John of Salisbury

First published Wed Aug 10, 2016; substantive revision Wed Apr 27, 2022

John of Salisbury (1115/20–1180) was among the foremost philosophers of the so-called twelfth century Renaissance, contributing to the development of political and moral philosophy as well as to the medieval theory of education and to the dissemination of emerging Aristotelian learning. Having received an extensive education in Paris, he spent most of his life as an active servant of the church. An associate of Archbishop Thomas Becket of Canterbury during his dispute with King Henry II of England, John eventually was raised to the office of Bishop of Chartres. John’s thought has been characterized as “humanistic”, since he valorizes the dignity of humanity and of nature generally: The latter is intelligible and may be understood through the application of natural reason. Yet John admitted that severe impediments exist to the attainment of wisdom. Throughout his writings, he professed to follow the moderate skepticism of Cicero and the New Academy, which rejected dogmatic claims to certainty. The best that rational human inquiry may in most matters achieve, John says, is probable truth, always subject to re-evaluation and revision. The general tenor of his philosophy is reflected in his advocacy of moderation and his emphasis on nature as a normative guide to earthly fulfillment. John composed several treatises of philosophical interest, most notably the Policraticus (PC), but also the Metalogicon (ML) and the Entheticus de dogmate philosophorum (EMM). These works were all completed between 1154 and 1159, during the period of John’s service to Archbishop Theobald, Becket’s predecessor at the see of Canterbury. John’s other writings—two letter collections, two hagiographies, and a history—evince the practical application of his philosophical commitments.

1. Biography

John of Salisbury was born at Old Sarum (the former site of Salisbury) in England between 1115 and 1120. Specific knowledge of his family background and early life is scant; something is known of a brother, Richard, and a half-brother, Robert, both of whom held offices within the English church. John probably received an early education at Salisbury and then at Exeter. The first date safely associated with him is 1136, when he traveled to Paris to study at Mont-Sainte-Geneviève. In a famous autobiographical passage in the Metalogicon, John narrates his twelve years of education, an important source for understanding French higher instruction in this period. The list of his teachers includes many of the great thinkers of the mid-twelfth century, among them Peter Abelard, Robert of Melun, William of Conches, Thierry of Chartres, Adam de Petit Pont, Gilbert of Poitiers, and Robert Pullan. John’s studies encompassed speculative philosophy, rhetoric, linguistic theory, literature, and theology. He seems to have tutored students during his later years in Paris. It was also during these years (specifically, 1141 to 1147) that John likely drafted the first two parts of his 1852-line philosophical and satirical poem, the Entheticus de dogmate philosophorum (or Entheticus maior); the final two parts likely date from late 1154 to mid-1156 (the much shorter Entheticus minor prefaces the Policraticus).

Like many educated churchmen of his era, John eventually entered the corridors of power rather than the cloister or the classroom. Through the assistance of his friend Peter of Celle, John joined, in 1148, the household of Archbishop Theobald of Canterbury, a vocal and energetic advocate of the rights of the English church. In his capacity as secretary to Theobald, John was an omnicompetent administrator: He composed the Archbishop’s letters, advised him on legal and political affairs, traveled often to the Continent as an archiepiscopal envoy, and altogether lived in the manner of a trusted intimate. John’s first letter collection, which he assembled shortly after Theobald’s death in 1161, is largely comprised of official letters under Theobald’s name, augmented by letters John himself wrote on Canterbury’s behalf and some personal missives.

Theobald’s court attracted many clerics with training and experience similar to John’s own, so he could continue to indulge his intellectual pursuits in a sympathetic environment during the 1140s and 1150s. John was counted a member of a circle of learned clerics, among whom was Thomas Becket (the future archbishop and martyr), who was a trusted servant of Theobald before he was appointed King Henry II’s Chancellor in late 1154 (Nederman and Bollermann 2020). John’s activities on behalf of Theobald brought him into contact with some of the most powerful and prominent men of twelfth-century Europe. He was present at the Roman curia for many crucial occurrences during the pontificate of Eugenius III (1145–1153), the final four years of which he later chronicled in his Historia Pontificalis (HP) (written during the early period of his Becket-related exile, likely early 1164 to early 1166). He enjoyed a warm friendship with his fellow countryman Nicholas Breakspear, who ascended the papal throne as Adrian IV in 1154. John was also well-acquainted with important figures in twelfth-century secular life, in France as well as England, most especially Henry II. John had supported Henry’s side in the struggle against the partisans of King Stephen during the period of English history known as the Anarchy. John was, however, sufficiently vocal in his opposition to Henry’s policies toward the English church to be banished from the royal court during 1156 and 1157. Although he ultimately recovered favor, he acquired a lingering skepticism about Henry’s motives that was to be confirmed by later events. As busy as John seems to have been with Canterbury administration in the final years of Theobald’s archiepiscopacy, this was also the period (late 1156 through late 1159) in which John produced the two works for which he is best known and esteemed: the Metalogicon, which presents a survey of the scholastic curriculum and a defense of the study of the trivium; and, the Policraticus, a work of moral and political philosophy grounded in a Ciceronian moderate skepticism and replete with exempla drawn from Biblical, patristic, and classical sources.

After Becket became Archbishop of Canterbury in 1162, he began to defend ecclesiastical liberty against Henry’s encroachments, partly in response to which Becket tasked John with composing (in early 1163) a hagiography of Anselm—a prior Canterbury archbishop who’d wrestled with overreaching English monarchs—in support of formal canonization. As the conflict between Becket and Henry deepened, John backed the church’s cause against the English crown, albeit somewhat reluctantly. John consequently spent much of the 1160s in exile, either in France or at the papal court, lobbying on behalf of Becket and against Henry and the English bishops who backed the king. Most of the copious volume of letters contained in John’s second letter collection date from and form important testimony to this period. Following Becket’s murder in December 1170, an event at which John was a bystander, he served the English church in numerous capacities during the early 1170s. Importantly, John wrote one of the earliest hagiographies of Becket, used in support of an initial canonization effort. John was consecrated Bishop of Chartres in 1176 (a post in which he dedicated himself to promoting the cult of Becket). He died there in 1180 and is buried in the nearby abbey church of Notre-Dame-de-Josaphat.

2. Classical Philosophical Sources

It was once supposed that John of Salisbury was “the best-read man of the twelfth century” (Poole 1932: 191). Janet Martin, however, has convincingly demonstrated that much of John’s familiarity with Latin (and, to some extent, Greek) classics derived from so-called florilegia, collections of brief passages (Martin 1977, 1979, 1984). These compilations were probably readily available in the extensive (pre-Reformation) library of Christ Church monastery, attached to Canterbury Cathedral. This does not mean that John lacked direct acquaintance with ancient philosophical texts and ideas. At minimum, a list of his personal library (which he left to Chartres Cathedral, where he served as bishop from 1176 to 1180) mentions Cicero’s De officiis and De oratore, Seneca’s Naturalium quaestionum libros, and Valerius Maximus (Webb 1932: 65–69). Of course, John knew many more ancient Latin authors and texts than those contained in his own collection. In addition to Christ Church’s library, John’s travels afforded him access to considerable textual resources. Moreover, intellectuals of the time often traded volumes or commissioned copies thereof. Hence, the Latin philosophers, especially Cicero and Seneca, enjoyed wide dissemination during the twelfth century, and John relied heavily upon them (see the comprehensive overview by Hermand-Schebat 2015).

Among the Greek philosophers, John’s knowledge was meager at best, if only because the language of ancient Greece was almost entirely absent in the Latin West during the twelfth century. Until the dissemination of Latin translations of the Aristotelian corpus, and a few works by Plato, over the course of the thirteenth century, little in the way of acquaintance was possible. The only one of Plato’s texts that John could have accessed was the Timaeus in the partial translation by Calcidius; among Aristotle’s writings, he clearly was somewhat familiar with the six books of the Organon, which formed the foundation for the Aristotelian logical and “scientific” system. In an undated letter to his former teacher Richard of l’Évêque, John expresses interest in acquiring (unspecified) works by Aristotle (JL2: 294–95). (Bloch 2012 offers a thorough analysis of the technical aspects of John’s use of classical sources in his philosophy, with special, but not exclusive, attention to Aristotle.)

