Biological Information

First published Thu Oct 4, 2007; substantive revision Wed Mar 23, 2016

Since the 1950s, the concept of information has acquired a strikingly prominent role in many parts of biology. This enthusiasm extends far beyond domains where the concept might seem to have an obvious application, such as the biological study of perception, cognition, and language, and now reaches into the most basic parts of biological theory. Hormones and other cellular products through which physiological systems are regulated are typically described as signals. Descriptions of how genes play their causal role in metabolic processes and development are routinely given in terms of “transcription”, “translation”, and “editing”. The most general term used for the processes by which genes exert their effects is “gene expression”. The fates of cells in a developing organism are explained in terms of their processing of “positional information” given to them from surrounding cells and other factors. Many biologists think of the developmental processes by which organisms progress from egg to adult in terms of the execution of a “developmental program”. Other biologists have argued for a pivotal role for information in evolution rather than development: John Maynard Smith and Eors Szathmáry (for example) suggest that major transitions in evolution depend on expansions in the amount and accuracy with which information is transmitted across generations. And some have argued that we can only understand the evolutionary role of genes by recognizing an informational “domain” that exists alongside the domain of matter and energy.

Both philosophers and biologists have contributed to an ongoing foundational discussion of the status of this mode of description in biology. It is generally agreed that the sense of information isolated by Claude Shannon and used in mathematical information theory is legitimate, useful, and relevant in many parts of biology. In this sense, anything is a source of information if it has a range of possible states, and one variable carries information about another to the extent that their states are physically correlated. But it is also agreed that many uses of informational language in biology seem to make use of a richer and more problematic concept than Shannon’s. Some have drawn on the teleosemantic tradition in philosophy of mind to make sense of this richer concept. Other theorists have countered that Shannon’s correlational conception of information is richer than it looks.

A minority tradition has argued that the enthusiasm for information in biology has been a serious theoretical wrong turn, and that it fosters naive genetic determinism, other distortions of our understanding of the roles of interacting causes, or an implicitly dualist ontology. However, this sceptical response is fading, with key sceptics coming to accept a modest but genuine role for informational concepts in the life sciences. Others have taken the critique seriously but tried to distinguish legitimate appeals to information from misleading or erroneous ones.

1. Introduction

Biology is concerned with living organisms—with their structure, activities, distribution in space and time, and participation in evolutionary and developmental histories. Many of these organisms engage in activities that seem best understood in terms of information processing or representation. These include perception, cognition, signalling, and language use. We will not much be concerned with the role of concepts of information and representation in these cognitive contexts. For over the second half of the 20th century, biology came to apply informational concepts (and their relatives) far more broadly than this. For many biologists, the most basic processes characteristic of living organisms should now be understood in terms of the expression of information: the response to signals, the execution of programs, and the interpretation of codes. So although contemporary mainstream biology is an overtly materialist field, it has come to employ concepts that seem intentional or semantic. These come with a long history of causing foundational problems for materialists (and, to some extent, for everyone else).

The embrace of informational and other semantic concepts has been especially marked within genetics, and other fields—evolutionary theory and developmental biology—with strong ties to genetics. But informational language is not only found there: for example, hormones are routinely seen as long distance signals that enable one organ system to coordinate with others (Levy 2011). That said, the usage that has generated the most discussion is found in the description of the relations between genes and the various structures and processes to which genes contribute. For many biologists, the causal role of genes should be understood in terms of their carrying information about their various products; and perhaps as well about the environments in which these products enhance fitness (Lorenz 1965; Shea 2013). The expression of that information might depend on the presence of various environmental factors, but the same can be said of other kinds of message. Breaking things down further, we can recognize two causal roles for genes, and hence two potential explanatory roles for genetic information, within biology. Genes are crucial to both explaining the development of individual organisms, and to explaining the inheritance of characteristics across generations. Information has been invoked in both explanatory contexts.

One important use of informational language is relatively uncontroversial, through being anchored in striking and well established facts about the role of DNA and RNA in the manufacture of protein molecules in cells, a set of facts summarized in the familiar chart representing the “genetic code”, that maps triplets of the DNA bases (C, A, T, G) to individual amino acids, which are the building blocks of protein molecules. Not even this use of “coding” language is completely uncontroversial (Sarkar 1996). More importantly, enthusiasm for the use of informational language in biology both predates the discovery of the DNA-RNA-amino acid mapping (Schrödinger 1944), and goes far beyond it, so this mapping is only a partial explanation of the uptake of informational notions in biology. Current applications of informational concepts in biology include:

  1. The description of whole-organism phenotypic traits (including complex behavioral traits) as specified or coded by information contained in the genes,
  2. The treatment of many causal processes within cells, and perhaps of the whole-organism developmental sequence, in terms of the execution of a program stored in the genes,
  3. Treating the transmission of genes (and sometimes other inherited structures) as a flow of information from the parental generation to the offspring generation.
  4. The idea that genes themselves, for the purpose of evolutionary theorizing, should be seen as, in some sense, “made” of information. Information becomes a fundamental ingredient in the biological world.
  5. Characterising, in a fully general way, the dynamics of idealized populations changing as a result of natural selection.

There is no consensus about the status of these ideas. Indeed, the use of informational notions is controversial even when giving accounts of animal communication, with some theorists denying that such communication is the flow of information from one animal to another (Krebs and Dawkins 1984; Owren et al. 2010). The result has been a growing foundational discussion within biology and the philosophy of biology. Some have hailed the employment of informational concepts as a crucial advance (Williams 1992). Others have seen almost every biological application of informational concepts as a serious error, one that distorts our understanding and contributes to lingering genetic determinism (Francis 2003). Most of the possible options between these extreme views have also been defended. Perhaps most commentators within philosophy have seen their project as one of sorting through the various kinds of informational description that have become current, distinguishing legitimate ones from illegitimate ones (Godfrey-Smith 2000; Griffiths 2001; Godfrey-Smith 2007; Shea 2013; Lean 2014). Philosophers have also tried to give a reductive or naturalistic explanation for the legitimate ones.

