Philosophical attention to animals can be found in a wide range of texts throughout the history of philosophy, including discussions of animal classification in Aristotle and Ibn Bâjja, of animal rationality in Porphyry, Chrysippus, Aquinas and Kant, of mental continuity and the nature of the mental in Dharmakīrti, Telesio, Conway, Descartes, Cavendish, and Voltaire, of animal self-consciousness in Ibn Sina, of understanding what others think and feel in Zhuangzi, of animal emotion in Śāntarakṣita and Bentham, and of human cultural uniqueness in Xunzi. In recent years, there has been increased attention to animal minds in philosophical discussions across many areas of metaphysics, epistemology, and value theory. Given that nonhuman animals share some biological and psychological features with humans, and that we share community, land, and other resources, consideration of nonhuman animals has much to contribute to our philosophical activities.
Contemporary philosophy of animal minds often also engages with the sciences of animal cognition and behavior. The science of comparative cognition is a thriving area of research, complementing the philosophical study in two ways. For one, philosophers of animal cognition can use claims resulting from animal cognition studies as premises in philosophical discussions. For example, Jacob Beck (2012) relies on pigeons’ abilities to compare quantities to argue for nonconceptual content; Sidney Carls-Diamante (forthcoming) appeals to octopus behavior and physiology to defend embodied cognition; Richard Moore (2016a) refers to ape gestural communication to rethink the requirements for intentional communication; Andrew Barron and Colin Klein (2016) appeal to insect cognition research to defend new theories of consciousness; Sarah Vincent, Rebecca Ring, and Kristin Andrews (2019) cite dolphins’ social practices to argue for the existence of norms that do not require metacognition.
In addition, philosophers of animal cognition can examine the epistemology and methods used to justify the claims that arise from the science. Research into animal cognition has resulted in surprising claims about animal capacities, such as sociality in garter snakes (Skinner & Miller 2020), tool-use in ants (Maák et al. 2017), mirror self-recognition in fish (Kohda et al. 2019), empathy in rats (Bartal et al. 2011), social learning in fruit flies (Danchin et al. 2018), episodic memory in dogs (Fugazza et al. 2020), addition and subtraction in bees (Howard et al. 2019). How should we evaluate such claims?
Some philosophers have argued that animal cognition research is held to a higher standard than human cognition research, and that scientists working with animals are sometimes asked to solve skeptical problems (Halina 2015). Others have challenged scientific assumptions about the relationship between brain size and intelligence, as well as biases against invertebrates (Mikhalevich & Powell 2020).
Animal cognition research challenges philosophers to consider that many capacities and behaviors often assumed to require language, sophisticated technological capacities, or legal systems may in fact be had by other animals who lack these properties. In this way, animal cognition research often surprises us by showing that sophisticated-looking activity can be caused through rather simple mechanisms.
- 1. What is Animal Cognition?
- 2. Philosophical Assumptions in the Study of Animal Cognition
- 3. Animal Cognition Applied to Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What is Animal Cognition?
Cognition is often understood to be what permits flexible goal-oriented behavior through information processing. Comparative cognition research examines which animal behaviors are cognitive, and what sort of cognitive mechanisms or processes permit that behavior. Questions include: What sort of representations do animals need to solve particular tasks; do they have mental maps, metacognition, or number concepts? How do animals learn; do they only have associative learning processes, or do they also learn through trial-and-error, play, insight, or social imitation? How do animals solve problems; do they engage in logical reasoning, causal reasoning, future planning? Philosophers take up these questions, and complement them with questions of their own, such as: Do animals have beliefs? Which animals are conscious? What is the relationship between language and thought? Are animals rational? Answering any of these questions requires both scientific investigation into the phenomenon and conceptual analysis of the psychological property at stake. The philosophy of animal minds promises to help us gain a deeper understanding of familiar concepts by exploring them in a new and sometimes foreign context—in the lives and communities of other species.
Videos of animals engaged in surprising behaviors, such as an orangutan washing clothes and sawing wood or a dog using buttons to “speak” (see Other Internet Resources), might suggest that these animals are smart or intelligent. The idea that some animals are smarter than others might also lead you to expect that research in animal cognition focuses on animals such as chimpanzees, elephants, dolphins, dogs, or ravens—all species that often make the news with reports of their amazing abilities. But animal cognition research is just as interested in research on worms, honeybees, snakes, stickleback fish, chickadees, and spiders, though there remains quite a bit of cognition research on the behaviorist standbys of pigeons and rats.
Furthermore, animal cognition research tends to eschew questions of which animals are smarter than others, focusing instead on more specific questions like the ones above. Scientists often say that they are more interested in how well an animal evolved to thrive in their environment, rather than in how smart they are. This way of thinking about intelligence makes comparing intelligence between species moot (though it is a topic that is largely unexplored by philosophers of animal minds).
Contemporary research in animal cognition has as its roots Charles Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection, and Darwin’s thesis of the continuity of the mental across species:
the difference in mind between man and the higher animals, great as it is, certainly is one of degree and not of kind. (Darwin 1874: 126, with a minor variation 1871: 105)
In On the Origin of Species (1859), he avoided comparing humans with other animals, as well as foregoing any discussion of the evolution of psychological capacities. In his follow up book, The Descent of Man (1871 [second edition 1874]), Darwin turned to compare the psychological capacities across species. In introducing Chapter 3 (chapter 2 in the first edition), he wrote:
If no organic being excepting man had possessed any mental power, or if his powers had been of a wholly different nature from those of the lower animals, then we should never have been able to convince ourselves that our high faculties had been gradually developed. But it can be shewn that there is no fundamental difference of this kind. We must also admit that there is a much wider interval in mental power between one of the lowest fishes, as a lamprey or lancelet, and one of the higher apes, than between an ape and man; yet this interval is filled up by numberless gradations. (Darwin 1874: 65, with a couple of minor variations 1871: 34–35).
Darwin’s talk of higher and lower suggests that some animals are less intelligent than others, and that humans, with our advanced mental powers, are on top. But that interpretation is in contrast with how comparative psychologists like to think about animals, as different rather than as higher or lower. Furthermore, in The Origin Darwin insisted that evolution by natural selection is non-hierarchical—just changes in response to the environment rather than a gradual improvement from lower to higher beings.
While Darwin is known for his thesis that there is continuity between humans and other animals in their morphological and psychological properties, one might be forgiven for thinking that Darwin was sometimes overly hasty in ascribing some human properties to animals. In The Descent, Darwin discusses cases of horses and dogs who are ill-tempered and sulky, a baboon and a dog who recognized friendly people after years apart, dreaming canaries, elephants who blow on out-of-reach objects to bring them closer, a bear who pawed the water to draw in a floating object, a monkey who kept a stone hidden in his bedding that he used to crack nuts, and female birds who are attracted to male songs and bright colors. Darwin takes these cases to suggest animal emotion, memory, imagination, reason, property, and aesthetic sensibility.
The theory of evolution by natural selection suggests that there will be differences as well as similarities across species. Just as Darwin’s finches have different beak shapes depending on the food available on their island, psychological difference should be expected given different environmental pressures. Thus, a Darwinian approach to animal cognition will emphasize differences as well as similarities. Problems arise when the focus is only on questions about similarities without also attending to questions about differences, and vice versa, as we will see in section 2.
