Locke’s Moral Philosophy

First published Fri Oct 21, 2011; substantive revision Fri Jun 10, 2016

Locke’s greatest philosophical work, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, is generally seen as a defining work of seventeenth-century empiricist epistemology and metaphysics. The moral philosophy developed in this work is rarely taken up for critical analysis, considered by many scholars of Locke’s thought to be too obscure and confusing to be taken too seriously. The view is not only seen by many commentators as incomplete, but it carries a degree of rationalism that cannot be made consistent with our picture of Locke as the arch-empiricist of his period. While it is true that Locke’s discussion of morality in the Essay is not as well-developed as many of his other views, there is reason to think that morality was the driving concern of this great work. For Locke, morality is the one area apart from mathematics wherein human reasoning can attain a level of rational certitude. For Locke, human reason may be weak with regards to our understanding of the natural world and the workings of the human mind, but it is exactly suited for the job of figuring out human moral duty. By looking at Locke’s moral philosophy, as it is developed in the Essay and some of his earlier writings, we gain a heightened appreciation for Locke’s motivations in the Essay, as well as a more nuanced understanding of the degree of Locke’s empiricism. Further than this, Locke’s moral philosophy offers us an important exemplar of seventeenth-century natural law theory, probably the predominant moral view of the period.

1. Introduction

1.1 The puzzle of Locke’s moral philosophy

There are two main stumbling blocks to the study of Locke’s moral philosophy. The first regards the singular lack of attention the subject receives in Locke’s most important and influential published works; not only did Locke never publish a work devoted to moral philosophy, but he dedicates little space to its discussion in the works he did publish. The traditional moral concept of natural law arises in Locke’s Two Treatises of Government (1690) serving as a major plank in his argument regarding the basis for civil law and the protection of individual liberty, but he does not go into any detail regarding how we come to know natural law nor how we might be obligated, or even motivated, to obey it. In his Essay Concerning Human Understanding (first edition 1690; fourth edition 1700, hereafter referred to as the Essay) Locke spends little time discussing morality, and what he does provide in the way of a moral epistemology seems underdeveloped, offering, at best, the suggestion of what a moral system might look like rather than a fully-realized positive moral position. This brings us to the second major stumbling block: What Locke does provide us by way of moral theory in these works is diffuse, with the air of being what J.B. Schneewind has characterized as “brief, scattered and sometimes puzzling” (Schneewind 1994, 200). This is not to suggest that Locke says nothing specific or concrete about morality. Locke makes references, throughout his works, to morality and moral obligation. However, two quite distinct positions on morality seem to emerge from Locke’s works and it is this dichotomous aspect of Locke’s view that has generated the greatest degree of controversy. The first is a natural law position, which Locke refers to in the Essay, but which finds its clearest articulation in an early work from the 1660s, entitled Essays on the Law of Nature. In this work, we find Locke espousing a fairly traditional rationalistic natural law position, which consists broadly in the following three propositions: first, that moral rules are founded on divine, universal and absolute laws; second, that these divine moral laws are discernible by human reason; and third, that by dint of their divine authorship these rules are obligatory and rationally discernible as such. On the other hand, Locke also espouses a hedonistic moral theory, in evidence in his early work, but developed most fully in the Essay. This latter view holds that all goods and evils reduce to specific kinds of pleasures and pains. The emphasis here is on sanctions, and how rewards and punishments serve to provide morality with its normative force. Both elements find their way into Locke’s published works, and, as a result, Locke seems to be holding what seem to be incommensurable views. The trick for Locke scholars has been to figure out how, or even if, they can be made to cohere. The question is not easily settled by looking to Locke’s unpublished works, either, since Locke also seems to hold a natural law view at some times and a hedonistic view at others.

One might conclude, with J.B. Schneewind, among others, that Locke’s attempts at constructing a morality were unsuccessful. Schneewind does not mince words when he writes the following: “Locke’s failures are sometimes as significant as his successes. His views on morality are a case in point” (Schneewind 1994, 199). Schneewind argues that the two strands of Locke’s moral theory are irreconcilable, and that this is a fact Locke must have realized. This view is indeed an apt representation of the frustration many readers have felt with Locke’s moral theory. Locke’s eighteenth-century apologist, Catharine Trotter Cockburn thought Locke provided a promising, but incomplete, starting point for a positive moral system, imploring, in her work “A Defense of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding,”

I wish, Sir, you may only find it enough worth your notice, to incite you to show the world, how far it falls short of doing justice to your principles; which you may do without interrupting the great business of your life, by a work, that will be an universal benefit, and which you have given the world some right to exact of you. Who is there so capable of pursuing to a demonstration those reflections on the grounds of morality, which you have already made? (Cockburn 1702, 36)

Locke’s friend William Molyneux similarly implored Locke to make good on the promise found in the Essay. In a letter written to Locke on September 16th, 1693, Molyneux presses Locke to work on a moral treatise once he has finished editing the second edition of his Essay, writing as follows:

I am very sensible how closely you are engaged, till you have discharged this Work off your Hands; and therefore will not venture, till it be over, to press you again to what you have promis’d in the Business of Man’s Life, Morality. (Locke 1742, 53)

Several months later, in December of the same year, Molyneux concludes a letter by asking Locke about what other projects he currently has on the go “amongst which, I hope you will not forget your Thoughts on Morality” (Locke 1742, 54).

