Feminist Philosophy

First published Thu Jun 28, 2018; substantive revision Fri Jul 14, 2023

This entry provides an introduction to the feminist philosophy section of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP). Overseen by a board of feminist philosophers, this section primarily takes up feminist philosophy of the twentieth and twenty-first century. It has three subsections of entries (as can be seen in Table of Contents under “feminist philosophy”): (1) approaches to feminist philosophy, (2) feminist interventions in philosophy, and (3) feminist philosophical topics. By “approaches to feminist philosophy” we mean the main philosophical approaches such as analytic, continental, psychoanalytic, pragmatist, and various intersections. We see these as methodologies that can be fruitfully employed to engage philosophically isssues of feminist concern. The second group of entries, feminist interventions in philosophy, includes entries on how feminist philosophers have intervened in and begun to transform traditional philosopical areas such as aesthetics, ethics, the history of philosophy, metaphysics, and political philosophy. Entries in the third group, feminist philosophical topics, take up concepts and matters that traditional philosophy has either overlooked or undertheorized, including autonomy, the body, objectification, sex and gender, and reproduction. In short, this third group of entries shows how feminist philosophers have rendered philosophical previously un-problematized topics, such as the body, class and work, disability, the family, human trafficking, reproduction, the self, sex work, and sexuality. Entries in this third group also show how a particularly feminist lens refashions issues of globalization, human rights, popular culture, race and racism, and science. Following a brief overview of feminism as a political and intellectual movement, we provide an overview of these three parts of the feminist section of the SEP.

In addition to the feminist philosophy section of the SEP, there are also a number of entries on women in the history of philosophy, for example, on Mary Wollstonecraft, Mary Astell, Jane Addams, Rosa Luxemburg, Simone de Beauvoir, Iris Murdoch, and others. Additionally, dozens of other entries throughout the SEP discuss facets of feminist philosophy, including, to name just a handful, the entries on global justice, respect, contemporary Africana philosophy, multiculturalism, privacy, and Latinx philosophy.

1. What is Feminism?

Broadly understood, feminism is both an intellectual commitment and a political movement that seeks an end to gender-based oppression. Motivated by the quest for social justice, feminist inquiry provides a wide range of perspectives on cultural, economic, social, and political phenomena. It identifies and evaluates the many ways that some norms have been used to exclude, marginalize, and oppress people on the basis of gender, as well as how gendered identities have been shaped to conform and uphold the norms of a patriarchal society. In so doing, it tries to understand the roots of a system that has been prevalent in nearly all known places and times. It also explores what a just society would look like.

While less frequently than one would think, throughout history women have rebelled against repressive structures. It was not until the late 19th century that feminism coalesced into a movement. In the mid-1800s the term feminism was still used to refer to “the qualities of females.” After the First International Women’s Conference in Paris in 1892, the term feminism, following the French term féministe, was used regularly in English for a belief in and advocacy of equal rights for women based on the idea of the equality of the sexes. Hence the term feminism in English is rooted in the mobilization for women’s suffrage in Europe and the United States during the late nineteenth and early twentieth century.

As a term, feminism has many different uses and its meanings are often contested. For example, some writers use the term to refer to a historically specific political movement in the United States and Europe; other writers use it to refer to the belief that there are injustices against women, though there is no consensus on the exact list of these injustices. Some have found it useful, if controversial, to think of the women’s movement in the United States as occurring in “waves.” The wave model has some virtues, but it also tends to overlook a great deal of heterogeneity of thought in any given moment. It works well enough for what is thought of as the first wave, identified as the period from the mid-nineteenth century until the passage of the Nineteenth Amendment in 1920. This first wave focused on the struggle to achieve basic political rights. According to the wave model, feminism in the United States waned after women achieved voting rights, to be revived in the late 1960s and early 1970s as “second wave” feminism. In this second wave, the model holds, feminists pushed beyond the early quest for political rights to fight for greater equality across the board, e.g., in education, the workplace, and at home. But in actuality, many feminists during this time were focusing on more than equality. Like the first wave, many of the leaders of the second wave of feminism were white women seeking equal rights. But also, as in the first wave, other voices emerged, broadening the movement. The second wave came to include women of different identities, ethnicities, and orientations. In addition to calling for equal political rights, they called for greater equality across the board, e.g., in education, the workplace, and at home. Transformations of feminism beginning in the 1990s have resulted in a “third wave.” Third Wave feminists often critique earlier feminists for their lack of attention to the differences among women due to class, ethnicity, nationality, religion, and race (see Breines 2002; Springer 2002), and emphasize “identity” as a site of gender struggle. (For more information on the “wave” model and each of the “waves,” see the subsection on Waves of Feminism in the Other Internet Resources section.)

