The notion of transworld identity—‘identity across possible worlds’—is the notion that the same object exists in more than one possible world (with the actual world treated as one of the possible worlds). It therefore has its home in a ‘possible-worlds’ framework for analysing, or at least paraphrasing, statements about what is possible or necessary.
The subject of transworld identity has been highly contentious, even among philosophers who accept the legitimacy of talk of possible worlds. Opinions range from the view that the notion of an identity that holds between objects in distinct possible worlds is so problematic as to be unacceptable, to the view that the notion is utterly innocuous, and no more problematic than the uncontroversial claim that individuals could have existed with somewhat different properties. Matters are complicated by the fact that an important rival to ‘transworld identity’ has been proposed: David Lewis’s counterpart theory, which replaces the claim that an individual exists in more than one possible world with the claim that although each individual exists in one world only, it has counterparts in other worlds, where the counterpart relation (based on similarity) does not have the logic of identity. Thus much discussion in this area has concerned the comparative merits of the transworld identity and counterpart-theoretic accounts as interpretations, within a possible-worlds framework, of statements of what is possible and necessary for particular individuals. (Similar issues arise concerning the transworld identity of properties.)
- 1. What is transworld identity?
- 2. Transworld identity and Leibniz’s Law
- 3. Is ‘the problem of transworld identity’ a pseudo-problem?
- 4. Individual essences and bare identities
- 5. Transworld identity and the transitivity of identity
- 6. Concluding remarks
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Suppose that, in accordance with the possible-worlds framework for characterizing modal statements (statements about what is possible or necessary, about what might or could have been the case, what could not have been otherwise, and so on), we treat the general statement that there might have been purple cows as equivalent to the statement that there is some possible world in which there are purple cows, and the general statement that there could not have been round squares (i.e., that it is necessary that there are none) as equivalent to the statement that there is no possible world in which there are round squares.
How are we to extend this framework to statements about what is possible and necessary for particular individuals—what are known as de re modal statements (‘de re’ meaning ‘about a thing’)—for example, that Clover, a particular (actually existing) four-legged cow, could not have been a giraffe, or that she could have had just three legs? A natural extension of the framework is to treat the first statement as equivalent to the claim that there is no possible world in which Clover is a giraffe, and the second as equivalent to the claim that there is some possible world in which Clover is three-legged. But this last claim appears to imply that there is some possible world in which Clover exists and has three legs—from which it seems inescapably to follow that one and the same individual—Clover—exists in some merely possible world as well as in the actual world: that there is an identity between Clover and some individual in another possible world. Similarly, it appears that the de re modal statements ‘George Eliot could have been a scientist rather than a novelist’ and ‘Bertrand Russell might have been a playwright instead of a philosopher’ will come out as ‘There is some possible world in which George Eliot (exists and) is a scientist rather than a novelist’ and ‘There is some possible world in which Bertrand Russell (exists and) is a playwright and not a philosopher’. Again, each of these appears to involve a commitment to an identity between an individual who exists in the actual world (Eliot, Russell) and an individual who exists in a non-actual possible world.
To recapitulate: the natural extension of the possible-worlds interpretation to de re modal statements involves a commitment to the view that some individuals exist in more than one possible world, and thus to what is known as ‘identity across possible worlds’, or (for short) ‘transworld identity’. (It is questionable whether the shorthand is really apt. One would expect a ‘transworld’ identity to mean an identity that holds across (and hence within) one world, not an identity that holds between objects in distinct worlds. (As David Lewis (1986) has pointed out, our own Trans World Airlines is an intercontinental, not an interplanetary, carrier.) Nevertheless, the term ‘transworld identity’ is far too well established for it to be sensible to try to introduce an alternative, although ‘interworld identity’ or even ‘transmodal identity’ would in some ways be more appropriate.) But is this commitment acceptable?
To say that there is a transworld identity between A and B is to say that there is some possible world w1, and some distinct possible world w2, such that A exists in w1, and B exists in w2, and A is identical with B. (Remember that we are treating the actual world as one of the possible worlds.) In other words, to say that there is a transworld identity is to say that the same object exists in distinct possible worlds, or (more simply) that some object exists in more than one possible world.
But what does it mean to say that an individual exists in a merely possible world? And—even if we accept that paraphrases of modal statements in terms of possible worlds are in general acceptable—does it even make sense to say that actual individuals (like you and your neighbour’s cat and the Eiffel Tower) exist in possible worlds other than the actual world? To know what a claim of transworld identity amounts to, and whether such claims are acceptable, we need to know what a possible world is, and what it is for an individual to exist in one.
Among those who take possible worlds seriously (that is, those who think that there are possible worlds, on some appropriate interpretation of the notion), there is a variety of conceptions of their nature. On one account, that of David Lewis, a non-actual possible world is something like another universe, isolated in space and time from our own, but containing objects that are just as real as the entities of our world; including its own real concrete objects such as people, tables, cows, trees, and rivers (but also, perhaps, real concrete unicorns, hobbits, and centaurs). According to Lewis, there is no objective difference in status between what we call ‘the actual world’ and what we call ‘merely possible worlds’. We call our world ‘actual’ simply because we are in it; the inhabitants of another world may, with equal right, call their world ‘actual’. In other words, according to Lewis, ‘actual’ in ‘the actual world’ is an indexical term (like ‘here’ or ‘now’), not an indicator of a special ontological status (Lewis 1973, 84–91; Lewis 1986, Ch. 1).
On Lewis’s ‘extreme realist’ account of possible worlds, it looks as if, for Clover to exist in another possible world as well as the actual world would be for her to be a part of such a world: Clover would somehow have to exist as a (concrete) part of two worlds, ‘in the same way that a shared hand might be a common part of two Siamese twins’ (Lewis 1986, 198). But this is problematic. Clover actually has four legs, but could have had three legs. Should we infer that Clover is a part of some world at which she has only three legs? If so, then how many legs does Clover have: four (since she actually has four legs), or seven (since she has four in our world and three in the alternative world)? Worse still, we appear to be ascribing contradictory properties to Clover: she has four legs, and yet has no more than three.
Those who believe in the ‘extreme realist’ notion of possible worlds may respond by thinking of Clover as having a four-legged part in our world, and a three-legged part at some other world. This is Yagisawa’s (2010) view (cf. Lewis 1986, 210–220). Yagisawa thinks of concrete entities—everyday things such as cats, trees and macbooks—as extended across possible worlds (as well as across times and places), in virtue of having stages (or parts) which exist at those worlds (and times and places). Ordinary entities thus comprise spatial, temporal and modal stages, all of which are equally real. Metaphysically, modal stages (and the worlds at which they exist) are on a par with temporal and spatial stages (and the times and places at which they exist). (This view is the modal analogue of the ‘perdurance’ account of identity over time, according to which an object persists through time by having ‘temporal parts’ that are located at different times.) Thus, when we say that Clover has four legs in our world but only three in some other world, we are saying that she has a four-legged modal stage and a distinct three-legged modal stage. Clover herself is neither four-legged nor three-legged. (However, there is a sense in which Clover herself—the entity comprising many modal stages—has awfully many legs, even though she actually has only four.)
Another option for the ‘extreme realist’ about possible worlds is to hold that Clover is four-legged relative to our world, but three-legged relative to some other world. In general, qualities we would normally think of as monadic properties are in fact relations to worlds. McDaniel (2004) defends a view along these lines. A feature of this account is that one and the same entity may exist according to many worlds, for that entity may bear the exists-at relation to more than one world. Accordingly, the view is sometimes called genuine modal realism with overlap (McDaniel 2004). This view, transposed to the temporal case, is precisely what the endurantist says: objects do not have temporal parts; each object is wholly present at each time. (See the separate entry on Temporal Parts.)
Lewis rejects both of these options. He rejects the overlap view because of what he calls ‘the problem of accidental intrinsics’. On the overlap view, having four legs is a relation to a world, and hence not one of Clover’s intrinsic properties. In fact, any aspect of a particular that changes across worlds turns out to be non-intrinsic to that particular. As a consequence, every particular has all its intrinsic properties essentially, which Lewis thinks is unacceptable (1986, 199–209).
