinction in some passages of Metaphysics IX. However, the distinction is well known to Avicenna. In his Shifā’, Metaphysics IV.2 (Avicenna, Metaphysics, IV.2, 130–143), Avicenna explains the notions of potentiality and possibility in detail; Avempace also makes the distinction in his commentary on the Physics (Avempace [SST], 28: 21–30, 10). The LC and the MC do not refer to the distinction, and the absence may be explained because Avempace’s influence loses weight in Averroes’ later stages.
3. Nature and Human Form
At the end of his Long Commentary on Book I, Averroes distances himself from Avicenna in so far as the latter maintains that Metaphysics has to prove the composition of matter and form in any body. Averroes claims that only the observation of changes in the substance can explain the existence of these two principles (LC 47H TC83). He is not quoting Avicenna in an exact way, so he may not have had Avicenna’s books of the Shifā’, “The Healing”, at hand. However, he is right in the interpretation, since Avicenna states that the subject matter of natural philosophy is the body as such, not the condition that it is composed of matter and form (Avicenna, Metaphysics, I.2, 7).
Avicenna affirms also that the natural philosopher is not allowed to address the question of Nature as a principle but has to receive it from the metaphysician (Avicenna, Physics, I.5, 39–40). Averroes, at the beginning of his commentary on Book II follows his Master Aristotle and defines Nature as “principle and cause by reason of which that in which it is changes [primarily and per se] and by reason of which that in which it is rests primarily and by itself” (LC 49B TC3). Aristotle’s definition in Phys. 192b21–23, reads perhaps more clearly: “Nature is the principle and cause of motion and rest in that in which [Nature] inheres primarily and by itself, and not accidentally.”
According to Averroes the existence of Nature is self-evident as well as its definition; the metaphysician does not have to prove it. He disagrees with Avicenna who seemingly contended that Nature belongs to the class of things that are not self-evident and that the definition above is not known by itself; for this reason the metaphysician should have to explain what Nature is. Averroes is not sure about what Avicenna said and he admits that the metaphysician is qualified to refute those views denying the existence of Nature as a principle. He guesses that Avicenna was moved to this view “because [Aristotle] had explained in Books VII and VIII that every movable has a mover, and there is no doubt about it except for the four elements” (LC 49B).
They move by themselves but mover and movable are different in them (see below § 12), and Avicenna would falsely understand that Aristotle had not explained it in physics so held that the metaphysician had to do it.
Is Nature a material or formal cause? Aristotle said that some of his predecessors, and he names Antiphon among them, held that Nature was solely a material cause, and not a formal cause; they would say that Nature is fire, earth, air or water (Phys. II.1, 193a12–26). Alexander of Aphrodisias, according to Averroes, added that they also did not know that Nature “was different from the other accidents” (LC 51G TC8) and Averroes joins his view. Nature is not only matter but form too, and it better deserves to be form because form is in actuality as Nature is (LC 52G TC12).
Within the context of Nature as form and “inasmuch as privation is a kind of form” (Phys. II.1, 193b18–21), Averroes insists on a twofold division of form: there are perfect and imperfect forms. Perfect forms are free from privation, while imperfect, diminutae, forms contain some kind of privation (LC 53G TC15). In the example of blackness becoming whiteness, whiteness is perfect form since there is no privation inherent it, but blackness is not, since the privation of whiteness inheres it. Form has these double aspects in all contraries existing in qualitative changes. In the case of substantial changes—the generation of water out of air would be one example—doubts arise since contraries are apparently not existent.
Averroes recalls that privation exists in Prime Matter and thinks that Aristotle “perhaps wanted to say that form is predicated in both aspects of the disposition and privation existing in Prime Matter” (LC 53H TC15). Privation existing in Prime Matter is not absolute privation and Averroes adds a gradation: quodammodo, “in a certain way” because this kind of privation is “like the form of matter” (LC 53I) that never deserts matter. Averroes tells us that Aristotle will inquire later about the issue in the Book De generatione et corruptione, and Book II of the Aristotelian Coming-to-be and Passing-away explains the composition of the four elements, the forms of which are the primary contraries, i.e., the four primary qualities (Averroes [SC GC]: 27). Averroes anticipates his own conclusion: The kind of privation existing in Prime Matter is such that it is never dispossessed of the primary contraries (LC 53K TC15).
Nature is form, and perfect form, but “inasmuch as privation is a kind of form” Nature is affected by the kind of privation existing in Prime Matter, in such a way that Nature can be considered an imperfect form. This seems to be Averroes’ interpretation of Phys. I.1, 193b18–21 concerning the two kinds of perfection.
Averroes follows Aristotle who asserts that the philosopher of Nature also has to inquire about the purpose and the means needed for this purpose (LC 57EH TC23; Phys. 194a29–30) and reformulates Aristotle’s reasoning in a syllogistic way: “Nature is the last of the motions of coming-to-be, but it is nobler than the foregoing ones; Everything in this manner is purpose, ergo Nature is purpose,”and he distinguishes it from death that is solely end.
We had read that the philosopher of Nature is concerned with Prime Matter, but “since matter belongs to the genus of relation”, i.e., it depends on its relation to form (LC 58K TC26; Phys. II.2, 194b9), its study also involves the study of form. Averroes mentions that matter exists on account of form, propter formam, and that the philosopher of Nature investigates both. He investigates form per se, and matter because of form (LC 58L), but the issue of how far his research can go arises. The philosopher of Nature searches for form and quiddity and goes as far as to the last, or highest form on the account of which matter exists, and this is man’s form, forma hominis (LC 59A TC26). Averroes is very assertive and once again he disagrees with Avicenna when he claims that only the metaphysician deals with these forms. For Averroes, the metaphysician studies the abstract forms, i.e., existing without matter, while the philosopher of Nature, the material forms but also the human form which is an intermediate between them and the purely abstract forms (LC 59D).
4. Nature against Fortune
Chapter 3 of Aristotle’s Physics II is a treatise on the subject of the four causes and it corresponds almost entirely to Metaphysics V.2. Then chapters 4 and 5 examine the question of chance and incidental causation, i.e., spontaneity. The question is related to whether Nature acts with purpose and Averroes sees its great significance. Commenting on 196b10–17, Averroes enters into a discussion with Avicenna on the status of two irregular kinds of causation, fortuna and casus, chance (LC f. 66D–67D TC48). In the Arabic translation of the Physics they were bakht and min tilqā’ al-nafs (Aristotle, Ṭabīʻa [1964: 111: 4–5]), and in Averroes’ short commentary, bakht and ittifāq, respectively (SC 26: 19). Averroes formulates the Aristotelian argument in the form of a conditional syllogism the conclusion of which is that spontaneous causation happens in things that are possible only in a few cases, in minori parte. Avicenna argues that the same action can be necessarily caused in some beings and accidentally in some others and that, in a similar way, the action can be possible for some beings in most cases and for some others in the least cases. Averroes gives an example of walking and resting. According to Avicenna, walking is accidental from the point of view of the moving power, but it is necessary from that of the desire.
In Avicenna’s metaphysics necessity pervades everything, so that we should agree with Averroes’ view that for him “all [actions] are necessary by nature”, (LC 66M). Averroes affirms contingency and points out that Prime Matter is prepared to receive two contraries in the same way but that efficient causes act differently. Any contingent action does not correspond with two efficient causes “contrary in the same way and at all the time”. Averroes objects that if any efficient cause would equally act or not act, then the whole of Nature would act without any rule, that is, in vain, ociose, a result that neither Aristotle nor Averroes accept. The following quotation illustrates Averroes’ thought:
When we say that in Prime Matter the potentiality (potentia) for being is the same as the potentiality for not being, we mean that two contraries exist in it at the same opposite times, as for example rain can be and not be, but here in the winter, and here in the summer, and that the causes equally producing these two contingent [facts] must be alternating at equal times, [but] the action of those [causes] takes place generally, and [the causes] are the celestial bodies, and consequently they are causes of that which exists just as of that which does not exist. (LC 67BC TC48)
Averroes solves the conflict in an original way, he ranges Prime Matter and passive potencies against efficient causes and active potencies. Passive potencies are in principle indifferent to a certain action and they are the reason why contingent actions may take place or not likewise. Active potencies, on the contrary, follow rules so that their actions are not equally contingent but usually happen. A further distinction between essential and accidental causality helps him to explain generally and rarely occurring actions (LC 67GK TC49). Under another aspect, the agent, or efficient cause, necessarily produces the effect in the case of eternal beings and generally does it in the beings that come-to-be (LC 75D TC74).
The philosopher of Nature enquires about Nature and about the four causes, and we have known the material, formal and efficient causes, but does Nature act for a purpose? Aristotle starts Phys. II.8 saying that he is going to prove that Nature belongs to the final causes (198b10–15) and Averroes observes that this tenet is a basic principle in Physics and Metaphysics (LC 75L TC75). If the philosopher of Nature would deny the existence of purposiveness in it, the other causes would be annulled. Matter exists on the account of form, we have read. Form exists because an agent impresses it on matter, and the agent acts because it wants to achieve an end. And “if the metaphysician would not admit [the principle of purposiveness] he would be unable to prove that God has solicitousness for those [beings] that are here.” (LC 75L)
Aristotle mentioned Zeus in Phys. II.8, 198b10–32 but to deny that he produced rain in order that crops grow; rain happens out of necessity. Since Averroes read God instead of Zeus in the Arabic translation available to him (Ṭabīʻa [1964: 144: 3]), and he also used the word in his comment on the first passage (LC 76H–77B TC76), it is remarkable that he did not see divine providence assailed by that claim. Averroes saw no difficulty in Nature acting here with purpose, and he placed God in a rank higher than just making rain fall. For him God acts as final cause and the order of Nature reveals the presence of His intelligence.
Aristotle argued that there is purposiveness in the natural as well as the artificial realm concluding that “it is obvious that Nature is a cause, and one directed towards an end” (Phys. II.8, 199b32–33). Averroes agreed and opposed those who claim that purposiveness exists only in deliberative actions because arts act externally while Nature acts internally. He notes that not all arts are deliberative and that the physician is capable of using the art of medicine to heal himself, he is not external to the action (LC 81I–82A TC86).
5. Absolute or Conditional Necessity in Nature
Purposiveness and necessity are interrelated and Aristotle analyses the matter in Phys. II.9, introducing the distinction between absolute and conditional necessity. Conditional necessity is always subject to achieving an end. A well-known instance is given by Aristotle in 200a10–15: a saw must necessarily be made of iron to do its work. The material, iron, is necessary but does not lead to the production of a saw. Purpose precedes deliberative actions and imposes necessity upon the materials. As for natural events, Aristotle only says: “necessity in the natural [events] is limited to what is called their matter and their motions” (Phys. II.9, 200a30–32), not to the results, and the question arises whether necessity is absolute or conditional.
