The laden phrase “identity politics” has come to signify a wide range of political activity and theorizing founded in the shared experiences of injustice of members of certain social groups. Rather than organizing solely around belief systems, programmatic manifestos, or party affiliation, identity political formations typically aim to secure the political freedom of a specific constituency marginalized within its larger context. Members of that constituency assert or reclaim ways of understanding their distinctiveness that challenge dominant characterizations, with the goal of greater self-determination.
- 1. History and Scope
- 2. Philosophy and Identity
- 3. Liberalism and Identity Politics
- 4. Contemporary Philosophical Engagement with Identity Politics
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1. History and Scope
The second half of the twentieth century saw the emergence of large-scale political movements—second wave feminism, Black Civil Rights in the U.S., gay and lesbian liberation, and the American Indian movements, for example—based in claims about the injustices done to particular social groups. These social movements are undergirded by and foster a philosophical body of literature that takes up questions about the nature, origin and futures of the identities being defended. Identity politics as a mode of organizing is intimately connected to the idea that some social groups are oppressed; that is, that one’s identity as a woman or as African American, for example, makes one peculiarly vulnerable to cultural imperialism (including stereotyping, erasure, or appropriation of one’s group identity), violence, exploitation, marginalization, or powerlessness (Young 1990). Identity politics starts from analyses of such forms of social injustice to recommend, variously, the reclaiming, redescription, or transformation of previously stigmatized accounts of group membership. Rather than accepting the negative scripts offered by a dominant culture about one’s own inferiority, one transforms one’s own sense of self and community. For example, in their germinal statement of Black feminist identity politics, the Combahee River Collective argued that
as children we realized that we were different from boys and that we were treated different—for example, when we were told in the same breath to be quiet both for the sake of being ‘ladylike’ and to make us less objectionable in the eyes of white people. In the process of consciousness-raising, actually life-sharing, we began to recognize the commonality of our experiences and, from the sharing and growing consciousness, to build a politics that will change our lives and inevitably end our oppression. (1982: 14–15)
The scope of political movements that may be described as identity politics is broad: the examples used in the philosophical literature are predominantly of struggles for recognition and social justice by groups of citizens within western capitalist democracies, but Indigenous rights movements worldwide, nationalist projects, or demands for regional self-determination use similar arguments. Predictably, there is no straightforward criterion that makes a political struggle into an example of “identity politics.” Rather, the term signifies a loose collection of political projects, each undertaken by representatives of a collective with a distinctively different social location that has hitherto been neglected, erased, or suppressed. It is beyond the scope of this essay to offer historical or sociological surveys of the many different social movements that might be described as identity politics, although references to this literature are provided in the bibliography; instead the focus here is to provide an overview of the philosophical issues in the expansive literature in political theory.
The phrase “identity politics” is also something of a philosophical punching-bag for a variety of critics. Often challenges fail to make sufficiently clear their object of critique, using “identity politics” as a blanket description that invokes a range of tacit political failings. From a contemporary perspective, some early identity claims by political activists certainly seem naive, totalizing, or unnuanced. However, the public rhetoric of identity politics served useful and empowering purposes for some, even while it sometimes belied the philosophical complexity of any claim to a shared experience or common group characteristics. Since the twentieth century heyday of the well-known political movements that made identity politics so visible, a vast academic literature has sprung up; although “identity politics” can draw on intellectual precursors from Mary Wollstonecraft to Franz Fanon, writing that actually uses this specific phrase, with any of its contemporary baggage, does not begin until the late 1970s. Thus it was barely as intellectuals started to systematically outline and defend the philosophical underpinnings of identity politics that we simultaneously began to challenge them. At this historical juncture, then, asking whether one is for or against identity politics is to ask an impossible question. Wherever they line up in the debates, thinkers agree that the notion of identity has become indispensable to contemporary political discourse, at the same time as they concur that it has troubling implications for models of the self, political inclusiveness, and our possibilities for solidarity and resistance.
2. Philosophy and Identity
From this brief examination of how identity politics fits into the political landscape it is already clear that the use of the controversial term “identity” raises a host of philosophical questions. Logical uses aside, it is likely familiar to philosophers from the literature in metaphysics on personal identity—one’s sense of self and its persistence. Indeed, underlying many of the more overtly pragmatic debates about the merits of identity politics are philosophical questions about the nature of subjectivity and the self (Taylor 1989). Charles Taylor argues that the modern identity is characterized by an emphasis on its inner voice and capacity for authenticity—that is, the ability to find a way of being that is somehow true to oneself (Taylor 1994). While doctrines of equality press the notion that each human being is capable of deploying their practical reason or moral sense to live an authentic life qua individual, the politics of difference has appropriated the language of authenticity to describe ways of living that are true to the identities of marginalized social groups. As Sonia Kruks puts it:
What makes identity politics a significant departure from earlier, pre-identarian forms of the politics of recognition is its demand for recognition on the basis of the very grounds on which recognition has previously been denied: it is qua women, qua blacks, qua lesbians that groups demand recognition. The demand is not for inclusion within the fold of “universal humankind” on the basis of shared human attributes; nor is it for respect “in spite of” one’s differences. Rather, what is demanded is respect for oneself as different (2001: 85).