Locke never did produce such a work, and we might well wonder if he himself ever considered the project a “failure”. There is no doubt that morality was of central importance to Locke, a fact we can discern from the Essay itself; there are two important features of the Essay that serve to enlighten us regarding the significance of this work in the development of Locke’s moral views. First of all, morality seems to have inspired Locke to write the Essay in the first place. In recounting his original inclination to embark on the project, he recalls a discussion with “five or six friends”, at which they discoursed “on a Subject very remote from this” (Locke 1700, 7). According to Locke, the discussion eventually hit a standstill, at which point it was agreed that in order to settle the issue at hand it would first be necessary to, as Locke puts it, “examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with” (Locke 1700, 7). This was, he explains, his first entrance into the problems that inspired the Essay itself. But, what is most interesting for our purposes is just what the remote subject was that first got Locke and his friends thinking about fundamental questions of epistemology. James Tyrell, one of those who attended that evening, is a source of enlightenment on this matter—he later recalled that the discussion concerned morality and revealed religion. But, Locke himself refers to the subjects they discussed that fateful evening as ‘very remote’ from the matters of the Essay. That may well be, but it is also true that Locke, in the Essay, identifies morality as a central feature of human intellectual and practical life, which brings us to the second important fact about Locke’s view of morality. Locke writes, in the Essay, that “Morality is the proper Science, and Business of Mankind in general” (Essay, 4.12.11; these number are, book, chapter and section, respectively, from Locke’s Essay). For a book aiming to set out the limits and extent of human knowledge, this comes as no small claim. We must, Locke writes, “know our own Strength” (Essay, 1.1.6) and turn our attention to those areas in which we can have certainty, i.e., “those [things] which concern our Conduct” (Essay, 1.1.6). The amount of attention given to the question of morality itself would seem to belie its primacy for Locke. The Essay is certainly not intended as a work of moral philosophy; it is a work of epistemology, laying the foundations for knowledge. However, a very big part of the programme involves identifying what true knowledge is and what it is we as humans can have knowledge about, and morality is accorded a distinctive and fairly exclusive status in Locke’s epistemology as one of “the Sciences capable of Demonstration” (Essay, 4.3.18). The only other area of inquiry accorded this status is mathematics; clearly, for Locke, morality represents a unique and defining aspect of what it means to be human. We have to conclude, then, that the Essay is strongly motivated by an interest in establishing the groundwork for moral reasoning. However, while morality clearly has a position of the highest regard in his epistemological system, his promise of a demonstrable moral science is never realized here, or in later works.

It seems we can safely say that the subject of morality was a weighty one for Locke. However, just what Locke takes morality to involve is substantially more complicated an issue. There are two broad lines of interpretation of Locke’s moral views, which I will briefly outline here.

1.2 Critical interpretations of Locke’s moral philosophy

The first interpretation of Locke’s moral theory is what we might call an incompatibility thesis: Locke scholars Laslett, Aaron, von Leyden, among others, hold that Locke’s natural law theory is nothing more than a relic from Locke’s early years, when he wrote the Essays on the Law of Nature, and represents a rogue element in the mature empiricist framework of the Essay. For these commentators, the two elements found in the Essay seem not only incommensurable, but the hedonism seems the obvious and straightforward fit with Locke’s generally empiricist epistemology. The general view is that Locke’s rationalism seems, for all intents and purposes, to have no significant role to play, either in the acquisition of moral knowledge or in the recognition of the obligatory force of moral rules. These fundamental aspects of morality seem to be taken care of by Locke’s hedonism. Worse than this, however, is that the two views rely on radically different epistemological principles. The conclusion tends to be that Locke is holding on to moral rationalism in the face of serious incoherence. The incompatibility thesis is supported by the fact that Locke seems to emphasize the role of pleasure and pain in moral decision-making, however it has difficulty making sense of the presence of Locke’s moral rationalism in the Essay and other of Locke’s later works (not to mention the exalted role he gives to rationally-deduced moral law). Added to this, even in Locke’s early work, he seems to hold both positions simultaneously. Aaron and von Leyden both throw up their hands. According to von Leyden, in the introduction to his 1954 edition of Locke’s Essays on the Law of Nature,

the development of [Locke’s] hedonism and certain other views held by him in later years made it indeed difficult for him to adhere whole-heartedly to his doctrine of natural law. (Locke 1954, 14)

In a similar vein, Aaron writes:

Two theories compete with each other in [Locke’s] mind. Both are retained; yet their retention means that a consistent moral theory becomes difficult to find. (Aaron 1971, 257)

Yet, it is curious that Locke neither claimed to find these strands incompatible, nor ever abandoned his rationalistic natural law view. It seems unlikely that this view would be nothing more than a confusing hangover from earlier days. Taking seriously Locke’s commitment to both is therefore a much more charitable approach, and one that takes seriously Locke’s clear commitment to the benefits of rationally-apprehending our moral duties. An approach along these lines is one we might call a compatibility approach to the question of Locke’s moral commitments. John Colman and Stephen Darwall are two Locke scholars who have argued that Locke’s view is neither plagued with tensions nor incoherent. Their common view is that the two elements of Locke’s theory are doing different work. Locke’s hedonism, on this compatibility account, is intended as a theory of moral motivation, and serves to fill a motivational gap between knowing moral law and having reasons to obey moral law. Locke introduces hedonism in order to account for the practical force of the obligations arising from natural law. As Darwall writes,

what makes God’s commands morally obligatory [i.e., God’s authority] appears…to have nothing intrinsically to do with what makes them rationally compelling. (Darwall 1995, 37).

Thus, on this account, reason deduces natural law, but it is hedonistic considerations alone that offer agents the motivating reasons to act in accordance with its dictates.

This interpretation convincingly makes room for both elements in Locke’s view. A central feature of this interpretation is its attention to the legalistic aspect of Locke’s natural law theory. For Locke, the very notion of law presupposes an authority structure as the basis for its institution and its enforcement. The law carries obligatory weight by virtue of its reflecting the will of a rightful superior. That it also carries the threat of sanctions lends motivational force to the law.

A slight modification of the compatibility account, however, better captures the motivational aspect of Locke’s rationalistic account: Locke does, at times suggest that rational agents are not only obligated, but motivated, by sheer recognition of the divine authority of moral law. It is helpful to think of morality as carrying both intrinsic and extrinsic obligatory force for Locke. On the one hand moral rules obligate by dint of their divine righteousness, and on the other hand by the threat of rewards and punishments. The suggestion that morality has an intrinsic motivational force appears in the Essays on the Law of Nature and is retained by Locke in some of his final published works. It is, however, a feature of his view that gets somewhat underappreciated in the secondary literature, and for understandable reasons—Locke tends to emphasize hedonistic motivations. Why this is will be discussed in section 4. At this point, however, it suffices to say that Locke’s theory does not have the motivational gap that the compatibility thesis suggests—hedonism serves as a ‘back-up’ motivational tool in the absence of the right degree of rational intuition of one’s moral duty.