Averroes pays attention to the division between that which results from an intended action and that which results from having a certain matter. He quotes Alexander of Aphrodisias, whose commentary on the Physics, as already noted, is not extant: “Those [causes] that are before the purpose in something (in re) are not said to be cause of the purpose except in the way that matter is cause of the purpose” (LC 82M TC88).
We know that Alexander had to defend the Aristotelian position against the Stoics in such an important matter as destiny or fate. In his book On Destiny Alexander admits fate in Nature but not as governing human acts. While the final cause appears in planned changes as external to them, “the creations of Nature have the principle and cause of such generation within themselves” (De fato 168). Alexander’s treatise On Providence was well known to Averroes who paraphrased part of it in his “Short Commentary on the Metaphysics”, as R. Arnzen has proved (Arnzen 2010: 331–335). This is the context within which we may interpret the short quotation Averroes makes of Alexander and Averroes ends it adding “purpose is indeed the main cause” (LC 83A TC88).
Averroes also reflects upon necessity of that which follows matter. One example is death which is necessary for animals as a consequence of their matter. Is this an absolute necessity? Averroes denies it, pointing out that these instances of necessity are caused by the substantial form or essential definition of the beings, here the animals. Averroes claims that both cases of necessity—according to matter or according to purpose—have conditional characters since “they are because of the form and essence (definitio) and they are not unconditionally necessary” (LC 83C TC88).
Averroes finally reflects on absolutely necessary, which seemed to be excluded by Aristotle in the passage. Whenever we ask for the reason of products of Nature or of the arts, the answer we get is their final cause, for instance, why does a saw have sharp teeth? To cut wood. The answer however is completely different in the case of the eternal beings. An eternal being acts because of its essence, its activity is because of itself, propter ipsum, and necessity is unconditional (LC 83F TC88).
6. Change or Motion
In Book III Aristotle defines motion once as “the perfection of that which is in potentiality under the aspect that it is in potentiality” (201a10–11) and another as “the perfection of that which is movable under the aspect that it is movable” (202a7–8). Before reaching the first passage, Averroes distinguishes four premises in Aristotle’s approach to defining motion (LC 86H TC3; Phys. III.1, 200b25–32):
- Being divides into actual and potential being
- All beings belong to [at least] one of the ten Aristotelian categories, praedicamenta.
- The category of relation embraces the relation between more and less, as well as the relation between agent and patient.
- Motion occurs in more than one category (LC 87A TC4).
Based on the evidence of four propositions, Averroes realizes that motion does not have a univocal definition. Motion belongs to the genus of the perfection toward which it intends, thus motion in substance belongs to the genus of substance, motions in quantity, place and quality to the respective genera. But insofar as transition towards a perfection is different from the perfection itself, motion is something different from its goal and Averroes affirms that, considered in this way, “Motion must be a genus per se, for the way toward something is different from it [the end]”, necesse est ut sit genus per se, via enim ad rem est aliud ab ipsa re (LC 87D TC4). For this reason he believes, Aristotle classified motion in own category in his book on the Categories, and as we will see below, the category is being affected, passio.
Averroes remarks that the definition of motion as belonging to the genus of its perfection, is more adequate, verior, although the definition of motion as a genus in itself, is better known, famosior. In the Physics Aristotle deals accordingly with the first definition, Averroes points out (LC 87E TC4). Medieval Latin philosophy would call this view of motion as genus in itself “a flow of form” fluxus formae, and the contrary view, “a flowing form”, forma fluens (Maier 1958: 62–64).
Averroes comments on the definition of Physics 201a10–11: “motion is the perfection of that which is in potentiality under the aspect that it is in potentiality” (LC 87D, secundum quod) and says that the movable has two kinds of perfection, a perfection in actuality, and a perfection in potentiality, under the aspect of which it is called motion. Themistius elaborated on the distinction (CAG 5.2: 69:9–70:31 ) and Philoponus emphasized it in his commentary (Philoponus, CAG 16: 342:10–344:7). Averroes could have received it either from Philoponus (Lettinck 1994: 213) or Themistius (see above). He observes that the definition is valid for both eternal and non-eternal classes of motion and he anticipates that the continuity of motion results from the definition itself (LC 88A TC6).
As for the definition of motion in Phys. 202a7–8, “perfection of that which is movable”, Averroes finds that it is more evident but that of Phys. 201a10–11, “perfection of that which is in potentiality” effectively targets the substance of motion, demonstrat magis substantiam motus (LC92A TC16).
In the Middle Commentary the premises for defining motion are three:
- Natural beings are sometimes in potentiality, sometimes in actuality and “that is common to all ten categories”;
- Motion belongs to the category of relation (hiṣṭarphut);
- Motion is said by analogy (MC 449G–I; MC Kalonymos L 28rº19–28vº8).
The definition of motion presented there is the verior one, i.e., motion belongs to the genus of its perfection, and it is not a category in itself.
Since any change or motion requires two elements, the agent or mover and the patient or movable, Aristotle raises the question whether motion is in the mover or the movable (Phys. III.3). Averroes gives following explanation: the mover acts in so far as it is form, that is to say, in so far as it is in actuality, and the movable is moved in so far as it is in potentiality, therefore the motion “becomes the same perfection of both of them” (LC 92H TC18). Nevertheless, they are two kinds of perfection and Aristotle saw here a dialectical difficulty (aporía logikē, Phys. III.3, 202a21) with which Averroes deals at length (LC 93F–94B TC19) but for Averroes the double character is no difficulty: motion is one and the same according to the subject, different according to the definition (LC 94K TC21).
Motion in place is one kind of change but it is prior to the other kinds, to change in quality or alteration, to change in quantity or growth and decrease, and to change in substance, or coming-to-be and passing-away. Within local motion circular motion is the most perfect form and we will see how the universe is moved by circular motion.
At the beginning of Book III, Aristotle had linked the issue of motion to that of the continuous but also to that of the infinite (Phys. 200b16–18) because the continuous can be divided without limit. Averroes commented there that the advocates of atoms, i.e., the thesis that bodies are composed of a limited quantity of indivisible parts, would not agree with the definition that “continuous is that which divides into infinite”. He added:
Maybe [Aristotle] said so because continuous can have another definition, like as that saying that “the continuous is that in the middle of which a common bound to two parts can be established”. (LC 86A TC1; cf. Categories 5a14–15)
The infinite can be seen under various aspects including intellects and geometrical extensions, but the philosopher of Nature has to enquire only about the infinite “which concerns the extensions that are in matter” (LC 102K TC39). He realizes that there is neither continuous nor discrete infinite actually existent. The infinite can only exist in potentiality.
Further Averroes agrees with Aristotle that spatial extension can be divided in infinitum which does not mean that it actually happens. For the possibility of an infinite by addition, Averroes echoes al-Fārābī’s and Avempace’s commentaries while explaining the passage 206b16–26 (LC 113H–114G T60).
If we would affirm an endless decrease (diminutio), it would be not impossible because decrease is going towards nothing (ad nihil), the cause of which is matter; addition is going towards being, the cause of which is form, infinity exists because of matter, as finiteness does because of form. (LC 114B).
Averroes disagrees with al-Fārābī and Avempace who held the view that just as the geometer can always draw a longer line in infinitum, so a magnitude can always grow larger. For him there is a major difference between the geometer and the philosopher of Nature who can conceive infinity in addition only by means of addition of finite quantities, and so interprets Aristotle. Imagination is responsible for the misunderstanding (LC 120IK TC75).
Adding and deducting finite magnitudes is true in potentiality, but an increasing or decreasing of a whole is not possible, neither potentially nor actually. And Averroes does not comment on Aristotle’s words that time, motion, and thought must be considered infinite (208a20–21), and he only remarks “the infinity which is found in them is not stable, i.e., existing in actuality, and that is impossible, but it is successive” (LC 121A TC75).
Aristotle holds that place is something but it is neither form nor matter. He gives several reasons against place being either of the two and argues, for instance, “If a thing’s place is in the thing (as it must be if it is either its form or its matter), place will be in place” (Phys. IV.2, 210a5–6) and the result is absurd. The passage causes Averroes to depart from the subject and he first considers the following propositions concerning place:
First, form and matter move by means of the body composed of them both. Second, in so far as they move, they need to be in place. Third if one of them is place, place must be in place. The second and third propositions are true, the first is not. (LC 129B TC20)
Averroes reminds us that in Book VII, Aristotle says that the proper subject of change and motion is body, not its matter or its form. Matter and form are in place accidentally and “it is not impossible that place is in place accidentally, per accidens” (LC 129C). What is accidental divides into two categories, always accidental or rarely so. Matter and form always move together with the body, therefore place belongs to the category of always accident, and if it is constant, place is in place all the time, but it is obvious that place is not always in place, either essentially or accidentally. The argument makes an exception: the place of the outermost body, the place embracing the last body, because it moves together with the outermost body, and in this case it is in place accidentally and raro, rarely (LC 129E).
Alexander of Aphrodisias objected because place is related to quantity: Place is equal to the thing that it contains. If a body moves, it moves into a place that is equal to it, and for this reason form or matter are in place essentially. Alexander’s commentary on the Physics has not reached us, and we have to rely on Averroes’ account. He admits: “that which Alexander said is not free of doubt” (LC 129F).
Later on (LC 133H TC30) Averroes refers again to Alexander; he comments on Phys. IV 210b31–211a6, and makes five statements concerning ‘place’ that he considers to be Aristotelian:
- Place contains what is in place and is different from it;
- Place is equal to what is in place;
- Place is separate from what is in place, and Averroes quotes Aristotle: “it is also devoid of any kind of particulars and is separated from them”, extra quodcunque singularium, et separatur ab eis;
- Above and below are the directions of place;
- Place is that toward which what is in place naturally moves.
According to Averroes, Alexander read in statement 3: “It [place] is not devoid of any particulars and is separated”, instead of the affirmative sentence “It is also devoid of any particulars and is separated from them” (LC 133H). Averroes should have read Isḥāq Ibn Ḥunayn’s translation. The Arabic translation of Isḥāq reads here “[Place] is devoid of any aspects and it is separable” (Aristotle, Ṭabīʻa [1964: 302: 9–10]), and it coincides with Ross’ edition (apoleipesthai ekastou, 211a2; [Ross 1936]). Averroes thinks that Alexander’s reading is “more true, but it is not known per se”, and that Alexander would choose this reading to oppose those who pretend the place to be the void.