Yet John clearly knew a great deal more about the doctrines of the classical Greek philosophers than this account might indicate. There were a number of Latin-language writers who transmitted to the Middle Ages accounts of Greek philosophical teachings, including Apuleius, Calcidius, Cicero, Seneca, Lactantius, and St. Augustine (O’Daly 2018). Thus, for example, John was aware of the existence of Plato’s Republic and some of its leading ideas, even though that text did not circulate in Europe until the fifteenth century (Dutton 1983; PC: 54, 137). He was also able to make considerable reference to Epicurus, albeit primarily filtered through the highly critical writings of Cicero and other Latin authors (Nederman and Bollermann 2011). And, the translated texts of ancient Greek thinkers sometimes contained passing references to other of their philosophical precepts, forming so-called “underground” sources (a term applied to John by Nederman and Brückmann 1983: 228–29). One instance of this is John’s use of key elements of Aristotelian ethical theory in his major writings, nearly one hundred years before the circulation of a Latin version of the Nicomachean Ethics, explicable by Aristotle’s occasional references to his moral principles in the Organon (Nederman 1997).

Despite the relative paucity of John’s access to ancient philosophical writings, he pieced together a great deal of information about the ideas posited by their authors. This was central to John’s vision of his intellectual enterprise. In a famous comment in the Metalogicon, John speaks of the heritage to which he owes a great debt:

… our age enjoys the benefit of the age preceding, and often knows more than it, not indeed because our intelligence outstrips theirs, but because we depend on the strength of others and on the abundant learning of our ancestors. Bernard of Chartres used to say that we are like dwarfs sitting on the shoulders of giants so that we are able to see more and further than they, not indeed by the sharpness of our own vision or the height of our bodies, but because we are lifted up on high and raised aloft by the greatness of giants. With these words I will readily concur…. (ML: 257)

While what John owes to the great Christian theologians of the past should by no means be diminished, he clearly and stridently viewed himself as heir to the ancient traditions of philosophical inquiry. For this reason, among others, the term “humanist” has been bestowed upon him (by Leibschütz 1950 and more recently Nederman 2005: 41–43, but challenged by Olsen 1998 and later Bloch 2012: 61). The issue is not whether John read his classical predecessors “accurately”, but how he found inspiration in and adapted them in such a manner as to defend and further his own endeavors as a philosopher.

3. Philosophical Method

The most fundamental of John’s philosophical commitments arises expressly from Cicero. Beyond John’s self-conscious (and largely successful) effort to imitate Cicero’s polished style of Latin expression, he embraces the Ciceronian dedication to the program of the New Academy (Nederman 2005; Grellard 2013). The New Academy advocated an anti-dogmatic probabilistic theory of knowledge according to which claims to certainty remain open to challenge, so long as they have not been demonstrated beyond doubt. Cicero distanced himself from the more radically skeptical method of the so-called “Old Academy”, which denied that anything whatsoever could be known with certainty (Cicero De natura deorum: 1.1). As Cicero explains, the New Academy does not foreclose the possibility of the human mind attaining truth (pace the Old Academy), only insisting that the criteria for discerning truth from falsity are not self-evident or intuitive and that the senses can be deceived (Cicero Academica: 2.24.76–2.30.98). Cicero’s skeptical stance has the character not of absolute doubt but of anti-dogmatism.

John overtly adopted the same Ciceronian New Academic perspective in all of his noteworthy contributions to philosophy: the Policraticus, the Metalogicon, and the Entheticus de dogmate philosophorum maior. The first is his best-known work, a treatise on proper courtly and royal conduct which contains a great measure of political theory; the second comprises his critical appraisal of the state of education in twelfth-century Europe, with special attention to the advances in knowledge occasioned by the Aristotelian learning of his time; the last is a lengthy didactic poem. While scholars have normally treated these writings as discrete and largely unrelated (Wilks 1984a and von Moos 1984 are exceptions), they are united methodologically by their shared endorsement and application of Ciceronian moderate skepticism, which proves to be crucial in framing the substance of John’s philosophical stance. Charles B. Schmitt’s claim that John’s “treatment [of the New Academy] has little philosophical sophistication” proves unsustainable (Schmitt 1972: 37–38).

Because John enjoyed broad access to Cicero’s main works of philosophy, he possessed a comprehensive understanding of the issues at stake in adherence to New Academic skepticism (Denery 2016), clearly grasping the epistemological differences underpinning moderate and rigorous skeptical stances. In his Entheticus maior, John chides the radically skeptical view of the Old Academy that “the human race is deprived of light” (EMM: 1.138), endorsing the position associated with the New Academy that

one should hesitate in all things except those which are proved by living reason … These things, [the Academic] declares, are known; he passes doubtfully on other things, of which more certainty is to be had from experience. For the usual course of events makes probable what you always see under a similar pattern. Yet, since it sometimes happens otherwise, these things are not sufficiently certain, and yet not without evidence. What he, therefore, affirms to be true, he thinks to be necessary; for the rest, he says “I believe” or “I think it to be”. (EMM, ll. 1143–44, 1147–54)

Commencing with his first work of philosophical reflection, John had already declared his allegiance to an essentially Ciceronian outlook. John’s Metalogicon reiterates this position, repeatedly proclaiming his explicit commitment to the philosophical program of the New Academy. In the prologue, he announces,

An Academic in matters which to the wise man are doubtful, I do not swear that what I say is true, but, be it true or false, I remain content with probability alone. (ML: 122)

While John distances his version of skepticism from more radical views, he admits that the process of achieving knowledge is troublesome. Echoing a remark by Cicero, John observes,

… it is a great thing to discover the truth, which, as our Academic friends claim, lies hidden as it were at the bottom of a well …. (ML: 205)

John returns often in the Metalogicon to Cicero’s methodological injunction against embracing insufficiently substantiated truth-claims too hastily. A main theme of the Metalogicon might aptly be characterized as the refutation of the arid argumentation that occurred among the teachers of his time as a result of their unwillingness to renounce their rigid formulae and fixed dogmas.

John of Salisbury’s most extensive discussion and application of the Ciceronian New Academy occurs in the Policraticus. That treatise again contains repeated self-identification of its author with the teachings of the Academy, its prologue echoing the words of the Metalogicon:

In philosophy, I am a devotee of Academic dispute, which measures by reason that which presents itself as more probable. … I do not recede from their footprints in those matters about which the wise person has doubts. (PC: 7)

This is raised to the level of an evaluative standard in Book Seven’s recounting of the major schools of Greco-Roman philosophy, the stated aim of which is to discover the valuable lessons of each as well as to demonstrate the limitations inherent in all (PC: 148–49). The treatment of the Academic School is given pride of place, opening this critical history of pagan philosophy. Even as he admits his own devotion to the Academy, John stresses the divide that exists within the School between an extreme skepticism and his own moderate Ciceronian stance, offering a reductio argument against the former:

Yet I do not say that all those who are included under the name of Academic have upheld the rule of modesty, since even its basic creed is in dispute and parts of it are open as much to derision as to error… If the Academic is in doubt about each thing, he is certain about nothing… But he possesses uncertainty about whether he is in doubt, so long as he does not know for certain that he does not know this doubt itself. (PC: 150)

Radical skepticism cannot attain the mantle of philosophy, John says, because the philosopher’s love of wisdom requires the admission that one may know what is true (PC: 151–52).