This entry proceeds as follows. In the next section we discuss the most unproblematic technical use of information in biology, which draws on Shannon and the mathematical theory of information. Against that background, some of the more contentious uses are both motivated and introduced. In section 3, we discuss recent attempts to build a richer concept out of Shannon’s technical notion. We then discuss the status of the “genetic code” in its original sense (section 4), and signalling systems inside and outside of genetics (section 5). We then look at ways of rejecting informational forms of description (section 6). The key sceptical idea is the so-called “parity thesis”: the idea that while genes play an immensely important role in evolution and development, so do other factors, and so it is a mistake to think of genes and only genes as instructing or controlling these processes. The final two sections discuss the idea that biological development in individuals proceeds by the execution of a program (section 7), and the use of information in understanding the role of inheritance systems in the “major transitions” in evolution (section 8).

2. Shannon’s concept of information

It is common to begin the analysis of information in biology with an uncontroversial but minimal notion: a causal or correlational conception. Smoke in the air and fire in the forest are correlated with one another. If you see a forest burning at night, you can predict the air will be smoky. If you see a plume of smoke rising from above the trees, you can predict that below there is a fire. The correlation does not have to be perfect to be informative. Putting the point generally, a signal carries information about a source, in this sense, if we can predict the state of the source from the signal. This sense of information is associated with Claude Shannon (1948) who showed how the concept of information could be used to quantify facts about contingency and correlation in a useful way, initially for use in communication technology. For Shannon, anything is a source of information if it has a number of alternative states that might be realized on a particular occasion. Any other variable contains some information about that source, or carries information about it, if its state is correlated with the state of the source. This is a matter of degree; a signal carries more information about a source if its state is a better predictor of the source, less information if it is a worse predictor.

In this sense, a signal can carry information about a source without there being any biological system designed to produce that signal, nor any to use it once produced. When a biologist employs this sense of information in a description of gene action or of other processes, he or she is just adopting a quantitative framework for describing ordinary correlations or causal connections within those systems. So it is one thing for there to be a signal carrying information about a source; quite another to explain biological processes as the result of signalling. The familiar example of tree rings is helpful here. When a tree lays down rings, it establishes a structure that can be used by us to make inferences about the past. The number and size of the rings carry information, in Shannon’s sense, about the history of the tree and its circumstances (the technique, “dendrochronology”, is scientifically important). Despite the usefulness of the informational description, there is no sense in which we are explaining how the tree does what it does in informational terms. The only reader or user of the information in the tree rings is the human observer. The tree itself does not exploit the information in its rings to control its growth or flowering. Similarly, we might note ways in which the distribution of different DNA sequences within and between biological populations “carries information about” the historical relationships between those populations, and the histories of the individual populations themselves. Using this information has given evolutionary biologists a much richer and more reliable picture of the history of life (for a good introduction to these uses see Bromham 2008). It has been argued, for example, that the greater diversity in mitochondrial DNA in African populations, in comparison to other human populations, is an indicator of a comparatively recent human dispersal from an African origin. In making these inferences, informational concepts can be useful tools. But this is just a more complicated version of what is going on in the case of tree rings. The appeal to information has an inferential use that is no way explanatory. A large proportion of the informational descriptions found in biology have this character.

The border between these two categories, however, can be hard to discern. Steven Frank (2012) has developed a detailed mapping between equations describing change due to natural selection and equations used in information theory. Change across generations can be seen as the accumulation of information by a population about its environment. So far, there is no claim that populations use this information in any way, and the situation is akin to that found in tree rings: a tree accumulates, in its rings, information about climatic conditions in its past, though the tree does nothing with that information. Frank may view the role of information acquired by evolution in a more substantive way: “selection causes populations to accumulate information about the fit of characters to the environment” (2012: 2391). But it is doubtful that anything more than an inferential role has yet been shown for this kind of information.

Consequently, philosophers have sometimes set the discussion up by saying that there is one kind of “information” appealed to in biology, the kind originally described by Shannon, that is unproblematic and does not require much philosophical attention. The term “causal” information is also sometimes used to refer to this concept, and this is essentially Grice’s “natural meaning”, (see entry on Grice) from his work in the philosophy of language (Grice 1957). Information in this sense exists whenever there is contingency and correlation. So we can say that genes contain information about the proteins they make, and also that genes contain information about the whole-organism phenotype. But when we say that, we are saying no more than what we are saying when we say that there is an informational connection between smoke and fire, or between tree rings and a tree’s age. The more contentious question becomes whether or not biology needs another, richer concept of information as well. Information in this richer sense is sometimes called “semantic” or “intentional” information.

Why might we think that biology needs to employ a richer concept? One thought is that genes play a special, instructional role in development, telling the embryo how to grow. It is true that genes carry Shannon-information about phenotypes: the genome of a fertilized egg predicts much of the resulting phenotype. In mammals, for example, chromosome structure predicts the sex of the adult animal. But if an informational relationship between gene and phenotype is supposed to involve a distinctive instruction-like mode of causation, then this cannot be information in Shannon’s sense. For environmental factors, not just genes, “carry information” about phenotypes, in Shannon’s sense. With respect to Shannon information, there is a “parity” between the roles of environmental and genetic causes (Griffiths and Gray 1994). Moreover, if we are using Shannon’s concept, then the informational relationship between genotype and phenotype is symmetrical. For example, once a reader knows that both authors of this article are male, they can predict that we both carry a Y-chromosome. Some talk about information in biology is consistent with these features of Shannon information, but some is not. In particular, it is usually thought that at least some applications of informational language to genes ascribe to them a property that is not ascribed to environmental conditions, even when the environment is predictively important.