While Darwin may be seen as the progenitor of modern animal cognition research, many other scientists have played a role, leading to the vibrant interdisciplinary research we see today. Learning theorists who look carefully at the mechanisms that lead to acquiring new knowledge arose from the behaviorist methods of John Watson and B.F. Skinner. Field researchers owe much to the classical ethologists Nikolaas Tinbergen, Konrad Lorenz, and Karl von Frisch. Considerations of animal culture found their own progenitor in the work of ecologist and anthropologist Kinji Imanishi, who saw social transmission in animals as the same process that supports human cultural learning. The idea of creating puzzles for animals to solve can be traced back to psychologist Edward Thorndike’s puzzle boxes for cats. The rejuvenation of interest in animal consciousness finds an early defense in psychologist Margaret Floy Washburn, whose textbook The Animal Mind: A Text-book of Comparative Psychology (1908) was widely used in psychology for the first third of the twentieth century. The interface between psychology, anthropology, and biology is where most of the research in animal cognition can be found today.
Comparative cognition is the scientific study of animal cognitive capacities that recognizes humans as animals and acknowledges that all animals are evolved biological organisms. It also recognizes that there are species-specific capacities as well as individual differences, and that these capacities are a part of the natural world that can be studied using familiar scientific methods. Animal cognition focuses on capacities and psychological states that are causally effective in behavior, and thus the study of animal cognition can be understood broadly to include all topics that philosophers cover under the notion of mind.
For some, the current philosophical interest in comparative cognition was inspired by series of books written by zoologist Donald Griffin arguing for animal thinking and animal consciousness (Griffin 1976 , 1985, 1992 ), topics that were not at the time taken up by scientists. Collaborations between scientists and philosophers provided a rich environment for initial work on these issues. Notably, in philosopher Colin Allen and biologist Marc Bekoff’s book Species of Mind: The Philosophy and Biology of Cognitive Ethology (1997), the interdisciplinary team introduced many issues arising in the science of animal minds to the broader philosophical community.
Philosophers of animal minds are sometimes interested in epistemic virtues related to how the claims of the science are generated and justified, and whether the concepts being used in scientific studies are reasonable. Philosophers of animal minds are also sometimes interested in how the findings of scientific studies can serve as premises in philosophical arguments. In the remainder of this entry we will explore both of these aspects.
2. Philosophical Assumptions in the Study of Animal Cognition
One of the ways in which philosophy connects to the study of animal cognition has to do with the fact that, as with any science, there are numerous philosophical assumptions embedded in the practice of comparative cognition research. Scientists, like all humans, make choices about how to use terms, they are swayed to formulate questions and seek data given the values they have, they have assumptions about the topics under study, as well as views about what makes for a scientifically respectable interpretation of data and the virtues of a good scientific explanation. Scientists have the goal of seeking objectivity, but seeking objectivity can itself introduce new biases, as we know from work in the philosophy of science on objectivity and feminist philosophy of science. This is as true in animal cognition research as in any other science (Andrews 2020c).
Philosophical assumptions in animal cognition research are present, most obviously, in how the capacities under study are defined. For instance, when scientists embark on an experimental project to determine whether a certain species has capacities such as altruism, cooperation, or empathy, they assume a certain definition of these terms. These definitions are often operational, meaning that they focus on the behavioral or physiological reactions that one would have to see in an animal to confirm that they possess this capacity. But even operational definitions come with philosophical baggage. For instance, some scientists consider that finding emotional contagion in an animal is enough to claim that that species is capable of empathy. This presupposes that a particular philosophical account of empathy is true, and not others. Some phenomenological accounts of empathy, for instance, do not require emotional state-matching (Zahavi & Overgaard 2012), and so, under these accounts, finding emotional contagion in an animal would not suffice to claim that they are capable of empathy.
Simply stating how one uses a particular term might seem to be good science, for this is thought to offer clarity regarding what exactly is being studied. Terms are often defined without any argumentation, or simply by reproducing the definition given by another scientist or one that is generally accepted in a certain scientific tradition. However, different definitions come with different assumptions and implications. They can establish which animals we study in search for a certain capacity, the methods we use to study it, and what counts as evidence for that capacity. Moreover, determining that an animal has this or that capacity can have profound ethical implications, so how we choose to use our terms is far from normatively neutral.
This discussion of how terms are used in science is a starting point for understanding the theory-ladenness and value-ladenness of science. Considerations from the philosophy of science can help to bring to light how the choices scientists make impact the research. We will next consider how value-ladenness, theory-ladenness, concerns about objectivity, and appeals to the virtue of simplicity impact comparative cognition research.
Observations and definitions of terms can be theory-laden, in that they depend on a set of theoretical assumptions for their interpretation. Theory plays a role in background assumptions in animal cognition about the continuity or discontinuity of the mental across species, or regarding the relationship between certain behaviors and certain capacities, or how best to get good results from research subjects.
For example, Darwin’s perception of psychological continuity between species is an example of a theory-laden commitment that shapes how the data is perceived. Among today’s scientists, there is a diversity of views about continuity and discontinuity. Some scientists may be described as “romantic” because they take animals and humans to share many psychological properties the way Darwin described it. Other scientists may be described as “killjoy” because they deny many human capacities to animals. This terminology, first used by Daniel Dennett (1983), and criticized by Sara Shettleworth (2010b), highlights an example of a theory-laden approach to science. Attempts to avoid working from one of these two perspectives are attempts to find objectivity, which as we will see admits of its own challenges.
Animal cognition research can also be theory-laden within particular research paradigms. We can look at two current examples. The decades-long use of the false belief task as a measure for theory of mind in children and animals can be traced back to three commentaries on a scientific study of theory of mind (Premack & Woodruff 1978) by philosophers Dennett (1978), Jonathan Bennett (1978), and Gilbert Harman (1978), who first suggested this methodology. The suggestion reflected current philosophical theorizing associated with functionalism in the philosophy of mind, and a theory of action according to which behaviors are caused by propositional attitudes—beliefs and desires.
Another example is seen in research on social learning and imitation in nonhuman great apes that is grounded in the theory that the significant difference between humans and other animals rests on the cumulative nature of human culture (e.g., Dennett 2017; Henrich 2016; Heyes 2018; Sterelny 2012; Tomasello 2016). According to this theory, humans learn cultural behavior by a process of high-fidelity imitation in which even causally irrelevant aspects of the behavior are copied—overimitation—and subsequent generations innovate improvements that lead to an ever-growing technological society. Overimitation is understood here to be a capacity towards which humans are strongly drawn and that is thought to be driven by social factors, such as a desire to “fit in”. Great apes have been tested for overimitation several times and scientists have failed to find robust evidence that they overimitate (though, complicating this story, there is evidence that chimpanzees sometimes overimitate those with whom they have a long-term relationship (Myowa-Yamakoshi & Matsuzawa 2000) and that domestic dogs sometimes overimitate their human companion (Huber et al. 2018; Huber et al. 2020)). In contrast, young children will readily overimitate the actions of selective experimenters (Clay & Tennie 2018). Scientists have described this pattern of results as a “failure” on behalf of the apes and a “success” on behalf of the children, and are taken to bolster the claim that apes lack cumulative culture given theories of cultural learning.