John’s moderate skepticism accepts that there are three reliable foundations for knowledge: faith, reason, and the senses (PC: 153–56). Thus, it does not behoove the philosopher to question his faith in the existence of God, nor the certainty of some mathematical postulates, nor a number of other first principles which “one is not permitted to doubt, except for those who are occupied by the labors of not knowing anything” (PC: 154). Though it might seem that John’s skepticism is not so very skeptical after all, he generates a lengthy list of

doubtful matters about which the wise person is not convinced by the authority of either faith or his senses or manifest reason, and in which contrary claims rest on the support of some evidence. (PC: 152)

These topics include major issues of metaphysics, cosmology, natural science, theology, and ethics. Among the ethical topics that John cites as susceptible to doubt, and thus open to rational debate, are the uses and end and origins of virtues and vices, whether a man who has one virtue has all the virtues, whether all sins are equal and are punishable equally. (PC: 152)

The entire list is clearly meant to be illustrative rather than inclusive (PC: 152–53). In sum, John opens up to rational dispute an extraordinarily broad array of topics which are appropriate for philosophical discourse. In confronting all such debatable subjects, John counsels adherence to the Academic method, since

the Academics have doubts regarding these matters with so much modesty that I perceive them to have guarded diligently against the danger of rashness. (PC: 153)

Unique among all schools of philosophy, the Academy resists the temptation to replace open discussion of uncertain matters with prematurely closed dogma. In John’s view, the moderate skepticism of the New Academy alone defends the liberty of inquiry that he regards to be necessary to the quest for truth.

Although the Policraticus does not restate the epistemological bases of intellectual fallibility addressed in the Entheticus and Metalogicon, it clearly takes for granted that the human mind is furnished with the potential power to comprehend truth. Hence, John rejects the Augustinian claim that even Cicero’s moderate skepticism

piles up darkness from some hidden source, and warns that the whole of philosophy is obscure, and does not allow one to hope that any light will be found in it. (Augustine Against the Academicians: 3.14.30)

In a surprising twist, John enlists Augustine himself in support of those who evince Academic doubt:

Even our Augustine does not assail them, since he himself somewhat frequently employs Academic moderation in his works and propounds many matters as ambiguous which would not seem to be in question to another arguing with greater confidence and just as safely. (PC: 152)

On John’s reading, Augustine practiced the Academic method even while he excoriated it in principle. The validity of this interpretation aside, John seeks any evidence whatsoever to bolster his view that “mortals can know very little” (EMM, l. 1142).

4. Moderation

John’s admiration for temperate Academic skepticism supports what is among the key themes of his philosophy: modestia or moderatio. He was a convinced adherent of an Aristotelian-tinged doctrine that virtue necessarily consists in the mean, and that moderation in all things is the most valid standard for judging human thought and action (Nederman 1997). As John points out in the Entheticus, the Academic stance is consonant with

a modest mind … that no one may accuse it of being guilty of falsehood; it thus tempers all words with qualifiers, so that it should always be rightly credible. (EMM, ll. 155–58)

John stresses that the possessors of such a modest mind “restrain their words according to condition, time, cause, and manner, [and] they avoid speaking with too much simplicity” (EMM, ll. 161–62). Academic moderation results in rhetorical and intellectual humility, if not caution, consistent with the virtuous mean.

The counsel of moderation as crucial to any form of virtue permeates John’s later corpus as well. In the Metalogicon, he insists that education has a definite ethical component that requires recognition and examination. As he acknowledges in his prefatory remarks,

I have deliberately included a number of comments on moral issues, since my view is that everything that is read or written is valueless except in so far as it affords support to the way we live. Any profession of philosophy whatsoever is valueless and deceitful if it does manifest itself in the cultivation of virtue and the conduct of our lives. (ML: 122)

Making men virtuous is not a distinct enterprise from making them intelligent or knowledgeable; it is worthless to be well-educated if one is unable to apply this learning in the service of moral rectitude. Moreover, the very techniques one employs in the acquisition of knowledge are subject to ethical evaluation and judgment. Proper learning is defined not only by the quantity of knowledge inculcated, but by the quality of the educational experience. John believes that the doctrine of moderation and the virtuous mean is essential to any pedagogy which takes seriously its duty to mold morals as well as intellect.

The theme of moderation appears most prominently in the Metalogicon’s discussion of the correct attitude that the student ought to adopt toward his subject matter. Intellectual discipline, John asserts, arises out of adherence to a mean course between the overzealous pursuit of all topics and an absence of intellectual curiosity: “If, however, there is no moderation, all these qualities [of the mind] turn to their opposites. Subtlety is reft of its utility” (ML: 194). The mind must first discriminate among its potential subjects of study in order to eliminate those that are unsuitable, namely, matters that pertain to God alone as well as “things which are harmful; … from which come pain, anger, cupidity, and their followers, envy, hate, slander, lechery and vanity …” (ML: 299). Yet, excessive caution yields an intellect that resists inquiry into new or foreign territory. John maintains that proper philosophical investigation demands careful reflection upon the boundaries of one’s intelligence in consort with the correct application of our God-given powers of reason (ML: 180–82).

John extends his discussion of intellectual moderation to pedagogical practice, such that a moderate attitude toward study is manifested in the extent of materials one consults. The Metalogicon warns that

to follow up what some one even of the most contemptible of men has ever said is a sign either of complete masochism or of empty top-show, and it impedes and overwhelms minds which would be better off spending their time on other things. (ML: 177)

The well-trained scholar will survey those authorities who are deserving of respect, while ignoring works that do not merit effort and attention. Equally importantly, learning ought not to be an all-consuming, exclusive (and therefore excessive) way of life. Rather,

intelligence must … be carefully cultivated under the control both of study and of relaxation, the former designed to give it strength, the latter encouragement … Intelligence starts with nature, is assisted by practice, is dulled by excess of toil, and is sharpened by controlled exercise. (ML: 148)

The overzealous scholar courts counterproductive conduct, if not the peril of his soul.

The notion that wisdom entails a moderate cast of mind forms the basis for John’s criticism of pedagogical techniques then current in the schools. The temper of the times discourages observation of the mean, so that instructors prompt students to all manner of intellectual excess. Disputations are conducted without concern for time, place, or topic, in spite of the fact that

Aristotle ought to have checked this immoderation on the part of those who identify indiscriminate volubility with the exercise of dialectic. (ML: 196)

It is on grounds of immoderation that John objects to the unrestrained use of the verbal duel:

A voluble tongue … throws one’s life into confusion, and, unless checked by the curb of moderation, drives one’s whole being headlong. (ML: 195–96; translation slightly altered)

He has observed this situation, he says, at first hand. After visiting former school associates from Paris, John reports his disappointment, finding that “[t]hey had made progress—in just this one thing that, having unlearned moderation, they had thereby lost all modesty” (ML: 201). For like reasons, the Metalogicon urges re-evaluation of the contemporary practices associated with philosophical studies. When logic and dialectic are employed without regard for the pursuit of wisdom, when their practice moves beyond the mean, when, in sum, philosophy becomes immoderately fond of its own image, the goal of wisdom ceases to be paramount and such study is sterile and pointless.

The theme of moderation likewise infuses the Policraticus, the audience for which was two-fold: first, courtiers and other so-called “bureaucrats” (per Forhan 1985) who serve the interests of the realm; and second, rulers who are ultimately responsible for maintaining peace and justice in their kingdoms. John’s primary concern is to illuminate the vices of kings and their servants in order to instruct them in the forms of behavior appropriate to men of status and power. But John adopts a realistic approach, explicitly acknowledging that the demands of an ascetic morality are unsuitable for such people. Since John intended the Policraticus to be a practical guidebook, he was prepared to allow that

if moderation is displayed, I do not judge it unbecoming … to dwell at times upon the pleasures of the senses; as has been said, nothing is unseemly that is beyond measure … Modestly pursued for purposes of recreation, they are excused upon the license of leisure. (FCP: 373)

John orients the value of moderation toward the actual conditions under which courtiers and princes live. But there is an implicit political warning: Those in positions of leadership must not become so in thrall to such pursuits that these become ends in themselves and the business of the kingdom suffers.