Lewis himself combines his brand of realism about possible worlds with a denial of transworld identities. According to Lewis, instead of saying that George Eliot (in whole or in part) inhabits more than one world, we should say that she inhabits one world only (ours), but has counterparts in other worlds. And it is the existence of counterparts of George Eliot who go in for a career in science rather than novel writing that makes it true that she could have been a scientist rather than a novelist (Lewis 1973, 39–43; 1968; 1986, Ch. 4).
However, Lewis’s version of realism is by no means the only conception of possible worlds. According to an influential set of rival accounts, possible worlds, although real entities, are not concrete ‘other universes’, as in Lewis’s theory, but abstract objects such as (maximal) possible states of affairs or ‘ways the world might have been’. (See Plantinga 1974; Stalnaker 1976; van Inwagen 1985; Divers 2002; Melia 2003; Stalnaker 1995; also the separate entry on Possible Worlds. A state of affairs S is ‘maximal’ just in case, for any state of affairs S*, either it is impossible for both S and S* to obtain, or it is impossible for S to obtain without S*: the point of the restriction to the maximal is just that a possible world should be a possible state of affairs that is, in a relevant sense, complete.)
On the face of it, to treat possible worlds as abstract entities may seem only to make the problem of transworld identity worse. If it is hard to believe that you (or a table or a cat) could be part of another Lewisian possible world, it seems yet harder to believe that a concrete entity like you (or the table or cat) could be part of an abstract entity. However, those who think that possible worlds are abstract entities typically do not take the existence in a merely possible world of a concrete actual individual to involve that entity’s being literally a part of such an abstract thing. Rather, such a theorist will propose a different interpretation of ‘existence in’ such a world. For example, according to Plantinga’s (1973, 1974) version of this account, to say that George Eliot exists in some possible world in which she is a scientist is just to say that there is a (maximal) possible state of affairs such that, had it obtained (i.e., had it been actual), George Eliot would (still) have existed, but would have been a scientist. On this (deflationary) account of existence in a possible world, it appears that the difficulties that accompany the idea that George Eliot leads a double life as an element of another concrete universe as well as our own (or the idea that she is partially present in many such universes) are entirely avoided. On Plantinga’s account, to claim that an actual object exists in another possible world with somewhat different properties amounts to nothing more risqué than the claim that the object could have had somewhat different properties: something that few will deny. (Note that according to this account, if the actual world is to be one of the possible worlds, then the actual world must be an abstract entity. So, for example, if a merely possible world is ‘a way the world might have been’, the actual world will be ‘the way the world is’; if a merely possible world is a maximal possible state of affairs that is not instantiated, then the actual world will be a maximal possible state of affairs that is instantiated. It follows that we must distinguish the actual world qua abstract entity from ‘the actual world’ in the sense of the collection of spatiotemporally linked entities including you and your surroundings that constitutes ‘the universe’ or ‘the cosmos’. The sense in which you exist in this concrete universe (by being part of it) must be different from the sense in which you exist in the abstract state of affairs that is in fact instantiated (cf. Stalnaker 1976; van Inwagen 1985, note 3; Kripke 1980, 19–20).)
The discussion so far may suggest that whether the notion of transworld identity (that an object exists in more than one world) is problematic depends solely on whether one adopts an account of possible worlds as concrete entities such as Lewis’s (in which case it is) or an account of possible worlds as abstract entities such as Plantinga’s (in which case it is not). However, matters are not so simple, for a variety of reasons (to be discussed in Sections 3–5 below).
There may seem to be an obvious objection to the employment of transworld identity to interpret or paraphrase statements such as ‘Bertrand Russell could have been a playwright’ or ‘George Eliot might have been a scientist’. A fundamental principle about (numerical) identity is Leibniz’s Law: the principle that if A is identical with B, then any property of A is a property of B, and vice versa. In other words, according to Leibniz’s Law, identity requires the sharing of all properties; thus any difference between the properties of A and B is sufficient to show that A and B are numerically distinct. (The principle here referred to as ‘Leibniz’s Law’ is also known as the Indiscernibility of Identicals. It must be distinguished from another (more controversial) Leibnizian principle, the Identity of Indiscernibles, which says that if A and B share all their properties then A is identical with B.) However, the whole point of asserting a transworld identity is to represent the fact that an individual could have had somewhat different properties from its actual properties. Yet does not (for example) the claim that a philosopher in the actual world is identical with a non-philosopher in some other possible world conflict with Leibniz’s Law?
It is generally agreed that this objection can be answered, and the appearance of conflict with Leibniz’s Law eliminated. We can note that the objection, if sound, would apparently prove too much, since a parallel objection would imply that there can be no such thing as genuine (numerical) identity through change of properties over time. But it is generally accepted that no correct interpretation of Leibniz’s Law should rule this out. For example, Bertrand Russell was thrice married when he received the Nobel Prize for Literature; the one-year-old Bertrand Russell was, of course, unmarried; does Leibniz’s Law force us to deny the identity of the prize-winning adult with the infant, on the grounds that they differ in their properties? No, for it seems that the appearance of conflict with Leibniz’s Law can be dispelled, most obviously by saying that the infant and the adult share the properties of being married in 1950 and being unmarried in 1873, but alternatively by the proposal that the correct interpretation of Leibniz’s Law is that the identity of A and B requires that there be no time such that A and B have different properties at that time (cf. Loux 1979, 42–43; also Chisholm 1967). However, it seems that exactly similar moves are available in the modal case to accommodate ‘change’ of properties across possible worlds. Either we may claim that the actual Bertrand Russell and the playwright in some possible world (say, w2) are alike in possessing the properties of being a philosopher in the actual world and being a non-philosopher in w2, or we may argue that Leibniz’s Law, properly interpreted, asserts that the identity of A and B requires that there be no time, and no possible world, such that A and B have different properties at that time and world. The moral appears to be that transworld identity claims (combined with the view that some of an individual’s properties could have been different) need no more be threatened by Leibniz’s Law than is the view that there can be identity over time combined with change of properties (Loux 1979, 42–43).
It should be mentioned, however, that David Lewis has argued that the reconciliation of identity through change over time with Leibniz’s Law suggested above is oversimplified, and gives rise to a ‘problem of temporary intrinsics’ that can be solved only by treating a persisting thing that changes over time as composed of temporal parts that do not change their intrinsic properties. (See Lewis 1986, 202–204, and for discussion and further references, Hawley 2001; Sider 2001; Lowe 2002; Haslanger 2003.) In addition, it is partly because Lewis regards the analogous account of transworld identity in terms of modal parts as an unacceptable solution to an analogous ‘problem of accidental intrinsics’ that Lewis rejects transworld identity in favour of counterpart theory (Lewis 1986, 199–220; cf. Section 1.2 above).
In the discussion of transworld identity in the 1960s and 1970s (when the issue came to prominence as a result of developments in modal logic), it was debated whether the notion of transworld identity is genuinely problematic, or whether, on the contrary, the alleged ‘problem of transworld identity’ is merely a pseudo-problem. (See Loux 1979, Introduction, Section III; Plantinga 1973 and 1974, Ch. 6; Kripke 1980 (cf. Kripke 1972); Kaplan 1967/1979; Kaplan 1975; Chisholm 1967; for further discussion see, for example, Divers 2002, Ch. 16; Hughes 2004, Ch. 3; van Inwagen 1985; Lewis 1986, Ch. 4.)
It is difficult to pin down the alleged problem that is supposed to be at the heart of this dispute. In particular, although the main proponents of the view that the alleged problem is a pseudo-problem clearly intended to attack (inter alia) Lewis’s version of modal realism, they did not attempt to rebut the thesis (discussed in Section 1.2 above) that if one is a Lewisian realist about possible worlds, then one should find transworld identity problematic. Matters are complicated by the fact that proponents of the view that the alleged problem of transworld identity is a pseudo-problem were to some extent responding to hypothetical arguments, rather than arguments presented in print by opponents (see Plantinga 1974, 93). However, one central issue was whether the claim that an individual exists in more than one possible world (and hence that there are cases of transworld identity) needs to be backed by the provision of criteria of transworld identity, and, if so, why.