Philosophers of science have highlighted that scientific studies are also value-laden, insofar as scientists’ values shape how they do their science and the data that it ultimately delivers. This is also evident in the study of animal cognition. Values shape the choice of capacities to study. For example, during the twentieth century, a great deal of effort went into attempting to teach various forms of linguistic communication to great apes, an endeavor that stems from the value that humans place on language. Values also shape the methods that scientists use. Experimental evidence coming from labs is often considered more valuable than observational evidence coming from field studies, because the increase in ability to control the different variables that can affect an animal’s performance is thought to compensate for the loss of ecological validity that comes with the highly artificial experimental settings. Values also shape how scientists interpret the results of their studies. The data that an empirical study delivers is useless without an interpretation, and this interpretation cannot be fully disentangled from the values upheld by scientists. This is because scientists have to choose which statistical methods to apply, which theories to accept, and what narrative they follow when writing up the results in a scientific paper.
The research on animal culture is another example of value-ladenness, given that the driving force behind it is a fascination with human culture, and an attempt to map out the cognitive differences between our own and the other ape species that can explain the origins of our uniqueness. This is why the negative results in experiments that have tested for great ape overimitation are described as a “failure” on their behalf. However, by its very definition overimitation is the imitation of actions that are irrelevant to producing the desired goal, so one could easily turn these results on their head and describe this as evidence that apes will go for the more efficient solution to the problem, which children fail to do. The fact that these results are not described this way evidences a value-laden perspective, from which overimitation is seen as a “desirable” capacity, insofar as it is linked to other characteristically human traits, such as rituals, normativity, and cumulative technologies.
Another good example of how the design of studies in comparative cognition is value-laden is the mirror self-recognition (MSR) test, which was originally envisioned by Gordon Gallup (1970) to probe animals’ self-awareness. In this test, an animal is first allowed to become familiarized with a mirror. In a second step, the animal is anesthetized and an odorless mark is painted on their forehead. The behavior of the animal in front of the mirror is then observed, to see whether they interact with the mark, which would be a sign that they understand that the individual in the mirror is themself. Passing the MSR test is viewed as a sign of self-awareness, though whether it shows awareness of one’s own mind or just one’s body is disputed (Heyes 1994, 2008; Povinelli 1998). Leaving aside whether the MSR test actually addresses this capacity, which is an issue of theory-ladenness, we would like to draw attention to the methodology itself. As has long been argued, animals can fail this test for reasons that have nothing to do with their lack of self-awareness. For instance, gorillas’ failure to pass the test has been linked to the fact that this species tends to avoid eye contact with conspecifics, because it is considered a threat (Shillito, Gallup, & Beck 1999). Other species might fail the test because vision is not their primary sensory modality. Dogs, for instance, fail the MSR test but pass an analogous olfactory test (Horowitz 2017). In this alternative, dogs are presented with urine samples from themselves and other dogs. Results show that they spend less time sniffing their own urine marks, which evidences some form of olfactory self-recognition. For humans, however, vision is the primary and most cherished sensory modality and this often leads to study designs that, like the MSR test, are vision-centered. Joint attention, for instance, is measured by means of gaze-following (Carpenter & Call 2013), which Maria Botero (2016) has criticized, arguing that for nonhuman primates touch might also be a medium for joint attention to emerge.
Despite these problems, the MSR test is still treated as the gold standard in the study of self-awareness, which illustrates the value that humans place on visual self-recognition, and our failure to appreciate that other animals may recognize themselves through other sensory modalities. Additionally, the MSR test presupposes that the animals tested care in some sense about their appearance. This is a necessary requirement for them to be motivated to interact with the mark. The fact that this is taken for granted in discussions on the MSR test illustrates the importance that we grant to mirrors delivering our expected self-reflection. However, it is not immediately obvious that all animals should care about this. Instead, whether or not they do will likely be shaped by their particular ecology and evolutionary history. For example, a tiny fish, the cleaner wrasse, has been recently shown to pass the MSR test, attempting to scrape off the mark in the presence of a mirror and ignoring it if it was colorless or there was no mirror available (Kohda et al. 2019). This initially surprising result becomes less so when one considers that this species of fish feeds off the parasites that they visually detect on the skin of other fish, and the mark that was planted on their head was intentionally made to mimic the color, size, and shape of one of these parasites. In the cleaner wrasse’s Umwelt, this mark is clearly something worth attending to, but it might not be the case for all species. Other animals, for instance, might care much more if their coat smells in an unexpected way than if there is some debris on their head.
Further exemplifying value-ladenness, it is not uncommon for experimental results in comparative psychology to be communicated in a way that depicts the human species as “superior,” which can be illustrated by some experiments that have compared chimpanzee performance to our own. Daniel Povinelli and colleagues (1999), for example, found that chimpanzees outperform children in a gaze-following task, but interpreted the children’s poorer performance as evidence of their possession of superior cognitive capacities (see also Leavens, Bard, & Hopkins 2017). In this experiment, the subjects had to follow the experimenter’s gaze to find a reward, which both children and chimpanzees could do. In one condition, however, the experimenter was oriented towards the reward but gazing above it. While the chimpanzees could still use this gaze to find the reward, the children chose randomly in these trials. Povinelli et al. interpreted this as evidence that children, but not chimpanzees, have a theory of mind, which allowed the children to interpret the above-target gaze as a distracted one that was not worth following. From the chimpanzees’ perspective, however, one could also argue for their superiority in this task, since they were much more successful than the children in actually finding the reward. In another experiment (Jensen, Call, & Tomasello 2007), chimpanzees were tested in an ultimatum game, where one chimpanzee (the proposer) could choose how a reward was distributed among themself and another chimpanzee (the responder). The responder could either choose to accept the offer (in which case, they both kept it) or reject it (which would have meant they both lost it). The experimenters found that the responder would always accept the offer, regardless of how unfair the distribution was, so long as their part was higher than zero. Chimpanzees behaved in the way that economic theory predicts of the fully rational agent, in contrast to humans, who would typically rather be left with zero than accept an unfair distribution. Although the researchers acknowledge this, they also make a point of highlighting how these results illustrate that chimpanzees lack the sensitivity to fairness that characterizes (superior) human societies, though they fail to consider that chimpanzees may have fairness norms in domains outside of food sharing. A further example of results being interpreted to fit the narrative of human superiority comes from a study by Sana Inoue and Tetsuro Matsuzawa (2007), where a chimpanzee named Ayumu was found to strongly outperform humans in terms of speed and accuracy in a working memory task. Although in this paper the superiority of the chimp was acknowledged without caveats, one of the authors (Matsuzawa 2010) later used these results to highlight the superior cognitive capacities of humans, arguing for the existence of a trade-off between memory and abstraction in the phylogeny and ontogeny of our species, such that by letting go of the photographic memory that our ancestors likely shared with chimpanzees, we could develop our characteristic skills for complex representation and language.
While one might hope that an appeal to objectivity would help to offset the theory-ladenness and value-ladenness of science, philosophers of science tend to describe objectivity as an ideal, rather than an achievable result, of good science. Given that objectivity can be understood as a commitment to value- and theory-free faithfulness to facts that avoid any personal bias or perspective—a view from nowhere—it is at best a guide to balancing biases rather than avoiding them.