2. Locke’s natural law theory: the basis of moral obligation

In order to get a complete understanding of Locke’s moral theory, it is useful to begin with a look at Locke’s natural law view, articulated most fully in his Essays on the Law of Nature (written as series of lectures he delivered as Censor of Moral Philosophy at Christ Church, Oxford). Two predominant features of Locke’s natural law theory are already well-developed in this work: the rationalism and the legalism. According to Locke, reason is the primary avenue by which humans come to understand moral rules, and it is via reason we can draw two distinct but related conclusions regarding the grounds for our moral obligations: we can appreciate the divine, and thereby righteous, nature of morality and we can perceive that morality is the expression of a law-making authority.

2.1 Morality as Natural Law

In the Essays on the Law of Nature, Locke writes that “all the requisites of a law are found in natural law” (Locke 1663–4, 82). But, what, for Locke, is required for something to be a law? Locke takes stock of what constitutes law in order to establish the legalistic framework for morality: First, law must be founded on the will of a superior. Second, it must perform the function of establishing rules of behavior. Third, it must be binding on humans, since there is a duty of compliance owed to the superior authority that institutes the laws (Locke 1663–4, 83). Natural law is rightly called law because it satisfies these conditions. For Locke, the concept of morality is best understood by reference to a law-like authority structure, for without this, he argues, moral rules would be indistinguishable from social conventions. In one his later essays, “Of Ethic in General”, Locke writes

[w]ithout showing a law that commands or forbids [people], moral goodness will be but an empty sound, and those actions which the schools here call virtues or vices may by the same authority be called by contrary names in another country; and if there be nothing more than their decisions and determinations in the case, they will be still nevertheless indifferent as to any man’s practice, which will by such kind of determinations be under no obligation to observe them. (Locke 1687–88, 302)

For Locke, then, moral law is, by definition, an obligatory set of rules, because it reflects the will of a superior authority.

Moral rules are obligatory because of the authority structure out of which they arise. But, this is not the only story Locke has to tell regarding the nature of our obligation to divine moral dictates. The set of moral rules that reason deduces are taken by Locke to be reflective of human nature. The rules that govern human conduct are specifically tailored to human nature, and our duty to God involves realizing our natures to the fullest degree. There is a noticeable degree of teleology in Locke’s theory, which is worth pausing to consider in its content and its implications.

2.2 Morality and Teleology

In the Essays on the Law of Nature, Locke draws a connection between the natural law governing human action and the laws of nature that govern all other things in the natural world; just as all natural things seem nomologically determined, so human beings are likewise law-governed. Humans are not determined to the same degree as other physical and biological entities, but we are beholden to God to ensure that our lives follow a certain path. Natural law is, Locke writes, a “plan, rule, or … pattern” of life (Locke 1663–64, 81). Locke’s early view has a teleological strain typical of the Aquinian (and thus Aristotelian) tradition. In fact, Locke does not shy away from this teleological angle, acknowledging this inheritance when he writes of Aristotle’s that he

rightly concludes that the proper function of man is acting in conformity with reason, so much so that man must of necessity perform what reason prescribes. (Locke 1663–64, 83)

Locke considers moral duty to be tailored to human nature, a set of laws specific to humanity and governing our actions according to God’s will. These laws are not only discoverable by reason, but in order to fulfill our function, humans are required to make use of reason to this very end. This view resurfaces in the Essay, where Locke writes the following:

it will become us, as rational Creatures, to imploy those Faculties we have about what they are most adapted to, and follow the direction of Nature, where it seems to point us out the way. (Essay, 4.12.11)

The way it points us, he goes on to explain, is in the direction of our “greatest interests, i.e., the Condition of our eternal Estate” (Essay, 4.12.11). The greater effort we each make in refining our rational faculty, the more clearly each of us will discern the proper path to eternal salvation.

This teleological element may seem somewhat out of step with Locke’s unqualified empiricist rejection of teleological metaphysics in the Essay. However, it is important to bear in mind that the teleological aspects of Locke’s moral theory do seem to be serving a very specific purpose. Locke seems to be aiming to establish a natural-theological basis for natural law. Why would this be so crucial for Locke?

Locke is grounding human conduct within a general framework of laws originating in God’s divine command. This is not just a nomologically-ordered universe, but one, as we have seen, that reflects the interests of “a powerful and wise creator…who has made and built this whole universe and us mortals” (Locke 1663–64, 103). Humans are obligated to obey God’s laws since God is a superior to whom we owe “both our being and our work” (Locke 1663–64, 105). As such, we are obligated to show obedience to the “limits he prescribes” (Locke 1663–64, 105). The laws governing our nature are discovered by reason and their content is specifically suited to human nature. Thus, for Locke morality is clearly and necessarily anthropocentric, understood by reference to human nature. But moral rules are, above all, an expression of God’s will. It is this latter aspect of morality that binds us to abide by the dictates of morality. Moral obligation is a matter, for Locke, of obedience to the rightful authority of God.

2.3 Morality as a deductive science

There are two baseline assumptions of Locke’s moral thinking: morality is universal and it is something that can be understood clearly and unequivocally by human reason—when Locke imagines us rationally-discovering natural law, he envisions us applying a rigorous set of logical principles to a set of clear and well-defined ideas about human nature, God, and society. But, how exactly is this done?

For one thing, this process looks a great deal like mathematical reasoning. For Locke, moral rules are founded on a fundamental set of principles, much like mathematical axioms. The fundamental principles can be deduced rationally, and it is from these that we can further derive all of our moral duties. Morality is, therefore, demonstrable, a term indicating mathematical-style proofs wherein conclusions are derived from axiomatic foundations. The moral status of any action is then determined by comparing our behaviour against these demonstrated rules. But, we might ask, what kinds of ideas are moral ideas, and what sort of rationalist could Locke possibly be? Locke is a well-known empiricist; for Locke, the mind is a blank slate, the content of which is supplied exclusively from sensory or reflective experience. Locke famously espouses this empiricist view in the Essay, but holds it quite clearly also in the Essays on the Law of Nature. In fact, however, Locke’s moral rationalism takes this empiricist theory of ideas as its starting point. Moral ideas, for Locke, are fundamentally experiential in origin. They are not directly so, of course, since we do not perceive something like justice or honesty directly. Moral ideas are experiential, in the special Lockean sense that they are complex ideas—products of the mind’s ability to form complex constructions from its simple directly-experiential contents. For Locke, the interplay of reason and sensation works as follows:

reason is … taken to mean the discursive faculty of the mind, which advances from things known to things unknown and argues from one thing to another in a definite and fixed order of propositions… The foundations, however, on which rests the whole of that knowledge which reason builds … are the objects of sense-experience; for the senses primarily supply the entire as well as the chief subject-matter of discourse and introduce it into the deep recesses of the mind. (Locke 1663–64, 101)

From perceptual simple ideas, we can generate complex moral propositions. This seems like a tall order, and Locke offers very little, in any of his works, by way of actually putting this moral reasoning process to work. However, that is not to say that Locke is silent in this regard. There are places in his writings where Locke takes us through some moral demonstrations.