Since place is neither matter nor form nor extension, dimensio, i.e., an extension that is always independent from that of the movable, Aristotle concludes that place has to be the limit of the surrounding body (peras tou periekhontos sōmatos, Phys. IV.4, 212a2–6). Place does not move essentially, and Averroes says that Aristotle gave a renowned argument, rationemfamosam, to support his tenet (LC 140F TC42; Phys. 212a21–30). The surface surrounding the last sphere of universe is the absolute above, and the center of the universe, i.e., the earth, the absolute below and just as the center is stable, the outmost surface is too; they cannot move at all. Averroes adds that the air is above and the water below “but not absolutely”, since Aristotle could mention fire also, as being light. The argument can be organized as a syllogism of the second figure, and two affirmative propositions: “The highest [body] has to be stable, fixum; the outermost circulating [body] is stable; ergo, the highest [body] is the outermost circulating” (LC 140G).
1) Averroes now faces a great question, magna quaestio, in relation to Phys. IV.5, 212a31–b3, a passage where Aristotle mentions the circular motion in the universe (his commentary, TC43, occupies LC 141C through LC 143C). We know that the outermost sphere moves with the daily rotation but “as a whole it does not simultaneously change its place, though it moves in a circle: for this place is the place of its parts”. Only their parts, the four elements, change place (Phys. 212b1). For this accidental reason, Aristotle grants it some kind of place. The Aristotelian passage remained obscure and discussions about the place of the universe arose.
Averroes expresses the dilemma: “We have the choice between either of two options: either we affirm that something moving is not in place, or we affirm that place is the void, and it is extension” (LC 141F TC43). Averroes mentions the views of John Philoponus (d. 570 CE) and Themistius (d. 387 CE). For Philoponus, the solution to the dilemma consisted in taking place as extension, dimensio, and accepting the existence of the void. Averroes seems to have had access to Philoponus’ Corollary on Place, the Greek original of which is extant (Philoponus CAG 17: 557–585) and has been translated into English (1991). We will see below that Averroes rejects the existence of the void.
2) For Themistius, the celestial body is in a place “not in accordance with the whole but with the parts” (secundum partes, LC 141F TC43), and Averroes explains that “It means in accordance with the spheres that the largest sphere contains”, and we should understand that Themistius skipped the five elements. Averroes interprets that the latter is the sphere of the fixed stars, which is not surrounded by anything else and the concavity of which surrounds everything. Moreover he refers to the “natural science” of his time that proved that there is a ninth sphere, the one of the daily motion, and if so, we can affirm that the motion of the latter is “the essential motion of the whole universe, orbis” (essentialiter, LC 141H T43).
3) The magna quaestio is many-sided. Averroes recalls a passage in Physics VI, 240a29–b7, where Aristotle refuted Zeno’s fourth argument against motion and asserted that the sphere moves in accordance with the whole as well as with the parts. Therefore, if Themistius claimed that the sphere is in place not in accordance with the whole but only with the parts, because he thought that only its parts change place, he would contradict Aristotle’s views (LC 141I).
Averroes says that Themistius could argue that Aristotle in Physics VI meant the same as here in Physics IV, i.e., that the sphere does not change its place as a whole (Phys. 212a35). Averroes restricts the assertion to the spherical body of the universe. Other spheres move because of their parts, which change their places, and the parts are all the celestial bodies:
When he said “but it can move in a circle” (alio modo movetur circulariter 212a35–b1) he meant that the circular motion is predicated of the whole because of certain of its parts, i.e., the celestial bodies, in the same manner as rectilinear motion is predicated of them because of the motion of the elements, which are also some parts of them. (LC 141K TC43)
Themistius interpreted that since Aristotle said that the heavenly body (coelum) is in place per accidens, he assumed another heavenly body to be in place (I add, per se) and Averroes explains “another heavenly body” as all celestial spheres, orbium. According to Themistius, per accidens is such a wide category that the commentators before him did not find the term adequate and they said the heavenly body to be in a place because of its parts. Themistius and Averroes share the view that Aristotle here was using the term per accidens freely (LC 141M). Themistius is a highly regarded authority but Averroes will formulate his own solution.
According to Aristotle—so he understands him—the rectilinearly moving bodies are in place per se, essentially, the rotating bodies, accidentally, per accidens, and the whole universe is in place because of its parts, and parts mean the five elementary bodies (LC 142CD TC43). But before reaching his conclusion Averroes has to clear the way refuting Avempace’s doctrine:
4) Avempace (d. 1138) had his own view on the issue. The sphere is not in place because nothing encloses it from outside. “The place of the sphere that is envisioned by this, in so far as it is sphere, is the convexity of the center, around which it rotates” (LC 142A T43). Avempace would take Aristotle’s definition of place as that which surrounds the body and apply it to the external surface of the bodies moving rectilinearly and to the internal surface of the bodies rotating. Averroes conjectures that Avempace borrowed his view from al-Fārābī (d. c. 950) who refuted the opinions of Joannes Philoponus on place but al-Fārābī’s book “did not fall into our hands”, he says.
Averroes expounded Avempace’s view in the Short (SC 53:10–56:10; Lettinck 1994: 316), and the Middle Commentary at length (MC Kalonymos L 45vº22–47rº23) but he also refers to it in the LC where he rejects it because Avempace “abandoned Aristotle’s discourse and erred heavily” (LC 142K TC43). Avempace and al-Fārābī should maintain that the sphere is in place essentially, and Averroes’ summarizing words in the MC may be worth of being translated:
What we told about place of the sphere is that which Abū Bakr Ibn al-Ṣā’igh and Abū Naṣr [al-Fārābī] before him, considered, i.e., that its parts are in place essentially, i.e., by means of its center. Place is said by equivocity with regard to the place of the spherical body and to the place of the body [moving] in straight lines. Indeed, it appears [to me] that it is most reasonable to say that the sphere is in place accidentally by means of its center which [the sphere] surrounds because what is in place essentially is surrounded, not surrounding. But that which surrounds matches (maqbil) to that which is surrounded. It may be said that which surrounds is in that which is surrounded. Since the body of the heavens does not have anything surrounding it, it is not in place essentially, but it is in place by means of that surrounded by it, and this is accidentally. (MC Kalonymos L 47rº2–10; O 37vº–38rº)
5) Averroes disagrees with Avempace and he still has some reflections on the magna quaestio. He explains that the rectilinearly moving bodies are in place essentially, the rotating bodies, accidentally, and that the whole universe is in place because of its parts, as said before (LC 142CD).
He states: “That which is in place is equal to the place” (LC 142D TC43; cf. Phys. IV.4, 212a29–30). This means, in its proper sense, that the contents of both have to be equal, but the surface of the concave sphere is not equal to the surfaces of the embraced spheres. Averroes refers to their content, and says “that equality is impossible, unless place were the void” (ista aequalitas non est vera de loco, nisi inane esset, LC 142E TC43). Averroes looks for an answer. The universe is at rest as a whole. The earth is the center of the universe and the center is at rest, and it is in place essentially. The heavenly body (coelum) is not at rest in so far as its parts, i.e., the various spheres, move but it does not translocate, non transmutatur, and for this reason it is in place accidentally (LC 142G T43). His reference is Aristotle, but Bekker’s edition of the passage 212b7–13 simply reads that “some things [are] in place accidentally like the soul and the heavenly body”.
If the heavenly body is in place accidentally, per accidens, the following objection could be raised: Is its motion also accidental? (LC 142K TC43). And if its motion is accidental, since the motion of the heavenly body precedes all other motions, an accidental motion will precede any essential motion. Averroes answers the objection saying that all “that move by themselves need something at rest, around which they move, as Aristotle says in the Book about the local motions of the animals,” (De motu animalium, LC 142L TC43) but it does not matter whether a body is at rest essentially or accidentally.
Averroes believes this to be the solution and does understand why Alexander of Aphrodisias held the view that the sphere of the fixed stars is not in a place. Besides he thinks that Alexander influenced Avicenna to deny that the heavenly body is in place and to affirm that its motion is only “positional”, it changes only its position (situale, LC 144H–I TC47). Averroes final position is read at the beginning of TC44 that comments on Physics IV.4, 212b3–6:
Some bodies are in place essentially, and they are those outside of which there is some surrounding body, and some are in place because their parts are in place, and this is the condition of the body of the All, and some are in place accidentally, like that which moves circularly. (LC 143E)
9. Void, Motion in the Void
Aristotle stated the arguments of his predecessors for and against the existence of the void, then he defined its exact meaning (Phys. IV.6, 213a12–214a16). Afterwards he would refute the existence of the void by proving that change and locomotion do not involve the existence of the void (214a16–b11) and that void is incompatible with motion (214b12–216b26).
The second set of arguments includes his explanation about velocity and the motion of bodies in the medium (Phys. IV.8, 215a29–216a21). Velocity depends on the heaviness or lightness of a falling body, but also on the density of the medium, water or air, for instance. The same body will fall at different velocities in accordance with the ratio of the various media. The role of the medium is to oppose resistance to any natural or violent motion, but Aristotle does not see it as a hindrance but as necessarily complementing the action of the moving agent. The void has no density and since there is no ratio in which it stands to a body, motion would happen within any imaginable time.
Philoponus disagreed with Aristotle and affirmed the existence of the void and the possibility of motion in it (CAG 17: 675–695). Centuries later, Avempace denied the role of the medium as being necessary for motion, and maintained that bodies can move in the void, but a direct influence of Philoponus upon him has not been proved. Averroes ignored the issue in the Short Commentary but not in the Middle Commentary. Averroes organizes the arguments against the existence of the void in proofs, and the third proof as stated in MC Book IV, section 2, chapter 5 maintains that if there is no medium (emṣaՙi), motion will happen in no time, and that this is not possible. He opposes Avempace’s view that the stone can naturally move in time in the void and that the medium only makes its natural motion slower; the medium water slows down its fall less than the medium air does (MC Kalonymos L 52vº20–53rº23). Natural motion has its own velocity and the medium deducts from it, so that
If the movable would move in the void (requt), the movable would be within time because [Avempace] thought that the local delay would be removed from it and that its original motion would remain, and all this is false illusion. (MC Kalonymos L 53rº1–3)
Averroes does not accept the possibility of motion as addable or deductible and insists in the oneness. In the Long Commentary he develops the principle. The issue of motion in the void occupies LC 158L–162C T71, and there Averroes expounds Avempace’s commentary making it known to the Latin philosophers, and Thomas of Aquinas adopted the latter’s view. Averroes knows that Avempace objected that if motion needed a medium so that it happens in time, the celestial spheres would rotate in no time (LC 160D TC71; Avempace [SST] 1974, 116: 6–18]).