For some proponents of identity politics this demand for authenticity includes appeals to a time before oppression, or a culture or way of life damaged by colonialism, imperialism, or even genocide. Thus for example Taiaiake Alfred, in his defense of a return to traditional Indigenous values, argues that:
Indigenous governance systems embody distinctive political values, radically different from those of the mainstream. Western notions of domination (human and natural) are noticeably absent; in their place we find harmony, autonomy, and respect. We have a responsibility to recover, understand, and preserve these values, not only because they represent a unique contribution to the history of ideas, but because renewal of respect for traditional values is the only lasting solution to the political, economic, and social problems that beset our people. (Alfred 1999: 5)
What is crucial about the “identity” of identity politics appears to be the experience of the subject, especially their experience within social structures that generate injustice, and the possibility of a shared and more authentic or self-determined alternative. Thus identity politics rests on the connection between a certain undergoing and the subject-position to which it is attributed, and hence on unifying claims about the meaning of politically laden experiences to diverse individuals. Sometimes the meaning given to a particular experience will diverge from that of its subject: thus, for example, the victim of sexual violence who is told they caused their own fate by taking risks, when they believe their attacker is culpable. Making sense of such interpretive gaps depends on methods that recognize the divergence between dominant epistemic accounts and subjugated knowledges (Alcoff 2018). Thus concern about this aspect of identity politics has crystallized around the transparency of experience, and the univocality of its interpretation. Experience is never, critics argue, simply epistemically available prior to interpretation (Scott 1992); rather it requires a theoretical framework—implicit or explicit—to give it meaning (Heyes 2020). Moreover, if experience is the origin of politics, then some critics worry that what Kruks (2001) calls “an epistemology of provenance” will become the norm: on this view, political perspectives gain legitimacy by virtue of their articulation by subjects of particular experiences. This, critics charge, closes off the possibility of critique of these perspectives by those who don’t share the experience, which in turn inhibits political dialogue and coalition-building. Nonetheless, skepticism about the possibility of experience outside a hermeneutic frame has been juxtaposed (or even reconciled) with phenomenological attempts to articulate a ground for experience in the lived body (Alcoff 2000; see also Oksala 2004 and 2011; Stoller 2009; Heyes 2020), or in related accounts of complex embodiment (Siebers 2017). Recent work in Black feminist philosophy has also returned to identity political language by seeking to ground political perspectives in storytelling: for example, Kristie Dotson (2018) argues that a Black feminism starting from personal narrative provides a practice that can undercut unknowing in settler colonial contexts.
From these understandings of subjectivity, it is easy to see how critics of identity politics, and even some cautious supporters, have wondered how it can meet the challenges of intersectionality (Hill Collins and Bilge 2016). Intersectionality is both an ontology and a method, with origins in women of color feminisms, especially Black feminisms (Crenshaw 1989, 1990; Cho, Crenshaw, and McCall 2013; Hancock 2016). Its central tenet is that no axis of identity can be understood as separable from others—whether in terms of individual experience or the political structures that underlie social stratification. To speak of “people of color” without distinguishing between class, gender, sexuality, national and ethnic contexts, for example, is to risk representing the experience of only some of the group’s members—typically those who are most privileged. To the extent that identity politics urges mobilization around a single axis, it will put pressure on participants to identify that axis as their defining feature, when in fact they may well understand themselves as integrated selves who cannot be represented so selectively or reductively (Carastathis 2017). Generalizations made about particular social groups in the context of identity politics may also come to have a disciplinary function within the group, not just describing but also dictating the self-understanding that its members should have. Thus, the supposedly liberatory new identity may inhibit autonomy, as Anthony Appiah puts it, replacing “one kind of tyranny with another” (1994: 163). Just as dominant groups in the culture at large insist that the marginalized integrate by assimilating to dominant norms, so within some practices of identity politics dominant sub-groups may, in theory and practice, impose their vision of the group’s identity onto all its members.
For example, a common narrative of U.S. feminist history points to universalizing claims made on behalf of women during the so-called “second wave” of the feminist movement in the late 1960s and 1970s. The most often discussed (and criticized) second wave feminist icons—women such as Betty Friedan or Gloria Steinem—are white, middle-class, and heterosexual, although this historical picture itself too often neglects the contributions of lesbian feminists, feminists of color, and working-class feminists, which were less visible in popular culture, perhaps, but equally influential in the lives of women. For some early radical feminists, women’s oppression as women was the core of identity politics and should not be diluted with other identity issues. For example, Shulamith Firestone, in her classic book The Dialectic of Sex, argued that “racism is sexism extended,” and that the Black Power movement represented only sexist cooptation of Black women into a new kind of subservience to Black men. Thus for Black women to fight racism (especially among white women) was to divide the feminist movement, which properly focused on challenging patriarchy, understood as struggle between men and women, the foundational dynamic of all oppressions (Firestone 1970: esp. 103–120).