In addition, a message that carries “semantic information”, it is often thought, has the capacity to mis-represent, as well as accurately represent, what it is about. There is a capacity for error. Shannon information does not have that feature; we cannot say that one variable “carried false information” about another, if we are using Shannon’s sense of the term. But biologists do apparently want to use language of that kind when talking about genes. Genes carry a message that is supposed to be expressed, whether or not it actually is expressed. Thus the developmental disorders caused by thalidomide in the 1960s were due to an inability to use genetic signals that were supposed to control limb development. These genes were present and active; thalidomide did not do its harm by causing mutations.

These are the usual “marks” that are taken in the literature to show that a richer sense of information than Shannon’s has been introduced to biology. But the most crucial difference between the less and more contentious applications of informational concepts is that, in the richer cases, information use is supposed to help explain how biological systems do what they do—how cells work, how an egg can develop into an adult, how genetic inheritance mechanisms make the evolution of complex phenotypes possible.

At this point, there are a number of options on the table. One is to deny that genes, cells and other biological structures literally traffic in information in ways that explain their behaviour, but to argue nevertheless that this is a useful analogy or model. The idea is that there are useful similarities between paradigm cases of information and representation using systems—cognitively sophisticated agents, thinking and communicating with one another—and biological systems. Hormones, for example, are usefully thought of as messages because they are small, stable, energetically inexpensive items that can travel long distances (relative to their own size) without decaying, to specialized locations where they have predictable, specific, and important effects on arrival. But while this is a helpful way of thinking, perhaps we should not take talk of messages too seriously. For example, we should not treat a question about whether prolactin is a report of pregnancy or an instruction to the mammary glands as if it had a literally correct answer. Arnon Levy has developed the most sophisticated version of this view of biological information (Levy 2011).

A second option is to argue that genes and other biological structures literally carry semantic information, and their informational character explains the distinctive role of these structures in biological processes. If we think of genes or cells as literally carrying semantic information, our problem changes; who or what could count as composing or reading these messages? Paradigm cases of structures with semantic information—pictures, sentences, programs—are built by the thought and action of intelligent agents. So we need to show how genes and cells—neither intelligent systems themselves nor the products of intelligence—can carry semantic information, and how the information they carry explains their biological role. We need some kind of reductive explanation of semantic information (arguably, we need this to understand cognition, too). One place we might look for such an analysis is naturalistic philosophy of mind.

A third option is to argue that causal information itself can explain biological phenomena, and no additional concept of information is needed. Biological systems, on this view, can be adapted to send or receive signals that carry causal information. Elevated prolactin, for example, does covary with pregnancy, and that is no accident. Likewise, the production of milk is a designed response to the registration of these elevated levels at the mammary glands. While it is true that lactation carries as much causal information about prolactin levels as those levels carry about milk flow, there is a physical asymmetry, hence directionality, between source and receiver. (After birth, suckling stimulates local production of prolactin, so the physical asymmetry is the signal of pregnancy from the pituitary gland to the breasts, tuning them for lactation). Brian Skyrms’ work has been very important in returning causal information to centre stage, in part because his work shows that sender-receiver signalling systems need not be cognitively sophisticated agents (Skyrms 2010). Sending and receiving causal information can emerge and stabilise amongst simple systems; certainly amongst systems no more complex than a cell.

3. Teleosemantic and other richer concepts

As noted above, several philosophers and biologists have argued that much informational talk about genes uses a richer concept than Shannon’s, but this concept can be given a naturalistic analysis. The aim has been to make sense of the idea that genes semantically specify their normal products, in a sense similar to that seen in some paradigm cases of symbolic phenomena.

If genes are seen as “carrying a message” in this sense, the message apparently has a prescriptive or imperative content, as opposed to a descriptive or indicative one. Their “direction of fit” to their effects is such that if the genes and the eventual structure produced (the phenotype) do not match, what we have is a case of unfulfilled instructions rather than inaccurate descriptions. Alternatively, perhaps it is possible to think that the genes are telling the developing phenotype the environment it can expect. For the gene pool from which those genes have been drawn has been filtered by selection. In arid regions of Australia, genes which contributed to the development of leaves whose shape and surface restricted water loss have become common. Hence perhaps we can see these genes as telling the trees: conditions will be dry (for this line of thought, see Shea 2011, 2013).

In making sense of these ideas, the usual way to proceed has been to make use of a rich concept of biological function, in which the function of an entity derives from a history of natural selection (see Teleological Notions in Biology). This move is familiar from the philosophy of mind, where similar problems arise in the explanation of the semantic properties of mental states (Millikan 1984). When an entity has been subject to and shaped by a history of natural selection, this can provide the grounding for a kind of purposive or normative description of the causal capacities of that entity. To use the standard example (Wright 1973), the function of a heart is to pump blood, not to make thumping sounds, because it is the former effect that has led to hearts being favored by natural selection. The hope is that a similar “teleofunctional” strategy might help make sense of the semantic properties of genes, and perhaps other biological structures with semantic properties.

The idea of a teleosemantic approach to genetic information was developed in an early form by Sterelny et al. (1996); see also Maclaurin (1998). The eminent biologist John Maynard Smith took a similar approach, when he tried to make sense of his own enthusiasm for informational concepts in biology (Maynard Smith 2000; and see also the commentaries that follow Maynard Smith’s article). Eva Jablonka has also defended a version of this idea (Jablonka 2002). Her treatment is more unorthodox, as she seeks to treat environmental signals as having semantic information, along with genes, if they are used by the organism in an appropriate way. Nick Shea has developed the most sophisticated teleosemantic treatment of genes to date (see Shea 2007a,b, 2011, 2013).