The term ‘criterion of identity’ is ambiguous. In an epistemological sense, a criterion of identity is a way of telling whether an identity statement is true, or a way of recognizing whether an individual A is identical with an individual B. However, the notion of a criterion of identity also has a metaphysical interpretation, according to which it is a set of (non-trivial) necessary and sufficient conditions for the truth of an identity statement. Although a criterion of identity in the second (metaphysical) sense might supply us with a criterion of identity in the first (epistemological) sense, it seems that something could be a criterion of identity in the second sense even if it is unsuited to play the role of a criterion of identity in the first sense.
The most influential arguments against the view that there is a genuine problem of transworld identity (or ‘problem of transworld identification’, to use Kripke’s preferred terminology) are probably those presented by Plantinga (1973, 1974) and Kripke (1980). Plantinga and Kripke appear to have, as their target, an alleged problem of transworld identity that rests on one of three assumptions. The first assumption is that we must possess criteria of transworld identity in order to ascertain, on the basis of their properties in other possible worlds, the identities of (perhaps radically disguised) individuals in those worlds. The second assumption is that we must possess criteria of transworld identity if our references to individuals in other possible worlds are not to miss their mark. The third assumption is that we must possess criteria of transworld identity in order to understand transworld identity claims. Anyone who makes one of these assumptions is likely to think that there is a problem of transworld identity—a problem concerning our entitlement to make claims that imply that an individual exists in more than one possible world. For it does not seem that we possess criteria of transworld identity that could fulfil any of these three roles. However, Plantinga and Kripke provide reasons for thinking that none of these three assumptions survives scrutiny. If so, and if these assumptions exhaust the grounds for supposing that there is a problem of transworld identity, the alleged problem may be dismissed as a pseudo-problem.
The three assumptions may be illustrated, using our examples of George Eliot and Bertrand Russell, as follows. (The examples are alternated simply for the sake of a little variety.)
- The ‘epistemological’ assumption: We must possess a criterion of transworld identity for George Eliot in order to be able to tell, on the basis of knowledge of the properties that an individual has in some other possible world, whether that individual is identical with Eliot.
- The ‘security of reference’ assumption: We must possess a criterion of transworld identity for Bertrand Russell in order to know that, when we say such things as ‘There is a possible world in which Russell is a playwright’, we are talking about Russell rather than someone else.
- The ‘intelligibility’ assumption: We must possess a criterion of transworld identity for George Eliot in order to understand the claim that there is a possible world in which she is a scientist.
The epistemological assumption appears to imply that the point of our having a criterion of transworld identity for George Eliot would be that we could then employ the criterion in order to ascertain which individual in a possible world is Eliot; if, on the other hand, we do not possess such a criterion, we shall be unable to pick her out or identify her in other possible worlds (Plantinga 1973; 1974, Ch. 6; Kripke 1980, 42–53; cf. Loux 1979, Introduction; Kaplan 1967/1979). However, this suggestion, as stated, is vulnerable to the charge that it is the product of confusion. For how could we use a criterion of identity in the way envisaged? We must dismiss as fanciful the idea that if we had a criterion of transworld identity for George Eliot, we could use it to tell, by empirical inspection of the properties of individuals in other possible worlds (perhaps using a powerful telescope (Kripke 1980, 44) or ‘Jules Verne-o-scope’ (Kaplan 1967/1979, 93; Plantinga 1974, 94)), which, if any, of those individuals is Eliot. For no one (including an extreme realist like Lewis) thinks that our epistemological access to other possible worlds is of this kind. (According to Lewis, other possible worlds are causally isolated from our own, and hence beyond the reach of our telescopes or any other perceptual devices.) But once we face up to the fact that a criterion of transworld identity (if we had one) could have no such empirical use, the argument based on the epistemological assumption appears to collapse. It is tempting to suggest that the argument is the product of the (perhaps surreptitious) influence of a misleading picture of our epistemological access to other possible worlds. As Kripke writes (using President Nixon as his example):
One thinks, in this [mistaken] picture, of a possible world as if it were like a foreign country. One looks upon it as an observer. Maybe Nixon has moved to the other country and maybe he hasn’t, but one is given only qualities. One can observe all his qualities, but, of course, one doesn’t observe that someone is Nixon. One observes that something has red hair (or green or yellow) but not whether something is Nixon. So we had better have a way of telling in terms of properties when we run into the same thing as we saw before; we had better have a way of telling, when we come across one of these other possible worlds, who was Nixon. (1980, 43)
(It is possible, though, that in this passage Kripke’s principal target is not a mistaken conception of our epistemological access to other possible worlds, but what he takes to be a mistaken (‘foreign country’) conception of their nature: a conception that (when divorced from the fanciful epistemology) would be entirely appropriate for a Lewisian realist about worlds.)
It might be suggested that the point of a criterion of transworld identity is that its possession would enable me to tell which individual I am referring to when I say (for example) ‘There is a possible world in which Russell is a playwright’. Suppose that I am asked: ‘How do you know that the individual you are talking about—this playwright in another possible world—is Bertrand Russell rather than, say, G. E. Moore, or Marlene Dietrich, or perhaps someone who is also a playwright in the actual world, such as Tennessee Williams or Aphra Behn? Don’t you need to be able to supply a criterion of transworld identity in order to secure your reference to Russell?’ (Cf. Plantinga 1974, 94–97; Kripke 1980, 44–47.) It seems clear that the right answer to this question is ‘no’. As Kripke has insisted, it seems spurious to suggest that the question how we know which individual we are referring to when we make such a claim can be answered only by invoking a criterion of transworld identity. For it seems that we can simply stipulate that the individual in question is Bertrand Russell (Kripke 1980, 44).
Similarly, perhaps, if I say that there is some past time at which Angela Merkel is a baby, and am asked ‘How do you know that it’s the infant Angela Merkel that you are talking about, rather than some other infant?’, an apparently adequate reply is that I am stipulating that the past state of affairs I am talking about is one that concerns Merkel (and not some other individual). It seems that I can adequately answer the parallel question in the modal case by saying that I am stipulating that, when I say that there is some possible world in which Russell is a playwright, the relevant individual in the possible world (if there is one) is Russell (and not some other potential or actual playwright).
A third job for a criterion of transworld identity might be this: in order to understand the claim that there is some possible world in which George Eliot is a scientist, perhaps we must be able to give an informative answer to the question ‘What would it take for a scientist in another possible world to be identical with Eliot?’ Again, however, it can be argued that this demand is illegitimate, at least if what is demanded is that one be able to specify a set of properties whose possession, in another possible world, by an individual in that world, is non-trivially necessary and sufficient for being George Eliot (cf. Plantinga 1973; Plantinga 1974, 94–97; van Inwagen 1985).
For one thing, we may point to the fact that it is doubtful that, in order to understand the claim that there is some past time at which Angela Merkel is a baby, we have to be able to answer the question ‘What does it take for an infant at some past time to be identical with Merkel?’ in any informative way. Secondly, it may be proposed that in order to understand the claim that there is some possible world in which George Eliot is a scientist, we can rely on our prior understanding of the claim that she might have been a scientist (cf. Kripke 1980, 48, note 15; van Inwagen 1985).
However, even if all three of these assumptions can be dismissed as bad, or at least inadequate, reasons for supposing that transworld identity requires criteria of transworld identity (and hence for supposing that there is a problem of transworld identity), it does not follow that there are no good reasons for this supposition. In particular, even if the three assumptions are discredited, a fourth claim may survive:
- There must be a criterion of transworld identity for Russell (in the sense of a set of properties whose possession by an object in any possible world is non-trivially necessary and sufficient for being Russell) if the claim that there is a possible world in which Russell is a playwright is to be true. (Such a set of properties would be what is called a non-trivial individual essence of Russell, where an individual essence of an individual A is a property, or set of properties, whose possession by an individual in any possible world is both necessary and sufficient for identity with A.)
