The Emergence of First-Order Logic

First published Sat Nov 17, 2018

For anybody schooled in modern logic, first-order logic can seem an entirely natural object of study, and its discovery inevitable. It is semantically complete; it is adequate to the axiomatization of all ordinary mathematics; and Lindström’s theorem shows that it is the maximal logic satisfying the compactness and Löwenheim-Skolem properties. So it is not surprising that first-order logic has long been regarded as the “right” logic for investigations into the foundations of mathematics. It occupies the central place in modern textbooks of mathematical logic, with other systems relegated to the sidelines. The history, however, is anything but straightforward, and is certainly not a matter of a sudden discovery by a single researcher. The emergence is bound up with technical discoveries, with differing conceptions of what constitutes logic, with different programs of mathematical research, and with philosophical and conceptual reflection. So if first-order logic is “natural”, it is natural only in retrospect. The story is intricate, and at points contested; the following entry can only provide an overview. Discussions of various aspects of the development are provided by Goldfarb 1979, Moore 1988, Eklund 1996, Brady 2000, Ferreirós 2001, Sieg 2009, Mancosu, Zach & Badesa 2010, Schiemer & Reck 2013, the notes to Hilbert [LFL], and the encyclopedic handbook Gabbay & Woods 2009.

1. George Boole

The modern study of logic is commonly dated to 1847, with the appearance of Boole’s Mathematical Analysis of Logic. This work established that Aristotle’s syllogistic logic can be translated into an algebraic calculus, whose symbols Boole interpreted as referring either to classes or to propositions. His system encompasses what is today called sentential (or Boolean) logic, but it is also capable of expressing rudimentary quantifications. For instance, the proposition “All Xs are Ys” is represented in his system by the equation \(xy = x\), with the multiplication being thought of either as an intersection of sets, or as logical conjunction. “Some Xs are Ys” is more difficult, and its expression more artificial. Boole introduces a (tacitly: non-empty) set V containing the items common to X and Y; the proposition is then written \(xy = V\) (1847: 21). Boole’s system, in modern terms, can be viewed as a fragment of monadic first-order logic. It is first-order because its notational resources cannot express a quantification that ranges over predicates. It is monadic because it has no notation for n-ary relations. And it is a fragment because it cannot express nested quantifications (“for every girl, there exists a boy who loves her”). But these are our categories: not Boole’s. His logical system has no symbols corresponding to the quantifiers; so even to call it a restricted system of quantificational logic is anachronistic.

The two principal augmentations to Boole’s system that produced a recognizably modern logic were (a) the introduction, in addition to one-placed predicates (“x is mortal”), of many-placed relations (“x is the brother of y”; “x lies between y and z”); and (b) the introduction of a notation for universal and existential quantification.

Two logicians working in the Boolean tradition carried out these steps. The first step was partially carried out by Augustus De Morgan (in De Morgan 1864). The second was carried out by C. S. Peirce (in Peirce 1885). Working entirely independently, Gottlob Frege carried out both steps simultaneously in his Begriffsschrift of 1879. The subsequent history for several decades is a branching structure, with numerous researchers working in different traditions and only partially aware of one another’s accomplishments.

2. Charles S. Peirce

Peirce worked in the algebraic tradition of Boole. His first logic papers appeared in 1867; they simplify Boole’s system, re-interpret union or logical addition \(A+B\) so that it applies also when A and B are not disjoint, correct several mistakes, and explore connections between logic, arithmetic, and algebra.

Three years later, in his “Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives” (1870) Peirce produced a major expansion of Boole’s system. De Morgan had pointed out (De Morgan 1864) that the Aristotelian syllogistic was incapable of handling such inferences as, “If every man is an animal, then every head of a man is a head of an animal”. De Morgan had introduced a logic of relations, defined the converse and the contrary of a relation, and, for relations such as “X is a lover of Y” and “Z is a servant of W”, had explored such compositions of relations as “x is the lover of a servant of y”. This work successfully expanded the Aristotelian syllogistic logic, but was also limited in several ways. First, De Morgan only operated with binary relations. Secondly, his notation was clumsy. (For example: if \(X\pdot\pdot LY\) designates that X is a lover of Y, then \(X\pdot LY\) designates that X is not a lover of Y. De Morgan has no separate sign for negation, nor for the Boolean propositional connectives.)