Such claims about the universality of gender have therefore been extensively criticized in feminist theory for failing to recognize the specificity of their own constituencies. Friedan’s famous proposition that women needed to get out of the household and into the professional workplace was, bell hooks pointed out, predicated on the experience of a post-war generation of white, middle-class married women limited to housekeeping and child-rearing by their professional husbands (Friedan 1963; hooks 1981). Many women of color and working-class women had worked outside their homes (sometimes in other women’s homes) for decades; some lesbians had a history of working in traditionally male occupations or living alternative domestic lives without a man’s “family wage.” Theorizing the experience of hybridity for those whose identities are especially far from norms of univocality, Gloria Anzaldúa, for example, writes of her mestiza identity as a Chicana, American, raised poor, a lesbian and a feminist, living in the metaphoric and literal Borderlands of the American Southwest (1999 ). Some women from the less developed world have been critical of Northern feminist theory for globalizing its claims. Such moves construct “Third World” women, they argue, as less developed or enlightened versions of their “First World” counterparts, rather than understanding their distinctively different situation (Mohanty 1991 ); or, they characterize liberation for Northern women in ways that exacerbate the exploitation of the global poor—by supporting economic conditions in which increasing numbers of western women can abuse migrant domestic workers, for example (Anderson 2000). The question of what a global feminism should make of identity political claims, or how it should conceive solidarity among women from massively different locations within the global economic system remains open (Weir 2008).
Further complicating intersectional methods, the very categories of identity that are taken to intersect may themselves be thought of as historically contingent and variable. To take the example of “race,” despite a complex history of biological essentialism in the presentation of racial typologies, the notion of a genetic basis to racial difference has been largely discredited; the criteria different societies (at different times) use to organize and hierarchize “racial formations” are political and contingent (Omi and Winant 1994 ). While some human physical traits are in a trivial sense genetically determined, the grouping of different persons into races does not pick out any patterned biological difference. What it does pick out is a set of social meanings with political ramifications (Alcoff 1997, 2006). The most notorious example of an attempt to rationalize racial difference as biological is the U.S. “one-drop rule,” under which an individual was characterized as Black if they had “one drop” or more of “Black blood.” Adrian Piper points out that not only does this belief persist into contemporary readings of racial identity, it also implies that given the prolonged history of racial mixing in the US—both coerced and voluntary—very significant numbers of nominally “white” people in the U.S. today should be re-classified as “Black” (Piper 1996). In those countries that have had official racial classifications, individuals’ struggles to be re-classified (almost always as a member of a more privileged racial group) are often invoked to highlight the contingency of race, especially at the borders of its categories. And a number of histories of racial groups that have apparently changed their racial identification—Jews, Italians, or the Irish, for example—also illustrate genealogical theses (Ignatiev 1995). The claim that race is “socially constructed,” however, does not in itself mark out a specific identity politics. Indeed, the very contingency of race and its lack of correlation with categories that have more meaning in everyday life (such as ethnicity or culture) may circumscribe its political usefulness: just as feminists have found the limits of appeals to “women’s identity,” so Asian-Americans may find with ethnicities and cultures as diverse as Chinese, Indian, or Vietnamese that their racial designation itself provides little common ground. That a US citizen of both Norwegian and Ashkenazi Jewish heritage will check that they are “white” on a census form says relatively little (although in a post-Trump U.S., it arguably says more [Jardina 2019]) about their experience of their identity, or indeed of their very different relationship to anti-Semitism. Tropes of separatism and the search for forms of authentic self-expression are related to race via ethno-cultural understandings of identity: for example, the U.S. Afrocentric movement appeals to the cultural significance of African heritage for Black Americans (Asante 2000).