Animal cognition research has a particular interest in being objective, for some of the reasons reviewed in the previous two sections. Furthermore, as we saw in section 1, Darwin may have emphasized similarities over differences between species, suggesting a bias toward seeing other animals as like us. If humans are biased towards seeing animals as too much like humans, then some principles to protect against that bias may be needed. We see this in two classic principles used in comparative psychology: Morgan’s Canon and a prohibition against anthropomorphism.
The British biologist and psychologist C. Lloyd Morgan was worried that the methods of Darwin emphasized our tendencies to see others as like us, and he felt the need to offer a corrective to our egocentric biases in the form of what is now called Morgan’s Canon:
In no case may we interpret an action as the outcome of the exercise of a higher psychical faculty, if it can be interpreted as the outcome of the exercise of one which stands lower in the psychological scale. (Morgan 1894: 53)
Morgan describes his Canon by telling us the story of Tony, a fox-terrier pup who was able to open the gate from his garden and escape into the road by putting his head under the latch of the gate, lifting the latch and waiting for the gate to swing open. While it might look like Tony was smart—that he had a goal and knew how to achieve it by lifting the latch, Morgan invites us to consider other explanations. Perhaps Tony saw that the latch was liftable, and lifted it, without knowing the gate would open or wanting to get out. Perhaps Tony had associated the latch with getting out to the street, and wanted to get to the street, so he pushed against the latch without knowing how it worked. The worry is that, by thinking that Tony was a clever little dog, an observer is being anthropomorphic.
Though in its strictly literal sense, “anthropomorphism” simply makes reference to the attribution of human-like characteristics to animals, in its common usage in comparative cognition it has a very negative connotation, such that it is used to make reference to the mistaken attribution of human-like characteristics to animals. Thus understood, anthropomorphism is connected to humans’ well-documented tendency to over-attribute mental states. This was already demonstrated in the 1940s, in a famous study by Fritz Heider and Marianne Simmel (1944). In this study, human participants were shown a video that depicted animated geometric shapes moving around the screen (see Heider and Simmel (1944) animation in Other Internet Resources for the video). Although the shapes make no sounds and have no facial expressions, the participants couldn’t help but interpret their movement in intentional terms and construct a narrative regarding their “interactions”. This is a particularly egregious example of our anthropomorphic biases, which lead us to be inclined to interpret the behavior of entities (human, non-human, and beyond) in human-like terms. Scientists studying animal cognition are well aware of this problematic tendency, and they attempt to counter it by stressing the importance of avoiding anthropomorphism.
However, the dictum regarding the need to avoid anthropomorphism is also a philosophical assumption embedded in comparative cognition and, as such, it can be questioned. It has been argued, for instance, that a blanket ban against the attribution of human-like qualities to animals would beg the question by assuming that said qualities are indeed uniquely human (Fitzpatrick 2017a). Frans de Waal (1999) uses the term “anthropodenial” to refer to the a priori rejection of the possibility that humans and animals may share characteristics, and argues that it is just as worrisome as anthropomorphism. He points out that there is an imbalance in comparative cognition, such that the over-attribution of mental capacities to animals is seen as much more problematic than the under-attribution. The reason behind this is that comparative psychologists are wary of violating Morgan’s Canon. However, by looking to preserve cognitive parsimony at all costs, de Waal argues, comparative psychologists may be disregarding evolutionary parsimony, which dictates that we should offer explanations that posit the fewest possible changes in the phylogenetic tree. We should thus steer clear of both anthropodenial and anthropomorphism. A similar point was made by Kristin Andrews and Brian Huss (2014), who coined the term “anthropectomy” to refer to the mistake of denying that an animal has a certain characteristically human capacity when in fact they do have that capacity. They argue that anthropomorphism and anthropectomy are both errors, they both amount to a false depiction of how the world actually is, and so there is no reason to fear one over the other.
While anti-anthropomorphism attempts to avoid the bias of seeing mind when it isn’t there, it risks placing emphasis on another bias that humans are subject to, namely the bias of human exceptionalism. Anthropectomy arises in cases in which humans see their own cognitive capacities as sophisticated, and other species as only having diluted versions of them. For example, it is anthropectic to observe human cultural practices and infer that because other species don’t have opera houses they don’t have culture. When we make self-serving bias errors and assume too quickly that we are better than other people, we get ourselves and other people wrong. Anthropectic thinking extends this bias toward other animals.
Morgan also warned scientists against anthropectomy. In what we can call Morgan’s Challenge, he warned us not to too quickly ascribe sophisticated capacities as explanations of human behavior:
To interpret animal behavior one must learn also to see one’s own mentality at levels of development much lower than one’s top-level of reflective self-consciousness. It is not easy, and savors somewhat of paradox. (Morgan 1932: 250)
Morgan’s idea that we have to avoid exaggerating human capacities and wrongly denying that we share capacities with other animals has been taken up in current discussions of philosophers and psychologists. For example, as Shettleworth (2010b) points out, much human behavior is controlled by simple and often unconscious cognitive mechanisms of the sort we usually only associate with animals. We tend to disregard this and, as a result, we sometimes engage in anthropomorphism towards humans! Not only is there a tendency to forget that human behavior is often caused by simple mechanisms, one can also see a propensity to exaggerate the prowess of humans at various tasks. If we are wrong about human capacities, and then deny a continuity claim because we fail to find those confabulated capacities in other animals, we commit a double error—confabulating human cognitive mechanisms plus anthropocentrism, an error Cameron Buckner calls “anthropofabulation” (Buckner 2013). For example, despite the fact that we know that human memory is constructive and confabulatory to a large degree, many comparative psychologists engage in anthropofabulation by expecting animals to be capable of mentally replaying past events in order to be credited with episodic memory (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007; Tulving 1985; cited in Buckner 2013: 830).
One way to think of Morgan’s general idea is that to explain animal behavior we need to have a variety of competing hypotheses, and from that set we can then pick the one that fits best. Morgan’s Canon suggests that psychologically lower explanations are best, appealing to a kind of simplicity principle associated with Ockham’s Razor. But what counts as best is a classic problem in the philosophy of science. We turn to this issue next.
Another aspect of the science of animal cognition where philosophical assumptions become evident is in the preference given to simpler explanations of animal behavior. Simplicity has long been seen as a virtue of scientific explanations, but it is notoriously difficult to decide what makes one explanation simpler than another.
In comparative psychology, and especially when following Morgan’s Canon, simpler explanations are taken by default as the null hypothesis. This means that they are assumed to be true unless proven otherwise, and that the burden of proof falls on the side of more complex explanations. For example, research into causal reasoning in animals takes as its null hypothesis animals’ ability to learn associations between different events. The experiments then probe into whether animals are not just capable of this simple form of learning, but whether they have the more complex capacity to comprehend that some events cause others. When the experimental data support both a simple hypothesis and a more complex one, it is standard among scientists to prefer the simpler explanation. For instance, some have argued that the experiments done to test whether animals are capable of metacognition (or thinking about their thoughts) can in fact be passed by reasoning solely in first-order terms (or thinking about the world). Since first-order thinking is assumed to be a simpler explanation of the data, it has been argued that this explanation ought to be favored (e.g., Carruthers 2003; Hampton 2009).