Averroes blames Avempace for misunderstanding the essence of velocity. Velocity is not a motion added to or subtracted from another motion, in this case, natural motion, “like a line added or subtracted from a line” (LC 161A). For Averroes, there is a ratio between the power of mover and the resistance of the movable, and a ratio between the hindering and the hindered, and velocity depends on both factors. Velocity in the celestial spheres results from the first kind of ratio, since there is no medium, and Averroes agrees with Avempace in considering the degree of nobleness (sharf) of the various spheres as the factor explaining their different velocities. Sharf is the surplus of “energy” between the power of motor and the resistance opposed by the movable.
Averroes disagrees with Avempace concerning the movements of the four elements. He maintains that mover and movable among them are not really different (distincta per se) because “the movable thing is in potentiality, and the mover in actuality” (LC 161K; MC Wolfson 673–674). The four elements are composed each of prime matter and a simple form, for instance, the elementary form of earth is coldness and dryness. Averroes affirms that the form is their mover, and matter, their movable thing (see below c. 12). Under this conception the movable cannot oppose resistance to the mover, and motion without medium would be impossible, because it would be in no time. The medium makes motion possible because it introduces time (LC 161H; MC Wolfson 403–408). Averroes wanted to defend Aristotle and found this explanation. Its weakness is obvious but the denial of motion in a void prevailed in medieval science (Maier 1952: 221–223, 1958: 244–274).
According to Aristotle, motion and time are not the same but time cannot be isolated from motion, and. if we are not conscious of any change, we are not aware of time. He tells of the men in the fable who slept with the heroes in Sardinia; when they awoke, to them no time seemed to have elapsed (Phys. IV.11, 218b21–25). Averroes read the story in the Arabic translation but he adapted it to the Islamic context, and those men became the “People of the Cave” mentioned in the Qur’an 18:9–26 (LC 178B T97). However, the SC keeps the Aristotelian example (SC 58: 10–11).
More significant is Averroes’ interpretation of time as an accident of motion (Trifogli 2001, 62). Since motions are many, he wants to identify that motion the accident of which time is (LC 178G T98). If we assume that time is the accident of the celestial motion, those who do not perceive this motion, “like those of whom Plato says that they have been incarcerated underground since their childhood” (Republic 7, 514a–517a) will not perceive time at all. And if time is an accident of any motion, there will be as many times as kinds of motion. Averroes solves the dilemma making a double interpretation of time. Our perception of time in so far as we are beings undergoing change is the primary perception of time, and
it is evident that we only perceive that we are in a changing being (transmutabili, LC 179B) because of the change of the heavenly body.
And he adds that if the heavenly body would be at rest, we would have the nature of an unchanging being, in esse non transmutabili. This perception follows time essentially, while our perception of time in relation to any motion otherwise is only accidental. Averroes admits to have arrived at this opinion after long enquiry, post magnum tempus, since in earlier times he followed the commentators (LC 179G).
Time is defined by Aristotle as the number of motion in respect of before and after (Phys. IV.11, 219b1–2). Averroes expounds that ‘number’ is like the logical genus and ‘before and after’ the specific difference (LC 181F TC101). The definition was subject to discussion among Greek and Arab commentators, and Averroes refers to Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius, and to al-Fārābī. For Averroes the definition of time about which there is no doubt is that “time is the numerable one of the before and after existing in motion” (numeratum prioris et posterioris) (LC 181H TC101), that is, before and after is a condition existing in motion, and its numerability is time. Averroes has the same explanation in his Short Commentary: “When Aristotle says that time is the number of the preceding and the following he means that time is the numerable one (maՙdūd) of preceding and following that exists in motion” (SC 61: 12).
Because time numbers and measures, it is similar to the numbers we use in counting (assimilatur, LC 182B TC102). When Aristotle later says that motion and time number and measure each other (Phys. IV.12, 220b14–32), Averroes gives his view: time numbers and measures motion essentially (per se) and it is numbered and measured by motion accidentally “because the substance of time is number of motion” (LC 188D TC112). By employing the term substantia to time several times Averroes shows that he sees time as a certain entity in itself.
Time measures also things that are at rest because they exist in time (221b8–9). The Arabic translation does not insert “incidentally” to restrict “measures” (Ṭabīʻa [1964: 456: 4–5]). In his commentary (LC 192F TC118; MC Wolfson 647), Averroes shows first his concern for things that are eternally in motion like the universe and things that are eternally at rest like the earth: he says that they cannot be measured by time (LC 192L). Therefore, time measures motion and rest; it measures motion essentially and primarily, and it measures rest incidentally and secondarily, i.e., “as it is deprivation of motion” (LC 193L); the solution fits in with Averroes’ way of thinking.
Should we look at the processes of coming-to-be and passing-away we meet with similar interpretation. The elements change one into another; water exists for a while and then turns into air, for instance. In particular, individual living beings have a limited life span; thus a linear dimension extends to them while the whole undergoes a continuous cycle of coming-to-be and passing-away, and its dimension is circular. Time measures the limited duration of sublunary beings, and the eternal motion of the spheres makes cycles eternal. To link both dimensions, Averroes introduces the motion of the sun along the ecliptic, the inclined circle that marks the sun’s path.
For this circle, as Aristotle says, in addition to the continuity and perpetuity of the motion in it, has the added feature of possessing a duality of movements, one of approach and one of retreat. (Averroes [MC GC En]: 101)
In Physics V.3, 226b18, Aristotle begins to talk about the notions of ‘together’, ‘apart’, ‘in touch’, ‘between’, ‘next in succession’, ‘contiguous’ and ‘continuous’. Physics 226b23–27 is a sentence out of place and Isḥāq translation does not contain it. His translation goes on:
What moves continuously is that which has no gap at all, or a minimal, in that thing (pragma: maʻnà) in which its motion happens, nor [a gap] in time. A gap [in time] does not prevent the [highest] musical note Zīr (neatē) from coming after the [lowest] musical note Bam (hypatē) in place. I mean only the thing in which motion happens, and this is evident in movements that happen in place as well as in all others. (Ṭabīʻa [1964: 540–541]; cf. Phys. V.3, 226b27–32)
Bessarion almost skipped the musical example, but Scotus had translated Isḥāq’s text together with Averroes’ commentary (LC 223 HI T23). Aristotle admits minimal breaks in his definition of continuum, and his musical instance refers to the possibility of omitting a few notes, and that nevertheless, the transition to be continuous (Ross 1936: 628).
This definition of continuum looks contradictory in itself, but Averroes remains faithful to Aristotle and widens the range of possible breaks in a continuous change and motion. Many movements are continuous although they have small breaks in the thing (maʻnà: intentio) like animals when they walk, “but those that fly or swim do not have a break at all” (LC 223L T23).
Averroes explicitly backs Alexander’s account that Book VI follows Book V because the beginning of the former makes use of the “descriptions” of the continuous, contiguous and next in succession objects that were set up in Book V (LC 246L T1). Aristotle strives to prove that a continuum cannot be composed of indivisibles, and he gives the example of the line, because a line cannot be composed of points. The cause for the continuum in magnitude, spatial extension (megethos) is pleaded with various arguments, and it is shown that time and motion are continuous too (Phys. VI.1, 231a21–233b32). They are always divisible.
The same seems to apply for the subject of change: “Anything that changes must be divisible” (Phys. VI.4, 234b10), but Averroes has read the commentators and knows their doubts (LC 265I T32). First, does Aristotle mean only motion in the three categories, quantity, quality, and place, or does he also mean change in substance? Second, if there are changes in no time, how can the movable be partially there where it starts and there where it ends?
Alexander denied the existence of changes in no time, but “all the Peripatetics admit changes that take place in no time, as this is evident in lights and similar actions” (LC 265L). Themistius believed that Aristotle did not intend here any change in no time. Avempace claimed that the divisibility that Aristotle means here is not the divisibility according to the last point, secundum ultima, but according to the circumstance that in the movable there are two contraries, during the interval, and Averroes adds “I sustained this view long time ago” (LC 266C; cf. SC 99:13–100:2), and he had actually affirmed that Avempace had solved the issue (MC Wolfson 544–545; MC Kalonymos L 81vº & O 64vº).
Averroes admits changes in no time but he restricts them to accidental changes, and they are those which are the aim of another change and he gives the instance of lighting the room thanks to the motion of the candle. Since they result from another change, they are divisible in so far as the main movables are (LC 266F). As Cerami remarks, this is how Averroes wants to solve the aporia of the instantaneous changes (Cerami 2015: 406).
For the changes that Averroes calls “essential”, Aristotle stresses that during the process of change the movable must be partly under one condition and partly under the other. He explains: when white changes into black, it is partially white and partially grey, as grey is the first degree of change (Phys. VI.4, 234b17–18).
Averroes verifies the fact in changes in quality—color, temperature, place, and substance. In all we find a first changed thing that is partially in that from which it changed and partially in that into which has primarily changed (LC 266I). Let us quote his words describing substantial change:
However the first [thing] in coming-to-be and passing-away is the minimal part of the generated [substance] being able to exist; “minimum” there is a [minimal] complete quantity in any generated [substance], for instance, the minimal part of fire is complete, i.e., the minimal part that is capable to be fire, minima pars, quae potest esse ignis. (LC 267D TC32)
Above we read that “animals that walk” have minimal breaks in their local motion and now we face an even more serious challenge to the continuum theory. It should be noted that Ruth Glasner has argued that Averroes in this passage develops a new doctrine of change, namely, change as “a contiguous chain of intermediate changes” (Glasner 2009: 122–127). Moreover, she has shown that Averroes’ breakdown extends to the composition of the bodies that are generated and perish, so that actual minimal units exist, “units having mater, form, and specific natura motion” (Glasner 2009, 159). Glasner has adduced evidence to support Averroes’ originality and the significance of his innovative doctrine for the history of modern science.