Critical engagement with the origins and conceptualization of subjectivity also informs poststructuralist challenges to identity politics. They charge that it rests on a mistaken view of the subject that assumes a metaphysics of substance—that is, that a cohesive, self-identical subject is ontologically (if not actually) prior to any form of social injustice (Butler 1999 ). This subject has certain core essential attributes that define her or his identity, over which are imposed forms of socialization that cause her or him to internalize other nonessential attributes. This position, they suggest, misrepresents both the ontology of identity and its political significance. The alternative view offered by poststructuralists is that the subject is itself always already a product of discourse, which represents both the condition of possibility for a certain subject-position and a constraint on what forms of self-making individuals may engage in. There is no real identity—individual or group-based—that is separable from its conditions of possibility, and any political appeal to identity formations must engage with the paradox of acting from the very subject-positions it must also oppose. Central to this position is the observation that any claim to identity must organize itself around a constitutive exclusion:
An identity is established in relation to a series of differences that have become socially recognized. These differences are essential to its being. If they did not coexist as differences, it would not exist in its distinctness and solidity. Entrenched in this indispensable relation is a second set of tendencies, themselves in need of exploration, to conceal established identities into fixed forms, thought and lived as if their structure expressed the true order of things. When these pressures prevail, the maintenance of one identity (or field of identities) involves the conversion of some differences into otherness, into evil, or one of its numerous surrogates. Identity requires differences in order to be, and it converts difference into otherness in order to secure its own self-certainty. (Connolly 2002: 64)
The danger of identity politics, then, is that it casts as authentic to the self or group a self-understanding that in fact is defined by its opposition to a dominant identity, which typically represents itself as neutral. Reclaiming such an identity as one’s own merely reinforces its dependence on this Other, and further internalizes and reinforces an oppressive hierarchy. This danger is frequently obscured by claims that particular identities are essential or natural, as we saw with race. For example, some early gay activists emphasized the immutable and essential natures of their sexual identities. They were a distinctively different natural kind of person, with the same rights as (white, middle-class) heterosexuals (another natural kind) to find fulfillment in marriage and family life, property ownership, personal wealth accumulation, and consumer culture. This strand of organizing (associated more closely with white, middle-class gay men) with its complex simultaneous appeals to difference and to sameness has a genealogy going back to pre-Stonewall homophilic activism (see discussion in Terry 1999, esp. 353–7). While early lesbian feminists had a very different politics, oriented around liberation from patriarchy and the creation of separate spaces for woman-identified women, many still appealed to a more authentic, distinctively feminist womanhood. Heterosexual feminine identities were products of oppression, yet the literature imagines a utopian alternative where woman-identification will liberate the lesbian within every woman (e.g., Radicalesbians 1988 ). The paradigm shift that the term “queer” signals, then, is a shift to a model in which identities are more self-consciously historicized, seen as contingent products of particular genealogies rather than enduring or essential natural kinds (Phelan 1989 and 1994; Blasius 2001). Michel Foucault’s History of Sexuality famously argues that “homosexuality appeared as one of the forms of sexuality when it was transposed from the practice of sodomy onto a kind of interior androgyny, a hermaphrodism of the soul. The sodomite had been a temporary aberration; the homosexual was now a species” (Foucault 1978: 43). Although Foucault is the most often cited as the originator of such genealogical arguments about homosexuality, other often neglected writers contributed to the emergence of this new paradigm (e.g., M. McIntosh 1968). Such theories still co-exist uneasily with popularized essentialist accounts of gender and sexual identity, which purport to look for a particular gene, brain structure, or other biological feature that is noninteractive with environment and that will explain gender-normative behavior (including sometimes trans identity) and same-sex sexual desire.
At stake are not only epistemological and metaphysical questions about how we can know what kind of thing “sexual orientation” might be, but also a host of moral and political questions. Some gay activists thus see biological explanations of sexuality as offering a defense against homophobic commentators who believe that gay men and lesbians can voluntarily change their desires. Indeed, much of the intuitive hostility to genealogical or poststructuralist accounts of sexuality within gay and lesbian communities even today seems to come from the dual sense of many individuals that they could not have been other than gay, and that anything less than a radically essentialist view of sexuality will open the door to further attempts to “cure” them of their homosexuality (through “conversion therapy,” for example). Nonetheless, it is perfectly possible to argue that the experience of one’s bodily feelings and concomitant sense of self having an origin solely inside oneself is both deeply felt and in this sense real, and an experience with a history larger than the individual (Heyes 2007; Salamon 2010). Furthermore, as Eve Sedgwick argues, no specific form of explanation for the origins of sexual preference will be proof against the infinitely varied strategies of homophobia (Sedgwick 1990: esp. 22–63). That sexual orientation takes on a metaphysical life of its own elides the fact that it is generally sexual behavior—not an abstract “identity”—that is the object of moral disapprobation. Queer politics, then, works to trouble the categories “gay” and “lesbian,” as well as “heterosexual” (or indeed other categories of social thought in general), and point out that the homo/hetero dichotomy, like many others in western intellectual history that it arguably draws on and reinforces, is not only mutually implicated, but also hierarchical (heterosexuality is superior, normal, and originary, while homosexuality is inferior, deviant, and derivative) and masquerades as natural or descriptive.