The idea that simpler explanations ought to be preferred is viewed by many as self-evident, a result of applying Ockham’s Razor to the study of animal cognition, and the claim that an explanation is “simpler” or “more parsimonious” is often offered as the equivalent to “End of discussion!” However, in the past couple of decades philosophers have argued that this preference for simplicity in comparative cognition is much more problematic than it may initially seem. For one, many have argued that there is no reason why a simpler explanation will be more likely to be true in this context. Simpler explanations may have other virtues, such as being easier to understand or to describe, but since animal behavior is the result of natural selection, and not the outcome of a process of intelligent design that infallibly delivers optimal solutions, there is no reason to think that it is more likely to be caused by simpler processes (Mikhalevich, Powell, & Logan 2017). In fact, some have argued that when scientists claim a preference for simpler explanations, it is actually some other consideration that is doing the epistemic work, like the idea that we should avoid anthropomorphic descriptions of animal behavior (Fitzpatrick 2017a; Sober 1998). We see this, for instance, in Shettleworth’s (2010a) equation of simpler explanations with associative ones. She argues that associative explanations are to be preferred, but this is not a result of a preference for simplicity per se, but stems from the idea that association is phylogenetically widespread in the animal kingdom, and so associative explanations are, in her view, more likely to be true.
In fact, there is no such thing as simplicity per se. Instead, what we have are different types of simplicity depending on how and what we focus on “simplifying”. Irina Mikhalevich (2017) has argued that simplification can be done through homogenization, by aiming at fewer entity types; through reduction, by decreasing the number of entities; or through idealization, by removing entities that are not seen as crucial. Simon Fitzpatrick (2009) distinguishes five different notions of the ideal of simplicity that are used in the literature on comparative cognition:
- simplicity as psychological unity (preferring explanations that unify different behaviors by positing a single cognitive mechanism);
- simplicity as parsimony of mental representations (preferring X over Y as an explanation whenever Y entails X but not vice versa);
- simplicity as less cognitive sophistication (preferring explanations that attribute the least cognitively sophisticated mechanisms);
- simplicity as analogy (preferring explanations that posit similar cognitive mechanisms to explain similar behavior in different species);
- simplicity as evolutionary parsimony (preferring explanations that posit mechanisms inherited from a common ancestor to explain similar behavior in different species).
Mike Dacey (2016) distinguishes further notions of simplicity, such as a preference for those mechanisms that demand less computational memory, time, or energy, those that require less input data, or those that posit fewer changes in the phylogenetic tree. We previewed an argument along these lines in our discussion of anthropomorphism and anthropodenial—which is simpler, positing a simpler cognitive capacity and more changes over evolutionary time, or positing a more sophisticated cognitive capacity and fewer changes over evolutionary time?
These different notions of simplicity are not only conceptually distinct, they are often mutually incompatible or conflicting. Nowhere has this become more evident than in the chimpanzee theory of mind debate. The last few years have witnessed a huge controversy over the experimental results in this research area. A number of studies have shown that chimpanzees can use information regarding what a competitor has visual access to in order to decide whether or not to go for a reward (Hare et al. 2000; Hare, Call, & Tomasello 2001; Karg et al. 2015; Melis, Call, & Tomasello 2006). The controversy arose because these experimental results can in principle be explained by positing that chimpanzees were reasoning about the mental states of others (in this case, about what they could or could not see), or that they were solely reasoning about their behavior (e.g., about their bodily orientation or the existence of an uninterrupted line of gaze between their eyes and the reward). What is interesting about this controversy is that the defenders of each of these options were both claiming to be offering the simplest explanation of the data. For Michael Tomasello and Josep Call (2006), it’s more parsimonious to assume that chimpanzees can understand what others can and cannot see rather than posit that they have learned a different behavioral rule for every relevant situation that involves a competitor’s line of gaze. For Povinelli and Jennifer Vonk (2004), mental state attributions can only be inferred from another’s behavior, which means that every mindreader must also be a behavior reader. Since the opposite is not the case, it’s more parsimonious to assume that chimpanzees are behavior readers rather than mindreaders. The chimpanzee theory of mind controversy perfectly illustrates that the issue of simplicity is a philosophical one, meaning that the question of whether, to what extent, and in what sense simpler explanations ought to be preferred is one that cannot be settled solely through empirical measurements or mathematical calculations, but requires philosophical analysis and argumentation (for discussions, see Clatterbuck 2017, 2018; Sober 2015).
Objectivity and simplicity are taken as goals of science, which is understood to aim at tracking the facts of the world. The value-ladenness and theory-ladenness of science, however, shows how difficult it is to achieve those goals. While this is true of science in general, with animal cognition the stakes are different. Human use of animals in food, in medicine, in work, as entertainment, and as companions raises a host of sometimes conflicting goals that scaffold motivated reasoning and risk implicit bias. The quest for truth about animal capacities relates to an over-arching philosophical theme in comparative cognition: the human-animal divide and the question of the extent and areas of continuity between the minds of humans and other animals. This is not a normatively-neutral issue, but rather, the picture that science delivers of the human-animal divide can serve to justify or undermine the practices that constitute the human-animal relationship. As we will see in section 3, addressing the biases and philosophical assumptions that shape the science of animal cognition is of great importance for getting things right philosophically as well as ethically.
3. Animal Cognition Applied to Philosophy
The science of animal behavior and cognition is increasingly being used to provide premises in philosophical arguments. What follows is an extremely brief gesture toward several areas of philosophy that have benefited from recent attention to the sciences of animal mind and behavior.
Before we begin, we should point out two potential obstacles with this project. It’s important to note that the use of animal cognition research in philosophy must be handled carefully, given the methodological considerations discussed in section 2. Sometimes philosophers seek to show that animals have a property because they have a capacity, but the way the capacity was operationalized in the study is different from how the philosopher understands it. While many of the terms used in comparative cognition are familiar, they may be defined differently, which can lead to confusion and misunderstanding.
It’s also important to note that the relationship between a theory and a claim about an animal having or lacking a psychological property is a tight one. Sometimes philosophers are both arguing for a theory and for a claim that an animal has a particular property; such projects might be defended as cohesive, or they might be critiqued as question-begging.
Keeping these obstacles in mind, in this section, we will have a look at how the evidence coming from the science has influenced and shaped different philosophical debates.
3.1 The problem of other minds
The traditional philosophical problem of other minds, which challenges us to consider the evidential basis for our commitment that other humans are minded beings like ourselves, exists in an extreme form when applied to other animals (see Andrews 2020b: Chapter 1).
The traditional argument from analogy for other minds rests on similarities between oneself and other humans. While the traditional argument is weak enough, when the analogy goes from humans to members of another species, it becomes significantly weaker.
The argument from analogy for animal minds can be formulated as:
- Humans who have minds have some property M.
- Individuals of species A have property M.
- Therefore, individuals of species A probably have minds.
But what is M? Commonly used properties in such arguments include observable behaviors (such as emotional or communicative behavior), passing certain experimental tests (such as success on a memory task or a reasoning task), or physical structures (such as the existence of a neocortex).
The inference to the best explanation argument for animal minds rests on the claim that the existence of animal minds is a better explanation of animal behavior and physiology than those offered by other hypotheses. This argument can be formulated as:
- Individuals of species x engage in behaviors y.
- The best scientific explanation for an individual engaging in behaviors y is that they have a mind.
- Therefore, it is likely that individuals of species x have minds.