In the Essays on the Law of Nature, for example, Locke claims that, based on sensory experience, we can assert the extra-mental existence of perceptible objects and all their perceptible qualities. All such qualities can be explained by reference to matter in motion. What is also clear to the senses, Locke argues, is that this world of moving objects exhibits a nomological regularity, or as Locke puts it, a “wonderful art and regularity” (Locke 1663–64, 103). Such regularity and beauty leads the contemplative mind to consider how such a world could have come about. Such contemplation would lead any rational being to the conclusion that the world cannot be the result of chance, and must therefore be the product of a creative will. Note that Locke is here trying to demonstrate for us just how sensation and reason work together. The mind moves from ideas of sensation to what Locke considers logical conclusions regarding the creative force behind the world we experience. But, our understanding of natural law is not founded solely in sensory experience. Through reflection, which is an introspective kind of perceptual experience for Locke, humans can gain ideas of our own nature and faculties that serve to complete our understanding both of God and of God’s creative will. This reasoning goes as follows—the creative being, which sensation indicates must exist, cannot be less perfect than human will, nor can it be human, because our ideas of reflection tell us that humans are not, and cannot be, self-causing. Reason must conclude, then, that the world is created by a divine will—a superior power, which can bring us into existence, maintain us, or take us away, give us great joy or render us in great pain. Locke concludes as follows:

with sense-perception showing the way, reason can lead us to knowledge of a lawmaker or of some superior power to which we are necessarily subject. (Locke 1663–4, 104)

From this deduction regarding divine purpose and authority, humans can conclude that they are obligated to render “praise, honour, and glory” to God. Beyond this, the rational agent can deduce, through reflection upon her own constitution and faculties, that her natural impulses to protect and preserve her life, and to enter into society with others are faculties with which she has been uniquely equipped by God and by which she is considered specifically human. These must constitute the basis of the principles and duties governing her conduct—her “function appears to be that which nature has prepared … [her] to perform” (Locke 1663–64, 105). Thus, by a series of steps from perception to reasoning about that perceptual experience, we are, Locke concludes, able to define our moral duties and regulate our conduct accordingly.

In the Essay, Locke develops this idea of the rational deduction of natural law somewhat further, setting it in the context of a more mature and coherent theory of ideas than we find in the Essays on the Law of Nature. In the Essay, moral ideas assume a particular significance owing to their place in Locke’s general taxonomy of ideas. For Locke, all the basic contents of the mind are simple ideas. These are formed by the mind into what Locke terms complex ideas, which are combinations of simple ideas made in the pattern of our perceptions of things in the extra mental world, or according to a pattern created by reason alone. Moral ideas fall into the second category of complex idea, falling under the technical heading complex ideas of modes. Modes are a specific kind of complex ideas, created by the mind from simple ideas of sensation or reflection, but referring to no extra-mental reality. They are not intended as natural kinds, but are products of the mind alone, referring to purely conceptual archetypes. They are best understood in contradistinction to ideas of substances, which are created by the mind but aim to mirror the real essences of extra-mental things—for example, the idea cat is intended to capture a kind of thing in the world that has a specific set of perceivable characteristics. Ideas of substances fail in mirroring reality, however, as they can never be complete representations of the world outside the mind. Modal ideas, on the other hand, are a special kind of idea for Locke, and actually hold out the promise for real knowledge. Modal ideas are ideas by which we fully grasp the real essence of things, because the mind, in some sense, is the originator of them (I will return to this in the next paragraph). The idea of a triangle is a modal idea, made by reason and knowable in its essence with complete accuracy. The idea of a triangle is a product of the mind, and does not refer to anything outside the mind—i.e., any external archetype. The kinds of ideas that fall into this category are the idea of God, mathematical concepts, and, most importantly for our present purposes, moral concepts. Locke writes,

I am bold to think, that Morality is capable of Demonstration, as well as Mathematicks: since the precise real Essence of the things moral Words stand for, may be perfectly known; and so the Congruity, or Incongruity of the Things themselves, be certainly discovered, in which consists perfect knowledge. (Essay, 3.11.16)

Moral rules, for Locke, are knowable with the same degree of certainty as “any Demonstration in Euclid” (Essay, 4.3.18).

This might seem to be a tall order when considering the controversy generated by beliefs about moral rules, yet Locke clearly believes that moral rules can, with the right mental effort, yield indisputable universal laws. Locke offers an example of how this might work, by analyzing the moral proposition Where there is no property, there is no injustice. In order to see the demonstrable certainty of this claim, we have to examine the composite ideas and how those agree or disagree with one another. The idea of property, first of all, is a right to something. The idea of injustice, considered next, is a violation of that right. Given these definitions, which Locke thinks are arrived at by careful attention to definition, it is a rational deduction that injustice cannot exist if there is no property to be violated. Injustice and property must, by definition agree. This is a clearly demonstrable rule, according to Locke, deduced from clear and adequately conceived ideas. The only other example Locke offers is the proposition No Government allows absolute Liberty. Government, according to Locke, is the establishment of society upon certain laws, requiring conformity. Absolute liberty is allowing anyone to do as they please. These are modal ideas, according to Locke, and thus known with complete adequacy. As such, it is possible for the rational individual to see clearly that the ideas of absolute liberty and government cannot agree. Of course, most people will argue that these rational deductions rely upon definitions that are debatable. This would not seem to be helped by the fact that, for Locke, modal ideas, like all complex ideas, are put together by the mind; while complex ideas of substance are constructed on the pattern of perceivable objects, modal ideas are, Locke explains, “put together at the pleasure of our Thoughts, without any real pattern they were taken from” (Essay, 4.4.12). This might seem to pose a problem for Locke’s moral theory, according to which moral laws are just as necessary as mathematical principles. However, Locke is not worried about any relativistic implications. For Locke, any disagreement about definitions of concepts like property, justice or murder, result from insufficient reasoning about the simple ideas that comprise our moral ideas, as well as bias, prejudice and other irrational influences. For Locke, it is precisely because these ideas refer to nothing outside the mind that they can be universally-conceived and adequately understood. Just as the notion of triangularity is known perfectly because it does not depend upon the existence of triangles outside the mind, so justice is understood perfectly because it is not using some extramental archetype as its inspiration. He writes,

the Truth and Certainty of moral Discourses abstracts from the Lives of Men, and the Existence of those Vertues in the World whereof they treat. (Essay, 4.4.8)

