Supplement to Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

More on Non-Disjunctive Theories

An attempt to design a theory of intrinsicality in terms of non-disjunctivity that avoids the objections to Langton and Lewis’s account discussed in the main document is that of Brian Weatherson (2001). In his theory, combinatorial principles of possibility are not used to derive characteristics of individual intrinsic properties, as Langton and Lewis do, but characteristics of the whole set of intrinsic properties. He argues that this set, call it \(SI\), will have the following properties:

  • If \(F \in SI\)and \(G \in SI\), then \(F\) and \(G \in SI\) and \(F\) or \(G \in SI\) and not \(F \in SI\)
  • If \(F \in SI\) then Having \(n\) parts that are \(F \in SI\) and Being entirely composed of exactly \(n\) things that are \(F \in SI\)
  • If \(F \in SI\) and \(G \in SI\) and there is a possible world with \(n+1\) pairwise distinct things, and something in some world is \(F\) and something in some world is \(G\), then there is a world with exactly \(n+1\) pairwise distinct things such that one is \(F\) and the other \(n\) are \(G\).
  • If \(F \in SI\) and \(G \in SI\) and it is possible that regions with shapes \(d_1\) and \(d_2\) stand in relation \(A\), and it is possible that an \(F\) wholly occupy a region with shape \(d_1\) and a \(G\) wholly occupy a region with shape \(d_2\), then there is a world where regions with shapes \(d_1\) and \(d_2\) stand in \(A\), and an \(F\) wholly occupies the region with shape \(d_1\) and a \(G\) wholly occupies the region with shape \(d_2\).

The first two principles are closure principles on the set. The third principle says that any two intrinsic properties that can be instantiated can be instantiated together any number of times. And the fourth says that if objects having two intrinsic properties can be in two regions, and those two regions can be in a particular spatial relation, then the regions can be in that relation while filled by objects having those properties. The third principle suffices to show that being such that a cube exists could not be in \(SI\), and the fourth to show that being a rock could not be.

Weatherson’s theory still requires an appeal to a concept of naturalness. Without such an appeal, then if \(F\) and \(G\) are intrinsic properties that atoms could have, nothing in his theory rules out the property being simple, lonely and \(F\) or being \(G\) from being intrinsic. There are a few ways for the appeal to go at this point, see Weatherson (2001) and Lewis (2001) for a few suggestions. The following moves, taken directly from Langton and Lewis, will probably work if any will. Say that the basic intrinsic properties are those non-disjunctive properties such that their membership in \(SI\) is consistent with the above four principles. Two objects are duplicates if they do not differ with respect to basic intrinsic properties. A property is intrinsic iff it never differs between duplicates.

Unfortunately, Weatherson’s theory still faces apparent counterexamples, similar to those faced by Langton and Lewis’s account. While Weatherson’s account might successfully classify being such that there is a cube as extrinsic, it arguably fails to correctly classify other similar quantificational properties. One example discussed by Hawthorne 2001 is the property of standing in relation \(R\) to something, where \(R\) is a perfectly natural relation a thing can stand in to itself and to things wholly distinct from it. Another example discussed by Marshall (2012), which relies on less controversial assumptions about what types of perfectly natural relations there are, is the property of having a part that is 1 m away from something. Both these properties are arguably non-disjunctive. Given the set of intrinsic properties satisfy the above conditions for \(SI\), both these properties plausibly satisfy them as well, and hence are plausibly falsely classified as intrinsic by Weatherson’s account.

A further problem that applies to both Langton and Lewis’s account and Weatherson’s account is that they are incompatible with certain metaphysical views that posit necessary connections between wholly distinct entities. On a popular view of sets, for example, each thing \(x\) is wholly distinct from its singleton set \(\{x\}\), and is such that, necessarily, it exists iff its singleton \(\{x\}\) exists. Given this view, however, no contingently existing things can be lonely, and hence no intrinsic property that can only be had by contingently existing things can be independent of accompaniment. Given that being made of tin is such a property, it follows that each of the above combinatorial accounts falsely classifies being made of tin as extrinsic, given the above view of sets. (See Cameron 2008, 2009 for more discussion.)

In addition to the above problems, it has also been recently argued by Wilhelm 2022 that the Langton and Lewis account (and perhaps other accounts that appeal to duplication, such as Weatherson’s account and Lewis’s 1986 account) are incompatible with the phenomena of quantum entanglement.

An account that does not appeal to non-disjunctivity, but which uses principles similar to those used in the accounts described above, has been proposed by Denby 2010. (This account is a modified version of an earlier account given in Denby 2006 which takes into account objections made by Hoffman-Kolss 2010b.) Instead of appealing to naturalness or non-disjunctiveness, Denby’s account employs the notion of an object instantiating a property under a relation. Denby, however, gives very little explanation of what this technical notion is meant to mean, and it is therefore not clear what to make of Denby’s account.

Copyright © 2023 by
Dan Marshall <>
Brian Weatherson

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