Averroes had to go back to the issue in his interpretation of Book VIII.3, 253b6–31, where Aristotle denies the processes of increase and decrease and of qualitative change to be always occurring. His commentary is unusually long (LC 358D–360F TC23) and Averroes asks himself why Aristotle had to refute something apparently obvious. He conjectures that the reason is because continuity is hidden in quantitative and qualitative motions (in motibus augmentationis et alterationis, LC 359H). He gives the Aristotelian example of the stone being worn away by the drop of water and then discusses how the process takes place. The stone loses each time a certain part, and not whatever part but the first actually created one (prima pars facta in actu, LC 359G), and the same rule applies to the falling drops of water. They are complete parts. Averroes recalls that Aristotle had said in Book VI (234b10–20) that what changes does not have a first part, and he sees there a difficulty but he explains:
Let us say that the first part that is generated from the motion is in some way in actuality and in some way in potentiality because it is determinate as that which will be in actuality, and under this aspect it is not divisible, and it is divisible in so far as motion is continuous. (LC 359KL; LC Schmieja8 79: 9–12)
12. Change in Substance
At the beginning of Book V of the Physics, Aristotle makes a distinction between change (metabolē) and motion (kinēsis). Aristotle classifies the changes per se from two angles: the terms whence and whither of any change and motion and from the angle of the categories. From the first angle (Phys. V.1, 224b35–b5), change can take place through four ways:
- from positive A (hypokeimenon, Arabic mawḍūʻ) to positive B,
- from positive A to negative A,
- from negative A to positive A,
- from negative A to negative B.
(4) is not a change at all, because not-A and not-B are neither contrary nor contradictory. (2) is passing-away and (3) is coming-to-be, and these two changes are not motion. The only change that is a motion is (1) from positive A to positive B. Averroes interprets A (the Latin translation reads subjectum) as ‘being’ (esse), and non subjectum becomes ‘non-being’ (non esse), but immediately he adds:
I understand under not being not being in actuality, that is being in potentiality, and [that is] not being in general (universaliter), that which is characteristic of Prime Matter, and not absolute non-being. (LC 211E TC7; MC Wolfson 514–516)
From the angle of the ten Aristotelian categories (225b5–b10), there are three kinds of motion: qualitative (how), quantitative (how much), and local (where). Averroes observes:
The commentators ask here in what manner [Aristotle] places motion under three different genera, although he placed it as a genus in itself, namely under the category of being affected. (LC 214K TC9)
Some of the commentators voiced the opinion that the category of being-affected is a genus for motion under the consideration of “receiving the motion”, others, that quality, quantity and place are partially moving, partially at rest, and others disagree, and do not accept quality, quantity and place as genera for motion. Averroes considers it wrong to enter motion into the category of being-affected because motion is something the movable receives. Averroes’ view is summarized in his own words:
Motion has a twofold consideration because according to its matter, it belongs to the genus of that toward which it moves, but according to its form, namely, according to its being change (transmutatio) linked with time, it belongs to the category of being-affected. (LC 215B TC9)
Motion does not take place in substantial change, that is, coming-to-be or passing-away because there is nothing contrary to substance (Phys. 225b10–11). Averroes comments on “contrary” and explains that the contraries here involved have “intermediate” states (mediata), no matter their form or condition (LC 215F TC10). Averroes refers to the commentaries of Alexander on De generatione et corruptione and Themistius (without identifying the work which the latter comments) and their arguments. He develops his point of view: Aristotle’s doctrine that changes in substance are not motion because substance has no contrary is well known (famosa) but it seems to him more adequate to say: “coming-to-be and passing-away are not motion because they are in something which is potentiality, not in actuality, and motion is in actuality” (216A TC10; MC Wolfson 518). If there is motion in substantial change, it is only accidentally (LC 216C), but motion plays its role in necessitating it.
13. Substantial change as coming-to-be
Change in substance is the main subject of Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione although the other two kinds are examined too, namely, growth and alteration. Substantial change implies absolute coming-to-be and perishing, and first matter is assumed as their ground; it takes place in an absolute, unqualified way (haplōs) (GC 317a 32–34); absolute coming-to-be and perishing divide again into simple (haplous) and composite (synthetos) forms. The Arabic uses ʻalá al-iṭlāq for ‘absolutely,’ and basīṭ for ‘simple’.
Averroes wrote a Middle and a Short Commentary on Aristotle’s treatise and his approach is somewhat different in each one. The Short Commentary or Epitome places the treatise in the context of Aristotle’s works. We are told that the book belongs after the De Caelo and that “in an earlier work,” i.e., the Physics change in place was examined. Growth was examined in the books On the Soul and On Animals, and coming-to-be was also studied in the Meteorologica (Averroes, SC GC En, 113), but its treatment is now different:
With regard to simple generation, he explains it here completely , but with regard to the generation of composite [bodies], he does it, in this book, at the level of the genus of the topic (amr), giving account of its principles and elements (usṭuqusāt) (Averroes, SC GC Ar, 3: 11–4: 2 Arabic).
Averroes divides the genus of coming-to-be and perishing into two kinds simple and composite. Simple generation is found in the so-called elements (usṭuqusāt) and chapters 1–8 of Book II of De generatione identify them as Earth, Air, Fire, and Water and justify why they are only these four and how they change into each other. The issue of the ether, the fifth element, is left aside in this treatise. No need saying that his argumentation is based on the preeminence of the sense of touch, something which is obviously questionable, but the classification was successful for many centuries.
For a modern reader, more important than the reality of the four elements seems to be Aristotle’s doctrine of the contrarieties as well as the double dimension active and passive of their potencies (in particular, c. 2, 329b 7 – 330a 29). Joachim considers that the contrarieties (enantiōseis) in Aristotle are merely “couples of contrasted qualities” (Aristotle, GC Joachim 1926, 200–201) but Averroes was more specific and wrote al-mutaḍḍaḍāt al-ūlá / al-uwwal, the primary contrarieties (contrarietates primae, haphakhim re’shonim) so that we should look for the reasons of his precision.
Since Philoponos’ commentary is extant, we may turn to it for his interpretation of the passage (Philoponus GC Gr 1897, 213: 1–223: 27). For him Aristotle’s doctrine of the contrarieties considers them as principles, arkhai. There are three principles according to Philoponus: matter is the first principle, form “which is the contrariety” is the second, and the third is the simple body. (Philoponus, 123) The translation by Williams reads that :“the principles are three, first matter, second the enmattered form which is the same as the contrarieties, and third the simple bodies which he says come to be out of matter when it takes on the contrarieties” (Philoponus 2013, 123).
Averroes knew the commentary and therefore, that they were principles and that they were on the same level as first matter. One should not dismiss the possible reading “primary contrarieties” in the Arabic translation used by Averroes. The Aristotelian tradition taught him that hotness/coldness and dryness/moistness are principles. Furthermore, the capacity of acting was related to one of the members of the couple of primary contrarieties, and that of being affected to the second. Their dual combination was substantial form, and Averroes stressed it: “The proximate matter of the simple bodies is the prime matter, as has already been shown, and their forms are the primary contrarieties existing in them” (Averroes, SC GC, 27: 6–8). The Middle Commentary expresses the very conclusion in similar terms (MC GC En, 70)
As for the question whether the “primary contrarieties” --as enmattered form-- are active or passive powers, Philoponus commented on GC 329b 24 – 26 and observed that the elementary qualities, or contrarieties, have a power to act and a capacity to be affected, and that “in the case of their coming-to-be from one another they are all alike capable both of acting and of being affected” (Philoponus 2013, 128). Avempace was very sensitive to the issue and extended in an excursus when writing his own commentary and was clear in accepting an active and a passive power in each element, for instance, in the element water (Avempace 1994, 65).Averroes, in the Epitome, summarized Aristotle’s views that only hotness/coldness and dryness/moistness can be the primary contrarieties because they are powers, quwá, while heaviness and lightness, in spite of their being tangible qualities, are not. Averroes insisted:.
As for heavy and light, however, although they are present in the simple bodies, they do not belong to them insofar as they are elements since they are neither active nor passive forces [powers], whereas the forms by reason of which the simple bodies are elements must necessarily be active and passive (Averroes, SC GC En, 124) (SC GC Ar, 30: 2–5).
When it comes to the Middle Commentary, and to the words of Aristotle describing “hot and cold” and “dry and moist” (GC 329b 24–26), Averroes reflects on the sense of the terms and expresses his doubts about their right meaning. Their description does not match the meaning that the term has in the colloquial language, nor the various meanings collected by lexicologists, and maybe those who theorize about them, understand them differently, he doubts. Finally, Averroes writes that “hot and cold” and “dry and moist” are
Things whose existence in these qualities is evident in itself, i.e., these actions described by them [are evident]; the descriptions are taken from their properties. However in that [the Greek] language they [the descriptions] happen to be generally accepted and intellectually apprehended which prove the names given to them. For us they are only intellectually apprehended (maʻqūl), not generally accepted (mashhūr) (Averroes, MC GC Ar, 92: 5–8).
Therefore, Averroes will use “hot and cold” and “dry and moist” only as intellectually apprehended concepts, namely, primary contrarieties and consider them “the specific differences (fuṣūl) of the elements” (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005, 92: 9). Averroes does not deny the primary contrarieties to be powers, but in the Middle Commentary, he underlines the genus/species classification. The Short Commentary follows the line of the primary contrarieties and produces following syllogism:
[Minor premise] These four bodies are those bodies in which the primary contrarieties exist and their number is equal to the number of the possible compositions of the primary contrarieties.
[Major premise] The bodies in which are existing those primary contrarieties and whose number is equal to the number of the contrarieties are the elements.
[Conclusion] Therefore, the elements are those bodies and their number is equal to the number of those bodies (Averroes, SC GC Ar, 35) (SC GC En, 127).
The Middle Commentary does not make recourse to the syllogism but both commentaries agree on the conclusion “that all bodies are composed out of all of the four bodies which are called elements” (Averroes, MC GC En, 96). Quantities of fire, air, water, and earth – even minimal parts-- are the ultimate components of tissues and limbs, or organs.
Since Averroes was very aware that any philosophical enquiry is about causes, this was also the case in the investigation concerning the generated and corruptible beings. The elements are composed of matter and form but they cannot be generated out of one another, nor can they combine with each other and generate composite bodies unless the third principle intervenes, and this principle is the efficient cause (fāʻil) . The efficient cause is present in all changes, and requires a previous local motion. There is a local motion which is inherent, natural to each kind of element, and another which is external. The latter brings two elements in contact, one acts and the other reacts, so that a mixture is produced. The mixture is the last condition for the coming-to-be or perishing of the elements. Aristotle and his disciple, Averroes, were convinced that the explanation should be true.
14. Alteration, Growth, Nutrition
The Middle Commentary on De generatione et corruptione is systematic in organizing Aristotle’s original. As in the case of the Middle Commentary on the Physics, Averroes draws a synopsis, where he divides the content into the 2 books, maqāla, each one into sections, jumla, and some of the jumla into chapters, faṣl, following the method of the divisio textus. Averroes paraphrases GC 314a 1–4 in I.1 and writes that Aristotle’s purpose was “to explain the causes that are common to all naturally (bi-l-ṭabʻ) generable and corruptible things to explain as well the causes of growth and alteration”, (Averroes, MC GC Ar, 2: 3–4) (MC GC En, 4). Natural here opposes artificial.