More broadly, John harnesses the principle of moderation to a general theory of virtue, one that has important consequences for his political as well as moral thought. It is central to John’s doctrine throughout the Policraticus that if any action

exceeds the mean, it is a fault. Every virtue is marked by its own boundaries, and consists in the mean. If one exceeds this, one is off the road, not on it. (FCP: 157)

Bad men “‘withdraw from the mean between vices, which is the field of virtue’” (FCP: 374). But John by no means endorses zealotry. Employing the metaphor of the left and right hands, John observes that

to stray to the right is to insist vehemently upon the virtues themselves [that is, to be fanatical]. To stray to the left is to exceed the mean in works of virtue, which consists in the mean. Truly all vehemence is inimical to salvation, and all excess is in error; an excess of goodness and of habitually good deeds is very evil. (PC: 53)

While this view may seem strange for an orthodox churchman to assert, it reveals the extent of John’s concern about how his audience might interpret his remarks. All virtues by nature may be attained only when pursued within definite limits, and so he is not expecting courtiers to be saints. Almost certainly referring to Aristotle, John remarks that

the philosopher says: Beware that which is excessive because if one abandons this cautious moderation itself, to that extent does one withdraw incautiously from the path of virtue … What, therefore is advanced by excess, if the queen of the virtues, justice, perishes in its excessiveness? (PC: 54)

Overstepping good in the name of goodness itself is as repugnant as the utter absence of moral propriety.

To determine the virtuous mean in any specific circumstance, John advances an essentially Ciceronian standard: “Discretion with regard to time, place, amount, person and cause readily draws the proper distinction” between virtuous and vicious actions. Indeed, one might understand John to advocate a sort of circumstantialist—though by no means relativist—moral theory, since discretion “is the origin and source of moderation in its widest sense without which no duty is properly performed” (FCP: 373). Attention to context is required, for John, to guide the determinations one ought to make of what constitutes virtuous behavior. Thus, it is clearly vicious to take a human life, yet as a form of punishment or as the result of a justly fought battle, it may be vicious not to take a life. This conception of virtue posits the identification of a morally correct action as a sort of moving target, rather than a fixed moral absolute that applies at all times and in all places. This seems to be the philosophical premise behind his argument that various activities that might be viewed as reprehensible in themselves may be morally justifiable when conducted in the proper measure. In Book One of the Policraticus, following a lengthy and scathing critique of hunting—a favorite pastime of the English aristocracy to whom he is writing—John reverses course: “The activity, however, is laudable when moderation is shown and hunting is pursued with judgment and, when possible, with profit” (FCP: 25). The same holds for the many other popular courtly “frivolities”. John’s overarching aim is to keep his audience mindful of that “moderation without which the good life is impossible” (FCP: 161), the very essence of which is the performance of the right act in the right way and in the right situation, in accordance with one’s best judgment. (For further discussion of this topic, see the supplement on Practical Moderate Skepticism.)

5. Princely Moderation

John applies his principle that virtue is by definition a mean between excess and deficiency emphatically to the ruler. The moral qualities of the community as a whole are inextricable linked, in John’s view, to the moral characteristics of its royal head. By dint of his personal character, the good prince—the king—assures the coherence and well-being of the polity he rules; by contrast, a vicious prince—the tyrant—will reduce his subjects to slaves of his own private desires. Given the definition of virtue that John posits, the actions of a king must themselves and by definition be moderate. According to the Policraticus, the moderation exercised by the good ruler necessarily unifies and balances the relationship that his people enjoy with one another. Employing a musical metaphor, he asks,

How much more care should be taken by princes to be moderate—at one time by the vigour of justice, at another by the forgiveness of mercy—so that subjects are made to be of a single mind … and the works of peace and charity create one perfect and great harmony out of pursuits which appear discordant? (PC: 51)

This does not mean that the king is the absolute arbiter of his subjects’ morals. Rather, the good prince should instruct by example, adopting that “tranquil moderation of mind” so valued in the magistrates of antiquity (PC: 54). While never encouraging vice, John’s preferred ruler would tolerate—or at least not punish hastily and harshly—those evils committed by members of the community that do not endanger public order or religious orthodoxy. John cautions that “the amount of the affection, with which subjects are embraced [by the king] like brothers in the arms of charity must be confined to the limits of moderation”, lest his people lose respect for him and believe that they can perform all manner of wickedness without fear of consequence (PC: 49). Yet, the Policraticus protests against the ruler “who is too excessively inclined towards the punishing of the faults of subjects” (PC: 54). While the king should rapidly take action against those “flagrant crimes” that “one is not permitted to endure or which cannot faithfully be endured”, he should also demonstrate mildness and patience toward those acts of his subjects “which honor and religion can securely endure” (PC: 140). Special royal virtue, the art of governance, consists in the moderate use of the authority that God has bestowed.

Although John regards the king as “the minister of God” and the servant of divine law, the good ruler must restrain himself with the bridle of law and hold back his will, while maintaining humility in his relations with his subjects, since he is defined by moderation in all his deeds and decrees (PC: 28–29, 46–49). A good ruler will display such restraint despite his divinely mandated power, according to John, because the king’s ingrained moral character—the result of a careful program of instruction—necessarily guides him to seek justice and to respect divine dictates. It bears emphasis that John’s conception of the nature of political power is an entirely personalized one: The incumbent makes the office. The king’s disposition to follow the path of moderation is reinforced by the rewards that he receives: Honored among men, he guarantees a peaceful reign and safe succession; beloved of God, he will receive the gift of salvation. “Kings can both flourish and abound with the most sweet worldly things”, John proclaims, “and yet can pick the most useful fruits of eternity” (PC: 55). Nor does he suppose that such desserts pertain only to the most righteous of rulers:

To refuse evil is a great thing in them [princes], even if they do no great goodness, provided that they do not permit their subjects to indulge in evil. (PC: 55)

The king who refrains from misusing his great powers and who pursues policies that maintain the harmonious order of the community assures happiness (temporal and eternal) for himself, his progeny, and his subjects.

The opposite of the king is the tyrant, who is characterized by the immoderate application of political power over those subject to him. If the ruler seeks excessive domination, if he attempts to use his power to enslave the community, then he is a tyrant. That is, the tyrant is a person possessing a wholly self-interested and willful character whose ambition for the supreme governmental office has been fulfilled. What renders him a tyrant is, strictly speaking, neither his moral qualities nor the power he exercises, but the conjunction and combination of the two. A tyrant claims a monopoly of discretionary authority over all those under his control, so that the maintenance of his full license requires the absence of true freedom for others. The Policraticus insists that “as long as all, collectively and individually, are borne along at the will of a single head, they are deprived of their own free will” (FCP: 184). Nor does John believe that the victim of the tyrant ought “to make a virtue of necessity by uniting consent and necessity and by gracefully embracing that which is incumbent upon him” (FCP: 184), as this preserves the mere semblance of liberty. John instead advocates positive measures to protect the community from its tyrant—in the last instance, by tyrannicide (discussed below). The good government of the king, typified by rule in accordance with the virtuous mean, is regarded by the Policraticus to be the sole guarantee of the freedom necessary for the exercise of moral goodness in society.

6. Anti-Epicureanism

In line with John’s heavy emphasis on moderation, significant sections of Books Seven and Eight of the Policraticus deliver a withering critique of a philosophy he regards as the antithesis of moderation, namely, Epicureanism (despite virtually no mention of Epicurus and/or his school in the examination of John’s use of classical philosophy in Hermand-Schebat 2015). While John’s views reflect Cicero’s highly critical perspective (similar criticisms exist in Seneca and Augustine’s De civitate dei), several aspects of John’s presentation of Epicureanism seem highly distinctive and innovative. In selectively appropriating Epicurean doctrines, he omits significant dimensions of the tradition, while extending other elements in novel directions. Classical Epicureanism depended upon an atomistic cosmology that posited random occurrences in the void as the ontological premise of the universe. As a consequence, classical Epicureans insisted that no political lessons followed from their moral theory. John sets aside the cosmological backdrop to Epicurean ethical teachings, while also finding in them the source of a potent (albeit dangerous) political doctrine. There does not seem to be any direct precedent for such an interpretation, but, given John’s inventive use of authorities and exempla, one ought not to be surprised by his selective and idiosyncratic treatment of the Epicurean school (von Moos 1984; Martin 1984).