One way of developing these ideas is to focus on the evolved functions of the genetic machinery as a whole (Godfrey-Smith 1999). Carl Bergstrom and Martin Rosvall take this approach, emphasising the adapted, impressively engineered features of intergenerational gene flow in developing their “transmission sense of information”. Bergstron and Rosvall point out that intergeneration gene flow is structured so as to make possible the transmission of arbitrary sequences (so the message is relatively unconstrained by the medium); that information is stored compactly and stably; that the bandwidth is large and indefinitely extendable. DNA sequences are reliably replicable with very high fidelity, so transmission is accurate, yet the mapping between DNA and amino acid sequence seems optimised to reduce the impact of those errors that do occur. Many point mutations are mapped onto the same or a chemically similar amino acid. Bergstrom and Rosvall conclude both that DNA replication is an exquisitely designed information channel, and that we can tell this from the characteristics of the DNA-amino acid system itself. We do not need to know what signals from the parental generation say to the offspring generation, in order to know that the characteristics of DNA replication are explained by its information-carrying capacities (Bergstrom and Rosvall 2011).

The more usual route, and the one taken both by Sterelny et al. (1996) and by Maynard Smith (2000) is to focus on the natural selection of particular genetic elements. That view faces an immediate problem, for the fact that specific genetic elements (or the genetic system as a whole) have an evolved function is clearly not sufficient for genes to carry semantic information. Legs are for walking, but they do not represent walking. Enzymes are for catalyzing reactions, but they do not instruct this activity. There are things that legs and enzymes are supposed to do, but this does not make them into information-carriers, in a rich beyond-Shannon sense. Why should it do so for genes? Sterelny, Smith and Dickison (1996), suggested that the differences between genes and legs is that genes have been selected to play a causal role in developmental processes. They add, however, that any non-genetic factors that have a similar developmental role, and have been selected to play that role, also have semantic properties. So Sterelny, Smith and Dickison want to ascribe very rich semantic properties to genes, but not only to genes. Some non-genetic factors have the same status. Even so, many quite plausible cases turn out not to be informational on this view: prolactin, like most hormones, does not have a specifically developmental function, so it would not count as carrying information to the mammary glands. This is one reason why Levy thinks of talk of information as merely metaphorical (Levy 2011). In contrast to the views of Sterelny, Smith and Dickison, in his 2000 paper, John Maynard Smith argued that only genes carry semantic information about phenotypes. He suggested that in contrast to other developmental resources, the relationship between adapted gene and phenotypic outcome is arbitrary; the gene-trait relationship is like the word-object relationship. This idea is intriguing but hard to make precise. One problem is that any causal relation can look “arbitrary” if it operates via many intervening links, for there are many possible interventions on those links which would change the product of the causal chain. The problem of arbitrariness is discussed further in section 4.

To distinguish between ordinary biological functions and representational functions, Nicholas Shea draws upon the more elaborate machinery of Ruth Millikan’s teleosemantic theory. For Millikan, any object that has semantic properties plays a role that involves a kind of mediation between two “cooperating devices”, a producer and a consumer device. In the case of an indicative signal or representation, the representation is supposed to affect the activities of the consumer in a way that will only further the performance of the consumer’s biological functions if some state of affairs obtains. In the case of an imperative representation, the representation is supposed to affect the activities of the consumer by inducing them to bring some state of affairs about. Shea treats genetic messages as having both indicative and imperative content, and depending on both producers and consumers (Shea 2007b, 2011, 2013). Where Shea follows Millikan in emphasizing the roles of both producers and consumers, Jablonka (2002) tries to achieve as much as possible with an emphasis on consumer mechanisms alone. It seems clear that the attention to producer and consumer mechanisms is a step forward in this discussion, but we will see in section 5 that it also poses problems. In thinking about both inheritance and development, it turns out to be unclear whether there are independently identifiable mechanisms which count as senders and receivers, producers and consumers.

The overall picture envisaged by the teleosemantic approach has undeniably appealing structural features. If this program succeeds, we would have an uncontroversial sense of information, via Shannon, that applies to all sorts of physical correlations. This picture can then be developed by identifying a subset of cases in which these signals have been co-opted or produced to drive biological processes. In addition, perhaps we can appeal to rich semantic properties in cases where we have the right kind of history of natural selection to explain the distinctive role of genes, and perhaps other factors, in development. Genes and a handful of non-genetic factors would have these properties; most environmental features that have a causal role in biological development would not. There remain many problems of detail, but the appeal of the overall picture provides, at least for some, good reason to persevere with some account along these lines.

4. The genetic code

So far we have mostly discussed the concept of information; there has not been much talk of “coding”. With the exception of our discussion of Bergstrom and Rosvall’s “transmission sense” of information, the discussion so far has not emphasised the distinctive features of the cell-level processes in which genes figure, such as the language-like combinatorial structure of the “genetic code”. These structural features of DNA and its relation to amino acids are not central to some of the ideas about information in biology, even when the focus is on development and inheritance. As noted above, the enthusiasm for semantic characterization of biological structures extends back before the genetic code was discovered (see Kay 2000 for a detailed historical treatment). But one line of thought in the literature, overlapping with the ideas above, has focused on the special features of genetic mechanisms, and on the idea of “genetic coding” as a contingent feature of these mechanisms.

Both Peter Godfrey-Smith and Paul Griffiths have argued that there is one highly restricted use of a fairly rich semantic notion within genetics that is justified (Godfrey-Smith 2000; Griffiths 2001). This is the idea that genes “code for” the amino acid sequence of protein molecules, in virtue of the peculiar features of the “transcription and translation” mechanisms found within cells. Genes specify amino acid sequence via a templating process that involves a regular mapping rule between two quite different kinds of molecules (nucleic acid bases and amino acids). This mapping rule is combinatorial, and apparently arbitrary (in a sense that is hard to make precise, though see Stegmann 2004 for discussion of different versions of this idea).

Figure 1 below has the standard genetic code summarized. The three-letter abbreviations such as “Phe” and “Leu” are types of amino acid molecules.