Therefore, Averroes and Aristotle agree in separating change in place from the three other kinds, and they want to look into the common causes of the three. Coming-to-be has been analyzed above, alteration and growth remain to be. Alteration (istiḥālah) is change in quality, in which the underlying subject, or substratum (mawḍūʻ) remains one and the same throughout the process. The mawḍūʻ is “a definite thing existing in actuality” and there are plenty of examples (Averroes, MC GC En, 24) (MC GC Ar , 30: 6). There is not much discussion about alteration.
Growth and its opposite, diminution, come to the fore and are easy to understand, because they affect the animated beings (emphsykha) and these changes are at the very essence of life and death. Aristotle treated the subject in other places, De anima, Generation of the Animals, Parts of the Animals, but in GC I.5, 320a 5 – 322a 33, he discussed growth in contrast to coming-to-be and alteration. The passage was commented by Alexander, whose text was known to Averroes but not to us; we have to rely on Philoponus who also discusses the issue of growth at length in his own commentary on GC (Philoponus GC Gr 1897, 69: 27–123: 26), as an indirect source.
Any explanation has to look for the material, formal and efficient cause of the investigated object. Aristotle observed that “Matter in the chief and strictest sense of the word is the substratum which admits of coming-to-be and passing-away; but the substratum of the other kinds of change is also in a sense matter” (GC 320a 2–4) (GC Forster 1955, 203), but as for “in which sense” he left the question open. Maybe this was the reason why Averroes introduced the notion of corporeality in answering it:
The corporeality (jismīya) which is common to all that is generated in substance, is one in number in potentiality, not in actuality, while the corporeality which is the substratum for alteration is one in number in actuality (Averroes, MC GC Ar, 32: 2–4) (MC GC En, 26).
The editor, Eichner, as well as the translator, Kurland, draw the attention of the reader to the fact that the whole paragraph (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005, 32: 1–12) is missing in the Hebrew and Latin translations, and in the Arabic manuscript (Oxford Bodleian 34) and that it appears in the body of one Arabic manuscript (Paris 1009) and in the margin of another (Modena 13), so that one doubts whether Averroes is the real author but, in any case, the explanation is half-finished.
Philoponus had said “The matter of corporeal substance is one thing, that of growth another (Philoponus GC En 2013, 116)”, but he saw that the distinction was purely “in definition” (tōi logōi) following Aristotle GC 320b 24. Averroes knew it and sets forth that growth takes place “out of a body existent in act” (MC GC Ar 2005, 38: 6). He then considers the difficulties already raised by Aristotle because of this statement. The solution to the problem is obtained by means of examining how growth occurs. Aristotle discerns three characteristics:
(a) Every part of the growing magnitude is larger—for instance, if flesh grows, every part of flesh grows; (b) it grows by the accession of something; and (c) that it grows because that which grows is preserved (sōzomenon) and remains (Aristotle, GC Forster 1955, 213).
In Averroes’ paraphrase of the passage, (a) reads more specific “every drop and every perceptible part grows in the same manner, and likewise, when it diminishes, it does in every perceptible part”. Characteristic (c) reads also differently: “the thing which is characterized by growth and diminution must be definite (mushār ilayhi) and remain identical” (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005, 39). Averroes makes clear that growth is not an increase in volume, and that the homoeomerous bodies play the key role.
The Aristotelian tradition consider the organic tissues, like blood, flesh, or bones, but also, minerals, like gold or silver, homoeomerous bodies. They are composed of the four elements and the composition is in accordance with a blend specific to each body. The living being grows when their tissues, i.e., their homoeomerous bodies, increase their size. Certainly, the existence of principles or causes is known in the case of growth as it was made clear in the case of the four elements: they were the material, formal and efficient cause.
Averroes understands that growth occurs primarily (awwalan) in the homoeomerous bodies, which are matter for the organic (āliyah) bodies, while these organs, or limbs, grow through growth occurring in the homoeomerous tissues (Averroes, MC GC En, 33) (MC GC Ar, 41: 9–10). And so, Aristotle saw that the homoeomerous bodies interact as material and formal causes, “for the form as well as the matter is called flesh or bone” (GC 321b 20–22).
Matter is fluid (sā’il) and form, persistent (thābit) and so, form is determinant; the form of flesh or bone determines the homoeomerous body. As the magnitude is not unchanging, growth needs food to be brought in from the outside, and food must give up its specific form and become flesh or bone “through a process of mixture” (Averroes, MC GC En, 39).
Averroes faces an objection by Alexander of Aphrodisias concerning the assimilation of the food; the passage has been thoroughly studied by Eichner (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005) who translated all the relevant texts. Alexander was awfully admired by Averroes but was criticized by the latter in his Middle Commentary. Alexander—according to Averroes—sustained that there is a moisture, or humidity dispersed (mabthūtha) throughout all of the limbs, that the incoming food mixes with it and that as a result, food is transformed into the “nature of this moisture” (ṭabīʽa tilka l-ruṭūba) (MC GC Ar 2005, 44: 2). Its increase is growth and its decrease, diminution, but the shape of the limbs is stable. If this account—such as it is given in the Middle Commentary—were Alexander’s, then Averroes’ critique would be permissible from his point of view, because the doctrine would be valid only for things undergoing mixture (MC GC Ar, 48: 16). It seems more adequate to regard Alexander’s physiological explanation as insufficient.
Physiology set apart from the discussion, philosophy is that which must give a comprehensive explanation using the instruments available to the philosopher, i.e., the distinction between matter and form, between being itself, per se and qua, min jihatin mā, and between quality and quantity. Form per se does not grow but insofar as it is quantity endowed with form, it does (MC GC Ar, 45: 2). Matter qua matter, i.e., per se cannot grow but in so far as any perceptible part possesses matter, it is needed and present. Averroes concludes:
The Master indeed did not mean to say that growth takes place in the form to the exclusion of the matter, nor in the matter to the exclusion of the form, but he did mean to say that growth takes place in all parts of the growing thing due to their form, not due to their matter by virtue of which they are parts (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005, 46 18 – 47 2) (MC GC En 1958, 37).
Since the participation of the material and formal principle has been clarified, we should proceed with analyzing the efficient cause with respect to growth, that Aristotle considered in GC 320b 17–22 and again in GC 322a 28–33. Let us not forget that Aristotle placed the principle of motion, (arkhē tēs kinēseōs, mabda’ al-taḥrīk ) i.e., the efficient cause of alteration and of growth in the thing which undergoes alteration or growth (321b 6–10).
Growth and nutrition are intrinsically linked to life, and require the vegetative soul investigated by Aristotle in De anima II 4 (416b 18–31). The vegetative soul is also generative (psykhē genetikē), producing the power to grow (dynamis auxētikē). Joachim identified the form of the growing thing with this power in his commentary on GC 322a 28–33 (GC Joachim 1926, 135–136) and so did Averroes. He says that the growing thing has a power due to which it has a form. It is “endowed with form” (dhū ṣūra), so that “Were it not for the presence of that force in the growing thing, growth in all the sensible parts of the growing thing would be impossible” (Averroes, MC GC En 1958, 38) (Averroes, MC GC Ar 2005, 48 13–15) .
On the other side, Aristotle mentioned the efficient cause of coming-to-be in 320b 17–22, although in a generic way. Philoponus interpretated it as something applicable to growth too (Philoponus 2013, 114–115) and introduced the strict term, poiētikon aition (Philoponus CAG 1897, 83: 25–26). Averroes follows him and compares coming-to-be and growth with respect to the efficient cause (sabab fā‛il) (MC GC Ar, 37: 9–15) arriving at the conclusion that the efficient cause is not only in the growing thing but also of the same species as its parts. Averroes has set forth the material, formal and efficient causes in the processes of growth, and diminution, as close as possible to Aristotle, which was his purpose. The preeminence of form has shown in many aspects, that of principle of life being indisputable.
15. Movable and Mover
Book VII begins with the statement “Whatever is moving must be moved by something” (Phys. 241b24), and Averroes comments on it: “In this treatise [Aristotle] searched whether every movable has a mover”, and he points out that Aristotle has in mind those movables in which the mover is not clearly distinguished from the movable, “as in the four elements” (ut in, LC Schmieja7 1:20–2:1; absque, “except for”, LC 306B T1).
Later, in Book VIII, Averroes considers that Book VII did not deal with motion because of ‘leaning’ in particular, and that Book VIII finishes the task. In this book he classifies essential motions in two kinds: violent and natural, and he divides the latter in ‘motion because of the soul’ and ‘motion because of leaning’ (declinatio: Arabic mail), which includes gravity and levity, that is, the motion of the elements to their natural place (LC 366D TC28). Since natural motion of the four elements seems to happen by itself, Aristotle put forward several arguments to prove that they are not moved by themselves (Phys. VIII, 255a1–b30) but the chapter ends acknowledging that “[the element] possesses a principle of motion in itself, although not of setting in motion nor of acting but of being affected”.
Averroes examines the sentence and interprets it in a sense that he considers to be Aristotelian. The simple element has two movers, an essential and an accidental one (LC 370B TC32). What moves essentially is
that which is external, that is, the generating [cause; generans : mukawwin] and the generating [cause] is that which gives its form and all the accidents resultant from the form—one of which is the local motion—to the generated simple body. (LC 370G TC32)
Generating acts upon matter and in this manner, Averroes places the principle of motion in it, because matter is “that in which the true potentiality for motion is, that is, the potentiality for receiving motion” (LC 370H). The issue was of import in Arabic and Jewish natural philosophy (MC Wolfson 669–675), while the Latin thinkers were most interested in the question how the four elements remain in the mixture, a question that Averroes also wanted to answer (Maier 1952: 28–31).
Averroes discusses two points related to the mentioned issue of how the four elements are moved. First, Galen maintained that the arguments brought to support the thesis “Whatever is moving must be moved by something” are false. Second, other commentators considered Book VII redundant, because VIII deals with the same subject in a more comprehensive way (LC 306C; LC Schmieja7 2:1–4), and actually, Book VII pleads that there is a first mover which is not moved by anything else. Averroes’ discussion goes as follows:
1) To prove that “Whatever is moving must be moved by something”, Aristotle chose a body “A_B which is moving per se, and not by virtue of some part” (241b37–38). Averroes carefully distinguishes movable essentially, per se or accidentally, per accidens and movable as a whole or by virtue of some part (LC 306F; LC Schmieja7 2:19–3:1). He gives us an instance of that which moves by itself but not as a whole:
Thus the first essentially movable (primum motum) in animals is the heart which does not move as a whole, because one part of it moves itself, and moves the whole. (LC 306F; LC Schmieja7 3:1–3)
The whole does not move itself, only one part moves essentially, but the whole here is a composite the parts of which are continuous.