One indication that John is offering a unique reading of the Epicurean tradition emerges from his claim that the ideas of Epicurus himself are not to be mainly disdained, but that his followers should be blamed for turning his ethics into a form of untrammeled hedonism. Deviating from his ancient and patristic sources, John detaches master from school, finding some merit in Epicurus’ notion that happiness may be sought through the pursuit of moderate hedonism. “[I]f moderation is displayed”, John states,

I do not judge it unbecoming … to dwell at times upon these pleasures of the senses … [for] nothing is unseemly except that which is beyond measure. (FCP: 373)

“[T]he field of virtue” consists neither in excessive enjoyment of nor denial of pleasure, but is to be found in “the mean between vices” (FCP: 374).

John asserts that the followers of Epicurus broke loose from the crucial restraint of moderation, such that Epicureanism became the pursuit of sensual pleasure without bounds. John separates Epicurus’ acceptable philosophy from its later practice:

…[W]hat should have been the instrument of virtue has been diverted by writers to the profit of filthiness. Flesh then has concluded (for assuredly no man endowed with sense holds the opinion) that to think, say, and do all that the mind, tongue, and hand covet and to thwart oneself or to repress one’s inclination in nothing is the life of a man enjoying supreme happiness …. (FCP: 273)

The sensual has been placed above the philosophical, the external above the internal, and pleasure above wisdom, so that in all ways Epicureanism subverts true happiness. Epicureanism not only perverts the individual, but also the entire body politic, inasmuch as a nation that “has … been conquered by its own self-indulgence” is ripe for conquest (FCP: 331).

Those whom John labels Epicureans are so branded not because of any self-proclaimed adherence to the school of Epicurus, but rather because of their observable behaviors and deeds. Excess is the defining characteristic of Epicureans, “who in all matters serve their own personal desires” (PC: 182). Because they “teach philosophy and … serve their own private wills”, they are also hypocrites (PC: 175). Despite John’s flexible standard for evaluating moderation, he finds that “the world is filled with Epicureans for the reason that in its great multitude of men there are few who are not slaves to lust” (FCP: 399–400). Since most people are susceptible to sensual gratification, one need not call oneself an Epicurean, John asserts, in order to practice its teachings.

John is convinced that Epicureans, lacking moderation, cannot achieve the happiness that Epicurus himself postulated (FCP: 399), because

toilsome is the passage to happiness by the route of pleasure, for its votaries gather wealth to maintain themselves, seek grandeur to be upheld by power, position to inspire respect and to avoid contempt, and aim at glory to win fame. Yet that life which Epicurus describes is not acquired by all these means. (FCP: 274)

One sign that a man driven by Epicurean acquisitiveness is notoriety—whether in conduct, speech, or dress—“for notoriety connotes lack of moderation” (FCP: 371). Thus it is that “ermine makes the judge” (FCP: 386). A person’s desire for possessions “exhaust[s] the strength of [his] whole being” and can never lead to the good life, “[f]or the frenzy of avarice … covets to excess the possessions of others or guards its own too tenaciously” (FCP: 277). John is explicit about the origin of this vicious cycle: “Pride is the beginning of all sin”, creating in man the desire to be pre-eminent. From its “poisonous root” spring ambition, acquisitiveness, hoarding, resentment, flattery, false modesty, over-indulgence, and all manner of evils (FCP: 295).

While John recognizes hierarchy as intrinsic to human and corporate relations, he warns of the perverting effects hierarchy can produce when the twin pillars of liberality and justice have been toppled: “Wealth, influence, and favor, since they confer much power, put character to a severe test” (FCP: 298). The only way to survive such a test is to embrace the guiding light of moderation, for “[e]ach one more easily becomes puffed up with pride in that in which he excels others, unless he be sustained by the grace of moderation” (FCP: 297). Though aware of Plato’s contention that such pleasures ought to be actively struggled against (a stock view of classical philosophers), John advocates that “the safer course [is] to flee and evade the conflict”, as he has never “read of anyone who has challenged carnal pleasures who has not fallen in the encounter” (FCP: 353). Likely, his own experience and observations of rampant Epicureanism also inform his views.

John’s treatment of Epicureanism leads him to identify a political component not present in the ancient school. For John, the Epicurean mindset and lifestyle are intimately associated with and form the foundation for tyranny, which is not a wholly political concept. The Policraticus details several species of tyrant: the private tyrant, the ecclesiastical tyrant, and the public or royal tyrant (PC: 191–92). According to John, anyone who employs power to impose his will arbitrarily upon another is a tyrant. John admits that his definition deviates considerably from the ordinary understanding:

It is said that the tyrant is one who oppresses a people by forceful domination; but it is not solely over a people that [the tyrant] exercises his tyranny, but he can do so from the lowest position. For if not over a people, still he will lord over (dominatur) whomever he can … Who is it who does not wish to come before some other one if he might be subdued? (PC: 163)

Anyone, in John’s estimation, is capable of behaving tyrannically, owing to humans’ deep-seated desire to seek sensual gratification. “They who wish to do their own will are to be rated as Epicureans”, John concludes, “for when actions become the slave of lust, affection changes to passion” (FCP: 399). The vices of Epicureanism spring from “the well of passion”, which leads men to suppose that they “can do with impunity” whatever they wish and “can to a certain degree be just like God”—not in imitation of divine goodness, but in the belief that their wills can supplant God’s own. Thus, Epicureanism promotes pride and ambition, leading to “a passion for power and honors” that constitutes the root of tyranny (PC: 162–63). (For John’s paradigmatic example, see the supplement on The Epicurean Tyrant.)

7. Naturalism

Another substantive philosophical issue John of Salisbury engages is the role played by nature in the foundations of social and political order, an interest evident across his works. That John adopts a naturalistic framework in the Policraticus might seem sensible, but it appears also as a crucial feature of the Metalogicon, wherein John develops the Ciceronian theme that humans are transformed from animalistic primordial beings into civil creatures as a consequence of the realization of the inhering human capacities of reason and language. Thus, education forms a highly relevant element of his naturalism.

John’s appeal to a Ciceronian conception of the natural foundations of society in the Metalogicon arises out of his attempt to refute the doctrine, ascribed to the possibly fictional Cornificius and his followers, that the qualities and powers with which men are born constitute the limit of their knowledge and faculties (Tobin 1989). Under this view, human beings ought not to seek to improve their condition or to develop their minds and skills, relying instead on God’s redemptive grace, while shunning the material world and their own natures completely (ML: 137, 141–42). In opposition to Cornificius, John argues that the mundane and sinful character of human nature does not end the debate. Rather, God through nature has granted to mankind the capacity to improve its lot by diligent application of the native faculties of reason and speech. This is not to say that John considers man’s nature (in Aristotelian terms) to be wholly perfectible; grace is still required. Yet men may accomplish much by nature alone, contrary to the Cornifician teaching that no attempt can (or perhaps should) be made to develop post-lapsarian man (ML: 125–26).

A major pillar supporting John’s case against the Cornificians is an adapted version of Cicero’s depiction of the primitive development of human association. John deploys his source in order to demonstrate that social interaction among men is an important well-spring of true (albeit partial, because merely mortal) happiness or blessedness (beatitudo). The Metalogicon regards nature (in Stoic fashion), “the most benign parent and governor of all things in order most due”, as imprinted with a divine plan (ML: 124). Thus, if nature has granted to man alone the powers of speech and reason, this is so he may “gain blessedness” (ML: 125). Such a plan emerges from the rational observation of the structure of the universe:

[T]he one and true God, in order to bind the parts of the universe in a firm alliance and to keep charity alive, ordered them in such a way that one thing needed the help of another, and one made good the deficiency of another, every single one being as it were a member of every other one. All things if separated from one another are thus only half complete, but are made perfect when allied to others, since all things are held together by mutual support. (ML: 125)

This theme of reciprocity imbues John’s corpus, employed in his correspondence and forming the basis of his organic metaphor for the polity (addressed below) (see JL1: 181). In the Metalogicon, this universal model of mutual interconnection indicates the natural course which ought to guide human behavior: “[I]t is not possible even to imagine a kind of blessedness which knows nothing of communion or exists outside society”, John declares, because nature decrees that earthly happiness derives from human association (ML: 125). To imperil society by assailing man’s capacity to improve his rational powers—an accusation which John levels against Cornificius—is thus to cut man off from the happiness which God has allotted to him in the present life, as well as to exclude the possibility of fulfilling the terms of divinely bestowed grace.