These conflicting positions within gender and sexual politics are exemplified in the history of the expansion of gay and lesbian organizing to those with other queer affiliations. Those describing themselves as “gay” and “lesbian” wondered if bisexual and transgender (and then intersex, Two Spirit, asexual, and more) people shared sufficiently similar experience and interests to make an identity political movement. Indeed, this suspicion sometimes worked in the opposite direction: not all trans or intersex people have understood themselves to be queer, or to share the same political goals as gay and lesbian organizers, for example. The debate finds a parallel in a form of challenge to the inclusion of transwomen in women-only spaces (or indeed, their identification as “women” in the first place). The possibility of feminist solidarity across cis and trans lines hinges on the centrality of sex and gender identities—and how those are understood—to political spaces and organizing (Heyes 2003). Traditions of trans, mestiza, and cyborg feminist politics have resisted the claim of sameness and recommended models that embrace the historicity of subject-positions and intrasubjective plurality (Stone 1991; Haraway 1991; Lugones 1994; see Bettcher 2014 for an overview).
While the common charge that identity politics promotes a victim mentality is often made glibly, Wendy Brown offers a more sophisticated caution against the dangers of ressentiment (the moralizing revenge of the powerless). She argues that identity politics has its own genealogy in liberal capitalism that relentlessly reinforces the “wounded attachments” it claims to sever: “Politicized identity thus enunciates itself, makes claims for itself, only by entrenching, restating, dramatizing, and inscribing its pain in politics; it can hold out no future—for itself or others—that triumphs over this pain” (Brown 1995: 74). The challenge that identity politics retains attachments to hierarchized categories defined in opposition to each other and over-identifies with artifactual wounds has been met with more discussion of the temporality of identity politics: can an identification be premised on a forward-looking solidarity rather than a ressentiment-laden exclusion (see Zerilli 2005; Weir 2008; Bhambra and Margee 2010)? It also invites consideration of whether pain is always a regressive, fixed ground of identity claims, or whether it might be a legitimate reality for mobilization, as Tobin Siebers suggests of disability (2017: 322–3). Some proponents of identity politics have suggested that poststructuralism is politically impotent, capable only of deconstruction and never of action (Hartsock 1998: 205–226). There are, however, political projects motivated by poststructuralist theses. For example, Judith Butler’s famous articulation of performativity as a way of understanding subject-development suggests to her and others the possibility of disarticulating seamless performances to subvert the meanings with which they are invested (Butler 1999 ). Drag maybe constituted such a disarticulation, although other critics have suggested other examples; Adrian Piper’s conceptual art seeks to disrupt the presumed self-identity of race by showing how it is actively interpreted and reconstituted, never determinate and self-evident. Linda Zerilli discusses the “world-building” work of the Milan Women’s Bookstore Collective—a feminist group that rejects a subject-centred view of women’s injured status in favor of a protensive practice of freedom (2005: chapter 3).
3. Liberalism and Identity Politics
Institutionalized liberal democracy is a key condition of possibility for contemporary identity politics. The citizen mobilizations that made democracy real also shaped and unified groups previously marginal to the polity, while extensions of formal rights invited expectations of material and symbolic equality. The perceived paucity of rewards offered by liberal capitalism, however, spurred forms of radical critique that sought to explain the persistence of inequity. At the most basic philosophical level, critics of liberalism suggested that liberal social ontology—the model of the nature of and relationship between subjects and collectives—was misguided. The social ontology of most liberal political theories consists of citizens conceptualized as essentially similar individuals, as for example in John Rawls’ famous thought experiment using the “original position,” in which representatives of the citizenry are conceptually divested of all specific identities or affiliations in order to make rational decisions about the social contract (Rawls 1971). To the extent that group interests are represented in liberal polities, they tend to be understood as associational, forms of interest group pluralism whereby those sharing particular interests voluntarily join together to create a political lobby. Citizens are free to register their individual preferences (through voting, for example), or to aggregate themselves for the opportunity to lobby more systematically (e.g., by forming an association such as a neighborhood community league). These lobbies, however, are not defined by the identity of their members so much as by specific shared interests and goals, and when pressing their case the marginalized subjectivity of the group members is not itself called into question. Finally, political parties, the other primary organs of liberal democratic government, critics suggest, have few moments of inclusivity, being organized around party discipline, responsiveness to lobby groups, and broad-based electoral popularity. Ultimately conventional liberal democracy, diverse radical critics claim, cannot effectively address the ongoing structural marginalization that persists in late capitalist liberal states, and may even be complicit with it (Young 1990; P. Williams 1991; Brown 1995; M. Williams 1998; Mills 2017).