When we look for the best explanation for a phenomenon, we first have to generate a number of hypotheses, and then decide between them. The best explanation will be the one that can be used to generate accurate predictions and that coheres with our other scientific commitments.
The argument from evolutionary parsimony is based on the idea that closely related species share some physical traits, and this relationship can offer evidence in favor of a mentalistic causal explanation in certain cases. For example, we can consider this argument that chimpanzees have minds:
- The more parsimonious explanation requires the fewest changes between species with recent common ancestors.
- Humans and chimpanzees have a recent common ancestor.
- Humans achieve behavior B by psychological capacity P.
- Therefore, it is most parsimonious to infer that chimpanzees achieve behavior B by psychological capacity P.
In his discussion of this style of argument, Elliott Sober (2015) points out that phylogenetic parsimony only offers some evidence of the trait in other animals; while the probability of chimpanzees having P is raised by the presence of P in humans, given other considerations we might still conclude that the probability of chimpanzees having P is low.
These arguments all have their weakness when it comes to their ability to justify belief in other animal minds, just as the humancentric versions do when it comes to other human minds. Even when used in conjunction with one another, there is room for doubt when it comes to other minds. However, in the case of humans, it is deemed a mental illness to worry that the others around you are actually minded. The weakness of these arguments suggests that when we are doing science and trying to determine the causes of behavior, we are engaged in one project, but when we are considering the traditional problem of other minds when it comes to other animals, we are engaged in a different kind of project, one of relating to others.
Dale Jamieson (1998) argues that the problem of other minds is solved not inferentially, but via engagement with other beings. The inferential solution to the problem suggests that when we see other beings we see behaving bodies rather than agents or people—individuals we can have relationships with. Jamieson suggests that this idea of a behaving body is a “philosophical monster”—a boogie man created by philosophers that creates a problem rather than solving one.
When philosophers presume humans have minds, rather than feel that they have to prove their existence, they can move forward to ask questions about those minds. The same goes for other species. Skepticism about the existence of other minds remains a possibility in the human as well as the nonhuman case.
3.2 The mind-body problem
The traditional mind-body problem asks what are the relationships that exist between mental properties and physical properties, or between the mental and the physical. Appealing to nonhuman animals offers additional evidence in support of theories regarding the relationship between the mind and the body.
For example, Hilary Putnam (1967) famously used the example of octopus pain to challenge identity theory and introduce the notion of multiple realizability into the philosophy of mind. While Putnam presumed the existence of pain in the octopus, contemporary philosophers use the science of octopus behavior and physiology to argue for embodied cognition (Carls-Diamante forthcoming) or to suggest the existence of multiple cognitive systems working together in a single organism (Godfrey-Smith 2016).
Research on animals without neurons, such as sponges, or on other organisms, such as slime molds, which show habituation learning (Boisseau, Vogel, & Dussutour 2016), or pea plants, which show associative learning (Gagliano et al. 2016; though for a dissenting view see Markel 2020), also offers opportunities for supporting the multiple realizability of the material and organization that supports cognition and mentality.
Philosophers are developing theories of consciousness that are sensitive to studies of neurobiological and psychological properties of animals, including pain, emotions, decision-making, learning, memory, and future planning. Philosophers are also using theories of consciousness to argue for or against animal consciousness. For example, in his book Human and Animal Minds: The Consciousness Questions Laid to Rest (2019), Peter Carruthers argues that since consciousness is neural processing in a human global workspace, and nonhuman animals lack the equivalent to a human global workspace, it doesn’t make sense to continue asking whether animals are conscious. In contrast, Michael Tye (1997) argues that on his PANIC theory of consciousness most vertebrates and invertebrates will be conscious, because they have to evaluate their sense data in order to act. Such theory-first approaches often end in a standoff between theories.
Some philosophers and scientists also argue from a more pre-theoretical position that many species are conscious. In their plea for a new science of consciousness, Francis Crick and Christof Koch (1990) decided to assume that some mammals are conscious in order to study consciousness in animals, which might explain the widespread use of macaque monkeys as research subjects in consciousness studies. Andrews (2020c) argues that presuming animal consciousness in this way has a precedent in human sciences; while we can’t prove that humans are conscious, we are justified in presuming humans are conscious, just as we are justified in presuming that there is an external world, and that we’re not merely brains in vats. The premise that humans are conscious allows us to do good science, and generates findings that are robustly predictive and support other facts that we believe are true. If the premise that animals are conscious also supports the fecundity of science, it should be taken as starting point.
A common theory-light approach deals with markers for consciousness. A marker is an indicator of something we cannot directly perceive, and in the case of consciousness we find markers by relying on our own phenomenological experience. For example, in his book Personhood, Ethics, and Animal Cognition (2012), Gary Varner relies on behavior and physiology of pain in order to argue that nociceptors connected to the brain, endogenous opioids, responsiveness to analgesics, and appropriate pain behavior are sufficient indicators of consciousness. Scientific data current at the time suggested to Varner that all vertebrates experience pain, but among the invertebrates, the current science only suggested pain in cephalopods (such as octopus, squid, and cuttlefish). More recently, Tye’s Tense Bees and Shell-Shocked Crabs: Are Animals Conscious? (2017) suggests we use Newton’s Principle (“from similar effects we can infer similar causes”) and the premise that certain human behaviors are caused by consciousness to infer that certain animal behaviors are caused by conscious experience; this approach finds consciousness in crabs, bees, and fish, as well as mammals, birds, and reptiles.
Yet another way of finding markers of consciousness is to ask what consciousness is for—the function of consciousness. In their book The Evolution of the Sensitive Soul, Simona Ginsburg and Eva Jablonka (2019) propose that consciousness evolved with the development of a capacity for an open-ended kind of learning they call Unlimited Associative Learning (UAL), originating in the Cambrian era. UAL permits organisms to assign value to new and complex stimuli, to remember the associations with these stimuli, and to use those memories to make decisions in the future.
This tension between these different approaches has led philosophers to engage in meta-theoretical analysis of how best to answer the question. Jonathan Birch argues that the debate about invertebrate consciousness can move forward if we adopt a theory-light approach over theory-heavy and theory-neutral approaches (Birch forthcoming). Eric Schwitzgebel (2019) argues that when we rely on a theory of consciousness in order to answer questions about consciousness in animals who are very different from us, such as garden snails, we inevitably beg the question, suggesting that any theory-first approach to such questions is not going to be helpful. To move forward on questions of consciousness in beings who are very different from the mammals, birds, and reptiles many naturally take to be conscious, Andrews (2020b) sketches a method she calls the Dynamic Marker Approach, which starts by identifying the properties that trigger human commitments to consciousness in familiar animals, and then derives further markers that can be used to identify consciousness in unfamiliar ones.
Philosophical engagement on the nature of belief, concepts, perception, mental representation, non-conceptual content, rationality, and reasoning deals both with the question of whether animals have capacities related to thought, and with questions about the nature of these capacities. Though there are a lot of contemporary discussions on these topics, this corresponds to a rather recent turn of events, since philosophy of mind has, for the most part, historically dealt only with human forms of thought. This was not out of lack of interest, but the result of the conviction that only humans were capable of thinking. Descartes, for instance, famously argued that animals’ lack of language gives us a good reason to think that they do not have any form of thought or rationality.