That this possibility is left open by the arguments so far considered is suggested by at least two points. The first concerns the analogy drawn above between transworld identity and identity through time. Even if we can understand the claim that there is some past time at which Angela Merkel is a baby without being able to specify informative (non-trivial) necessary and sufficient conditions for the identity of the adult Angela Merkel with some previously existing infant, it does not follow that there are no such necessary and sufficient conditions. And many philosophers have supposed that there are such conditions for personal identity over time. Secondly, the fact that one may be able to ensure, by stipulation, that one is talking about a possible world in which Bertrand Russell (and not someone else) is a playwright (if there is such a world) does not imply that, when making this stipulation, one is not implicitly stipulating that this individual satisfies, in that world, conditions non-trivially necessary and sufficient for being Russell, even if one is not in a position to say what these conditions are.
This second point is an extension of the observation that, if (as most philosophers believe) Bertrand Russell has some essential properties (properties that he has in all possible worlds in which he exists), to stipulate that one is talking about a possible world in which Russell is a playwright is, at least implicitly, to stipulate that the possible world is one in which someone with Russell’s essential properties is a playwright. For example, according to Kripke’s ‘necessity of origin’ thesis, human beings have their parents essentially (Kripke 1980). If this is correct, then, when we say ‘There is a possible world in which Russell is a playwright’, it seems that, if our stipulation is to be coherent, we must be at least implicitly stipulating that the possible world is one in which someone with Russell’s actual parents is a playwright, even if the identity of Russell’s parents is unknown to us, and even though we are (obviously) in no position to conduct an empirical investigation into the ancestry, in the possible world, of the individuals who exist there. Thus, it seems, even if Kripke is right in insisting that we need not be able to specify non-trivial necessary and sufficient conditions for being Russell in another possible world if we are legitimately to claim that there are possible worlds in which he is a playwright, it might nevertheless be the case that there are such necessary and sufficient conditions (cf. Kripke 1980, 46–47 and 18, note 17; Lewis 1986, 222).
But what positive reasons are there for holding that transworld identities require non-trivial necessary and sufficient conditions (non-trivial individual essences), if arguments that are based on the epistemological, security of reference, and intelligibility assumptions are abandoned? (Similar issues arise for the transworld identities of properties, discussed in the supplement on transworld identity of properties.)
The principal argument for this view—that transworld identities require non-trivial individual essences—is that such essences are needed in order to avoid what have been called ‘bare identities’ across possible worlds. And some regard bare identities as too high a price to pay for the characterization of de re modal statements in terms of transworld identity. If they are right, and if (as many philosophers believe) there are no plausible candidates for non-trivial individual essences (at least for such things as people, cats, trees, and tables) there is, indeed, a serious problem about transworld identity. (The expression ‘bare identities’ is taken from Forbes 1985. The notion, as used here, is approximately the same as the notion of ‘primitive thisness’ employed by Adams (1979), although Adams’s notion is that of an identity that does not supervene on qualitative facts, rather than an identity that does not supervene on any other facts at all.)
Suppose that we combine transworld identity with the claim (without which the introduction of transworld identity seems pointless) that a transworld identity can hold between A in w1 and B in w2 even though the properties that B has in w2 are somewhat different from the properties that A has in w1 (or, to put it more simply, suppose that we combine the claim that there are transworld identities with the claim that not all of a thing’s properties are essential to it). Then, it can be argued, unless there are non-trivial individual essences, we are in danger of having to admit the existence of possible worlds that differ from one another only in the identities of some of the individuals that they contain.
One such argument, adapted from Chisholm 1967, goes as follows. Taking Adam and Noah in the actual world as our examples (and pretending, for the sake of the example, that the biblical characters are real people), then, on the plausible assumption that not all of their properties are essential to them, it seems that there is a possible world in which Adam is a little more like the actual Noah than he actually was, and Noah a little more like the actual Adam than he actually was. But if there is such a world, then it seems that there should be a further world in which Adam is yet more like the actual Noah, and Noah yet more like the actual Adam. Proceeding in this way, it looks as if we may arrive ultimately at a possible world that is exactly like the actual world, except that Adam and Noah have ‘switched roles’ (plus any further differences that follow logically from this, such as the fact that in the ‘role-switching’ world Eve is the consort of a man who plays the Adam role, but is in fact Noah). But if this can happen with Adam and Noah, then it seems that it could happen with any two actual individuals. For example, it looks as if there will be a possible world that is a duplicate of the actual world except for the fact that in this world you play the role that Queen Victoria plays in the actual world, and she plays the role that you play in the actual world (cf. Chisholm 1967, p. 83 in 1979). But this may seem intolerable. Is it really the case that Queen Victoria could have had all your actual properties (except for identity with you) while you had all of hers (except for identity with her)?
However, if one thinks that such conclusions are intolerable, how are they to be avoided? The obvious answer is that what is needed, in the Adam-Noah case, is that the roles played by Adam and Noah in the actual world include some properties that are essential to their bearers’ being Adam and Noah respectively: that Adam and Noah differ non-trivially in their essential properties as well as in their accidental properties: more precisely, that Adam has some essential property that Noah essentially lacks, or vice versa. For if ‘the Adam role’ includes some property that Noah essentially lacks, then, of course, there is no possible world in which Noah has that property, in which case the Adam role (in all its detail) is not a possible role for Noah, and the danger of a role-switching world such as the one described above is avoided.
The supposition that Adam and Noah differ in their essential properties in this way, although sufficient to block the generation of this example of a role-switching world, does not by itself imply that each of Adam and Noah has an individual essence: a set of essential properties whose possession is (not only necessary but also) sufficient for being Adam or Noah. Suppose that Adam has, as one of his essential properties, living in the Garden of Eden, whereas Noah essentially lacks this property. This will block the possibility of Noah’s playing the Adam role, although it does not, by itself, imply that nothing other than Adam could play that role. However, when we reflect on the potential generality of the argument, it appears that, if we are to block all cases of role-switching concerning actual individuals, we must suppose that every actual individual has some essential property (or set of essential properties) that every other actual individual essentially lacks. For example, to block all cases of role-switching concerning Adam and other actual individuals, there must be some component of ‘the Adam role’ that is not only essential to being Adam, but also cannot be played, in any possible world, by any actual individual other than Adam.
Even if we suppose that all actual individuals are distinguished from one another by such ‘distinctive’ essential properties, this still does not, strictly speaking, imply that they have individual essences. For example, it does not rule out the existence of a possible world that is exactly like the actual world except that, in this possible world, the Adam role is played, not by Adam, but by some merely possible individual (distinct from all actual individuals). However, if we find intolerable the idea that there are such possible worlds—worlds that, like the role-switching world, differ from the actual world only in the identities of some of the individuals that they contain—then, it seems, we must suppose that individuals like Adam (and Noah and you) have (non-trivial) individual essences, where an individual essence of Adam is (by definition) some property (or set of properties) that is both essential to being Adam and also such that it is not possessed, in any possible world, by any individual other than Adam—i.e., an essential property (or set of properties) that guarantees that its possessor is Adam and no one else.
Chisholm (1967) arrives at his role-switching world by a series of steps. Thus his argument appears to rely on the combination of the transitivity of identity (across possible worlds) with the assumption that a succession of small changes can add up to a big change. And ‘Chisholm’s Paradox’ (as it is called) is sometimes regarded as relying crucially on these assumptions, suggesting that it has the form of a sorites paradox (the type of paradox that generates, from apparently impeccable assumptions, such absurd conclusions as that a man with a million hairs on his head is bald). (See, for example, Forbes 1985, Ch. 7.)