On a philosophical level, liberal understandings of the political subject and its relationship to collectivity came to seem inadequate to ensuring representation for women, gay men and lesbians, or racial-ethnic groups (M. Williams 1998). Critics charged that the neutral citizen of liberal theory was in fact the bearer of an identity coded white, male, bourgeois, able, and heterosexual (Pateman 1988; Young 1990; Di Stefano 1991; Mills 1997; Pateman and Mills 2007). This implicit ontology in part explained the persistent historical failure of liberal democracies to achieve full inclusion in power structures for members of marginalized groups. A richer understanding of political subjects as constituted through and by their social location was required. In particular, the history and experience of injustice brought with it certain perspectives and needs that could not be assimilated through existing institutions. Individuals are oppressed by virtue of their membership in a particular social group—that is, a collective whose members have relatively little mobility into or out of the collective, who usually experience their membership as involuntary, who are generally identified as members by others, and whose opportunities are deeply shaped by the relation of their group to corollary groups through privilege and oppression (Cudd 2006). Liberal democratic institutions have persistently grappled with the challenge of recognizing such asymmetries of identity while stressing procedural consistency and literal equality in institutions. Thus for example the twentieth-century U.S. discussion of the categories of race organized around color-blind versus color-conscious public policy (Appiah and Gutmann 1996). Color-blindness—that is, the view that race should be ignored in public policy and everyday exchange—had hegemony in popular discourse. Drawing attention to race—whether in a personal description or in university admissions procedures—was characterized as unfair and racist. Advocates of color-consciousness, on the other hand, argued that racism would not disappear without proactive efforts, which required the invocation of race. Affirmative action requires statistics about the numbers of members of oppressed racial groups employed in certain contexts, which in turn requires racial identification and categorization. Thus those working against racism face a paradox familiar in identity politics: the very identity they aim to transform must be invoked to make their case.
Critics have also charged that integration (or, more provocatively, assimilation) is a guiding principle of liberalism (see Callan 2005). If the liberal subject is coded in the way Young (1990) suggests, then attempts to apply liberal norms of equality will risk demanding that the marginalized conform to the identities of their oppressors. For example, many commentators on the politics of gender and sexuality objected to campaigns defending “gay marriage” or otherwise representing queer people as living up to heterosexual (white, or middle-class) norms, on the grounds that these legal developments assimilate same-sex relationships to an existing dominant model, rather than challenging its historical, material, and symbolic terms (e.g., Card 2007; Puar 2017). If this is equality, they claim, then it looks suspiciously like the erasure of socially subordinate identities rather than their genuine incorporation into the polity. One of the central charges against identity politics by liberals, among others, has been its alleged reliance on notions of sameness to justify political mobilization. Looking for people who are like you rather than who share your political values as allies runs the risk of sidelining critical political analysis of complex social locations and ghettoizing members of social groups as the only persons capable of making or understanding claims to justice. After an initial wave of relatively uncompromising identity politics, proponents have taken these criticisms to heart and moved to more philosophically nuanced accounts that appeal to coalitions as better organizing structures. On this view, separatism around a single identity formation must be muted by recognition of the intersectional nature of social group memberships. The idea of a dominant identity from which the oppressed may need to dissociate themselves remains, but the alternative becomes a more fluid and diverse grouping, less intent on guarantees of internal homogeneity.
Finally, the literature on multiculturalism takes up questions of race, ethnicity, and cultural diversity in relation to the liberal state (Levy 2000; Kymlicka 2001). Some multicultural states—notably Canada—allegedly aim to permit the various cultural identities of their residents to be preserved rather than assimilated, despite the concern that the over-arching liberal aims of such states may be at odds with the values of those they claim to protect. For example, Susan Moller Okin argued that multiculturalism is sometimes “bad for women,” especially when it works to preserve patriarchal values in minority cultures. If multiculturalism implies a form of cultural relativism that prevents judgment of or interference with the “private” practices of minorities, female genital mutilation, forced marriage, compulsory veiling, or being deprived of education may be the consequence. Okin’s critics countered that she falsely portrayed culture as static, internally homogeneous, and defined by men’s values, allowing liberalism to represent a culturally unmarked medium for the defense of individual rights (Okin et al. 1999). For many commentators on multiculturalism this is the nub of the issue: is there an inconsistency between defending the rights of minority cultures, while prohibiting those (allegedly) cultural practices that the state judges illiberal (Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005; Phillips 2007)? Can liberalism sustain the cultural and value-neutrality that some commentators still ascribe to it, or to what extent should it embrace its own cultural specificity (Taylor 1994; Foster and Herzog 1994; Kymlicka 1995)? Defenders of the right to cultural expression of minorities in multicultural states thus practice forms of identity politics that are both made possible by liberalism and sometimes in tension with it (see Laden and Owen 2007). Increasingly it is difficult to see what divides anything called “liberalism” from anything called “identity politics,” and some commentators have suggested possible rapprochements (e.g., Laden 2001).