Some feminist scholars object to identifying feminism in terms of waves on the grounds that doing so eclipses differences within each wave as well as continuity of feminist resistance to male domination throughout history and across cultures. In other words, feminism is not confined to a few (white) women in the West over the past century or so. Moreover, even considering only relatively recent efforts to resist male domination in Europe and the United States, the emphasis on “First” and “Second” Wave feminism ignores the ongoing resistance to male domination between the 1920s and 1960s and the resistance outside mainstream politics, particularly by women of color and working class women (Cott 1987). The wave model also cannot account for theoretical work taking place between waves, for example, of the tremendous work done by Simone de Beauvoir in her groundbreaking book of 1949, The Second Sex. Because of these many limitiations of the wave model, the feminist section of the SEP makes little use of it.

Although the term feminism has a history in English linked with women’s activism from the late nineteenth century to the present, it is useful to distinguish feminist ideas or beliefs from feminist political movements, for even in periods where there has been no significant political activism around women’s subordination, individuals have been concerned with and theorized about justice for women. So, for example, it makes sense to ask whether Plato was a feminist, given his view that some women should be trained to rule (Republic, Book V), even though he was an exception in his historical context (see, e.g., Tuana 1994). Overall, feminism can be understood as not only a social movement but also a set of beliefs, concepts, and theories that seek to analyze, diagnose, and identify solutions to the manifold injustices that people suffer on account of gendered norms. Broadly understood, this is feminism as a intellectual movement. The SEP feminist section aims to chronicle and explain the various theories, concepts, and philosophical tools that feminist philosophers have developed.

Much has been made of the methodological differences or “divides” between various philosophical traditions, namely analytic and continental, but also pragmatist and psychoanalytic. But throughout these entries the reader will find a continuity of descriptions on the meaning of feminism, even with the heterogeneity of the philosophical methodologies these entries’ authors employ. The entry on feminist ethics, written by the analytic feminist philosopher Kathryn Norlock, describes that field in a way that is agreeable to almost any feminist philosopher:

Feminist Ethics aims “to understand, criticize, and correct” how gender operates within our moral beliefs and practices (Lindemann 2005, 11) and our methodological approaches to ethical theory. More specifically, feminist ethicists aim to understand, criticize, and correct: (1) the binary view of gender, (2) the privilege historically available to men, and/or (3) the ways that views about gender maintain oppressive social orders or practices that harm others, especially girls and women who historically have been subordinated along gendered dimensions including sexuality and gender-identity. (entry on feminist ethics, introduction)

Likewise, the entry on feminist perspectives on power, written by the critical theorist Amy Allen, proposes the idea that “although any general definition of feminism would no doubt be controversial, it seems undeniable that much work in feminist theory is devoted to the tasks of critiquing gender subordination, analyzing its intersections with other forms of subordination such as racism, heterosexism, and class oppression, and envisioning prospects for individual and collective resistance and emancipation.” (entry on feminist perspectives on power, introduction)

Even with general overall shared commitments about the meaning of feminism, numerous differences among feminist philosophers do show up in the array of arenas outlined in this section of the SEP. Some of these may be due to different methodological approaches (whether, for example, continental or analytic), but others show up because of different ontological commitments (such as the category of woman) and beliefs about what kind of political and moral remedies should be sought.