Aristotle argued that if a body moves as a whole, primarily and essentially, it need not stop moving because something else has stopped moving. And if something is at rest because something else has stopped moving, that thing must be moved by something (Phys. VII.1, 241b44 [Ross 1936: 419).
For Averroes, Galen and others misinterpreted Aristotle. They identified that which is only contrary to that which moves accidentally with that which moves essentially (LC 307H; LC Schmieja7 6:3–6). Indeed that which moves essentially (and as a whole) is opposed to that which is moved by virtue of one part of it. In Galen’s view, if one part of a movable would come to rest, the whole should not. In the case of the heart of the animals, Galen contested the doctrine that it is the first movable because when the heart is removed, the animal is still capable of walking two steps. Galen claimed that the head is the source of motion, but Averroes objects “I saw a ram walking after the head was cut off” (LC 309C TC4; LC Schmieja7 11:21–22). But there are primary movables that fulfill these conditions and it is worth quoting Averroes’ words:
There must be here first movables because natural bodies do not divide infinitely into that for which they are natural bodies, e.g., because the first movable in fire is the minimal part that is capable of being fire in actuality. (LC 307I TC2; LC Schmieja7, 6:10–13)
Aristotle’s arguments were not very satisfying and the question which are the bodies moving per se and as a whole was not answered. Galen considered that the arguments were flawed, but Averroes would never accept that Aristotle was wrong and made an interpretation, that we cannot guess whatever the Master would agree upon.
Ruth Glasner has shown evidence that Averroes borrowed the notion of minimal parts from Alexander; she stresses the import of the new doctrine that “bridges the gap between the two opposing systems, the Aristotelian and the atomistic” (Glasner 2009: 146–159). Whether the smallest part actually exists or it is the limit of divisibility is something that Averroes does not answer. The context, however, hints at the second direction.
Therefore, Averroes sees the Book VII essential in order to prove that “Whatever is moving must be moved by something” and the Latin medieval philosophers will make of the statement Omne quod movetur necesse est ab aliquo moveri a basic principle of medieval physics.
2) At the beginning, Averroes complained that some commentators considered Book VII superfluous, and in LC 312C TC9 (LC Schmieja7 20:15–18), he refers to Themistius as the main one. The final arguments of Phys. VII.1 establish the impossibility of an endless succession of movables and movers and, by reductio ad absurdum, the necessity of a first mover. Consider the following version of Isḥāq’s passage 243a3–4 (textus alter): “The first mover is not such because it is that for the sake of which [motion happens] but because it is that from which the source of motion is” (LC 311H; Ṭabīʻa [1964: 746: 3–6]). However M. Scot translates the passage differently: “The first movable is not such because it is that for the sake of which [motion happens] but because it is that from which the source of motion is” (LC 311K; LC Schmieja7 18:18–20). Averroes’s copy of the Physics was wrong and he hesitates: “Maybe there is an error by the copyist, who should have placed the term ‘mover’ instead of this term ‘movable’” (LC 312 AB; LC Schmieja7 20:3–4 [more precise to my view]).
In spite of the hesitation caused by the wrong term, Averroes interpreted that Aristotle distinguished here between a mover setting in motion as a final cause or as an efficient cause (quasi agens), and that Book VIII would clarify the matter concerning the first mover. He was even more certain in asserting that Book VIII would inquire about first motion, whether it is eternal or generated, and he rejected Themistius’ view that Book VII was superfluous for this reason.
16. Qûwa as Force
Physics VII.5 (249b27–250b10) discusses some problems of simple mechanics (Lettinck 1994: 559–561). The moving-agent is always moving something in a certain time and a certain distance, and Aristotle presumes here that motion here is at a constant velocity. There is a relationship between the four factors, for instance if A sets B in motion over a distance C in time D, A will move half B over the distance C in half the time D, because there is a proportion between the force of A and the load of B. Aristotle sees limits to the interchange because “it may well happen that it [a fraction of A] cannot move B at all” (250a15–16). Thirty men can tow a ship over a distance and in a time, but one man cannot tow it either over any distance or in any time. He also faces Zeno’s contention that every grain of millet must make a sound when it falls as the whole measure does stirring the air and answers that the grain is part of a whole and that the whole is the moving-agent.
The wording was not clear and the commentators made their contribution to explain it. Averroes, in his turn, insisted that Zeno’s discourse is fallacious because “one part does not set in motion in actuality, but it does in potentiality within the whole” (LC 336F TC37; LC Schmieja7 79:7–8). Moreover, he set two conditions, the movable has to be “prepared” (præparatum) and the power of the mover has to be “complete” (terminatum).
One man out of the thirty does not set the ship in motion on his own, [but] when his moving action (motio) joins the preparation and the power coming from the 29 men, [he] will necessarily set in motion the whole ship; therefore each of the 29 gives to the ship a preparation to move (moveri) that it did not have before. (LC 336G; LC Schmieja7 79:8–12)
Averroes sees the same process in the falling grain of millet. Each grain cannot move the air on its own and make a sound. But each grain gives the necessary preparation to the air. When the last added grain passes the threshold and power is complete, the air is stirred and a sound is made. This last part is not stronger than the others, but it definitely causes motion “because of the preparation made in the movable” (LC 336H; LC Schmieja7 79:8). Although he does not explain what “preparation” is, we can gather that it is a kind of potential energy. And as for the notion of “complete power”, Averroes seems to intend kinetic energy.
17. First Movable, First Mover, Eternal Motion
1) Aristotle begins his Book VIII of the Physics raising the question whether motion has come into being and will cease to be, or is eternal “belonging to all beings as their immortal and never failing property” (250b13–14). In order to answer it, he develops various arguments the main one being based on the definition of motion as the actualization of the movable in so far as movable (251a10). If there was a first motion, and since any movable requires a mover, there must have pre-existed a mover and a movable, something capable of setting fire and something capable of burning, for instance. If these have come into being, there must have been a change before the supposed first change that brought them into existence. If they pre-existed without change occurring, a previous change must have occurred that set them into the condition of moving and being moved. By reductio ad absurdum, it is proved that motion has always existed.
Aristotle ends up by identifying eternal motion with a specific motion that of the heavenly sphere, but in doing this he jumps from a philosophical to a scientific explanation, and the leap is scarcely justifiable. He can only assume that a single eternal motion exists (Ross 1936: 91). Glasner describes it as Aristotle’s failure to overcome the so called succession argument (Glasner 2009: 76).
The Greek commentators concentrated on whether potentiality has to precede motion or is simultaneous with it, and Philoponus adduced heavy arguments against potentiality preceding motion (Puig Montada 1999). Averroes followed the tradition of those commentators for a long time, he knew well the contributions by al-Fārābī and Avempace to the discussion and he sided with them. The beginning of the Long Commentary hints at it:
Since [Aristotle’s] purpose is to inquire about the first mover, he begins by inquiring about motion, whether it is eternal or innovated, that is, according to the genus, and that which precedes this treatise, either is necessary to this section, or is for the sake of better. And when he said “Whether motion”, he did not mean any specific (proprium) motion, but he wanted to know whether those motions existent in the parts of the universe came to be, after no part of the universe moved at all, etc. (LC 338FG TC1; Schmieja8, 2: 2–7 MC Glasner 94–95)
In the same chapter, however, Averroes gives up this interpretation that he considered to be what he calls “at first glance” (in primo aspectu, LC 339A). After long investigation he gained the deeper and true meaning of Aristotle’s words: The inquiry about motion concerns that motion embracing the universe, or maybe several motions (if it is proven that the heavenly spheres have several movers), that is, it concerns one species of motion, and wants to know if it is eternal or innovated (LC 339C).
Of course, Averroes was wrong with his new interpretation of Aristotle but the new interpretation helped him to design his vision of the universe, and to counter the attacks of the Ashʻarite theologians against the eternity of creation. If a particular motion precedes another one, the resulting succession, or continuity, is purely accidental for Averroes and it is no basis for the argumentation conducted by al-Fārābī, Avempace, etc. On the contrary the eternal motion of the heavenly spheres possesses continuity per se, while the rest of motions possess accidentally.
An objection could be raised against the new interpretation, and indeed it had been raised by al-Ghazālī (d. 1111 CE) in his polemical writing The Incoherence of the Philosophers (Ghazālī ). Potentiality has to precede motion, as potentiality precedes the act; Averroes agrees with the tenet but restricts it to the sublunary world, to innovated motions. The rule of temporal priority does not apply to “motion as motion, but to something innovated as innovated” (novo facto, LC 341IK).
2) Aristotle argues for eternity also from the angle of time, endorsing the common belief that “there is always time” and in Physics VIII.1 he concludes that it has been demonstrated that there never was nor will be a time when motion was not or will not be (252b5–6). Aristotle rejects the views of Anaxagoras and Empedocles (252a5–b5). For Anaxagoras there is a single principle of motion, Mind; for Empedocles Love and Strife alternately prevail and cause motion. Averroes points out two inconsistencies of their views. First, the laws of Nature do not admit, “something to be possible for an endless time in the past, and then to be brought into existence” (LC 349H TC15) and second, its laws rebut that the mover and the movable are at rest for an endless time and that then, at a given moment, motion starts.
Averroes compares Anaxagoras and Empedocles with the Ashʻarite theologians, who introduce the Divine will instead of Nature as the moving agent, “they establish a voluntary mover” (LC 349I). The discussion goes at length (LC 349I–350L) and parallels that of the First Question in the Incoherence of the Incoherence. Averroes denies that an eternal will can originate a temporally initiated action (actio nova). If the will is eternal, the willed object has to be eternal, and vice versa.
The will does not postpone what it intends except because some cause (intentio) exists in the willed thing that did not exist at the time of [the action of] willing and if [that cause] was not there, that which is willed must be together with the will. If we would assume that there is a will in which the delay of the willed is possible, this would occur because something exists that did not exist before, i.e., because some cause, or disposition, was absent. There would be neither time nor anything because we affirmed that this will is the first motion, and it is obvious that this willed object must be together with the will. Therefore if we would affirm that the will is eternal, the willed would be eternal. (LC 349LM; Schmieja8, 43: 21–44: 6)
The world of coming-to-be and passing-away shows however that there is rest and that motions start and end. We see innovated events. Averroes makes an exception to explain the apparent contradiction: The will can precede the willed object through an infinite time although in an accidental way and this is “clear to those who know the difference between essentially and accidentally” (LC 350C). An intermediate motion is the key solution and the motion he considered was that which Aristotle searched for in Book VIII, i.e., the specific motion of the heavenly spheres.