Mathematical concepts are impervious to bias, prejudice or otherwise-idiosyncratic definitions and their relative properties are clear to anyone who understands them perfectly. While many would contend that moral ideas are simply too controversial to fit a proto-mathematical picture, Locke would respond that they seem controversial only because many of us have not taken the time to consider moral ideas in an objective and analytical light. If we were to do so, he argues, we could come to know moral rules with certainty.

Locke, in fact, adds something of a meta-moral dimension to this epistemological point by suggesting that as rational beings it is our “proper Imployment” to contemplate morality. In Book IV of the Essay, where Locke concludes that morality is, like mathematics, a human science (and, properly-speaking, knowledge), Locke draws a teleological lesson—since we are clearly fitted with the capacity for discerning our moral duty, then that is what we ought to do: “I think I may conclude, that Morality is the proper Science and Business of Mankind in general.” (Essay, 4.12.11) Humans must, he argues, employ reason in the pursuit of that which “they are most adapted to, and follow the direction of Nature, where it seems to point us out the way” (Essay, 4.12.11). The fact that many people do not or cannot devote contemplative hours to their moral duties is something Locke will consider in his account of moral motivation, however, the key point here is that humans have a teleological makeup that allows for rational certainty with regard to divine moral law.

Is having this degree of knowledge enough to motivate humans to act accordingly—that is, does the sheer recognition of one’s duty have any sway in one’s practical deliberations?

3. Moral motivation 1: reward and punishment

Locke’s hedonism has a dual function in Locke’s moral theory. It accounts both for how we acquire the ideas of moral good and evil that lie at the root of moral law and for the motivation to comply with moral rules. A prominent feature of Locke’s moral legalism is his view that a law needs to carry the threat of sanctions for it to have normative force. Locke holds this view on the basis of his hedonistic theory of human motivation.

3.1 Locke’s general theory of motivation

Locke develops his hedonistic account most extensively in the Essay. According to this account, pleasure and pain are the primary motivating factors for all human action and human thought. Feelings of pleasure and pain accompany all our ideas, for Locke, prompting us to act in response to our perceptual experiences, and to move, in thought, from one idea to another. If we had no accompanying feeling of delight or pain in the face of certain stimuli we would be unmoved to create music, eat when hungry, or even shift our attention from one idea to any other—the perception of rain would raise in us no different response than a sunny day, the idea of one’s children would inspire no related thoughts of home or family, nor any discernibly different response from the idea of children one does not know. Locke writes,

we should have no reason to preferr [sic] one Thought or Action, to another; Negligence, to Attention; or Motion, to Rest. And so we should neither stir our Bodies, nor employ our Minds; but let our thoughts (if I may so call it) run a drift, without any direction or design; and suffer the Ideas of our Minds, like unregarded shadows to make their appearances there, as it happen’d, without attending to them. (Essay, 2.7.3)

Pleasure and pain are the engines that make decisions, thoughts, and actions happen. This is not merely coincidence, or chance, for Locke, but yet another example of God’s divine design. God has attached feelings of pleasure and pain to our ideas, so the natural faculties with which humans are endowed “might not remain wholly idle, and unemploy’d by us” (Essay, 2.7.3).

3.2 Locke’s theory of moral motivation

Pleasure and pain form the basis of Locke’s general theory of motivation, but they are also the bedrock upon which our moral ideas, and the motivation to moral goodness arise. Good and evil reduce, for Locke, to “nothing but Pleasure or Pain, or that which occasions or procures Pleasure and Pain to us” (Essay, 2.28.5). A flower is good, because its beauty raises feelings of affection or pleasure in us. Illness, on the other hand, is an evil since it raises feelings of aversion in those who have experienced illness in any of its many forms. A good is whatever produces pleasure in us, or diminishes evil, and an evil is whatever produces pain or diminishes pleasure. In this way, for Locke, the ideas of good and evil arise from natural emotive responses to our various ideas. Now, these are not moral goods and evils, but for Locke moral ideas are founded in the general ideas we have of natural pleasures and pains. Locke designates no special faculty by which we acquire the basic moral concepts of good and evil, since these are merely a modification of our ideas of natural good and evil; moral good and evil gain their special significance from considering ideas of pleasure and pain in specific contexts.

Our ideas of moral good and evil do not, therefore, differ qualitatively from natural good or evil. If this is the case, however, one might ask what makes smelling a rose different from helping those in need. For Locke, the answer lies in the different context for pleasures and pains that distinguishes the moral from the natural. While a natural good involves the physical pleasure that arises from the scent of a rose, moral good is a pleasure arising from one’s conformity to moral dictates, and moral evil is pain arising from the failure to conform. The pleasure and pain are not qualitatively distinct, in these cases, but they take on a special significance as a result of the considerations that bring them about. Locke explains this in the Essay, making sure to emphasize the purely contextual distinction between moral and natural feelings:

Morally Good and Evil then, is only the Conformity or Disagreement of our voluntary Actions to some Law, whereby Good and Evil is drawn on us, from the Will and Power of the Law-maker; which Good and Evil, Pleasure or Pain, attending our observance or breach of the law, by the Decree of the Law-maker, is that we call Reward or Punishment. (Essay, 2.28.5)

Reward and punishment are a distinct species of pleasure and pain, specifying the outcomes attending the decrees of a rightful legislator. In this way, Locke’s is a straightforwardly legalistic account of the concepts of moral good and evil. The practical force of moral laws arises when we compare our actions against these laws, determine the degree to which they do or do not conform to the law and consider the pleasure of pain we will privately experience. In fact, for Locke, the very idea that one being has rightful legislative power over another is predicated on the degree to which the former being can effectively impose sanctions on the latter:

It would be in vain for one intelligent Being, to set a Rule to the Actions of another, if he had not in his Power, to reward the compliance with, and punish deviation from his Rule, by some Good and Evil, that is not the natural product and consequence of the action itself. (Essay, 2.28.6)

God, according to Locke, is just such a rightful superior with the

Goodness and Wisdom to direct our Actions to that which is best: and he has the Power to enforce it by Rewards and Punishments, of infinite weight and duration, in another Life. (Essay, 2.28.8)

Locke is clearly committed to the idea that hedonistically-construed outcomes are a necessary condition of any system of law and of legislative authority itself. In this regard, Locke’s views are consistent throughout his corpus. It is worth noting that Locke holds the same view in the early work, the Essays on the Law of Nature, as he does in the more mature works quoted above. In the Essays on the Law of Nature, Essay V, Locke asserts that both God and the soul’s immortality “must necessarily be presupposed if natural law is to exist” (Locke 1663–64, 113). The inclusion of the immortality of the soul would seem to suggest the centrality of rewards and punishments in the afterlife. Locke continues by asserting that “law is to no purpose without punishment” (Locke 1663–64, 113). For Locke, then, an agent may well know the moral law, and that they are obligated to a superior authority, but the obligatory force—i.e., what gives the agent a reason for acting—is the structure of rewards and punishments built into the system.

The question that has plagued Locke scholarship has been how, if at all, the hedonistic elements of Locke’s moral philosophy can be reconciled with his rationalistic account, which suggests that reason can discern morality’s inherent righteousness and motivate accordingly. Some scholars have concluded that Locke effectively abandons the rationalism of his earlier writings by the time he is writing the Essay, and that any such elements found therein are mere holdovers of an earlier position. Von Leyden expresses this view when he writes,

the development of [Locke’s] hedonism and certain other views held by him in later years make it indeed difficult for him to adhere whole-heartedly to his doctrine of natural law. (von Leyden, 1954, 14)

But does it? What I earlier called the compatibilist thesis is held most prominently by scholars John Colman and Stephen Darwall, according to whom Locke’s hedonism does not supplant the rationalist account of natural law and moral obligation, but is, rather, intended to account for the motivational force of moral law. In this way, the two views work together for a complete moral picture. Darwall identifies the distinction between rationally-derived versus legalistically-construed moral obligation when he writes

what makes God’s commands morally obligatory [i.e., God’s authority] appears…to have nothing intrinsically to do with what makes them rationally compelling. (Darwall 1995, 37)

Colman makes a similar point:

Right is the central concept in Locke’s natural law doctrine, but the law could have no purchase on human conduct unless doing that which is right were in some way productive of good. ‘Good’ is the central concept in his moral psychology. (Colman 1983, 49)

Both Darwall and Colman understand Locke as equating moral good and evil with rewards and punishments, such that good and evil are the operative notions that turn moral rules into moral imperatives for rational agents. Agents do not have reasons for acting until they are aware of the rewards and punishments that accompany natural law. On this interpretation, rational insight regarding the righteousness of morality cannot, on its own, motivate humans to act.

Divine sanctions are a constant feature of Locke’s moral philosophy, as we’ve seen, and the compatibilist interpretation goes much further than the incompatibilist interpretation in capturing the nuances in Locke’s moral philosophy. However, there are passages in Locke’s work that suggest that moral rules carry an obligatory force that can motivate rational agents irrespective of rewards and punishments. When this further aspect of Locke’s view is taken into account, we can see that, for Locke, rewards and punishments do not exhaust our reasons for obeying divine moral rules.

4. Moral motivation 2: the righteousness of morality

In the Essays on the Law of Nature, Locke argues that there are two different kinds of obedience to the law of a superior authority, and that these are founded upon two distinct kinds of obligation. The example is as follows:

Anyone would easily … perceive that there was one ground of his obedience when as a captive he was constrained to the service of a pirate, and that there was another ground when as a subject he was giving obedience to a ruler; he would judge in one way about disregarding allegiance to a king, in another about wittingly transgressing the orders of a pirate or robber. (Locke 1663–64, 118)

At this point, Locke might be understood to be distinguishing laws backed by a rightful authority and laws that are not, in which the point is simply that there is no obligation to the pirate, since his are not strictly laws at all on Locke’s definition of the term. However, Locke continues this passage as follows:

in the latter case [subject to a pirate or robber], with the approval of conscience, he rightly had regard only for his well-being, but in the former [subject to a king], though conscience condemned him, he would violate the right of another. (Locke 1663–64, 118)

Locke identifies two distinct grounds of obedience. Recognizing that one’s obligation to the king arises from his rightful authority provides a grounds for obedience that is absent in the case of obeying the pirate. My reasons for obeying the pirate are hedonistic, but my reasons for obeying the king involve my recognition of his rightful authority. Further on in the same Essay, Locke explains that

We should not obey a king just out of fear, because, being more powerful he can constrain (this in fact would be to establish firmly the authority of tyrants, robbers, and pirates), but for conscience’ sake, because a king has command over us by right; that is to say, because the law of nature decrees that princes and a lawmaker, or a superior by whatever name you call him, should be obeyed. (Locke 1663–64, 120)

Thus, sanctions are not the sole motivating factor for Locke. The contrast Locke draws here is an important but commonly underappreciated one; that is, acting for “conscience’ sake” versus acting ‘out of fear’ as two quite distinct grounds for obedience.

The question that remains is how Locke’s notion of acting ‘for conscience’ sake’ can be made sense of within the context of Locke’s general hedonistic account of motivation. It might sound as though we are working with the kind of purely rational motivating factor that Locke’s hedonistic theory clearly rejects; for Locke all human action is motivated by considerations of pleasure and pain.