Nonetheless, over the decades there has been a lot of frustration, perhaps because as philosophers these feminist theorists often want to get to the (one) truth of the matter, for example, what is “a woman”? What is freedom? What is autonomy? Yet so far any search for a unified or unifying theory of feminism has yet to bear fruit. Consider the seemingly unproblematic claim that feminism is a commitment to women’s equal rights. Perhaps it is, but framing it this way comes with its own presuppositions. The first is that feminism is committed to a liberal model of politics. Although most feminists would probably agree that there is some sense of rights on which achieving equal rights for women is a necessary condition for feminism to succeed, most would also argue that this would not be sufficient. This is because women’s oppression under male domination rarely if ever consists solely in depriving women of political and legal rights, but also extends into the structure of our society and the content of our culture, and the workings of languages and how they shape perceptions and permeate our consciousness (e.g., Bartky 1988, Postl 2017). A second presupposition is that there is some clear and universal definition of what it is to be a woman. The SEP entry, Feminist Perspectives on Sex and Gender, gives a rich overview of what is problematic about this supposition. Any attempt to define “woman,” according to Judith Butler, is also an attempt to exclude some from that category. More recently this debate shows up in discussions about nonbinary and trans people. Previously, it showed up in suppositions that the typical subject of feminism was white and middle class. While feminism would be easier to theorize if it were clear who its subject is, any attempt to define it runs into trouble. (see the entry on feminist perspectives on trans issues)

Is there any point, then, in asking what feminism is? Rather than looking for a unified field theory of feminism, perhaps feminism can be identified as an engagement precisely where there are contradictions over questions of freedom, identity, and agency. These contradictions are not just logical ones but also historical ones. For example, the question of women’s political equality to men arose precisely at those historical moments when “all men” came to be deemed as equal (McAfee 2021). During the French Revolution, the French settled the matter by saying that “men” meant men and not women. In the American Revolution, “men” was not so clearly gendered but it was certainly raced as white. Equality becomes an issue precisely where there is a disjunct between what seems to be the case normatively and what is happening empirically. Questions about the category of women arise in the context of political diversity and biological malleability, where peoples of many cultures mingle and sexual or gender identity can be altered. Feminist debates over pornography and sex work become heated in the context, respectively, of a free press and economic precarity. In short, feminist inquiry arises in the context of disagreement and contradiction and it produces new ways of approaching issues and asking questions. Thus, that it lacks a cohesive set of answers may be beside the point.

In sum, “feminism” is an umbrella term for a range of views about injustices against women. There are disagreements among feminists about the nature of justice in general and the nature of sexism, in particular, the specific kinds of injustice or wrong women suffer; and the group who should be the primary focus of feminist efforts. Nonetheless, feminists are committed to bringing about social change to end injustice against women, in particular, injustice against women as women.

2. Feminist Scholarship

Contemporary feminist philosophical scholarship emerged in the 1970s as more women began careers in higher education, including philosophy. As they did so, they also began taking up matters from their own experience for philosophical scrutiny. These scholars were influenced both by feminist movements in their midst as well as by their philosophical training, which generally was anything but feminist. Until about the 1990s, one could not go to graduate school to study “feminist philosophy.” While students and scholars could turn to the writings of Simone de Beauvoir or look back historically to the writings of “first wave” feminists like Mary Wollstonecraft, most of the philosophers writing in the first decades of the emergence of feminist philosophy brought their particular training and expertise to bear on analyzing issues raised by the women’s liberation movement of the 1960s and 1970s, such as abortion, affirmative action, equal opportunity, the institutions of marriage, sexuality, and love. Additionally, feminist philosophical scholarship increasingly focused on the very same types of issues taken up by mainstream philosophers.