John’s view is that man’s rational faculty demands a level of sociability unparalleled in nature. In Ciceronian fashion, the Metalogicon argues that reason’s discovery of the naturalness of association is not sufficient, because such individual realization can never generate the community that it knows to be natural to and beneficial for human existence. Speech is the mechanism by which mute wisdom translates its insights into public proclamations and persuades men to follow their natural inclination by surrendering their private interests in favor of the common good (ML: 126). Should humans retain their rational abilities yet be deprived of speech, “they will become brute beasts, and … cities will seem like farmyards rather than gatherings of human beings united in the bonds of society” (ML: 126). Enlightened eloquence, however,

gave birth to so many glorious cities … and bound so many peoples in the bonds of charity, that whoever strives to put asunder what God has joined together for the common benefit of all would rightly be accounted the common enemy of all. (ML: 126)

John’s vision of society is comparable to Cicero’s in its quasi-contractual quality, in that human association requires, beyond geographic proximity, explicit agreement to share a common life in all of the features that compose a community. Only the eloquent use of language can convince selfish men that by nature they prefer the common good to personal welfare. In this regard, John’s reliance on Cicero is pronounced: The Metalogicon presumes that the bond of association among men is simultaneously a product of their active cooperation, a natural, but not purely natural (in contrast to Aristotle), outcome.

The real significance of the Cornifician position lies in its opposition to “all cities simultaneously and the whole of civil life”, since, by claiming that men should not develop their capacities for reason and speech, any opportunity for man to associate is in the process denied (ML: 127). The Cornifician error is to interpret the fixity of post-lapsarian human nature as a permanent condition, whereas, if this were correct, society could never have been formed originally, let alone maintained. Yet, John recognizes that conscious effort is required if men are to join together in communal life. John conceives of human association as a process of man refining and improving his own abilities in order to aid the cause of nature. The Metalogicon’s understanding of the genesis of society is profoundly indebted to Cicero’s notion that nature’s endowment is only a point of departure which men must develop and shape if they are truly to live in accordance with their own natural inclinations.

This commitment to naturalism is perhaps even more on display in the Policraticus, in which John repeatedly asserts that “nature is the best guide to living” (PC: 27, 127, 201). The Policraticus follows the teaching in the Metalogicon that, while nature provides the foundation for human capabilities, they are only potentialities. “The beginning of each thing is from nature”, John observes, but people may (and should) develop their natural capacities by means of practice until they master their art, a principle that “obtains in liberal and mechanical occupations” alike (PC: 125). While nature offers a model for human conduct and association, the natural scheme for living well may only be realized with the cooperation of people who partake in it.

8. The Body Politic

John’s naturalistic conception of cooperative association informs the famous organic analogy that he proposes and develops in the Policraticus. Ascribing his insight to a letter of instruction (John’s creation) purportedly by Plutarch to Emperor Trajan, John commences with the simple observation that the commonwealth may be likened to a “body which is animated” (PC: 66; on the history of the controversy about the letter’s authenticity, see Martin 1984: 194–96). The different offices of political society are represented as analogous to the distinct parts of the human anatomy. Like all bodies, the commonwealth is guided by a soul, which John assigns to “those who direct the practice of religion” (PC: 67). Yet, just as the eternal human soul is not coextensive with the mortal physical organism within which it resides, the clerical soul of the polity is not, strictly speaking, a member of the commonwealth (see Nederman 2013). Because the political creature is an essentially secular entity, the body politic is ruled by the prince, who “occupies the place of the head” (PC: 69). (For further discussion of the relationship between the secular body and its ecclesiastical soul, see the supplement on Princely Tyranny and the Liberty of the Church.)

The senate, composed of the prince’s counselors, functions as the commonwealth’s heart. The senses correspond to the royal judges and local agents who exercise jurisdiction in the king’s name. The financial officers constitute the body’s stomach and intestines, while the tax-collector and the soldier represent the two hands. Finally, John compares the feet to the artisans and peasants “who erect, sustain and move forward the mass of the whole body” (PC: 67). Each part of the organism, according to the Policraticus, has its own definite function, fixed by its location within the overall scheme of the body. None of the members may be excluded or removed without serious damage to the whole.

John’s functional depiction of the community was not, as is sometimes supposed, primarily intended to justify hierarchy and division within society (for a contrary view, see Struve 1984: 309–11). Rather, the body politic found in the Policraticus is the expression of a principle of cooperative harmony through which otherwise disparate individuals and interests are reconciled and bound together. John adopts a “physiological” approach to the political organism, according to which all of the organs cooperate reciprocally in order to achieve a common purpose. The Policraticus insists that “there can be no faithful and firm coherence where there is not a tenacious unity of wills and a virtual joining together of souls themselves” (PC: 77). Echoing the naturalistic principle articulated in the Metalogicon, John posits that all parts of the body must be truly oriented toward and dedicated to a common or public welfare that supersedes the aggregate private goods within the polity. The ruler and magistrates are advised to attend “to the utility of all”, the feet are counseled “to concentrate on the public utility in all matters”, and in general “all the members” are expected to “keep watch over the public advantage” (PC: 136, 126, 135). The security of the body politic can only be maintained by means of a joint commitment to a public good which benefits all, so that

each individual may be likened to a part of the others reciprocally and each believes what is to his own advantage to be determined by that which he recognizes to be most useful for others. (PC: 126)

John’s political body is one in which, beyond all social differentiation, there is “mutual charity reigning everywhere”, because all segments are attuned to the same enduring common purpose that encompasses the valid interests of the whole (PC: 142). Unity follows from cooperation, and cooperation stems from the existence of a good shared by the entire community and each of its members.

Following from his use of a physiological model of social organization, John identifies maintenance of the ‘health’ of the body politic as necessary to ensuring a cooperative spirit and avoiding fragmentation. For John, the political body’s health depends on the practice of justice by the organs and members. This association between the common good and justice entails a correlative obligation on the part of all members of the commonwealth:

Inasmuch as the duties of each individual are practiced so that provision is made for the corporate community, as long as justice is practiced, the ends of all are imbued with the sweetness of honey. (PC: 131)

Every organ and limb must conduct itself according to the dictates of justice if the polity is to exist as a corporate whole. John’s conception of justice follows the Ciceronian duality (Cicero De officiis: I.7.23) of negative obligation and positive duty:

Justice consists chiefly in this: do not do harm and prevent the doing of harm out of duty to humanity. When you do harm, you assent to injury. When you do not impede the doing of harm, you are a servant of injustice. (PC: 62)

Because justice is inherently productive of social cooperation, whereas injustice necessarily tends to disharmony and social disintegration, John construes justice as both a generalized virtue and the guarantor of the body’s health. Since justice is the salient characteristic of the common good, it determines the manner in which each bodily member performs its functions. Not only kings and magistrates, but even the lowliest of parts, are viewed by John as potential agents of public justice (see Nederman 1997), reinforced by the fact that the function of each is absolutely necessary for the well-being of all. The wide diffusion of responsibility for the maintenance of justice assures that all members of the body politic possess the basic faculties necessary for guarding and protecting the common good.

John is willing, under exceptional circumstances, to extend this discretion to direct political action against evil rulers. He describes two circumstances that warrant public concern: the commission by rulers of minor offenses, which can be tolerated by the community, and of flagrant crimes, which endanger the well-being of the body politic (PC: 140–41). In the first instance, citizens should express their disapproval and recommend corrective measures, but should not challenge the king’s position. In the second case, when the common good and religion are threatened by a tyrant, members of the political organism ought—indeed, are bound by the functionalist terms of the political order—to take action to deflect injury to the body. This claim forms the basis for John’s controversial doctrine of tyrannicide. Scholars have debated whether these remarks amount to a theory of tyrant-killing or merely an account of the bad endings that have come to all tyrants (Van Laarhoven 1984; Nederman 1988). John’s seemingly contradictory claim that tyrants are both the servants of God and assured of divine punishment (PC: 201–02) finds resolution through numerous historical examples of the destruction of tyrannical rulers once their ordained purpose has been achieved.