Recall that for Locke rewards and punishments are specific pleasures and pains. Acting for conscience’ sake will necessarily involve considerations of pleasure and pain, but of a kind quite distinct from sanctions. For Locke, there is a kind of pleasure that attends fulfilling one’s moral duty that is quite distinct from considerations of reward and punishment. In an essay, written in 1692, entitled Ethica A (the first of two essays, the other entitled Ethica B), Locke appeals to a kind of pleasure that attends the fulfilment of one’s moral duty:

Whoever spared a meal to save the life of a starving man, much more a friend…but had more and much more lasting pleasure in it than he that eat it. The other’s pleasure died as he eat and ended with his meal. But to him that gave it him ‘tis a feast as often as he reflects on it’. (Locke 1692, 319)

The pleasure here is of a special kind. It is not the same as the pleasure we get from satisfying our hunger, nor is it the pleasure that comes with pleasing an authority or earning a reward. In fact, Locke explicitly distinguishes it from the pleasure expected in the afterlife. Fulfilling one’s duty, for Locke, carries its own kind of pleasurable motive—it makes us happy. As Locke writes, further on in Ethica A, “Happiness…is annexed to our loving others and to doing our duty, to acts of love and charity” (Locke 1692, 319). Acting according to moral duty, then, is motivated by feelings of pleasure that attend such acts.

Why, then, does Locke so frequently emphasize the legalistic angle of morality, which depends so heavily on the motivational force of reward and punishment? In Locke’s view, many people fail to acknowledge, or be motivated by, the pleasure inherent to the fulfilment of one’s moral duty, and for these people (which, it turns out, is most of us), God has provided extra incentive—the rewards and punishments God attaches to our actions are a matter of God’s jurisdiction, quite apart from the pleasures of acting dutifully, and in accordance with righteous moral dictates. As Locke explains, God

brings in a necessity of another life…and so enforces morality the stronger, laying a necessity on God’s justice by his rewards and punishments, to make the good the gainers, the wicked losers. (Locke 1692, 319)

Sanctions, therefore, serve to enforce morality ‘the stronger’ but are quite clearly secondary to the intrinsic pleasures motivating dutiful action. So, conscience does not motivate in and of itself, nor does the rational apprehension of one’s moral duty, but Locke identifies a species of pleasure distinct from divine sanctions that makes his notion of acting for conscience’ sake perfectly consistent with his hedonism: to act for conscience’ sake is to be motivated by, and take pleasure in, acting in accordance with one’s moral duty.

4.1 Locke’s ethics of belief

Locke’s emphasis can be explained by turning our attention to a view of human nature that lies at the root of Locke’s account. Locke tends to be fairly pessimistic about the degree to which most humans appreciate the inherent righteousness of morality. In fact, Locke maintains a fairly low opinion of the willingness of most people to actually take the time to appreciate the righteousness natural law. If, he writes,

we will not in Civility allow too much Sincerity to the Professions of most Men, but think their Actions to be Interpreters of their Thoughts, we shall find, that they have no such internal Veneration for these Rules, nor so full a Perswasion of their Certainty and obligation. (Essay, 1.3.7)

Humans are flawed in two respects, according to Locke: we can fail to acknowledge our obligations to natural law, and we can fail to comply even when these obligations are acknowledged.

Locke’s views regarding reason and intellectual duty can be characterized as an ethics of belief, according to which our rational abilities place a responsibility on each of us to examine the beliefs we hold, and to be accountable for those things to which we assent. This is particularly the case with respect to moral rules, themselves, which are the ultimate guidelines for a good human life. As Locke sees it, our capacities as rational agents are insufficiently realized in many, if not most, cases. While the law of nature is knowable by reason for Locke, it is not innately known—Locke does not mean to suggest, as many theologians of his day believed, that it “lies open in our hearts” (Locke 1663–64, 89). This would, he grants, be:

an easy and very convenient way of knowing, and the human race would be very well off if men were so fully informed and so endowed by nature that from birth they were in no doubt as to what is fitting and what is less so. (Locke 1663–64, 90)

For Locke, however, this is just not the case. It is clear, to him, that most people do not understand their moral duty in any deep or robust way. To really know one’s moral duty is to be a moral agent, for Locke—moral knowledge is something gained, by the individual, through rational discovery. Moral truths are attainable with the proper use of reason:

there is some sort of truth to the knowledge of which man can attain by himself and without help of another, if he makes proper use of the faculties he is endowed with by nature. (Locke 1693–94, 89)

For Locke, knowledge, properly-speaking, requires that the individual herself perceives the truth or falsity of any claim to which she grants or withholds assent. An individual agent must perform the intellectual analysis and demonstration herself in order to truly know her moral duty. As it turns out, however, the greatest number of people (particularly in Locke’s day), are, he acknowledges

given up to Labour, and enslaved to the Necessity of their mean Condition; whose lives are worn out, only in the Provisions of Living. (Essay, 4.20.2)

For these people, the opportunity for gaining a clear perception of their moral duty is very narrow. Worse than this, there are people who have the means and the leisure, but “satisfy themselves with a lazy ignorance” (Essay, 4.20.6). These latter, Locke asserts, have a “low Opinion of their Souls” (Essay, 4.20.6). But, in neither case are people entirely off the hook, according to Locke, who argues that no matter how busy one is, there should always be time for thinking about our souls and matters of religion. If one fails to do this, then one is relying for one’s salvation and self-realization upon the mere current of opinion or the untrustworthy word of others. Locke asks if this can provide

sufficient Evidence and Security to every Man, to venture his greatest Concernments on; nay, his everlasting Happiness, or Misery. (Essay, 4.20.3)

The failure to do so is a kind of moral failing for Locke, one that gains its normative force from the teleogical imperative attending our rational natures:

God has furnished Men with Faculties sufficient to direct them in the Way they should take, if they will but seriously employ them that Way, when their ordinary Vocations allow them the Leisure. (Essay, 4.20.3)

Again, Locke is not suggesting that we do this from considerations of rewards and punishments, but because it is the fulfillment of our divinely-created natures. Despite failures to comply, the normative force of morality is undeniable, for Locke, on these teleogical grounds. Though Locke seems to believe that our failings with regards to moral knowledge result from a failure to engage our minds in the right direction, he does however acknowledge that the discovery of moral truths is difficult and laborious. And this is where sanctions come into play.