4. Contemporary Philosophical Engagement with Identity Politics
Since its 1970s origins, identity politics as a mode of organizing and set of political philosophical positions has undergone numerous attacks by those motivated to point to its flaws, whether by its pragmatic exclusions or more programmatically. For many leftist commentators, in particular, identity politics is something of a bête noire, representing the capitulation to cultural criticism in place of analysis of the material roots of oppression. Marxists, both orthodox and revisionist, and socialists—especially those who came of age during the rise of the New Left in western countries—have often interpreted the perceived ascendancy of identity politics as representing the end of radical materialist critique (see discussions in McNay 2008: 126–161, and Kumar et al. 2018). Identity politics, for these critics, is both factionalizing and depoliticizing, drawing attention away from the ravages of late capitalism toward superstructural cultural accommodations that leave economic structures unchanged. For example, while allowing that both recognition and redistribution have a place in contemporary politics, Nancy Fraser laments the supremacy of perspectives that take injustice to inhere in “cultural” constructions of identity that the people to whom they are attributed want to reject. Such recognition models, she argues, require remedies that “valorize the group’s ‘groupness’ by recognizing its specificity,” thus reifying identities that themselves are products of oppressive structures. By contrast, injustices of distribution require redistributive remedies that aim “to put the group out of business as a group” (Fraser 1997: 19). If Fraser’s argument traces its intellectual roots to Marx through critical theory, similar arguments come via Foucauldian genealogy. In her 2008 book Against Recognition, for example, Lois McNay argues that identity claims that are at the heart of many contemporary social movements are represented as demands for recognition in the context of an over-simplified account of power. Although theorists of recognition typically start from a Hegelian model of the subject as dialogically formed and necessarily situated, they too quickly abandon the radical consequences of such a view for subject formation, McNay argues. The subject of recognition becomes both personalized and hypostatized—divorced from the larger social systems of power that create conditions of possibility for particular “identities” (2008: esp. 1–23). In this way, the debates around subject-formation that are at the heart of philosophical discussions of identity politics parallel conversations between Habermasians and Foucauldians about the possibility of a transcendental subject that can ground practices of critique (see Allen 2008). This varied debate has a long half-life (see Fraser 2010; 2013) and contemporary manifestations. For example, Glen Coulthard (2014) argues that the shift in colonial state-Indigenous relations in present-day Canada from unabashed assimilationism to demands for mutual recognition (especially of cultural distinctiveness) cannot be an adequate decolonization strategy. Reading the intellectual history of the politics of recognition through Hegel to Sartre to Fanon to Benhabib, Coulthard argues that this discourse is a reiteration (and sometimes a cover-up) of the patriarchal, racist, and colonial relations between Indigenous people and the Canadian state that it purports to ameliorate. Instead, he defends a paradigm of critical Indigenous resurgence that draws on cultural history and economic practices that are neither essentialized nor romanticized, but that also do not rest on concession-oriented relation-building with the existing Canadian state. Audra Simpson makes a similar argument, suggesting that the politics of recognition in the context of settler dispossession denies its own history, assuming that recognition for Indigenous people can occur within the context of such “largely state-driven performance art” as reconciliation, which casts the injustices of settler colonialism as having occurred “in the past” and requiring apology, rather than acknowledging the wide-ranging material political consequences of land theft and Indigenous sovereignty (2017, 6–7).
From the early days, the presentation of a dichotomy (or a choice) between recognition and redistribution, or the cultural and the economic, was challenged by those who pointed out that the intersectional politics of gender, sexuality, and race had always been engaged and understood through the structures of capitalism (Butler 1997; Upping the Anti 2005; Walters 2018). Given how many contexts these debates must generalize, it is hard to see how one can draw any conclusions about the merits of a thing called “identity politics” over and above any other kind. Nonetheless, in the post-2016 political world, after the Brexit referendum in the UK and the election of Donald Trump in the US, as well as following the rise of nationalist and/or austerity right parties in many other countries, recrimination from diverse political perspectives has again focused on the alleged over-emphasis on “identity politics.” The decline of class-based politics, the growth of economic inequality, and the disaffection of working-class white men, critics suggest, was neglected by both political party leaderships and grassroots organizers, in favor of campaigning around issues attaching to feminism, queer politics, and anti-racism. For example, Francis Fukuyama argues that the twentieth century was the century of the economic in politics—a contest between a left defined through workers’ rights, social welfare, and robust redistribution, and the right’s drive to reduce government by shrinking the public sector and selling publicly owned services and replacing them with private market delivery. By contrast, he suggests, the twenty-first century has seen the left focus “less on creating broad economic equality and more on promoting the interests of a wide variety of marginalized groups, such as ethnic minorities, immigrants and refugees, women, and LGBT people. The right, meanwhile, has redefined its core mission as the patriotic protection of traditional national identity, which is often explicitly connected to race, ethnicity, or religion” (Fukuyama 2018, 91). This allegedly renders the left less able to address trending inequality, and redirects its focus to “cultural issues,” and validating interiority and achieving recognition—all of which racist nationalists can easily co-opt:
Today, the American creedal national identity, which emerged in the wake of the Civil War, must be revived and defended against attacks from both the left and the right. On the right, white nationalists would like to replace the creedal national identity with one based on race, ethnicity, and religion. On the left, the champions of identity politics have sought to undermine the legitimacy of the American national story by emphasizing victimization, insinuating in some cases that racism, gender discrimination, and other forms of systematic exclusion are in the country’s DNA. (108)
Identity politics, Fukuyama concludes, is the lens through which politics in the US is refracted, with a turning-away from economic inequality on the left providing a convenient evasion for the right.