However, there are versions of the role-switching argument that do not rely on the cumulative effect of a series of small changes. Suppose we assume that Adam and Noah do not differ from one another in their essential properties; in other words, that all the differences between them are accidental (i.e., contingent) differences. It seems immediately to follow that any way that Adam could have been is a way that Noah could have been, and vice versa. But one way that Adam could have been is the way Adam actually is, and one way that Noah could have been is the way Noah actually is. So (if Adam and Noah do not differ in their essential properties) it seems that there is a possible world in which Adam plays the Noah role, and a possible world in which Noah plays the Adam role. But there is no obvious reason why a world in which Adam plays the Noah role and a world in which Noah plays the Adam role shouldn’t be the very same world. And in that case there is a possible world in which Adam and Noah have swapped their roles. This argument for the generation of a role-switching world does not rely on a series of small changes: all that it requires is the assumption that there is no essential difference between Noah and Adam: or, to put it another way, that any essential property of Noah is also an essential property of Adam, and vice versa. (See Mackie 2006, Ch. 2; also Adams 1979; cf. Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri 2021.)
Another type of argument for the conclusion that unless things have non-trivial individual essences there will be ‘bare’ transworld identities: identities that do not supervene on (are not grounded in) other facts, is presented by Graeme Forbes. (Strictly speaking, Forbes is concerned to avoid identities that are not grounded in what he calls ‘intrinsic’ properties.) A sketch of a type of argument used by Forbes is this. (What follows is based on Forbes 1985, Ch. 6; see also Mackie 2006, Ch. 3.) Suppose (as is surely plausible) that an actually existing oak tree could have been different in some respects from the way that it is; suppose also that, even if it has some essential properties (perhaps it is essentially an oak tree, for example), it has no non-trivial individual essence consisting in some set of its intrinsic properties. Then there is the danger that there may be three possible worlds (call them ‘w2’, ‘w3’, and ‘w4’), where in w2 there is an oak tree that is identical with the original tree (w2 representing one way in which the tree could have been different), and in w3 there is an oak tree that is identical with the original tree (w3 representing another way in which the tree could have been different), and in w4 there are two oak trees, one of which is an intrinsic duplicate of the tree as it is in w2, and the other an intrinsic duplicate of the tree as it is in w3. If all of w2, w3, and w4 are possible, then, given that at least one of the trees in w4 is not identical with the original tree (since two things cannot be identical with one thing) there are instances of transworld identity (and transworld distinctness) concerning a tree in one possible world and a tree in another that are not grounded in (do not supervene on) the intrinsic features that those trees possess in those possible worlds. For example, suppose that, of the two trees in w4, the intrinsic duplicate of the w2 tree is not identical with the original tree. Then, obviously, the distinctness (non-identity) between this w4 tree and the tree in w2 is not grounded in the intrinsic features that the trees have in w2 and w4—and nor is the identity between the tree in w2 and the original tree grounded in the intrinsic features that the tree has in w2 and in the actual world.
Forbes argues that, in order to avoid this (and similar) consequences, we should suppose that (contrary to the second assumption used in setting up the ‘reduplication argument’ sketched above) the oak tree does have a non-trivial individual essence consisting in some of its intrinsic properties, and his favoured candidate for its essence is one that includes the tree’s coming from the particular acorn from which it actually originated. If the tree does have such an ‘intrinsic’ individual essence, then, if w2 and w3 are both possible, each of them must contain a tree that has (in that world) intrinsic properties that are guaranteed to be sufficient for identity with the original tree, in which case (as a matter of logic) there can be no world such as w4 that contains intrinsic duplicates of both of them. (See Forbes 1985, Ch. 6, and, for discussion, Mackie 1987; Mackie 2006; Robertson 1998; Yablo 1988; Chihara 1998; Della Rocca 1996; further discussions by Forbes include his 1986, 1994, and 2002.)
Finally, it is obvious that the structure of Forbes’s argument has nothing to do with the fact that the chosen example is a tree. Forbes’s ‘reduplication argument’ therefore appears to pose a general problem for the characterization of de re modal statements about individuals in terms of transworld identity: either we must admit that their transworld identities can be ‘bare’, or we must find non-trivial individual essences, based on their intrinsic properties, that can ground their identities across possible worlds.
So far it has been assumed that (non-trivial) necessary and sufficient conditions for transworld identity with a given object would involve the possession, by that object, of an individual essence: a set of properties that it carries with it in every possible world in which it exists. But one might wonder why we should make this assumption. Those who believe that there are (non-trivial) necessary and sufficient conditions for identity over time need not, and almost universally do not, believe that these conditions consist in the possession, by an object, of some ‘omnitemporal core’ (to use a phrase suggested by Harold Noonan) that it has at every time in its existence. So why should things be different in the modal case?
The obvious answer seems to be this. In the case of identity over time, we can appeal to relations (other than mere similarity) between the states of an individual at different times in its existence. For example, it looks as if we can say that the adult Russell is identical with the infant Russell in virtue of the existence of certain spatiotemporal and causal continuities between his infant state in 1873 and his adult state in (say) 1950 that are characteristic of the continued existence of a human being. But no such relations of continuity are available to ground identities across possible worlds (cf. Quine 1976).
However, on reflection, it may seem that this is too swift. If we suppose that any possible history for Russell is a possible spatiotemporal and causal extension of the state that he was actually in at some time in his existence, then perhaps we may appeal to the same continuities that ground his identity over time in the actual world in order to ground his identity across possible worlds (cf. Brody 1980, 114–115; 121). For example, perhaps to say that Russell could have been a playwright is to say that there was some time in his actual existence at which he could have become a playwright. If so, then perhaps we can hold that for a playwright in a possible world to be identical with Russell is for that playwright to have, in that world, a life that is, at some early stage, exactly the same as Russell’s actual life at some early stage, but which develops from that point, in the spatiotemporally and causally continuous fashion that is characteristic of the continued existence of a human being, into the career of a playwright rather than that of a philosopher. However, although such a conception may seem initially attractive, it runs into difficulties if it is intended to provide conditions that are genuinely both necessary and sufficient for the identity of individuals across possible worlds. These difficulties include the fact that it seems too much to demand that Russell have exactly the same early history (or origin) as his actual early history (or origin) in every possible world in which he exists. Yet if Russell’s early history could have been different in certain respects, we face the question: ‘In virtue of what is an individual in another possible world with a slightly different early history from Russell’s actual early history identical with Russell?’—a question of precisely the type that the provision of necessary and sufficient conditions for transworld identity was intended to answer. (For discussion of this ‘branching’ conception of possibilities, and its implications for questions of transworld identity and essential properties, see Brody 1980, Ch. 5; Mackie 1998; Mackie 2006, Chs 6–7; Coburn 1986, Section VI; McGinn 1976; Mackie 1974; Prior 1960.)
The fact that, in the absence of non-trivial individual essences, a transworld identity characterization of de re modal statements appears to generate bare identities (via arguments such as Chisholm’s Paradox or Forbes’s reduplication argument) may produce a variety of reactions.
The moral that Chisholm (1967) drew from his argument was scepticism about transworld identity, based partly on scepticism about whether the non-trivial individual essences that would block the generation of role-switching worlds are available. Others would go further, and conclude that such puzzles provide not only a reason for rejecting transworld identity, but also a reason for adopting counterpart theory. (Note, though, that Lewis’s reasons for adopting counterpart theory appear to be largely independent of such puzzles (cf. Lewis 1986, Ch. 4).)
A third reaction is to accept bare identities—or, at least, to accept that individuals (including actual individuals) may have qualitative duplicates in other possible worlds, and that transworld identities may involve what have been called ‘haecceitistic’ differences. (See Adams 1979; Mackie 2006, Chs 2–3; Lewis 1986, Ch. 4, Section 4; also the separate entry on Haecceitism.)
A fourth reaction, that of Forbes, is to propose a mixed solution: he holds that for some individuals (including human beings and trees) suitable candidates for non-trivial individual essences can be found (by appeal to distinctive features of their origins), although for others (including most artefacts) it may be that no suitable candidates are available, in which case counterpart theory should be adopted for these cases (see Forbes 1985, Chs 6–7).
