Notes to Ibn Rushd’s Natural Philosophy

1. The Italian Averroist Marco Antonio Zimara (1475–1535) observes a seeming contradiction between this idea of happiness and Averroes’ words elsewhere affirming that true happiness consists in “intuitive knowledge of God” (LC 464vº).

2. This follows the marginal note on LC 38D4 pointing out that another manuscript deletes the term ‘non’. Unfortunately, neither the MC nor the SC can help to solve the dilemma.

3. Averroes’ profound dislike of Avicenna is very well known, and his criticism is often unjustified. For an examen of all the passages, see (Cerami 2018).

4. Phys. II.2, 194b10: Eidenai to eidos kai to ti estin, M. Scott, Scientia formae et quidditatis.

5. Omnia sint naturaliter necessario, literally, an adverb: “by necessity”.

6. Michael Scott’s Latin translation does not mention God, “rain comes from the sky” (LC 76F).

7. Isḥāq Ibn Ḥunayn’s Arabic translation is more explicit: “some things are in place accidentally, for instance, the soul and the heavens, i.e. the whole universe” (Aristotle, Ṭabīʻa [1964: 330: 12–13]).

8. Cf. similar explanation in SC VIII, pp. 138–139, referring to Phys. VIII, 254b33–255a30.

9. If the sun’s path is observed from the earth as it were at rest, the sun appears to move around it in a path which is tilted with respect to the rotation axis at 23.5°.

10. In her review of Glasner ‘s book, C. Trifogli observes that Averroes followed a strategy “common among Scholastic supporters of the theory of minima naturalia (Trifogli 2010, 88). See also G. Freudental’s observations on Trifogli’s review” (Freudenthal 2010).

11. Where the Greek original reads synekhōs (b14, b29), the Arabic translates dā’iman, and the Latin semper.

12. Forma fluens are the terms which the Latin philosophers would use to describe it, cf. Maier 1958: 64–68.

13. Descriptions in themselves inherent in these qualities, i.e., in the functions which are designated by them and they are descriptions derived from their particular properties. But it so happens that in that [the Greek] language, these contrarieties have acquired both a conventional and conceptual connotation […] we here use them in their conceptual, not their conventional sense (Averroes, MC GC En, 72).

14. The Latin by Michael Scotus reads causae universales like the Hebrew by Kalonymos, sibot koleliyot.

15. There are two versions of the first chapters of book VII, Isḥāq Ibn Ḥunayn translates from the textus alter, and Averroes very likely uses it.

16. Cf. Maier 1952: 152–153, for Averroes’ notion of generans.

17. Potentia, but the Vindobonensis manuscript reads adaptio, LC Schmieja: 79:9.

18. In Book VIII, Averroes applies the doctrine of the complete quantity to the process of wearing a stone by dropping water (LC 359BC TC23, commenting on Phys. 253b6–31).

19. Averroes often does not distinguish between them both: “[Aristotle] would not establish the eternal continuity existent accidentally in these motions as an evidence (signum) for the eternal continuity existent in the first motion, or motions” (LC 339EF).

20. This follows the altera lectio, although the text printed in the main body reads finita.

Copyright © 2023 by
Josep Puig Montada <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free