[A 4x4 matrix, the top is labeled 'Second Letter' and the 4 columns labeled T, C, A, G. The left side is labeled 'First Letter' and the rows labeled T, C, A, G.  The right side is labeled 'Third Letter' and the rows on that side labeled 'TCAG', 'TCAG', 'TCAG', 'TCAG'.  The 16 cells each contain 4 rows of 3 letters on the left and then one or more of those rows are labeled on the right.  From left to right then top to bottom there are: 
1st cell TTT and TTC bracketed and labeled Phe, TTA and TTG bracketed and labeled Leu; 
2nd cell TCT, TCC, TCA, TCG bracketed and labeled Ser; 
3rd cell TAT and TAC bracketed and labeled Tyr, TAA labeled Stop (in red letters), TAG labeled Stop (in red letters); 
4th cell TGT and TGC bracketed and labeled Cys, TGA labeled Stop (in red letters), TGG labeled Trp; 
5th cell CTT, CTC, CTA, CTG bracketed and labeled Leu; 
6th cell CCT, CCC, CCA, CCG bracketed and labeled Pro; 
7th cell CAT and  CAC bracketed and labeled His, CAA and CAG bracketed and labeled  Gin; 
8th cell CGT, CGC, CGA, CGG bracketed and labeled Arg;
9th cell ATT, ATC, ATA bracketed and labeled lle, ATG labeled Met;
10th cell ACT, ACC, ACA, ACG bracketed and labeled Thr;
11th cell AAT and AAC bracketed and labeled Asn, AAA and AAG bracketed and labeled Lys;
12th cell AGT and AGC bracketed and labeled Ser, AGA and AGG bracketed and labeled Arg;
13th cell GTT, GTC, GTA, GTG bracketed and labeled Val;
14th cell GCT, GCC, GCA, GCG bracketed and labeled Ala;
15th cell GAT and GAC bracketed and labeled Asp, GAA and GAG labeled Glu;
16th cell GGT, GGC, GGA, GGG bracketed and labeled Gly]

Figure 1. The Standard Genetic Code

This very narrow understanding of the informational properties of genes is basically in accordance with the influential early proposal of Francis Crick (1958). The argument is that these low-level mechanistic features make gene expression into a causal process that has significant analogies to paradigmatic symbolic phenomena.

Some have argued that this analogy becomes questionable once we move from the genetics of simple prokaryotic organisms (bacteria and archaea), to those in eukaryotic cells (Sarkar 1996). Mainstream biology tends to regard the complications that arise in the case of eukaryotes as mere details that do not compromise the basic picture we have of how gene expression works (for an extensive discussion of these complexities, by those who think they really matter, see (Griffiths and Stotz 2013)). An example is the editing and “splicing” of mRNA transcripts. The initial stage in gene expression is the use of DNA in a template process to construct an intermediate molecule, mRNA or “messenger RNA”, that is then used as a template in the manufacture of a protein. The protein is made by stringing a number of amino acid molecules together. In eukaryotes the mRNA is often extensively modified (“edited”) prior to its use. Moreover, much of the DNA in a eukaryotic organism is not transcribed and translated at all. Some of this “non-coding” DNA (note the informational language again) is certainly functional, serving as binding sites for proteins that bind to the DNA thus regulating the timing and rate of transcription. The extent of wholly nonfunctional DNA remains unclear. These facts make eukaryotic DNA a much less straightforward predictor of the protein’s amino acid sequence than it is in bacteria, but it can be argued that this does not much affect the crucial features of gene expression mechanisms that motivate the introduction of a symbolic or semantic mode of description.

So the argument in Godfrey-Smith (2000) and Griffiths (2001) is that there is one kind of informational or semantic property that genes and only genes have: coding for the amino acid sequences of protein molecules. But this relation “reaches” only as far as the amino acid sequence. It does not vindicate the idea that genes code for whole-organism phenotypes, let alone provide a basis for the wholesale use of informational or semantic language in biology. Genes can have a reliable causal role in the production of a whole-organism phenotype, of course. But if this causal relation is to be described in informational terms, then it is a matter of ordinary Shannon information, which applies to environmental factors as well. That said, it is possible to argue that the specificity of gene action, and the existence of an array of actual and possible alternatives at a given site on a chromosome, means that genes exert fine-grained causal control over phenotypes, and that few other developmental resources exert this form of causal control (Waters 2007; Maclaurin 1998; Stegmann 2014). In contrast, Griffiths and Stotz (2013) say that these other factors are often a source of “Crick information”, as they contribute to specifying the linear sequence of a gene product. We return to this issue in section 6.

One of the most appealing, but potentially problematic, features of the idea that genes code for amino acid sequences concerns the alleged “arbitrariness” of the genetic code. The notion of arbitrariness figures in other discussions of genetic information as well (Maynard Smith 2000; Sarkar 2003; Stegmann 2004). It is common to say that the standard genetic code has arbitrary features, as many other mappings between DNA base triplets and amino acids would be biologically possible, if there were compensating changes in the machinery by which “translation” of the genetic message is achieved. Francis Crick suggested that the structure of the genetic code should be seen as a “frozen accident”, one that was initially highly contingent but is now very hard for evolution to change (Crick 1958). But the very idea of arbitrariness, and the hypothesis of a frozen accident, have become problematic. For one thing, as noted in our discussion of Bergstrom and Rosvall (2011) above, the code is not arbitrary in the sense that many others would work as well. To the contrary, the existing code is near-optimal for minimising error costs. Conceptually, it seems that any causal relation can look “arbitrary” if it operates via many intervening links. There is nothing “arbitrary” about the mechanisms by which each molecular binding event occurs. What makes the code seem arbitrary is the fact that the mapping between base triplets and amino acids is mediated by a causal chain with a number of intervening links (especially involving “transfer RNA” molecules, and enzymes that bind amino acids to these intervening molecules). Because we often focus on the “long-distance” connection between DNA and protein, the causal relation appears arbitrary. If we focused on steps in any other biological cascade that are separated by three or four intervening links, the causal relation would look just as “arbitrary”. So the very idea of arbitrariness is elusive. And empirically, the standard genetic code is turning out to have more systematic and non-accidental structure than people had once supposed (Knight, Freeland, and Landweber 1999). The notion of arbitrariness has also been used in discussions of the links between genes and phenotypes in a more general sense. Kirscher and Gerhart (2005) discuss a kind of arbitrariness that derives from the details of protein molecules and their relation to gene regulation. Proteins that regulate gene action tend to have distinct binding sites, which evolution can change independently. To bind, a protein must be able to attach to a site, but that requires congruence only with a local feature of the protein, not sharply constraining its overall shape (Planer 2014). This gives rise to a huge range of possible processes of gene regulation. So there is a perennial temptation to appeal to the idea of arbitrariness when discussing the alleged informational nature of some biological causation.