Peirce noticed these shortcomings, and in 1870 showed how to extend Boole’s logic to cover

the whole realm of formal logic, instead of being restricted to that simplest and least useful part of the subject, the logic of absolute terms, which, when [Boole] wrote, was the only formal logic known.

He studied the composition of relations with each other and with class-terms, and worked out the principal laws for the resulting abstract algebraic system, ultimately showing that the linear associative algebras studied by his father (Benjamin Peirce, the Harvard mathematician) could all be defined in terms of what he called “elementary relatives”. His 1870 system, although a large advance both on Boole and on De Morgan, remains notationally awkward, and in retrospect it is clear that it needed the theory of quantification. But it was the first successful attempt to extend Boole’s system into the logic of relations.

In 1880 Peirce described the procedure for reducing formulae of the sentential calculus to conjunctive and disjunctive normal form, and also in unpublished work demonstrated that the sentential calculus can be obtained from the single connective of joint denial (“neither p nor q”). His 1881, “On the Logic of Number”, examined the foundations of arithmetic, and analyzed the natural numbers in terms of discrete, linearly ordered sets without a maximum element. He gave informal recursive definitions of addition and multiplication, and proved that both operations were associative and commutative.

In two remarkable papers, the short note 1883 and the longer “On the Algebra of Logic” of 1885, he introduced a modern notation for what he was the first to call the “quantifier”. He viewed his quantifiers (for which he used the symbols \(\Pi\) and \(\Sigma)\) as a generalization of the Boolean connectives, with the universal quantifier \(\Pi\) being interpreted as a (possibly infinite) conjunction, so that \(\Pi_x P(x)\) is understood as “a is P and b is P and c is P and …”. Similarly the existential quantifier \(\Sigma\) is understood as a (possibly infinite) sum: “a is P or b is P or c is P or …”. This flexible \(\Pi\) and \(\Sigma\) notation allowed him easily to express nested quantifications to any desired depth. Thus, in his notation, if \(l_{ij}\) represents “i is a lover of j”, \(\Sigma_i \Sigma_j\) \(l_{ij}\) tells us that somebody loves somebody, whereas \(\Pi_i \Sigma_j\) \(l_{ij}\) tells us that everybody loves somebody. (The \(\Sigma\) and \(\Pi\) notation is of course intended, in a Boolean spirit, to emphasize the analogy to arithmetical sums and products.)

“On the Algebra of Logic” is remarkable for other reasons as well. It begins with an important passage (§2) on the propositional calculus, containing the first explicit use of two truth values. Peirce then describes a decision procedure for the calculus:

[T]o find whether a formula is necessarily true substitute \(\mathbf{f}\) and \(\mathbf{v}\) for the letters and see whether it can be supposed false by any such assignment of values. (1885: 191)

He gives a defense of material implication, and shows how to define negation in terms of implication and a special symbol for absurdity. In the next section (§3) he treats what he calls, following the Schoolmen, the “first-intentional logic of relations”. It is here that he coins the term “quantifier”; the propositional matrix of a quantified formula he calls its “Boolian”. In this section the quantifiers range only over the individuals of the universe; the “first-intentional logic” is thus first-order. Here, too, he was the first to discuss the rules for transforming a quantified formula into prenex normal form. The following section (§4) is headed “second-intentional logic”. There is a clear demarcation from the first-intentional logic of §3. Here the quantifiers are permitted to range over predicates; and he uses his new notation to state the modern second-order definition of identity: two objects are identical just in case they satisfy the same predicates.

Peirce’s paper was in many respects far ahead of its time. His sharp distinction between propositional, first-intentional, and second-intentional logical systems was not to be equaled in clarity until Hilbert in his lectures of 1917/18. Peirce was also prescient in viewing the quantifiers as (possibly infinite) sums and products, a notation which Löwenheim was to credit with making possible the discovery of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, and which was to play a significant role in the formulation of Hilbert’s proof-theoretic program in the 1920s. (Peirce’s logical ideas were well-known in continental Europe, having been taken up by Ernst Schröder and given wide circulation in the three volumes of his Algebra der Logik (1890–95).)