Koslicki (2020) provides another mixed solution. She accepts (primarily for Quinean reasons) that there is a problem of transworld identity for certain individuals including people: one that can be solved only by attributing to them non-trivial individual essences; she argues that these consist in their individual forms. Such an individual form would provide a substantial answer to questions such as ‘what makes an individual Noah in the “role-switching” world rather than Adam?’ Thus, it would appear, the problem of transworld identity for individuals such as Noah and Adam is replaced by a problem of transworld identity for their individual forms. But why is this supposed to represent an improvement? As Fine puts it: ‘Why should we not simply take the crossworld identity of [non-form] entities as given and not standing in any need of a criterion?’ (2020, 430). One reason (considered by Koslicki) is conceptual. It is thought that we need to make sense of de re modal claims in terms of de dicto modal claims. However, if individual forms are to come to the rescue, the question arises how the individual forms are to be distinguished from one another. The problem is acute in cases where the individuals in question are otherwise indiscernible (Fine 2020, 432). Moreover, it is not clear that Koslicki’s invocation of the fact that individual forms—unlike, say, unanalysable haecceities—have a ‘qualitative’ element (2020, Sections 3.3.4–3.5) is supposed to help with this problem.
It is perhaps significant, though, that no theorist appears to have argued that a ‘non-trivial individual essence’ solution can be applied to all the relevant cases. In other words, the consensus appears to be that the price of interpreting all de re modal claims in terms of transworld identity (as opposed to counterpart theory) is the acceptance of (some) bare identities across possible worlds.
Salmon (1996) claims ‘something like a proof’ of this implication, from transworld identities to bare identities. He argues for what he calls Extreme Haecceitism, the view that transworld identities cannot be grounded in general facts about the individuals concerned. The purported proof goes as follows. We consider x in world w and y in world w2 and suppose, for reductio, that x = y and that this fact is reducible to (or grounded in, or entailed by) general facts about x in w and y in w2. But, says Salmon, the fact that x = x is not reducible (grounded, etc.) in this way, since it is a fact of logic. So, says Salmon, ‘x differs from y in at least one respect. For x lacks y’s feature that its identity with x is grounded in general (cross-world) facts about x and it’ (1996, 216), and hence (by Leibniz’s Law), x ≠ y, contrary to assumption. So if there are any transworld identities, those identities cannot be grounded in general facts about those individuals. They must be ‘bare’.
Salmon’s argument is a variant on Evans’s (1978) argument against the possibility of vague objects. It is controversial in general whether arguments of this form succeed, for applications of Leibniz’s Law in intensional contexts are questionable. Catterson (2008) argues on independent grounds that Salmon’s argument is not sound. We should also note that, even if the argument is successful, it does not directly establish Salmon’s Extreme Haecceitism, but only the conditional thesis that if there are any true transworld identity statements x = y, then they are not reducible to general facts about x and y.
Finally, it can be noted that the problems concerning transworld identity discussed here arise only because it is assumed that not all of an individual’s properties are essential to it (and hence that, if it exists in more than one possible world, it has different properties in different worlds). If, instead, one were to hold that all of an individual’s properties are essential properties—and hence, for example, that George Eliot could not have existed with properties in any way different from her actual ones—then no such problems would arise. Moreover, this suggestion, implausible though it may be, is of some historical interest. For, according to a standard interpretation of the views of Gottfried Leibniz, the philosopher who is the father of theories of possible worlds, Leibniz’s theory of ‘complete individual notions’ commits him to the thesis that an individual such as George Eliot does have all her properties essentially (cf. Leibniz, Discourse on Metaphysics (1687), Sections 8 and 13; printed in Leibniz 1973 and elsewhere). According to the ‘hyper-essentialist’ view to which Leibniz appears to be committed, any individual, in any possible world, whose properties in that world differ from the actual properties of George Eliot is not, strictly speaking, identical with Eliot. However, it also seems clear that this does not represent a way of saving a transworld identity interpretation of de re modality. On the contrary: if there is no possible world in which George Eliot exists with properties different from her actual properties, then it is plausible to conclude that there is no possible world, other than the actual world, in which she exists at all. For unless possible worlds can be exact duplicates (something that Leibniz himself would deny), any merely possible world must differ from the actual world in some respect. If so, then the properties of any individual in another possible world must differ in some respect from the actual properties of Eliot (even if the difference is only a difference in relational properties), in which case, if all Eliot’s properties are essential to her, that individual is not Eliot. (Leibniz’s views may, however, be seen as a partial anticipation of counterpart theory, which attempts to save the truth of the claim that George Eliot could have been different in some respects (thus denying ‘hyper-essentialism’) while preserving the metaphysical thesis that no individual who is, strictly speaking, identical with Eliot exists in any other possible world (cf. Kripke 1980, 45, note 13).)
The view that an individual’s transworld identity is ‘bare’ is sometimes described as the view that its identity consists in its possession of a ‘haecceity’ or ‘thisness’: an unanalysable non-qualitative property that is necessary and sufficient for its being the individual that it is. (The term ‘individual essence’ is sometimes used to denote such a haecceity. It should be noted that according to the terminology used in this article, although a haecceity would be an individual essence, it would not be a non-trivial individual essence.) However, it is not obvious that the belief in bare identities requires the acceptance of haecceities. One can apparently hold that transworld identities may be ‘bare’ without holding that they are constituted by any properties at all, even unanalysable haecceities (cf. Lewis 1986, 225; Adams 1979, 6–7). Thus we should distinguish what is standardly known as ‘haecceitism’ (roughly, the view that there may be bare identities across possible worlds in the sense of identities that do not supervene on qualitative properties) from the belief in haecceities (the belief that individuals have unanalysable non-qualitative properties that constitute their being the individuals that they are). (For more on the use of the term ‘haecceitism’ see Lewis 1986, Ch. 4, Section 4; Adams 1979; Kaplan 1975, Section IV; also the separate entry on Haecceitism. For the history of the term ‘haecceity’, see the entry on Medieval Theories of Haecceity.)
In addition, it should be noted that to believe in ‘bare’ transworld identities, in the sense under discussion here, is not to believe in ‘bare particulars’, if to be a bare particular is to be an entity devoid of (non-trivial) essential properties. As the arguments discussed in Sections 4.1–4.2 above demonstrate, a commitment to a ‘bare’ (or ‘ungrounded’) difference in the identities of two individuals A and B in different possible worlds (two human beings, or two trees, for example) does not imply that those individuals have no non-trivial essential properties. All it implies is that A and B do not differ in their non-trivial essential properties—and hence that, although there may well be non-trivial necessary conditions for being A in any possible world, and non-trivial necessary conditions for being B in any possible world, there are no non-trivial necessary conditions for being A that are not also necessary conditions for being B, and vice versa. (Cf. Adams’s ‘Moderate Haecceitism’ (1979, 24–26).)
It was argued above that the proponent of transworld identity without non-trivial individual essences faces the prospect of bare (‘ungrounded’) identities across possible worlds. One such argument is Chisholm’s Paradox, which relies on the transitivity of identity to produce the result that a series of small changes in the properties of Adam and Noah leads to a world in which Adam and Noah have swapped their roles. However, the transitivity of identity generates additional problems concerning transworld identity, some of which have nothing particularly to do with role-switching possibilities or bare identities.