5. Signalling systems

In section 2, we noted that Brian Skyrms’ work on signalling systems has made this framework a very natural fit for a quite large range of biological phenomena. As we remarked above, it is very intuitive to see hormones such as insulin, testosterone, and growth hormone as signals, as they are produced in one part of the body, and travel to other parts where they interact with “receptors” in a way that modifies the activities of various other structures. It is routine to describe hormones as “chemical messages”. The Skyrms framework fits these designed cause and response systems within biological agents for three reasons. First, as noted, this framework shows that signalling does not require intelligence or an intelligent grasp of signal meaning.

Second, the simplest cases for models of signalling are cases in which there is common interest. The sender and receiver are advantaged or disadvantaged by the same outcomes. While complete common interest is atypical of organism-to-organism communication, the cells and other structures within an organism share a common fate (with complex exceptions). So in this respect the base models might fit organ-to-organ communication better than they fit between-organism phenomena.

Third, in many of these biological systems, the abstract structure specified as a signalling system—environmental source, sender, message, receiver, response—maps very naturally onto concrete biological mechanisms. For example, Ron Planer has recently argued that we should see gene expression as the operation of a signalling system (Planer 2014). His view is quite nuanced, for the identity of the sender, receiver, and message vary somewhat from case to case. For example, when a protein is a transcription factor, then the gene counts as a sender. He treats other gene-protein relations differently. The details of his view need not concern us here. The point is that there is machinery in the cell—genes, proteins mRNA transcripts, ribosomes and their associated tRNA—that can be plausibly mapped onto sender-receiver systems. There is nothing forced about mapping the information-processing sender-receiver structure onto the molecular machinery of the cell.

However, while this framework very naturally fits within cell and between cell processes, it is much less clear how naturally other suggestions mesh with this framework. For example, in the Bergstrom-Rosvall picture of intergenerational transmission, who or what are the senders and receivers? Perhaps in the case of multicelled organisms, the receiver exists independently of and prior to the message. For an egg is a complex and highly structured system, before gene expression begins in the fertilised nucleus, and that structure plays an important role in guiding that gene expression (Sterelny 2009; Gilbert 2013). But most organisms are single celled prokaryotes, and when they fission, it is not obvious that there is a daughter who exists prior to and independently of the intergenerational genetic message she is to receive.

Likewise, Nicholas Shea’s Millikan-derived analysis does not seem to map naturally onto independently specifiable biological mechanisms. For him, the sender of genetic messages is natural selection operating on and filtering the gene pool of a population; messages are read by the developmental system of the organism as a whole (Shea 2013). But the less clearly a sender-receiver or producer-consumer framework maps onto independently recognised biological mechanisms, the more plausible a fictionalist or analogical analysis of that case becomes. So we see an important difference between a reader being the developmental system as a whole, and reader being a receptor on a cell membrane. The cell-level machinery of transcription and translation (the ribosomal/tRNA machinery, especially) really is a reader or consumer of nucleic acid sequences, with the function of creating protein products that will have a variety of uses elsewhere in the cell. But this realization of the causal schematism applies only at the cell level, at the level at which the transcription and translation apparatus shows up as a definite part of the machinery. One of the most extraordinary features of ontogeny is that it proceeds reliably and predictably without any central control of the development of the organism as a whole. There is nothing, for example, that checks whether the left-side limbs are the same size as the right side limbs, intervening to ensure symmetry. Similarly, there are DNA sequence-readers, and some intercellular sender-receiver systems with clear “readers” (such as neural structures), but there are no higher-level readers that interpret a message specifying the structure of a whole limb-bud in the embryo.

6. Rejections of informational concepts in biology

Some biologists and philosophers have argued that the introduction of informational and semantic concepts has had a bad effect on biology, that it fosters various kinds of explanatory illusions and distortions, perhaps along with ontological confusion. Here we will survey some of the more emphatic claims of this kind, but some degree of unease can be detected in many other discussions (see, for example, Griesemer 2005).

The movement known as Developmental Systems Theory (DST) has often opposed the mainstream uses of informational concepts in biology, largely because of the idea that these concepts distort our understanding of the causal processes in which genes are involved. For a seminal discussion, see Oyama (1985), and also Lehrman (1970); Griffiths and Gray (1994); Griffiths and Neumann-Held (1999). These theorists have two connected objections to the biological use of informational notions. One is the idea that informational models are preformationist. Preformationism, in its original form, in effect reduces development to growth: within the fertilized egg there exists a miniature form of the adult to come. Preformationism does not explain how an organized, differentiated adult develops from a much less organized and more homogeneous egg; it denies the phenomenon. DST’s defenders suspect that informational models of development do the same. In supposing, for example, that instructions for a “language organ” are coded in the genome of a new-born baby, you do not explain how linguistic abilities can develop in an organism that lacks them, and you foster the illusion that no such explanation is necessary. (See Francis 2003 for a particularly vigorous version of the idea that the appeal to information leads to pseudo-explanation in biology.)