Peirce drew these various distinctions—and, in particular, the distinction between first-order and second-order logic—with greater clarity than any logician until Hilbert’s lectures in 1917. And, unlike Hilbert, Peirce was steeped in the writings of the medieval logicians. He fully appreciated the philosophical significance of the arguments about the reality of universals: this is clearly why he drew such a sharp differentiation between the logic of §2 and that of §3. It was thus open to him to make (or, at least, to consider) a nominalist argument on behalf of first-order logic, and against second-order logic. But apart from a few incidental remarks, he himself did not further develop his observations on second-intentional logic, and it seems likely that the modern distinction between first-order and higher-order logic was a re-discovery made independently in 1917/18 by Hilbert, rather than being directly inspired by Peirce.

3. Gottlob Frege

Frege’s logical contributions grew out of a different soil, and were made (as far as can be determined) entirely independently of the Anglo-American algebraic tradition of Boole, De Morgan, and Peirce. Instead they have their root in the work on the foundations of real analysis by such German mathematicians as Dirichlet, Riemann, Weierstrass, and Heine. From this tradition Frege took, first, the idea of providing a rigorous foundation for mathematics (a project that, in his hands, became the project of showing that arithmetic can be grounded in the laws of logic); and, secondly, the central mathematical concepts of function and variable, which he employed in place of the Aristotelian concepts of predicate and subject. This latter step led him naturally to a logic of relations (since the functions considered in mathematics were multivariate); and his analysis of mathematical inference also led him to introduce a notation for quantificational logic. (Mathematicians such as Weierstrass, in his analysis of the limit concept, was already sensitive to the “nesting” of quantifiers, and the importance of their ordering: to the difference, for example, between saying “for every \(\varepsilon\) there exists a \(\delta\)”, and “there exists a \(\delta\) such that for every \(\varepsilon\)”. What was required now, and what Frege supplied, was a formal language to express and make explicit the quantificational inferences already present in the work of the German analysts.) So, at a single stroke, in the Begriffsschrift of 1879, Frege took the two major steps beyond traditional logic—relations and quantifiers—that the algebraic tradition had taken separately and decades apart.

Frege’s logical system had several advantages over Peirce. His axiomatic presentation of a purely syntactic calculus was considerably more precise, and his analysis of the number concept went deeper. His system permitted both variables and functions to be quantified. This was a central component of his program for providing a logical foundation for arithmetic, since, in his logical system, identity, cardinal number, and mathematical induction were all defined via higher-order quantifications. In his Grundlagen (1884) he distinguishes between concepts of different order, so that if concept A falls under concept B, then B is of “second-order” (§53). In the more technical treatment in his Grundgesetze (1893) he considered third-order quantifications, though his actual derivation of arithmetic proceeded entirely within second-order logic.

Frege was thus one of the first logicians to recognize the importance of a hierarchy of logical levels. His discovery was virtually simultaneous with Peirce’s, and arrived at entirely independently, in pursuit of different goals. Frege’s discovery was to have the greater impact. It formed the basis for Russell’s theory of types (and also, decades later, influenced Carnap, who studied logic with Frege).

But although Frege distinguished between logical levels, he did not isolate the portion of his quantificational system that ranges only over variables of the first order as a distinct system of logic: nor would it have been natural for him to have done so. In this respect, there is a significant contrast with Peirce. Frege’s project was to show that arithmetic could be grounded in the laws of logic: for him, there was only one logic, and logic necessarily included the logic of higher-order concepts. Peirce, in contrast, rejected the notion of a single, over-arching logic, instead thinking in terms of logics that vary according to the “universe of discourse”. Largely for this reason he came closer in his 1885 paper to isolating the propositional calculus, the “logic of first intention”, and the “logic of second intention” as distinct systems, each worthy of study in its own right: in that regard, he was closer to modern conceptions than was Frege. There is a further and subtler difference. Peirce’s \(\Sigma\) and \(\Pi\) notation for the quantifiers was explicitly conceived of in terms of (possibly infinite) conjunctions and disjunctions of propositions about individuals. This is a highly suggestive conception that is hard to represent in Frege’s system of notation. Löwenheim was to exploit it in his early work in model theory, leading to technical discoveries that were ultimately to call attention to first-order logic. But all this work lay decades in the future, and neither Frege nor Peirce can be credited with a modern understanding of the difference between first-order and higher-order logics.