One such argument is given by Chandler (1976). It can be illustrated simply as follows (adapting Chandler’s own example). Suppose that there is a bicycle originally composed of three parts: A1, B1, and C1. (We might suppose that A1 is the frame, and B1 and C1 the two wheels.) Suppose we think that any bicycle could have been originally composed of any two thirds of its original parts, with a substitute third component. We may call this (following Forbes 1985) ‘the tolerance principle’; it is a development of the intuitively appealing thought that it is too much to demand, of an object such as a bicycle, that it could not have existed unless all of its original parts had been the same. Suppose, further, that we think that no bicycle could have been originally composed of just one third of its original parts, even with substitutes for the other two thirds. Call this ‘the restriction principle’. The combination of these assumptions appears to generate a difficulty for the paraphrase of de re modal claims about bicycles in terms of transworld identity. For if there is (as the tolerance principle allows) a possible world w2 in which our bicycle comes into existence composed of parts A1 + B1 + C2, where C1 ≠ C2, then, if we apply the tolerance principle to this bicycle we must say that it could have come into existence (in some further possible world w3) with any two thirds of those parts, with a substitute third component: for example, that it could have come into existence (in w3) composed of A1 + B2 + C2, where B1 ≠ B2 and C1 ≠ C2. The bicycle in w3 is, ex hypothesi, identical with the bicycle in w2, and the bicycle in w2 is, ex hypothesi, identical with the original bicycle; so, by the transitivity of identity, the bicycle in w3 is identical with the original bicycle. Hence our assumptions have generated a contradiction. We have a bicycle in w3, originally composed of A1 + B2 + C2, that both is identical with the original bicycle (by the repeated application of the tolerance principle, together with the transitivity of identity) and is not identical with the original bicycle (by the restriction principle).
One might complain that the version of the tolerance principle cited above is too lenient. Perhaps it is not true that the bicycle could have come into existence with just two thirds of its original components: perhaps a threshold of, say, 90% or more is required. However, the simple argument given above can be adapted to generate a contradiction between the restriction principle and any tolerance principle that permits some difference in the bicycle’s original composition, simply by introducing a longer chain of possible worlds. Thus the transitivity argument appears to force the proponent of transworld identity to choose between two implausible claims: that an object such as a bicycle has all of its original parts essentially (thus denying any version of the tolerance principle) and that an object such as a bicycle could have come into existence with few (if any) of its original parts (thus denying any (non-trivial) version of the restriction principle). Moreover, it is clear that the problem can be generalized to any object to which versions of the tolerance principle and the restriction principle concerning its original material composition have application, which appears to include all artefacts, if not biological organisms.
It seems legitimate to call this puzzle a ‘problem of transworld identity’, for it turns partly on the transitivity of identity, and can be avoided by interpreting claims about how bicycles could have been different (de re modal claims about bicycles) in terms of a counterpart relation that is not transitive (Chandler 1976). Thus a counterpart theorist may admit that the bicycle could have been originally composed of A1 + B1 + C2 rather than A1 + B1 + C1, on the grounds that (according to the tolerance principle) it has a counterpart (in w2) that is originally so composed. And the counterpart theorist may admit that a bicycle (such as the one in w2) that is originally composed of A1 + B1 + C2 could have been originally composed of A1 + B2 + C2, since (by the tolerance principle) it has a counterpart (in w3) that is originally so composed. However, since the counterpart relation (unlike identity) is not transitive, the counterpart theorist need not say that the bicycle in w3 that is originally composed of A1 + B2 + C2 is a counterpart of the bicycle in the actual world (w1) originally composed of A1 + B1 + C1, for its similarity to the bicycle in w1 may be insufficient to allow it to be that bicycle’s counterpart. Thus the non-transitivity of the counterpart relation (a relation based on resemblance) appears neatly to allow the counterpart theorist to respect both the tolerance principle and the restriction principle, without falling into contradiction.
One reaction to the transitivity puzzle is to abandon transworld identity in favour of counterpart theory. But how—given the structure of the puzzle—can the theorist who wishes to resist that move, and retain transworld identity, respond?
One response would be to give up any non-trivial version of the restriction principle, and hold that an artefact such as a bicycle could have come into existence with an entirely different material composition from its actual original composition. Although this counterintuitive view has been defended (for example, Mackie (2006) argues for it on grounds independent of the transitivity problem), it has few adherents.
A second response would be to give up the tolerance principle, and adopt what Roca-Royes (2016) calls an ‘inflexible’ version of the principle that the material origin of an artefact is essential to it, holding that an artefact such as a bicycle could not have come into existence with a material composition in any way different from its actual original composition. Although this view is admittedly counterintuitive, Roca-Royes argues that it provides the best solution to the ‘Four Worlds Paradox’ to be discussed in the next section.
A third solution to the transitivity problem has been proposed (by Chandler, followed by Salmon) which apparently allows us to reconcile all three of the transitivity of identity, the tolerance principle, and the restriction principle. This is to say that although there are possible worlds (such as w3) in which the bicycle is originally composed of only a small proportion of its actual original parts, such worlds are not possible relative to (not ‘accessible to’) the initial world w1. From the standpoint of w1, such an original composition for the bicycle is only possibly possible: something that would have been possible, had things been different in some possible way, but is not, as things are, possible (Chandler 1976; Salmon 1979; Salmon 1982, 238–240). Whether this solution is satisfactory is disputed. (See, for example, Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri 2021, Chs 7–8.) Admittedly, there are some contexts in which we talk of possibility in a way that may suggest that the ‘accessibility relation’ between possible worlds is non-transitive: that not everything that would have been possible, had things been different in some possible way, is possible simpliciter. (If Ann had started writing her paper earlier, it would have been possible for her to finish it today. And she could have started writing her paper earlier. But, as things are, it is not possible for her to finish it today.) Nevertheless, the idea that, as regards the type of metaphysical possibility that is involved in puzzles such as that of the bicycle, there might be states of affairs that are possibly possible and yet not possible (and hence that de re metaphysical possibility and necessity do not obey the system of modal logic known as S4) is regarded with suspicion by many philosophers.
It should be noted that the ‘non-transitivity of accessibility’ response is distinct from an even more radical response, which rejects the principle of the transitivity of identity—a principle definitive of the classical notion of identity. For example, Priest (2010) denies the transitivity of identity in the context of his dialetheism about truth and a paraconsistent logic in which the material conditional does not obey the principle of modus ponens. Discussion of this extreme position is, however, beyond the scope of this article. (On dialetheism and paraconsistent logic, see the separate entry on Dialetheism. On the logic of identity, see the entry on Identity.)
Finally, Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri 2021 propose that, in some cases, the combination of (classical) transworld identity, tolerance, and the restriction principle can all be retained, yet without denying (as do Chandler and Salmon) the transitivity of accessibility between possible worlds. They appeal to two principles: a metaphysical principle of ‘plenitude’ and a metasemantic principle of ‘semantic plasticity’ (for the relevant terms). This solution is defended by Dorr et al partly by considering difficulties for rival solutions (including that of Chandler and Salmon). The details are complex, however: interested readers should consult Dorr et al 2021. As with other proposed solutions to the puzzle, the principles to which Dorr et al appeal (plenitude and semantic plasticity for the relevant terms) are controversial.
It is fair to say that there is no consensus about how the proponent of transworld identity should respond to the transitivity problem posed by Chandler’s example.
Chandler’s transitivity argument can be adapted to produce a puzzle that is like those discussed in Sections 4.1–4.2 above in that it involves the danger of ‘bare identities’, a puzzle that Salmon (1982) has called ‘The Four Worlds Paradox’. To illustrate the puzzle: suppose that the actual world (w1) contains a bicycle, a, that is (actually) originally composed of A1 + B1 + C1, and suppose that there is a possible world, w5, containing a bicycle, b (not identical with a), that is originally composed (in w5) of A2 + B2 + C1 (where A1 ≠ A2 and B1 ≠ B2). Then, it seems, the application of the tolerance principle to each of a and b may generate two further possible worlds, in one of which (w6) there is a bicycle with the original composition A1 + B2 + C1 that is identical with a, and in the other of which (w7) there is a bicycle with the original composition A1 + B2 + C1 that is identical with b. Since there need apparently be no further difference between the intrinsic features of w6 and w7 on which this difference in identities could depend, we appear to have a case of bare identities. This ‘Four Worlds Paradox’ is like Chandler’s original transitivity puzzle in that it does not seem that an appeal to individual essences could solve it without conflicting with the tolerance principle. If that is so, the proponent of transworld identity (as opposed to counterpart theory) appears to be left with two options consistent with the transitivity of identity: the denial of the tolerance principle, and the acceptance of bare identities. (But cf. Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri 2021.) It may be argued, however, that the acceptance of bare identities can be made more palatable in this case by the adoption of a non-transitive accessibility relation between possible worlds. (See Salmon 1982, 230–252; and, for discussion, Roca-Royes 2016. For a defence of the employment of counterpart theory to solve the Four Worlds Paradox, see Forbes 1985, Ch. 7. For discussion of a radical response that retains the tolerance principle and yet avoids bare identities, but only at the cost of claiming that two bicycles could completely coincide in one possible world, simultaneously sharing all their parts, see Roca-Royes 2016, discussing Williamson 1990. On the relevance to the Four Worlds Paradox to Kripke’s principle of the necessity (essentiality) of origin for artefacts, see also Robertson 1998 and Hawthorne and Gendler 2000.)