Descartes’ view was echoed in the twentieth century by philosopher Donald Davidson. In a well-known article (Davidson 1982), he argued that animals are incapable of thinking due to their lack of language. He departs from an example by Norman Malcolm (1972/73): a dog is chasing the neighbor’s cat through the backyard. The cat runs directly towards an oak tree but at the last minute they swerve and go up a maple. The dog misses this last maneuver and runs towards the oak tree, rests their paws on it, and begins to bark at its branches. Though we would be inclined to describe this behavior by saying that the dog believes that the cat is in the oak tree, Davidson thinks that we would be wrong.
Davidson first identifies an epistemological problem with attributing such a belief to the dog; a problem that was already described by Stephen Stich (1979). The problem boils down to the fact that we lack a way of determining which description would accurately capture the dog’s belief: do they believe the cat went up the oldest tree in the backyard? Or the tree that smells the best? Or the tree that the cat went up the last time? This epistemological hurdle is insurmountable, in Davidson’s view. Moreover, for him, beliefs are never had in isolation, but rather every belief is embedded in a network of associated beliefs without which that initial belief would lack all sense. In order to believe of an object that it is a tree, the dog needs all sorts of general beliefs about trees: that they grow; that they have leaves, branches, and roots; that they need water and sunlight, etc. And the same goes for the cat: believing that this is a cat implies believing that they are a mammal, that they have four legs, that they meow, etc. Even though there is no fixed set of beliefs that one needs in order to be able to believe of this object that it is a tree or a cat, without the attribution of at least some of these beliefs, the attribution to the dog of the belief that the cat is in the tree becomes senseless.
Though it has been widely discussed, few philosophers have been convinced by this argument. For one, similar problems also arise when attributing beliefs to other humans. Furthermore, such arguments are excessively pessimistic with regards to the limits of what we can know about animals’ beliefs. By studying animal behavior in controlled situations, we can come to know quite a lot about how they understand the world, which would allow us to delineate their beliefs to a much higher degree than Davidson and Stich acknowledge. Moreover, perhaps animals’ beliefs don’t take the form of propositional attitudes made up of concepts, like Davidson assumes. It could be the case, for instance, that the dog thinks of the cat, not as a four-legged meowing mammal, but in terms of the actions they allow: as, for instance, a chase-able or eat-able thing. And lastly, while Davidson’s argument may allow us to conclude that we don’t know the exact form that animals’ beliefs take, a number of philosophers have argued that we can still ascribe content to animal beliefs using a variety of different methods (e.g., Allen 2013; Bermúdez 2003; Rowlands 2012).
However, for Davidson, attributing thought to animals is not merely an epistemological problem. It isn’t just that we don’t have a way of knowing what animals believe; for him, the very idea that animals can think is problematic. Davidson ties the ability to think to the possession of language. He considers that an individual who has beliefs has to be capable of being surprised, for surprise consists precisely of registering that reality isn’t how we believed it was. Surprise shows that one can discriminate between the purely subjective and the objective. In order to have the capacity to be surprised, and therefore to have beliefs, one needs the concept of belief, to be able to understand that there is an objective reality that is independent from our beliefs. At the same time, language is necessary to have the concept of belief, for it allows us to contrast what we believe with what others believe, and thus generate the notion of truth and an objective reality. Given that only humans have language, only humans can have the concept of belief, and therefore beliefs. And as, for Davidson, beliefs are the basic foundation for all kinds of thought, only humans can think.
More recent philosophical engagement on these topics tends to take a more varied and often nuanced view about the relationship between language and thought that distinguishes between different kinds of thinking. Elisabeth Camp finds evidence that while some animals think in compositional representational systems, such systems lack other properties of language and are not propositional in structure (Camp 2009a). This is in contrast to Jerry Fodor’s Language of Thought (LoT) hypothesis, according to which all thought has a language-like structure and can be had by animals who do not use language (Fodor 1975). On Camp’s view, animals lack propositional thought, but some animals still have conceptual thought because they have systematically recombinable stimulus-independent representational capacities—a flexible capacity to represent different aspects of the world, including abstractions (Camp 2009b). Other philosophers argue that the evidence suggests both that animals lack concepts and that they think, providing evidence for nonconceptual mental content (e.g., Beck 2012; Peacocke 2001; Schellenberg 2013, 2018). Contemporary philosophers are also interested in investigating the kinds of rational thought processes that animals might engage in, including logical reasoning (Burge 2010), causal reasoning (Bermúdez 2006), or statistical reasoning (Rescorla, 2009, 2017).
Communication is another area in which data from animal studies is used to help shape philosophical theories. Many take their starting position from H.P. Grice, who proposed that a speaker means something by an utterance x if and only if the speaker utters x with the intention that:
- it produces a response in the intended audience,
- the audience recognizes the speaker’s first intention, and
- the audience’s recognition of the speaker’s first intention serves as a reason for the audience responding as it does (Grice 1957).
Dennett interprets Grice as concluding that only those being who can entertain a third-order belief (e.g., “I think that she thinks that I think”) can be communicators (Dennett 1987). That would entail that only creatures who have a theory of mind, and can think about others’ mental states, are able to communicate. More recently, philosophers have objected to the high cognitive requirements for communication, in part by noting that children and animals often appear to be communicating, expressing their thoughts and feelings, or exchanging information in a purposeful way. Current research also takes seriously that communication need not be limited to the verbal domain; communication can occur through gestures and other bodily movements, touches, and at least in some species, through the flexible release of chemicals.
For example, Moore (2016b) suggests that intentional communication need only require a message and an “act of address” that signifies that the message is intended for the receiver. This pragmatic ostensive communicative account of intentional communication requires that communicative partners be able to understand that others have goals, but doesn’t require understanding others’ beliefs. Moore thinks we may find evidence of intentional communication of this sort in animals from fish to apes.
For there to be communication, there must be thought, and as we saw in the previous section, some philosophers deny that thought is possible without language. Dorit Bar-On defends a theory of intentional communication she calls expressive communication, according to which avowals are self-reports or expressions of one’s current mental states that have both an action component and a semantic component (Bar-On 2004). She argues that an appreciation of expressive communication can help us see how children and animals who lack language may yet still have thoughts (Bar-On 2019).
While philosophers are finding value in animal behavior to develop theories of communication, there is less impact on theories of language. This is perhaps due to the fact that linguists tend to agree with Noam Chomsky that it is “obviously true” that animals can have systems of communication, but lack anything that can be called a language (Chomsky 1980: 430). However, continued research into animal communication challenges the idea that human language is discontinuous from animal communication systems, with evidence of capacities supporting recursion in birdsongs (Gentner et al. 2006) and syntax in bonobos (Clay & Zuberbühler 2011). Appeal to such findings permits better theories regarding the evolution of language (Zuberbühler 2020).
On the basis of empirical research into the multimodal communication of animals, Eva Meijer (2019) has recently argued that, far from being obviously true, it is anthropocentric to restrict the term “language” to human forms of communication. Instead, she suggests using the Wittgensteinian notion of language games to articulate a notion of language that is not fixed and universal, but instead incorporates many different forms of communication that bear a family resemblance without having any one common characteristic. This notion of language games can include much more than just verbal communication, seeing language instead as something that is embodied, open-ended, ever-changing and embedded in practices of co-creating meaning, something that need not exclude animals.