Second, DST theorists have often endorsed a “parity thesis”: genes play an indispensable role in development, but so do other causal factors, and there is no reason to privilege gene’s contribution to development. This claim is often buttressed by reference to Richard Lewontin’s arguments for the complexity and context sensitivity of developmental interaction, and his consequent arguments that we cannot normally partition the causal responsibility of the genetic and the environmental contributions to specific phenotypic outcomes (Lewontin 1974, 2000). DST theorists think that informational models of genes and gene action make it very tempting to neglect parity, and to attribute a kind of causal primacy to these factors, even though they are just one of a set of essential contributors to the process in question. Once one factor in a complex system is seen in informational terms, the other factors tend to be treated as mere background, as supports rather than bona fide causal actors. It becomes natural to think that the genes direct, control, or organise development; other factors provide essential resources. But, the argument goes, in biological systems the causal role of genes is in fact tightly interconnected with the roles of many other factors (often loosely lumped together as “environmental”). Sometimes a gene will have a reliable effect against a wide range of environmental backgrounds; sometimes an environmental factor will have a reliable effect against a wide range of genetic backgrounds. Sometimes both genetic and environmental causes are highly context-sensitive in their operation. Paul Griffiths has emphasised this issue, arguing that the informational mode of describing genes can foster the appearance of context-independence:

Genes are instructions—they provide information—whilst other causal factors are merely material…. A gay gene is an instruction to be gay even when [because of other factors] the person is straight. (Griffiths 2001: 395–96)

The inferential habits and associations that tend to go along with the use of informational or semantic concepts are claimed to lead us to think of genes as having an additional and subtle form of extra causal specificity. These habits can have an effect even when people are willing to overtly accept context-dependence of (most) causes in complex biological systems. So DST theorists suggest that it is misleading to treat genes and only genes as carrying “messages” that are expressed in their effects. To say this is almost inevitably to treat environmental factors as secondary players.

The parity thesis has been the focus of considerable discussion and response. In a helpful paper, Ulrich Stegmann shows that the parity thesis is really a cluster of theses rather than a single thesis (Stegmann 2012). Some ways of interpreting parity make the idea quite uncontroversial, as no more than an insistence on the complex and interactive character of development, or as pointing to the fact that just as genes come in slightly different versions, with slightly different effects (holding other factors constant), the same is true of nongenetic factors. Epigenetic markers on genes, due to nutritional environments, litter position and birth order, may also come in slightly different variants, with slightly different effects. Other versions of the claim are much more controversial.

One response to the parity thesis has been to accept the view that genes are just one of a set of individually necessary and collectively sufficient developmental factors, but to argue nonetheless that genes play both a distinctive and especially important role in development (Austin 2015; Lean 2014; Planer 2014). As noted above, perhaps the most promising suggestion along these lines is that genes exert a form of causal control over development that is universal, pervasive and fine-grained. Many features of the phenotypes of every organism exist in an array of somewhat different versions, as a result of allelic variation in causally relevant genes. No other developmental factor exerts control that is similarly universal, pervasive and fine-grained (Woodward 2010; Stegmann 2014). Thus Stegmann illustrates Woodward’s idea that genes exert specific control over phenotypes by contrasting the effects of intervening on, say, the quantity of polymerase on cell activity with intervening on the DNA template itself. Polymerase is critically causally important, but varying its concentration will modify the rate of synthesis, but not the sequences produced. That is not true of modifications of the DNA sequence itself, so the DNA sequence is more causally specific than polymerase.

Shea takes a different approach, arguing that different causal factors have different evolutionary histories. Some causal factors are simply persisting features of the environment (gravity being one example). Others are experienced by the developing organism as a result of histories of selection. Burrows, for example, ensure that eggs and nestlings develop in fairly constant temperature and humidity. But burrows are not naturally selected inheritance mechanisms. They have not come into existence to ensure that a seabird chick resembles its parents. In contrast, some other developmental features are present and act in development because of histories of selection in which the selective advantage is that these mechanisms help ensure parent-offspring similarity. Shea argues that genes, probably epigenetic markings on genes, and perhaps a few other developmental resources are shaped by this form of natural selection. So genes, and perhaps a few other developmental factors, play a distinctive developmental role, even though many other factors are causally necessary (Shea 2011).

In sum then, there are good reasons to be cautious about the use of informational terminology in thinking about development. But it is also possible to over-estimate the strength of the connection between informational conceptions of development and the idea that genes play a uniquely important role in development. There are ways of defending the idea that genes play a special role while acknowledging the interactive character of development. Moreover, an ambitious use of informational concepts is not confined to those within mainstream biological thinking. Eva Jablonka and Marion Lamb defend quite heterodox views of inheritance and evolution, while basing key parts of their work—including an advocacy of “Lamarckian” ideas—around informational concepts (Jablonka and Lamb 2005). They suggest that one of the useful features of informational descriptions is that they allow us to generalize across different heredity systems, comparing their properties in a common currency. In addition, one of the present authors has used informational concepts to distinguish between the evolutionary role of genes from that of other inherited factors whilst demonstrating the evolutionary importance of non-genetic inheritance (Sterelny 2004, 2011). So in various ways, an informational point of view may facilitate discussion of unorthodox theoretical options, including non-genetic mechanisms of inheritance.

7. Genetic programs

Talk of genetic “programs” is common both in popular presentations of biology, and in biology itself. Often, the idea is just a vivid (but perhaps misleading) way of drawing attention to the orderly, well-controlled and highly structured character of development. In its overall results, development is astonishingly stable and predictable, despite the extraordinary complexity of intracellular and intercellular interactions, and despite the fact that the physical context in which development takes place can never be precisely controlled. So when biologists speak, for example, of “programmed cell death”, they could just as well say that in an important class of cases, cell death is predictable, organised, and adaptive.