Fukuyama writes with a hostile outsider’s dismissal of the social movements he labels as identity politics, yet the bifurcation he describes between the economic and the identarian is echoed in a 2018 special issue of the Marxist journal Historical Materialism, in which the editors’ introduction describes approvingly subsequent articles that show how
the Left has abrogated the notion of identity as being materially rooted, and contingent on historical and geographical context. In its place, we see the hegemonic acceptance of an inherently reactionary alternative: one which perceives race, gender and sexuality as dearly-held, self-fashioning, and self-justifying essences. Such a concession has not only reinforced the class/identity binary, but also led to a stifled political imagination in which identity-based politics can only be conceptualised within a liberal-capitalist logic. (Kumar et al. 2018, 5–6)
In response to this challenge, defenders point out again how political organizing through contemporary feminism and anti-racism—by way of movements like #MeToo or Black Lives Matter, for example—has not shied away from the economic components to their analyses. The binary between economic critique that marks discussion of “redistribution,” and discussion of group identity that characterizes “recognition,” may in moments be conducted as if the two were separate. The idea, however, that proponents of treating gender, sexuality, or race as intersecting axes of individual meaning and social stratification have consistently neglected the economic aspects of their analyses is hard to sustain. As Suzanna Danuta Walters points out, “the critique of identity politics is dependent upon seeing identity as only the province of the disenfranchised and marginal” as well as upon seeing white men (including the working-class, straight men who are the imagined community of the neonationalist right) as somehow not having “identity” (Walters 2018, 477). Described by Paul Joshua as “anti-identity identity politics,” this position, as exemplified in his description of the “All Lives Matter” response to Black Lives Matter, “is predicated on the taken-for-grantedness of a pre-established racist system which from centuries of de jure and de facto practices is now fixed almost silently into the socio-political infrastructure…. Despite its universalist pretentions, it remains a cloaked identitarian politics which through a hegemonic narrative (re)presents itself as a radically inclusionary counter-narrative” (2019, 16).
Every time this article is revised, it is tempting to write that “identity politics” is an out-moded term, over-determined by its critics and part of a reductive political lexicon on both the Marxist left and the neoconservative right. Yet in 2020, still, there are recent iterations of the recognition versus redistribution debate, ongoing arguments about the demands of intersectionality, and new forms of political resistance to the movements that circulate under the sign “identity politics.” Both flexible and extensible, identity political tropes continue to influence new political claims: an extensive literature approaches disability, for example, as a diverse and dynamic set of experiences of social injustice that sediment self-understandings among the disabled and motivate a politics that insists dominant cultures change their exclusionary social practices (Davis 2017 ; Silvers 1998, Siebers 2006, 2008; Kafer 2013). Perhaps most important for philosophers, any idea of identity itself appears to be in a period of rapid evolution. Attempts to decode human genetics and shape the genetic make-up of future persons (Richardson and Stevens 2015), to clone human beings, or to xeno-transplant animal organs, and so on, all raise deep philosophical questions about the kind of thing a person is. As more and more people form political alliances using disembodied communications technologies, the kinds of identities that matter seem also to shift. Behaviors, beliefs, and self-understandings are increasingly pathologized as syndromes and disorders, including through the identification of new “types” of person (in turn generating possibilities for new forms of identity politics).
Increasingly, this long list of confounding variables for identity political thought is finding philosophical cohesion in anti-identarian models that take somatic life, affect, time, or space as organizing concepts. For example, both new materialisms and neo-vitalist philosophies, in their political contexts, share an emphasis on becoming over being, a “posthumanist” reluctance to award ontological priority to any shared characteristics of human beings (Wolfe 2010), a skepticism about discourses of authenticity and belonging, and a desire to focus on generative, forward-looking political solutions (Bhambra and Margee 2010; Coole and Frost 2010; Connolly 2011). The lines between humans and other animals (Haraway 2007; Donaldson and Kymlicka 2014, 2016), between the living and the non-living (Sharp 2011), and between objects and subjects (Bennett 2009) are radically challenged. The COVID-19 pandemic shows more clearly than ever how the edges of human bodies are porous with our environments. To varying degrees these emphases are echoed in other process ontologies—whether Annemarie Mol’s work in medical anthropology (2002), the reintroduction of bodies as socially and biologically dynamic and intra-active forces in forming political subjectivities (Protevi 2009), or the ways indirect, technologically mediated experience shapes so much of our contemporary “identities” (Turkle 2011). This mass of shifts and contradictions might be thought to mark the end of the era of identity politics. Whatever limits are inherent to identity political formations, however, the enduring rhetorical power of the phrase itself indicates the deep implication of questions of power and legitimate government with demands for self-determination that are unlikely to fade away.
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Other important works
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The author would like to thank Jeanique Tucker, who provided research assistance for the 2020 revision.