4.2 The special role of sanctions

Sanctions are not necessary to natural law if we consider it strictly as a system of divine rules. However, sanctions are necessary when morality functions as law. Sanctions are mechanisms for enforcement, where inherent motivating factors are either absent or underappreciated. Consider, as an example, the moral duty to care for one’s children. For most people, this carries inherent obligatory force arising from its being obviously good and necessary. Where a person fails to appreciate the inherent force of this duty, however, laws exist that require parents to provide the means of life and education for their children, and such laws stipulate compliance under threat of sanctions. To call the first instance a law seems unnecessary, but we can clearly see how the concept of a rule of law distinguishes the latter case. Sanctions provide motives when individuals fail to act on the responsibilities reason should on its own reveal and thereby compel. In the Essays on the Law of Nature, Locke writes,

Those who refuse to be led by reason and to own that in the matter of morals and right conduct they are subject to a superior authority may recognise that they are constrained by force and punishment to be submissive to that authority and feel the strength of him whose will they refuse to follow. (Locke 1663–64, 117)

Sanctions thus ensure that people who ‘refuse to be led’ by reason abide by the dictates of natural law; in this way, sanctions ensure that divine moral rules function as a system of law.

When Locke speaks of moral law, he frequently alludes to sanctions. Morality can motivate without sanctions, but it cannot ensure general compliance in the way that a system of law can. God’s imposition of sanctions is thus strictly instrumental. They are not intrinsic to a system of morality, but they are necessary when the obligatory force of moral rules is not adequately understood. The special role of sanctions as a means of shoring up moral compliance is articulated by Locke in several of his writings. In the 1680 essay Of God’s Justice, he writes

though justice be also a perfection which we must necessarily ascribe to the supreme being, yet we cannot suppose the exercise of it should extend further than his goodness has need of it for the preservation of his creatures in the order and beauty of the state that he has placed each of them in. (Locke 1680, 278)

God metes out justice in the form of sanctions as a means of ensuring social order and peace; sanctions ensure social good:

[God’s] justice is nothing but a branch of his goodness, which is fain by severity to restrain the irregular and destructive parts from doing harm; for to imagine God under a necessity of punishing for any other reason but this, is to make his justice a great imperfection. (Locke 1680, 278)

In one of his more mature works, The Reasonableness of Christianity, Locke makes the point several times, that moral law, with its attendant rewards and punishments, was articulated as a means of ensuring obedience. Humans appreciate the intrinsic righteousness of virtuous acts, which are generally granted the highest degree of approbation. However, virtuous behaviour is assured only when it is in an agent’s interests to comply. It is clear to reason that we ought to act virtuously, but it is easy enough for many of us to eschew virtuous actions when they either present hardships or sacrifice of any kind or when they will not clearly benefit our own interests:

The generality could not refuse [virtue] their esteem and commendation; but still turned their backs on her, and forsook her, as a match not for their turn. That she is the perfection and excellency of our nature; that she is herself a reward, and will recommend our names to future ages, is not all that can now be said of her. (Locke 1736, 247)

In order to remedy this problem, Locke explains, God attached clear and explicit sanctions (made plain through revelation) to ensure that the virtuous course of action will always be the more attractive option:

[Virtue] has another relish and efficacy to persuade men, that if they live well here, they shall be happy hereafter. Open their eyes upon the endless, unspeakable joys of another life, and their hearts will find something solid and powerful to move them. The view of heaven and hell will cast a slight upon the short pleasures and pains of this present state, and give attractions and encouragements to virtue which reason and interest, and the care of ourselves, cannot but allow and prefer. Upon this foundation, and upon this only, morality stands firm, and may defy all competition. This makes it more than a name; a substantial good, worth all our aims and endeavours; and thus the gospel of Jesus Christ has delivered it to us. (Locke 1736, 247)


Primary Literature: Works by Locke

Some of the works by Locke listed below can be found in Mark Goldie (ed.), Political Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

  • 1663–64, Essays on the Law of Nature, in Goldie (ed.) 1997, 79–133.
  • 1680, “Of God’s Justice,” in Goldie (ed.) 1997, 277–278.
  • 1686–88, “Of Ethic in General,” in Goldie (ed.) 1997, 297–304.
  • 1690, Two Treatises of Government, edited by Peter Laslett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • 1692, “Ethica A,” in Goldie (ed.) 1997, 318–319.
  • 1700, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, in P.H. Nidditch (ed.), An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, based on the fourth edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975.
  • 1736, John Locke, The Reasonableness of Christianity, As deliver’d in the scriptures, London: printed for A. Bettesworth and C. Hitch, in Paternoster-Row.
  • 1742, Familiar Letters between Mr. Locke and Several of his Friends, London: printed for F. Noble, T. Wright and J. Duncan in St. Martin’s Court.

Secondary Literature

  • Aaron, Richard I., 1971, John Locke, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Chappell, Vere, 1994, The Cambridge Companion to Locke, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cockburn, Catharine Trotter, 1702, “A Defense of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding,” in Catharine Trotter Cockburn: Philosophical Writings, P. Sheridan (ed.), Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press, 2006.
  • Colman, John, 1983, John Locke’s Moral Philosophy, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, 1995, The British Moralists and the Internal Ought: 1640–1740, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dunn, John, 1969, The Political Thought of John Locke, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, 2002, Locke: His Philosophical Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • LoLordo, Antonia, 2012, Locke’s Moral Man, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rossiter, Elliot, 2016, “Hedonism and Natural Law in Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” in Journal of the History of Philosophy, 54(2): 203–255.
  • Schneewind, J.B., 1994, “Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” in Chappell (1994).
  • Sheridan, Patricia, 2007, “Pirates, Kings, and Reasons to Act: Moral Motivation and the Role of Sanctions in Locke’s Moral Theory” in Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 37(1): 35–48.
  • –––, 2010, Locke: A Guide for the Perplexed, London: Continuum Publishing Group.
  • –––, 2015, “Locke’s Latitudinarian Sympathies: an exploration of sentiment in Locke’s moral theory” in Locke Studies, 15: 131–162.
  • von Leyden, W., 1954, “Introduction,” in John Locke, Essays on the Law of Nature, W. von Leyden (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon.

Other Internet Resources

  • Walsh, Julie, 2014, “Locke’s Ethics,” in Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, James Fieser and Bradley Dowden (eds.).
  • Texts by Locke, at earlymoderntexts.com.


The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for carefully reading this entry and pointing out a number of typographic and other infelicitous errors.

Copyright © 2016 by
Patricia Sheridan <pmsherid@uoguelph.ca>

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