Yet, as elsewhere in John’s writings, this religious dimension of tyrannicide is paralleled by a philosophical justification that depends on reason alone. Because John considers tyranny to be a crime against “the body of justice itself” (PC: 25), he invokes the organic nature of the community to explain the legitimacy, albeit rare, of tyrannicide. Inasmuch as one enjoys membership in the political community, one may ultimately be responsible—based on each part’s duty to see justice served in the whole—for eradicating the incorrigible tyrant. John does not believe that such action should be undertaken lightly, specifying a set of conditions that must be met prior to eliminating a tyrant (PC: 209; see 207–09 for the paradigmatic proper tyrannicide). Following from his naturalistic paradigm, John asserts that “whoever does not prosecute [the tyrant] transgresses against himself and against the whole body of the secular republic” (PC: 25). Note that slaying a tyrant, under the caveats John specifies, falls within the general obligation on the part of every member of the political body, without distinction, to pursue justice. Since the health of each depends upon the health of all, John posits a strong link between the organic nature of social and political order and the widespread public defense of that order, extending even to the act of removing a tyrant (on John’s use of medical metaphors, see Shogimen and Nederman 2011).

9. Practical Philosophy

John’s supposedly non-philosophical works—two substantial letter collections, two hagiographies, and a (brief) history—attest, in various ways, to his central commitment to a practical philosophy. John’s contemporary readers shared his understanding that all of his works both partake in the moral and philosophical and have immediate, real-world relevance. Upon receiving a copy of John’s first letter collection, his close friend and frequent correspondent Peter of Celle described it as “seasoned with philosophy, clothed in the characters of rhetoric” (quoted in JL1, x). In myriad ways within and across his non-theoretical texts, John addresses the nature of philosophy, provides examples of moderate skepticism at work, outlines the parameters of moderation and immoderation as to both virtues and vices, and examines the relationship between the secular body politic and its ecclesiastical soul.

John often drew attention to the practical dimensions of philosophy. In a passage in John’s Life of Saint Anselm, for instance, he expands on his critique of what he viewed as the sterile approach to learning—both philosophy for its own sake and for a purpose not oriented toward the cultivation of virtue—then dominant in the schools. John reports that Anselm, having been perhaps overly diligent in his studies, “c[ame] back to his senses and wisely examin[ed] his ways”, a pedagogical practice recommended in the Metalogicon. He then realized “that a stream of eloquence or this world’s philosophy does not confer true happiness. These often produce pride …” (A&B: 21). In light of John’s sustained indictment of rampant Epicurean tendencies, as well as his judgment that Epicureanism is incapable of leading to the summum bonum, it is likely that “this world’s philosophy” represents a retroactive reference to John’s present.

A number of the letters John wrote during his Becket-related exile in France include meditations on the true purpose of philosophy and the role of the true philosopher. In a letter to his fellow churchman Gerard of Pucelle, John characterizes his exile as “the trial of the purpose of true philosophers … those who suffer in innocence and for the defence of faith and justice” (JL2: 68–69). In light of the very real constraints on John’s finances, it is not surprising that he found comfort in the philosophic tradition of rejecting worldly possessions, claiming that “[n]othing is more fitting for a philosopher than to profess the truth, reverence justice, despise the world, and, when necessary, to love poverty” (JL2: 68–69). In a letter dating to the same period, John explains to his friend Hugh, abbot of Bury St. Edmunds, that philosophy is the “foster parent of virtues and governess of duty … She lays down that the useful and the honourable are linked together by mutual predication …” (JL2: 264–65), a distinctively Ciceronian theme. To fellow philosopher John Saracen, John casts his state of exile—in language that both echoes the Policraticus and calls to mind Boethius—as conducive to philosophy, writing that he now views his present condition as a

friend, who opened my eyes, formerly dazzled by the absurd fantasies of fortune, drove away courtly trifles and alluring pleasures, urged me on the path of virtue, and numbered me among the throngs of the philosophers. (JL2: 270–71)

Occupying the pinnacle of this throng, in John’s estimation, is his former teacher, Gilbert of Poitiers, “the most learned man of our day” (HP: 15), whose heresy trial at the 1148 Council of Rheims John attended and reports at length in his Historia Pontificalis (for an analysis of John’s account of the trial and its aftermath, see Bollermann and Nederman 2014). Among the qualities that single Gilbert—and, hence, the ideal (Christian) philosopher—out, John notes that he possessed

the very keenest intelligence … had read most things and … after spending almost sixty years in reading and close study, was so learned in the liberal arts that … he was held to surpass all in every subject … [and was] thoroughly conversant with the [church] doctors. (HP: 16, 27)

While displaying “the great moderation always habitual to him”, Gilbert “made use of every branch of learning as occasion demanded, knowing that all were consistent with each other, and mutually illuminating” (HP: 26–27). These sentiments echo and reinforce the Metalogicon’s lessons on scholars and study.

Finally, in the prologue to the Historia Pontificalis, John delineates a philosophy of history firmly rooted in the practical: A chronicle such as his will “profit my contemporaries and future generations” because it generates a record

valuable for establishing or abolishing customs, for strengthening or destroying privileges; and nothing … teaches the living more surely and soundly than knowledge of the deeds of the departed. (HP: 3)

John’s mention of customs and privileges is particularly noteworthy, as he wrote the Historia early in his exile, when King Henry II was insisting that Becket and the English church submit to the so-called ancient customs and privileges his royal predecessors had purportedly enjoyed.

In sum, John does not embrace the traditional doctrine that contemplation is inherently superior to and more praiseworthy than action. Quite to the contrary, he adopts the position that the entire point of philosophical inquiry is to provide guidance in the conduct of one’s affairs. John’s principles of philosophical inquiry should thus be viewed in the context of his broadly humanistic project, namely, the identification of the features conducive to human happiness. Throughout his writings, he stresses that philosophy ought not to be a specialized, dry, and obscure pursuit, but rather an integral feature of an active, dutiful, and devout life within the political arena. Philosophical investigation is to be valued because knowledge and its by-products (including social order and virtue) promote the earthly summum bonum of humanity. In contrast to the Epicureans, whom he observes abounding at court, John’s standard of living well is not found in the physical comfort associated with wealth, power, status, and luxury. Rather, he proposes that wisdom, properly attained, promotes the useful goods of virtue, qualities of the human soul that ultimately generate the highest degree of happiness. We should desire to be wise and virtuous, John believes, because we will thereby fulfill our natural (and divinely ordained) purpose as human beings. And when we flourish in this way, we cannot fail to become happy in the way God intended.

This basic orientation of mind constitutes the core of John’s main contributions to philosophy. The Metalogicon is meant to be a practical guidebook to such happiness through a morally-guided quest for knowledge, a goal that John regards to be of far greater worth and far more befitting the philosopher than the technical pursuits too commonly found in the schools. Likewise, in proposing the political ideas of the Policraticus, he sought to illustrate the principle that philosophy provides invaluable aid in achieving the good life of both the individual and the entire community. The vitality of John’s thought consists primarily in its confrontation with the tensions between the demands of everyday life, whether in the classroom or at court, and the requirements of living well in a moral and religious sense. His vision of philosophy is the self-consciously practical one of revealing how our moral and intellectual characteristics may help us to navigate toward lives that are fulfilling on earth, while also attaining the ultimate heavenly reward. Much of John’s career proves a testament to his conviction that philosophy only possesses value to the extent that it shapes our choices and actions.