3.6 Social understanding
Philosophical discussions on the nature of social understanding, including empathy, theory of mind, norms, and culture, have been influenced in the past couple of decades by the accumulating evidence on the socio-cognitive capacities of animals. The chimpanzee theory of mind controversy, which we outlined in section 2, is a perfect illustration of this, since it gave rise to numerous articles and books that dealt with this topic from a philosophical perspective. Many of the early papers focused on what has been termed the “logical problem,” which is the problem that the experimental results can be interpreted by postulating that chimpanzees are mindreaders or that they are mere behavior-readers. Philosophers have offered various solutions to this problem, ranging from experimental proposals that are meant to disentangle these two explanations of the data (Lurz 2011) to attempts to dissolve it by arguing that it is just a skeptical problem that will not help us advance in our study of animal cognition (Halina 2015).
Other philosophers have been inspired by the chimpanzee theory of mind controversy to rethink social cognition. Andrews (2012), for instance, argued that the chimpanzee theory of mind debate presupposes a view of social understanding according to which predicting and explaining behavior are two symmetrical activities that depend on the attribution of propositional attitudes (beliefs and desires) to others. Instead, she argues that in many cases humans and nonhumans alike can predict behavior without appealing to someone’s beliefs and desires, predicting instead from the situation in which the other is in, from what they themselves would do, based on stereotypes or personality traits, from what that individual did in the past, from social norms, by perceiving the individual’s emotional state, and so on. In contrast, the attribution of mental states is more commonly found in the practice of explaining the behavior of others, especially in the case of anomalous behavior. Though chimpanzees and other apes have been found to pass a false belief task (Buttelmann et al. 2017; Krupenye et al. 2016), the chimpanzee theory of mind experiments have been designed to test for their capacity to predict behavior, not to explain it, so they may not actually be probing into chimpanzees’ theory of mind (Andrews 2018). Stephen Butterfill and Ian Apperly (2013) also argued that theory of mind tests that have been performed on children, apes, and other animals can be passed without attributing full-blown propositional attitudes to others. The individuals can rely instead on what they call a “minimal theory of mind,” an ability to register objects and their relations to agents that allows one to track propositional attitudes without representing them as such. While much of the current discussion of ape theory of mind is methodological, raising worries about the nonverbal implicit methods used in these tests (Horschler, MacLean, & Santos 2020), there are also philosophical questions to be asked about a construct that has arisen from the nonverbal tests, namely, implicit belief representation. Implicit knowledge is often taken to be nonrepresentational, as seen in the philosophical literature on knowledge how. To address the questions of what it means to say a nonverbal infant or nonhuman animal has a theory of mind requires some conceptual clarifications (Rakoczy 2012).
Philosophers have more recently been interested in a wider array of social capacities. Philosophical accounts of social learning (Moore 2013), culture (Goodrich 2017; Ramsey 2013), innovation (Ramsey, Bastian, & van Schaik 2007), social norms (Andrews 2020a), and animal morality (Fitzpatrick 2017b; Korsgaard 2006; Monsó 2015; Rowlands 2012) are also topics that are informed by current research in animal cognition.
3.7 The influence of animal cognition on value theory
The evidence coming from comparative cognition also has important implications for our obligations towards animals. In this section, we will give an overview of some of the ways in which comparative cognition has influenced ethics and political theory.
Ethical theorizing regarding animals focuses on two main issues: the question of moral status and the question of moral treatment. The discussion on moral status attempts to establish which animals are owed moral consideration and on what grounds. The discussion on moral treatment starts from the assumption that some animals have moral status and aims to elucidate what the interests of these animals are and how to manage situations in which they conflict with our own. Discussions in both of these debates are often informed by comparative cognition research.
The most common capacity that has been used to ground animals’ moral status is sentience, roughly defined as the capacity to feel pleasure and pain. Sentience is widely regarded as sufficient for animals to be owed moral consideration, since only sentient animals care about what happens to them. Early animal ethics focused on animals most directly and gravely affected by human practices, namely, the mammals and birds used in food production and biomedical research, and built a case in their defense based on evidence of their sentience. In recent years, evidence of sentience in other taxa is being used to argue that the circle of moral consideration should be widened to include fish (Balcombe 2016; Sneddon 2006), cephalopods (King & Marino 2019; Mather & Anderson 2007), and arthropods (Mikhalevich & Powell 2020). Evidence from comparative psychology that points to some animals being capable of sophisticated forms of agency has also been used in attempts to ground moral status on this capacity (Sebo 2017; Wilcox 2020). Other philosophers object to using individualistic cognitive capacities to ground moral standing, and instead rely on our perception of animals and pre-existing relationships as the relevant properties (Crary 2010; Diamond 1978; Gruen 2015). However, it has been argued that even these approaches cannot ignore the cognitive capacities of individuals (Monsó & Grimm 2019).
If animals have moral status, the question emerges: what sort of treatment are they owed? Moral treatment is usually considered to be a function of the interests that a being has, and these are closely linked to their psychological capacities. Inspired by findings in comparative cognition, scholars have argued that some animals not only have an interest in experiencing pleasure and avoiding pain, but that they can also enjoy other goods, such as freedom (Gruen 2018; Schmidt 2015), friendship (Frööding & Peterson 2011), relationships of care (Monsó, Benz-Schwarzburg, & Bremhorst 2018), and meaning (Purves & Delon 2018). This has potential implications for the moral treatment that animals are owed, because it could mean that animals are not just wronged when they are made to feel pain, but also when they are deprived of opportunities to enjoy these other goods.
3.7.2 Political theory
Recent years have witnessed a political turn in animal ethics, with the appearance of several theories that discuss how political institutions and processes can be transformed to guarantee justice for animals (Cochrane, Garner, & O’Sullivan 2018). This work is somewhat less capacity-oriented than traditional animal ethics, since it does not focus on the moral obligations of individual humans towards animals, and tends to highlight instead the sorts of obligations that are generated at the state level by the relationships that humans have historically held with animals (Donaldson & Kymlicka 2011).
Still, some of the work in political theory has been influenced by findings in comparative cognition. An example of this is the debate surrounding the notion of personhood, a term that marks those beings who are entitled to legal protection, and which is often linked to certain cognitive capacities, such as rationality, self-awareness, or sociality. Drawing on the accumulating psychological evidence, scholars have defended that personhood should be granted to great apes (Andrews et al. 2018; Cavalieri & Singer 1993), cetaceans (Cavalieri 2011; White 2007), and elephants (Poole 1998). The capacities of animals documented by comparative cognition have also been used to defend different ways in which animals can be seen as having a political agency of their own, and thus as capable of engaging in political participation. Meijer (2019), for instance, has argued that animals can communicate in complex and nuanced ways using multimodal signals, and that by means of these they can express their needs and negotiate their relationships with us. Rather than seeing them merely as voiceless victims, she encourages us to take their voices into account when shaping an interspecies democracy.
The philosophy of animal minds is a rich and growing area of philosophy. Philosophers engage with the science of animal cognition to analyze the methods, assumptions, and values in the science itself. Philosophers also use the research findings to support theories in traditional topics in metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of mind, language and action, and value theory. Finally, attention to animal cognition can also highlight previously overlooked philosophical issues related to the nature of culture, learning, and teaching, and it provides a new lens to consider classic questions about human nature and our place among all the other animals.
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