Feminist philosophical scholarship begins with attention to women, and to limitations on their roles and locations and the ways they were valued or devalued. It developed further by considering gender in less binary terms as well as recognizing that gender is only one fact of the complex interactions among class, race, ability, and sexuality. Feminist scholarship asks how attention to these might transform feminist philosophy itself. From here we move to the realm of the symbolic and how it constructs “the feminine.” How is the feminine instantiated and constructed within the texts of philosophy? What role does it play in forming, either through its absence or its presence, the central concepts of philosophy?

Feminist philosophers brought their philosophical tools to bear on these questions. Since these feminist philosophers employed the philosophical tools they knew best and found most promising, feminist philosophy began to emerge from all the traditions of Western philosophy prevalent at the end of the twentieth century, including analytic, continental, and classical American philosophy. While the thematic focus of their work was often influenced by the topics and questions highlighted by these traditions, the larger shared feminist concerns often create as much commonality as difference. Hence, a given question could be taken up and addressed from an array of views in ways that are sometimes divergent and at other times complementary.

As an historically male discipline, many of the leading philosophical journals and societies did not recognize much feminist scholarship as properly philosophical. In response, feminist scholars began founding their own journals and organizations. The first leading feminist journal, Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy, was founded in 1982 as a venue for feminist philosophical scholarship. It embraced a diversity of methodological approaches in feminist philosophy, publishing work from a variety of traditions. Feminist scholarship in each of these traditions is also advanced and supported though scholarly exchange at various professional societies, including the Society for Women in Philosophy, founded in the United States in 1972. Additionally, the Society for Analytical Feminism, founded in 1991, promotes the study of issues in feminism by methods broadly construed as analytic, to examine the use of analytic methods as applied to feminist issues, and to provide a means by which those interested in analytical feminism can meet and exchange ideas. The journal philoSOPHIA was established in 2005 to promote continental feminist scholarly and pedagogical development. The Society for the Study of Women Philosophers was established in 1987 to promote the study of the contributions of women to the history of philosophy. Similar organizations and journals on many continents continue to advance scholarship in feminist philosophy. Often a feminist philosophical society will publish its own journal, just as the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics publishes the International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics. While the discipline of philosophy in the West remains predominantly white and male, feminist journals and scholarship continues to proliferate.

3. Approaches to Feminism

Important feminist philosophical work has emerged from all the current major philosophical traditions, including analytic philosophy, continental philosophy, and American pragmatist philosophy. It is also emerging from other new areas of inquiry, such as Latin American thought, which arises out of the context of colonialism. Entries in the SEP under the heading “approaches to feminism” discuss the impact of these traditions and constellations of thought on feminist scholarship. The subsection also addresses how some work, such as psychoanalytic feminism, bridges two or more traditions. The editors of the feminist section of the SEP see these different traditions as a rich array of methodologies rather than “continental divides.” The array reflects a variety of beliefs about what kinds of philosophy are both fruitful and meaningful. The different methodologies bring their own ways of asking and answering questions, along with constructive and critical dialogue with mainstream philosophical views and methods and new topics of inquiry.

As the SEP continues to grow, we anticipate that this subsection on approaches to feminism will expand to address other traditions, including Black feminism. But for now, here are links to entries in this subsection:

Though not included along with these in the table of contents, another relevant approach can be found in the entry on gender in Confucian philosophy.

All these approaches share a set of feminist commitments and an overarching criticism of institutions, presuppositions, and practices that have historically favored men over women. They also share a general critique of claims to universality and objectivity that ignore male-dominated theories’ own particularity and specificity. Feminist philosophies of almost any philosophical orientation will be much more perspectival, historical, contextual, and focused on lived experience than their non-feminist counterparts. Unlike mainstream philosophers who can seriously consider the philosophical conundrums of brains in a vat, feminist philosophers always start by seeing people as embodied. Feminists have also argued for the reconfiguration of accepted structures and problems of philosophy. For example, feminists have not only rejected the privileging of epistemological concerns over moral and political concerns common to much of philosophy, they have argued that these two areas of concern are inextricably intertwined. Part 2 of the entry on analytic feminism lays out other areas of commonality across these various approaches. For one, feminist philosophers generally agree that philosophy is a powerful tool for, as Ann Garry states in that entry, “understanding ourselves and our relations to each other, to our communities, and to the state; to appreciate the extent to which we are counted as knowers and moral agents; [and] to uncover the assumptions and methods of various bodies of knowledge.” As such, philosophy is also a powerful tool for understanding how gender itself has been constructed, that is, why and to whose benefit it is to construct some people as lesser and less capable than others. Along these lines, feminist philosophers are keenly attuned to male biases at work in the history of philosophy, such as those regarding “the nature of woman” and supposed value neutrality, which on inspection is hardly neutral at all. Claims to universality, feminist philosophers have found, are usually made from a very specific and particular point of view, contrary to their manifest assertions. Another orientation that feminist philosophers generally share is a commitment to normativity and social change; they are never content to analyze things just as they are but instead look for ways to overcome oppressive practices and institutions.