One of our initial questions (Section 1 above) was whether a commitment to transworld identity—the view that an individual exists in more than one possible world—is an acceptable commitment for one who believes in possible worlds. The considerations of Sections 4–5 above suggest that this commitment does involve genuine (although perhaps not insuperable) problems, even for one who rejects David Lewis’s extreme realism about the nature of possible worlds. The problems do not arise directly from the notion of an individual’s existing in more than one possible world with different properties. Rather, they derive principally from the fact that it is hard to accommodate all that we want to say about the modal properties of ordinary individuals (including all the things we want to say about their essential and accidental properties) if de re modal statements about such individuals are characterized in terms of their existence or non-existence in other possible worlds.
There is currently no consensus about the appropriate resolution of these problems. In particular, there is no consensus about whether the adoption of counterpart theory is superior to the solutions available to a transworld identity theorist. A full examination of the issue would require a discussion of the objections that have been raised against counterpart theory as an interpretation of de re modality. And a detailed discussion of counterpart theory is beyond the scope of this article. (For David Lewis’s presentation of counterpart theory, the reader might start with Lewis 1973, 39–43, followed by (the more technical) Lewis 1968. Early criticisms of Lewis’s counterpart theory include those in Kripke 1980; Plantinga 1973; and Plantinga 1974, Ch. 6. Lewis develops the 1968 version of his counterpart theory in Lewis 1971 and 1986, Ch. 4; he responds to criticisms in his “Postscripts to ‘Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic’” (1983, 39–46) and in Lewis 1986, Ch. 4. Other discussions of counterpart theory include Hazen 1979, the relevant sections of Divers 2002, Melia 2003, and the more technical treatment in Forbes 1985. More recent critiques of the theory (postdating Lewis’s 1986 response to his critics) include Fara and Williamson 2005, Fara 2009, and Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri 2021, Ch. 10.)
One way to argue in favour of transworld identity (distinct from the defensive strategies discussed in Sections 4 and 5 above) is what we might call ‘the argument from logical simplicity’ (Linsky and Zalta 1994, 1996; Williamson 1998, 2000). The argument begins by noting that Quantified Modal Logic—which combines individual quantifiers and modal operators—is greatly simplified when one accepts the validity of the Barcan scheme, ∀x□A → □∀xA (Marcus 1946). The resulting logic is sound and complete with respect to constant domain semantics, in which each possible world has precisely the same set of individuals in its domain. The simplest philosophical interpretation of this semantics is that one and the same individual exists at every possible world.
Several remarks on this argument are in order. First, its conclusion is very strong: it says that any entity that in fact exists or that could have existed exists necessarily. There is no contingent existence. This goes far beyond the claim that there are genuine identities across worlds. (Williamson (2002) defends this conclusion on independent grounds.) Second, the argument does not offer an explanation of how transworld identities are possible; it insists only that there are genuine transworld identities. (Nevertheless, the metaphysical picture that can most naturally be ‘read off’ the constant-domain semantics treats properties-at-a-world as relations between particulars and worlds, as on McDaniel’s modal realism with overlap (McDaniel 2004), discussed in Section 1.2 above.)
Third, the argument is not best understood as the claim that, if one does not accept transworld identities, then one is forced into denying the Barcan scheme (and hence forced into uncomfortable logical territory). That claim would be true only if the Barcan scheme were validated only by constant-domain semantics, which is not the case. Counterpart-theoretic semantics can be restricted so as to validate the Barcan scheme, by insisting that the counterpart relation is an equivalence relation which, for each particular x and world w, relates x to a unique particular in w. (One could not then interpret the counterpart relation in terms of similarity, as Lewis does.) Rather, the argument should be understood as the claim that the best way to gain the advantages of a logic containing the Barcan scheme is by adopting constant-domain semantics (and genuine transworld identities along with it). But just which metaphysical view counts as ‘best’ here will involve a trade-off between many factors. These include the simplicity of the constant-domain semantics, on the one hand, but also arguments of the kind raised by Lewis against modal realism with overlap, on the other.
Finally, we can note that Lewis (1986) has presented a challenge to the self-styled champions of ‘transworld identity’ to explain why the view that they insist on deserves to be called a commitment to transworld identity at all.
Throughout this article, it has been assumed that a commitment to transworld identity may be differentiated from a commitment to counterpart theory on the grounds that the transworld identity theorist accepts, while the counterpart theorist denies, that an object exists in more than one possible world (cf. Section 1.2 above). However, as Lewis points out, there is a notion of ‘existence according to a (possible) world’ that is completely neutral as between a counterpart-theoretic and a ‘transworld identity’ interpretation. In terms of this neutral conception, as long as the counterpart theorist and transworld identity theorist agree that Bertrand Russell could have been a playwright instead of a philosopher, they must agree that Russell exists according to more than one world. In particular, they must agree that, according to our world, he exists and is a philosopher, and according to some other worlds, he exists and is a non-philosopher playwright (cf. Lewis 1986, 194). The difference between the theorists, then, allegedly consists in their different interpretations of what it is for Russell to exist ‘according to’ a world. In the view of the counterpart theorist, for Russell to exist according to a possible world in which he is a playwright is for him to have a counterpart in that world who is (in that world) a playwright. According to the transworld identity theorist, it is supposed to be for Russell (himself) to exist in that world as a playwright.
If the transworld identity theorist were a Lewisian realist about possible worlds, this notion of existence in a world could be clearly distinguished from the neutral notion of existence according to a world, on the grounds that the existence of Russell in a world would require his complete or partial presence as a part of such a world (cf. Section 1.2 above). But, as Lewis notes, the self-styled champions of ‘transworld identity’ who oppose his counterpart theory are philosophers who repudiate a Lewisian realist conception of what it takes for Russell to exist in more than one possible world. Hence, he argues, there is a question about their entitlement to claim that, according to their theory, Russell exists in other possible worlds in any sense that goes beyond the neutral thesis (compatible with counterpart theory) that Russell exists according to other worlds. Thus Lewis writes (using the 1968 US presidential candidate Hubert Humphrey as his example):
The philosophers’ chorus on behalf of ‘trans-world identity’ is merely insisting that, for instance, it is Humphrey himself who might have existed under other conditions, … who might have won the presidency, who exists according to many worlds and wins according to some of them. All that is uncontroversial. The controversial question is how he manages to have these modal properties. (1986, 198)
A natural reaction to Lewis’s challenge is to point out that a proponent of transworld identity who is not a Lewisian realist will typically reject Lewis’s counterpart theory on the grounds that his counterpart relation does not have the logic of identity. If so, then (pace Lewis) it is not the case, strictly speaking, that the ‘philosophers’ chorus on behalf of “trans-world identity”’ is merely insisting on the neutral claim that objects exist according to more than one world. However, even if this is correct, it does not answer a further potential challenge. Suppose, as seems plausible, that there could be a counterpart relation that (unlike the one proposed by Lewis himself) is an equivalence relation (transitive, symmetric, and reflexive), and ‘one-one between worlds’. What would distinguish, in the case of a theorist who is not a Lewisian realist about possible worlds, between, on the one hand, a commitment to the interpretation of de re modal statements in terms of such an ‘identity-resembling’ counterpart relation, and, on the other hand, a commitment to genuine transworld identity (and hence to the view that an individual genuinely exists in a number of distinct possible worlds)? The aficionado of transworld identity owes Lewis a reply to this challenge.
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