There are attempts to draw closer and more instructive parallels between computational systems and biological development. In particular, Roger Sansom has made a sustained and detailed attempt to develop close and instructive parallels between biological development and connectionist computational models (Sansom 2008b,a, 2011). This view has the merit of recognising that there is no central control of development; organisms develop as a result of local interactions within and between cells. However, the most promising ideas about program-development parallels seem to us to be ones that point to an apparently close analogy between processes within cells, and the low-level operation of modern computers. One crucial kind of causal process within cells is cascades of up and down-regulation in genetic networks. One gene will make a product that binds to and hence down-regulates another gene, which is then prevented from making a product that up-regulates another… and so on. What we have here is a cascade of events that can often be described in terms of Boolean relationships between variables. One event might only follow from the conjunction of another two, or from a disjunction of them. Down-regulation is a kind of negation, and there can be double and triple negations in a network. Gene regulation networks often have a rich enough structure of this kind for it to be useful to think of them as engaged in a kind of computation. Computer chip “and-gates”, neural “and-gates” and genetic “and-gates” have genuine similarities.

While talking of signalling networks rather than programs, Brett Calcott has shown that positional information in the developing fruitfly embryo depends on this kind of Boolean structure, with limb bud development depending on the cells that differentiate into limb buds integrating one positive with two negative signals, so the buds develop in a regular pattern on the anterior midline of the embryo. Calcott shows that thinking of development in terms of these signalling networks with their Boolean structures has real explanatory value, for it enables us to explain how positional information, for example, can easily be reused in evolution. Wing spots on fruitflies can evolve very easily, for the networks that tell cells where they are on the wing already exist, so the evolution of the wingspot just need a simple mutational change that links that positional information to pigment production (Calcott 2014). Ron Planer agrees that gene regulation has this Boolean structure, and that we can, in effect, represent each gene as instantiating a conditional instruction. The “if” part of the conditional specifies the molecular conditions which turn the gene on; the “then” part of the conditional specifies the amino acid sequence made from the gene. As with Calcott, Planer goes on to point out that these conditional instructions can be and often are, linked together to build complex networks of control. Even so, Planer argues that while these are signalling networks, they should not be thought of as computer programs. For example, the combinations of instructions have no intrinsic order; we can represent each of the genes as a specific conditional instruction, but there is nothing in the set of instructions itself that tells us where to begin and end (Planer 2014).

8. Information and evolution

Information has also become a focus of general discussion of evolutionary processes, especially as they relate to the mechanisms of inheritance. One strand of this discussion misconceives information and its role in biological processes. In particular, G.C. Williams argues that, via reflection on the role of genes in evolution, we can infer that there is an informational “domain” that exists alongside the physical domain of matter and energy (Williams 1992). Richard Dawkins defends a similar view, arguing that the long-term path of evolution is made up of gradual changes in inherited information—as a river that “flows through time, not space” (Dawkins 1995: 4). This is an extension of a more common idea, that there exists such things as “informational genes” that should be understood as distinct from the “material genes” that are made of DNA and localized in space and time (Haig 1997). It is a mistake to think that there are two different things; that there is both a physical entity—a string of bases—and an informational entity, a message. It is true that for evolutionary (and many other) purposes genes are often best thought of in terms of their base sequence (the sequence of C, A, T and G), not in terms of their full set of material properties. This way of thinking is essentially a piece of abstraction (Griesemer 2005). We rightly ignore some properties of DNA and focus on others. But it is a mistake to treat this abstraction as an extra entity, with mysterious relations to the physical domain.

Other ways of linking informational ideas to general issues in evolutionary theory seem more promising. As John Maynard Smith, Eors Szathmáry, Mark Ridley and Richard Dawkins have emphasized in different ways, inheritance mechanisms that give rise to significant evolutionary outcomes must satisfy some rather special conditions (Dawkins 1995; Jablonka and Szathmáry 1995; Szathmáry and Maynard Smith 1997; Ridley 2000). Maynard Smith and Szathmáry claim, for example, that the inheritance system must be unlimited or “indefinite” in its capacity to produce new combinations, but must also maintain high fidelity of transmission. This fact about the relationship between inheritance systems and biological structure is often thought to reveal one of the most pressing problems in explaining the origins of life. If reproduction depends on the replication of a crucial set of ingredients to kick-start the new generation (whether or not we think of those ingredients as instructions), these ingredients must be replicated accurately. Yet accurate replication apparently depends on complex molecular and intracellular machinery that itself is the result of a long regime of adaptive evolution, and hence on deep lineages of living systems. So how could reproduction have begun? (see Ridley 2000 for a thoughtful discussion).

So life itself, the argument goes, depends on the evolution of mechanisms that support a high fidelity flow of information from one generation to the next. More ambitiously still, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry argue that many of the crucial steps in the last four billion years of evolution—their “major transitions in evolution”—involve the creation of new ways of transmitting information across generations—more reliable, more fine-grained, and more powerful ways of making possible the reliable re-creation of form across events of biological reproduction. The transition to a DNA-based inheritance system (probably from a system based on RNA) is one central example. But Maynard Smith and Szathmáry suggest that the transition from great ape forms of social life to human social life is a major transition, in part because of the novel forms of large scale cooperation that typify human social life, but mostly because they see human language as a breakthrough informational technology, revolutionising the possibilities of high fidelity intergenerational cultural learning (MacArthur 1958; Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995, 1999).

Maynard Smith and Szathmáry’s work on major transitions has been a landmark in macroevolutionary thinking—in thinking about large scale patterns in the history of life. But the informational dimension of their work has not been taken up. A minor exception is Sterelny (2009). This paper argued that multicelled animal life depended not just on the transmission of more information with high fidelity, but on the control of that information in development, suggesting that the evolution of the egg—a controlled, structured, information-rich developmental environment—was critical to complex animal life. But most focus has been on the other strand of their work on major transitions: on the solution of cooperation problems that then allow previously independent agents to combine into new, more complex agents. Thus in Calcott and Sterelny (2011), none of the papers focused primarily on the expansion or control of intergenerational information flow. That may change. The evolutionarily crucial features of inheritance mechanisms are often now discussed in informational terms, and the combinatorial structure seen in both language and DNA provides a powerful basis for analogical reasoning.


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