Such questioning of the problems of mainstream approaches to philosophy has often led to feminists using methods and approaches from more than one philosophical tradition. As Ann Garry notes in Part 3 of the entry on analytic feminism (2017), it is not uncommon to find analytic feminists drawing on non-analytic figures such as Beauvoir, Foucault, or Butler; and because of their motivation to communicate with other feminists, they are more motivated than other philosophers “to search for methodological cross-fertilization.” Moreover, feminist philosophers are generally inclined to incorporate the perspectives of all those who have been oppressed.

Even with their common and overlapping orientations, the differences between the various philosophical approaches to feminism are significant, especially in terms of styles of writing, influences, and overall expectations about what philosophy can and should achieve. Analytic feminist philosophy tends to value analysis and argumentation, though anyone trained in philosophy does so as well. Continental feminist theory puts more emphasis on interpretation and deconstruction, and pragmatist feminism values lived experience and exploration. Coming out of a post-Hegelian tradition, both continental and pragmatist philosophers usually suspect that “truth,” whatever that is, emerges and develops historically. They tend to share with Nietzsche the view that truth claims often mask power plays. Yet where continental and pragmatist philosophers are generally wary about notions of truth, analytic feminists tend to argue that the way to “counter sexism and androcentrism is through forming a clear conception of and pursuing truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality, justice, and the good.” (Cudd 1996: 20).

These differences and intersections play out in the ways that various feminists engage topics of common concern. One key area of intersection, noted by Georgia Warnke, is the appropriation of psychoanalytic theory, with Anglo-American feminists generally adopting object-relations theories and continental feminists drawing more on Lacan and contemporary French psychoanalytic theory, though this is already beginning to change as it becomes clearer that continental psychoanalytic theory is also interested, via Julia Kristeva and Melanie Klein, in object-relations theory (see the entry on intersections between analytic and continental feminism). The importance of psychoanalytic approaches is also underscored in Shannon Sullivan’s entry on intersections between pragmatist and continental feminism. Given the importance of psychoanalytic feminism for all three traditions, a separate essay on this approach to feminist theory is included in this section.

No topic is more central to feminist philosophy than sex and gender, but even here many variations on the theme flourish. Where analytic feminism, with its critique of essentialism, holds the sex/gender distinction practically as an article of faith (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender and Chanter 2009), continental feminists tend to suspect either (1) that even the supposedly purely biological category of sex is itself socially constituted (Butler 1990 and 1993) or (2) that sexual difference itself needs to be valued and theorized (see especially Cixous 1976 and Irigaray 1974).

Despite the variety of different approaches, styles, societies, and orientations, feminist philosophers’ commonalities are greater than their differences. Many will borrow freely from each other and find that other orientations contribute to their own work. Even the differences over sex and gender add to a larger conversation about the impact of culture and society on bodies, experience, and pathways for change.