Tracing the philosophical lineage of John’s thought through his later works illustrates the essential unity of his intellectual perspective. He did not discriminate radically between his speculative and his practical work. On the contrary, he seems to have enthusiastically incorporated philosophical principles into the conduct of his everyday life as well as his analysis of contemporary events and personalities. Philosophy for John was not to be left at the schoolhouse door, for it ought to occupy an important place in the world at large. The task of philosophical discourse is to aid in discerning the good from the evil, the true from the false, and so to illuminate the path toward happiness by navigating the tricky by-ways of public life.


Primary Sources

Works by John of Salisbury

[A&B] Anselm & Becket: Two Canterbury Saints’ Lives by John of Salisbury, R.E. Pepin (trans.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 2009.
[EMM] Entheticus maior et minor, L. Van Laarhoven (ed.), 3 vols., Leiden: Brill, 1987.
[FCP] Frivolities of Courtiers and Footprints of Philosophers, J.B. Pike (ed.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1938.
[HP] Historia Pontificalis, M. Chibnall (ed.), rev. ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
[JL1] The Letters of John of Salisbury, Vol. 1, The Early Letters (1153–1161), W.J. Millor, H.E. Butler and C.N.L. Brooke (eds.), Edinburgh: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1955.
[JL2] The Letters of John of Salisbury, Vol. 2: The Later Letters, W.J. Millor and C.N.L. Brooke (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979.
[ML] Metalogicon, J.B. Hall and J.P. Haseldine (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols, 2013.
[PC] Policraticus: Of the Frivolities of Courtiers and the Footprints of Philosophers, C.J. Nederman (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.

Other Primary Sources

  • Augustine, Against the Academicians, P. King (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995.
  • Cicero, De officiis, W. Miller (ed.), Cambridge, MA : Harvard University Press, 1913.
  • –––, De natura deorum and Academica, H. Rackham (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1933.
  • Eadmer, [History], Eadmer’s History of Recent Events in England, G. Bosanquet (trans.), London: The Cresset Press, 1964.
  • –––, The Life of Saint Anselm (Vita Anselmi), R.W. Southern (ed. and trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1962.

Secondary Literature

  • Bloch, D., 2012, John of Salisbury on Aristotelian Science, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Blumenroth, I., 2021, Das Alexanderische Schisma in Briefen und Ideenwelt des Arnulf von Lisieux und Johannes von Salisbury, Cologne: Bohlau Verlag.
  • Bollermann, K. and C.J. Nederman, 2014, “Standing in Abelard’s Shadow: Gilbert of Poitiers, the 1148 Council of Rheims, and the Politics of Ideas”, in Religion, Power, and Resistance from the Eleventh to the Sixteenth Centuries, K. Bollermann, T.M. Izbicki, and C.J. Nederman (eds.), New York: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 13–36.
  • –––, 2015, “John of Salisbury and Thomas Becket”, in Grellard and Lachaud 2015: 63–104.
  • Denery, D., II, 2016, “John of Salisbury, Academic Scepticism, and Ciceronian Rhetoric”, in The Oxford History of Classical Reception in English Literature, v. 1, Rita Copeland (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 377–390.
  • Dutton, P.E., 1983, “Illustre Civitatis et Popoli Exemplum: Plato’s Timaeus and the Transmission from Calcidius to the End of the Twelfth Century of a Tripartite Scheme of Society”, Mediaeval Studies, 45: 79–119.
  • Forhan, K.L, 1985, “A Twelfth-Century ‘Bureaucrat’ and the Life of the Mind: The Political Thought of John of Salisbury”, Proceedings of the PMR Conference, 10: 65–74.
  • Grellard, C., 2013, Jean de Salisbury et le renaissance médiévale du scepticisme, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Grellard, C. and F. Lachaud (eds.), 2015, A Companion to John of Salisbury, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2018, Jean de Salisbury, nouvelles lectures, nouveaux enjeux, Florence, SISMEL Edizioni del Galluzzo.
  • Hermand-Schebat, L., 2015, “John of Salisbury and Classical Antiquity”, in Grellard and Lachaud 2015: 180–214.
  • Hosler, J.D., 2013, John of Salisbury: Military Authority of the Twelfth-Century Renaissance, Leiden: Brill.
  • Liebeschütz, H., 1950, Mediaeval Humanism in the Life and Writings of John of Salisbury, London: The Warburg Institute.
  • Martin, J., 1977, “John of Salisbury’s Manuscripts of Frontinus and of Gellius”, Journal of the Warburg and Courtauld Institutes, 40: 1–26.
  • –––, 1979, “Uses of Tradition: Gellius, Petronius, and John of Salisbury”, Viator, 10: 57–76.
  • –––, 1984, “John of Salisbury as Classical Scholar”, in Wilks 1984b: 179–201.
  • Nederman, C.J., 1988, “A Duty to Kill: John of Salisbury’s Theory of Tyrannicide”, Review of Politics, 50: 365–389.
  • –––, 1997, Medieval Aristotelianism and its Limits, Aldershot, Hampshire, UK: Variorum/Ashgate.
  • –––, 2005, John of Salisbury, Tempe, AZ: Arizona Center for Medieval and Renaissance Studies.
  • –––, 2013, “Civil Religion—Metaphysical, Not Political: Nature, Faith, and Communal Order in European Thought, c.1150–c.1550”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 74: 1–22.
  • Nederman, C.J. and K. Bollermann, 2011, “‘The Extravagance of the Senses’: Epicureanism, Priestly Tyranny, and the Becket Problem in John of Salisbury’s Policraticus,” Studies in Medieval and Renaissance History, 3rd series, 8: 1–25.
  • –––, 2020, Thomas Becket: An Intimate Portrait, Maweh, NJ: Paulist Press.
  • Nederman, C.J. and J. Brückmann, 1983, “Aristotelianism in John of Salisbury’s Policraticus”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 21: 203–29.
  • Nederman, C.J. and C. Campbell, 1991, “Priests, Kings, and Tyrants: Spiritual and Temporal Power in John of Salisbury’s Policraticus”, Speculum, 66: 572–90.
  • O’Daly, I., 2018, John of Salisbury and the Medieval Roman Renaissance, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Olsen, G.W., 1998, “John of Salisbury’s Humanism”, in Gli Umansimi Medievali, C. Leonardi (ed.), Florence: SISMEL, pp. 447–468.
  • Pinzano, Roberto, 2018, “John Salisbury on Universals” in The Problem of Universals from Boethius to John of Salisbury, Studies in Intellectual History 282, Leiden: Brill, pp. 271–298.
  • Poole, R.L., 1932, Illustrations in the History of Medieval Thought and Learning, New York: Mcmillan.
  • Ray, R., 1985, “Rhetorical Skepticism and Verisimilar Narrative in John of Salisbury’s Historia Pontificalis”, in Classical Rhetoric and Medieval Historiograhy, Ernst Breisach (ed.), Kalamazoo: Medieval Institute Publications, pp. 61–102.
  • Schmitt, C.B., 1972, Cicero Skepticus: A Study of the Influence of the Academica in the Renaissance, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Shogimen, T. and C.J. Nederman, 2011, “The Best Medicine? Medical Education, Practice and Metaphor in John of Salisbury’s Policraticus and Metalogicon”, Viator, 42: 55–74.
  • Struve, T., 1984, “The Importance of the Organism in the Political Theory of John of Salisbury”, in Wilks 1984b: 303–317.
  • Tobin, R.B., 1989, “The Cornifician Motif in John of Salisbury’s Metalogicon”, History of Education, 13: 1–6.
  • Van Laarhoven, J., 1984, “Thou Shalt Not Slay a Tyrant! The So-called Theory of John of Salisbury”, in Wilks 1984b: 319–341.
  • von Moos, P., 1984, Geschichte als Topik, Darmstadt: Olms Verlag.
  • Webb, C.C.J., 1932, John of Salisbury, London: Methuen.
  • Wilks, M., 1984a, “John of Salisbury and the Tyranny of Nonsense”, in Wilks 1984b: 263–286.
  • Wilks, M. (ed.), 1984b, The World of John of Salisbury, Oxford: Blackwell for the Ecclesiastical History Society.

Copyright © 2022 by
Karen Bollermann <>
Cary Nederman <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free