The theologians argued that an endless chain of motions was impossible and that a first motion had to be created anew (ex novo). Aristotle argued that motion is generically eternal since no beginning can be determined. The former had a linear image of eternity and the latter, a circular one. Averroes stepped in with an original proposal: the succession of motions is accidental, not per se. But any accident presupposes a propriety to which is related. The heavenly motion is eternal per se and it is the reference to the accidental eternity. Averroes answers the Ashʻarites:
We say that it [succession of motions] is essentially impossible, not accidentally, that is, if there was an agent whose being has no beginning, it resulted that his actions have no beginning. (LC 350D; Schmieja8, 40: 14–17; MC Glasner 82; MC Wolfson 495)
and this kind of eternity is essential.
18. The Incorporeal First Mover
Aristotle reduced all kinds of change to local motion, and then to circular motion, up to the eternal motion of the universe the mover of which could not be movable at all.
Chapter 10 of Book VIII (266a10–267b26) accomplishes the identification of this unmovable mover: It has no parts nor magnitude (megethos), it is not material, it exerts an infinite force. We face Aristotle’s statement that “nothing finite can produce motion for an infinite time” (266a12–13) and Isḥāq translated it faithfully: “nothing finite can move anything for an infinite time” (Aristotle, Ṭabīʻa [1964: 924]). Nevertheless M. Scot made a translation where he clarified the term “finite”: “a finite mover cannot produce motion for an infinite time” (LC 423C). The principle is followed by two statements: no finite magnitude can have infinite force, and no infinite magnitude can have finite force (Ross 1936: 721). The statements fostered an intense discussion in Averroes’ Long Commentary. Averroes, following Aristotle (266a15–23), shows the inconsistencies of supposing a finite mover causing motion for an infinite time (LC 426BG TC79). As for the second statement (266a26–b6), Averroes again follows Aristotle and says that a body or a corporeal power does not have an infinite action, therefore the mover with an infinite power is not a body (LC 426G).
However, doubts can arise whether the proposition that all body has only finite power applies to the celestial body or not (LC 426H). If it applies, the celestial body has a finite power, and it is destructible. If it does not, the resulting motion will be instantaneous. The issue is very difficult and very exhaustive (multum scrupulosa, LC 426K). Averroes knows the opinions of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Johannes Philoponus and Avicenna. Alexander affirmed that the celestial body acquires eternity from its mover; Philoponus denied it and sustained that it is corruptible because its potentiality, power, is finite. Avicenna would follow Alexander and claim that the heavens are necessary because of another but its movers are necessary because of themselves, and we understand: they are eternal (LC 426LM). Then Averroes expresses his view on the celestial body and its potentiality:
But we say that from the meaning (ex vi) of Aristotle’s words in this demonstration it appears that its passive—that is, accepting motion—potentiality is infinite; like an infinite action is not infinite because of a form in a body, an infinite affection is also not because of a form in a body—that is, a composite of matter and form. (LC 426M; Schmieja8, 301: 22–302: 4)
Form always has a finite potentiality because it is divisible, and it is divisible because the body of which it is the form, is divisible, and the body is divisible because it is finite yet. The celestial body is finite but its motion is eternal. Averroes finds a way-out of the conflict: the celestial body is not composed of matter and form, it is simple, and no material form exists in it (LC 427BC; MC Wolfson 594) while form in material substances subsists because it is part of the composite. By exclusion we can conclude: the celestial body is an immaterial form.
Averroes recalls that in De caelo (in particular I.5–7) Aristotle had stated that the potentiality of the heavenly body was finite. An active, moving potentiality can be said to be infinite in two aspects: because its activity never ceases or because it produces motion at an infinite velocity, so that there cannot be any higher velocity. The heavenly spheres rotate at different velocities, therefore their motions are finite in the second aspect, i.e., in intensity, and they are not caused by an infinite potentiality. Averroes infers that Aristotle intended this meaning of ‘finite’ when he spoke of finite potentiality in the heavens (LC 427BD; Davidson 1987: 321–331).
No doubt, Aristotle did not make it easy for Averroes who complains how long he took great pains to find the explanation (cum grande labore et in tempore vitae meæ non modico LC 427D; Schmieja8, 303: 13–14). But once proven that the first mover is not a body, it becomes easier: the First Mover does not need to be affected by the mentioned restrictions of corporeal movers, and it can produce motion for an infinite time. And the First Mover becomes a metaphysical principle like Prime Matter.
The natural philosophy of Averroes goes far beyond paraphrasing Aristotle’s texts; it echoes the discussions of the Greek commentators, and the Arab philosophers on key issues. Furthermore, Averroes faced in his lifetime the challenge of Islamic jurists and Ashʻarite theologians. First of all, Averroes had to legitimate the study of philosophy and the consistency of its doctrines. His prologue should be understood not only as an outline of his doctrine of natural science but also as a defense of philosophy: Philosophy grants man his intellectual perfection, and true happiness.
Averroes’ views often respond to a dialectical treatment of the subject. Aristotle’s natural philosophy deals with Prime or first Matter as one of its two main subjects, the First Mover being the other. The existence of Prime Matter is in the root of a conflict with the Ashʻarite theologians who affirm changes out of a non-existent subject, and Averroes can rely on Aristotle to rebuke them.
Avicenna did not see himself in Aristotle’s debt and his science of the Divine Matters, what may be translated as metaphysics, contained an original doctrine of being. Avicenna allocated a role to the metaphysician in proving the existence of Nature or the composition of matter and form in bodies and Averroes did not admit such a role. Averroes’ tense relationship with Avicenna shows up also in their disagreement upon the existence of corporeal form, or on the extent of necessity in Nature.
The definition of motion or change is no doubt one of the key issues discussed by Averroes. Averroes decides on motion as an incomplete state of each of the categories of substance, quality, quantity and place, not as a category in itself and he paves the way for a medieval theory of motion.
Averroes followed Aristotle in the rejection of atomism and the defense of the continuum in motion, place and time. However, continuity cannot explain all aspects of change and Averroes formulates an original doctrine of minimal breaks. Moreover, the so called “perceptible parts” are essential to growth, and even to coming-to-be. C. Cerami pointed out that growth, for Averroes, requires “minimal parts endowed with a finite quantity” (Cerami 2012, 160) and then she discussed the issue of their ontological status. Averroes did not go into the insoluble problem of continuity versus atomism, but he focused on the efficient cause of growth and nutrition: There is a power in the growing thing because of its form.
The main conflict with the Islamic theological tradition concerns the eternity of creation. Averroes interpreted Aristotle’s argument of Physics VIII.1 in such a way that the continuity of the first motion was intended instead of motion in generic terms. This allowed him to disable the argument for a limit in the succession of motions and to maintain that the chain of motions is only an accidental manifestation of the eternal motion of the heavenly body. Furthermore, proving the incorporeality of the First Mover is the final contribution to the theological view of the universe, from which natural philosophy cannot be isolated.
Long commentary: Latin translation by Michael Scott
- [LC] Aristotelis opera cum Averrois commentariis: Quartum volumen, Venice: Apud Junctas, 1562–1574, R Frankfurt am Main: Minerva, 1962, ff. 1–433vº. Citations consist first of an number and a letter, for instance 36A. The number indicates the folio and the letter, its division, from A to M; the second part of the citation, for instance TC60, refers to the commented paragraph.
- [LC Schmieja7] Commentarium Magnum in Aristotelis Physicorum Librum Septimum (Vindobonensis, lat. 2334), (Averrois Opera, Series B), edited by Horst Schmieja, Paderborn: Schöningh, 2007.
- [LC Schmieja8] Commentarium Magnum in Aristotelis Physicorum Librum Octavum. In der lateinischen Übersetzung des Michael Scotus, mit einer Einleitung herausgegeben von Horst Schmieja, Frankfurt am Main: Institute for the History of Arabic-Islamic Science, 2020.
Middle Commentary: In Arabic only the summary
Hebrew, 2 translators, only in manuscript form: Zeraḥya ben Yiṣḥaq ben She’altiel, (Rome 1284) and Kalonymos ben Kalonymos, (Arles 1317). Kalonymos’s version is used with the abbreviations:
- [MC Kalonymos L] Be᾿ur emṣa῾i ῾al Sefer ha-shema῾ ha-ṭev῾i shel Arisṭo. The intermediate commentary on the Physics of Aristotle (by Averroees, and 1 other text). British Library, Add MS 25879, copied 5241/1481.
- [MC Kalonymos O] Be᾿ur ha-shema῾ le-Aben Roshd, Oxford, Bodleian Library, Neubauer 1380, ff. 1–99rº (Huntington 79; Uri 393), copied 5177/1417.
Latin, 3 translations, but all from Hebrew:
- [MC] Jacob Mantino, only the first three books: Aristotelis opera cum Averrois commentariis: Quartum volumen, Venice: Apud Junctas, 1562–1574, R Frankfurt am Main: Minerva, 1962, ff. 434rº–464rº.
- [MC Balmes] Abraham de Balmes. Vatican City, Bibliotheca Apostolica, Vat. Lat. 4548.
- [MC Dactylomelos] Vitalis Dactylomelos, Paris, Bibliothèque Nationale de France, lat. 6507.
English translation, fragments:
- [MC Glasner], Ruth Glasner, Averroes’ “Physics” A Turning Point in Medieval Natural Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2009. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199567737.001.0001
- [MC Wolfson], Harry Austryn Wolfson, Crescas’ Critique of Aristotle; Problems of Aristotle’s “Physics” in Jewish and Arabic Philosophy, (Harvard Semitic series, 6), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1929.
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Coming-to-be and Passing-away
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- Plato, Republic, Stephanus pagination (Genève, 1578) is used.
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- –––, 2012, On Aristotle: Physics 1–3, translated by Robert B. Todd, London: Bloomsbury. Translation of CAG 5.2.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Digital Averroes Research Environment, (Sources, Works, Bibliography), maintained at the University of Cologne.
- Aristotle: Motion and Its Place in Nature, entry by Joe Sachs in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Belo, Caterina, 2015, The concept of ‘Nature’ in Aristotle, Avicenna, and Averroes, paper in Kriterion: Revista de Filosofia, 56(131) (January/June 2015).
- Ramón Guerrero, Rafael, 2008, Averroes: Explicación aristotélica del universo paper in Filosofia Unisinos, 9(1): 25–42.
I thank Prof. Herbert A. Davidson (1932–2021), UCLA, for his thoroughly reading and his many observations. No need to say that all errors are only mine.