4. Interventions in Philosophy

Philosophers who are feminists have, in their work in traditional fields of study, begun to change those very fields. The Encyclopedia includes a range of entries on how feminist philosophies have intervened in conventional areas of philosophical research, areas in which philosophers often tend to argue that they are operating from a neutral, universal point of view (notable exceptions are pragmatism, poststructuralism, and some phenomenology). Historically, philosophy has claimed that the norm is universal and the feminine is abnormal, that universality is not gendered, but that all things feminine are not universal. Not surprisingly, feminists have pointed out how in fact these supposed neutral enterprises are in fact quite gendered, namely, male gendered. For example, feminists working on environmental philosophy have uncovered how practices disproportionately affect women, children, and people of color. Liberal feminism has shown how supposed universal truths of liberalism are in fact quite biased and particular. Feminist epistemologists have called out “epistemologies of ignorance” that traffic in not knowing. Across the board, in fact, feminist philosophers are uncovering male biases and also pointing to the value of particularity, in general rejecting universality as a norm or goal.

Entries under the heading of feminist interventions include the following:

5. Topics in Feminism

Feminist critical attention to philosophical practices has revealed the inadequacy of dominant philosophical tropes as well as the need to turn philosophical attention to things that had previously gone unattended. For example, feminists working from the perspective of women’s lives have been influential in bringing philosophical attention to the phenomenon of care and care-giving (Ruddick 1989; Held 1995, 2007; Hamington 2006), dependency (Kittay 1999), disability (Wilkerson 2002; Carlson 2009), women’s labor (Waring 1999; Delphy 1984; Harley 2007), the devaluation of women’s testimonies (see the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science), and scientific bias and objectivity (Longino 1990). In doing so they have revealed weaknesses in existing ethical, political, and epistemological theories. More generally, feminists have called for inquiry into what are typically considered “private” practices and personal concerns, such as the family, sexuality, and the body, in order to balance what has seemed to be a masculine pre-occupation with “public” and impersonal matters. Philosophy presupposes interpretive tools for understanding our everyday lives; feminist work in articulating additional dimensions of experience and aspects of our practices is invaluable in demonstrating the bias in existing tools, and in the search for better ones.

Feminist explanations of sexism and accounts of sexist practices also raise issues that are within the domain of traditional philosophical inquiry. For example, in thinking about care, feminists have asked questions about the nature of the self; in thinking about gender, feminists have asked what the relationship is between the natural and the social; in thinking about sexism in science, feminists have asked what should count as knowledge. In some such cases, mainstream philosophical accounts provide useful tools; in other cases, alternative proposals have seemed more promising.

In the sub-entries included under “feminism (topics)” in the Table of Contents to this Encyclopedia, authors survey some of the recent feminist work on a topic, highlighting the issues that are of particular relevance to philosophy. These entries are:

See also the entries in the Related Entries section below.


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Other Internet Resources

Resources listed below have been chosen to provide only a springboard into the huge amount of feminist material available on the web. The emphasis here is on general resources useful for doing research in feminist philosophy or interdisciplinary feminist theory, e.g., the links connect to bibliographies and meta-sites, and resources concerning inclusion, exclusion, and feminist diversity. The list is incomplete and will be regularly revised and expanded. Further resources on topics in feminism such as popular culture, reproductive rights, sex work, are available within each sub-entry on that topic.



“Waves” of Feminism

Feminism and Class

Marxist, Socialist, and Materialist Feminisms

Feminist Economics

Women and Labor

Feminism and Disability

Feminism, Human Rights, Global Feminism, and Human Trafficking

Feminism and Race/Ethnicity

General Resources

African-American/Black Feminisms and Womanism

Asian-American and Asian Feminisms

Chicana/Latina Feminisms

American Indian, Native, Indigenous Feminisms

Feminism, Sex, Sexuality, Transgender, and Intersex


Over many revisions, thanks go to Ann Garry, Heidi Grasswick, Elizabeth Harman, Elizabeth Hackett, Serene Khader, Ishani Maitra, Ásta Sveinsdóttir, Leslee Mahoney, and Anita Superson.

Copyright © 2023 by
Noëlle McAfee <noelle.c.mcafee@emory.edu>
Ann Garry
Anita Superson
Heidi Grasswick
Serene Khader

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