4. Ernst Schröder

Frege’s contributions were not immediately understood or appreciated, and in the closing decade of the century logic was dominated by the three volumes of Ernst Schröder’s Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik (1890–95). Schröder provided an encyclopedic treatment of the logical work of Boole and Peirce, systematizing and extending their results. Peirce’s quantifiers make their appearance in volume two, but the distinction between first-and second-order quantification is not drawn with comparable clarity. As Frege pointed out in his review (1895), Schröder’s notation did not distinguish set membership from the subset relation, and as a result it can be difficult to tell whether he intends a given quantification to range over the subsets of a domain (i.e., to be second-order) or over its elements (i.e., to be first-order). Schröder employs both second-order and first-order quantifications; and in his third volume he used the technique of expanding a second-order quantification into an infinite product of first-order quantifications—a technique that was a development of the Peircian product notation, and that was to furnish the starting point for the investigations of Löwenheim. But Schröder does not extract from his wider system a sub-system of first-order logic, and does not treat the distinction of orders as itself being of any great significance, either mathematically or philosophically. In this sense, he is less clear than Peirce’s paper of 1885. (A helpful analysis of Schröder’s logical work is contained in Brady 2000.)

5. Giuseppe Peano

In his 1889, Giuseppe Peano, independently of Peirce and Frege, introduced a notation for universal quantification. If a and b are propositions with the free variables \(x, y, \ldots\), then \(a \mathbin{\revc_{x, y,\ldots}} b\) symbolized: Whatever \(x, y, \ldots\), may be, from the proposition a one deduces b. One hesitates to call this a notation for the universal quantifier, since the quantification is not severable from the sign for material implication: notationally, this is a considerable step backwards from Peirce. Peano moreover does not distinguish first-order from second-order quantification. The point of his essay was to present the principles of arithmetic in logical symbolism, and his formulation of the principle of mathematical induction can be seen, by our lights, to be second-order: but only tacitly. This was a distinction to which (again unlike Peirce) he seems to have attached no importance. He did, however, add a range of new symbols to mathematical logic which were to be influential on the work of Whitehead and Russell in Principia Mathematica; and one of the symbols was the notation \(\exists\) for the existential quantifier. (Oddly, Peano did not introduce a parallel symbol for the universal quantifier. It seems to have been Whitehead who introduced the \((x)\) notation in Principia, and Hilbert who introduced the symbol \(\forall\).)

6. Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell

Russell’s discovery in 1901 of the Russell Paradox led him within a few months, in a letter to Frege (Frege [PMC]: 144) to propose a tentative version of the theory of types. The central idea he took from Frege’s theory of functions of the first, second, and higher orders. Russell presented a version of his theory in an appendix to the Principles of Mathematics (1903), and then in a mature form in his “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” (1908), which provided the conceptual underpinnings for Principia Mathematica. Russell views the universe as striated into levels or types. The first type comprises the individuals; the second type comprises the “first-order” propositions whose quantifiers range over the individuals of the first type; in general, the quantifiers in propositions of the n+1st type range over propositions of the nth type. Russell’s system in fact comprises two distinct hierarchies: one to deal with the paradoxes of set theory (specifically, to prohibit sets from being elements of themselves); the other to deal with the semantical paradoxes (such as the paradox of the liar). This dual structure, branching in two directions, gives his theory the name “ramified theory of types”. In order to be able to establish classical analysis, he was forced to adopt the axiom of reducibility, which provides that any function of level \(n+1\) is coextensive with a predicate of function of lower level. The system was immensely complicated; in time, at the hands of Chwistek, Ramsey, Carnap, Tarski, and Church, it was recognized that the hierarchy dealing with the semantical paradoxes could be pruned away, leaving the “simple theory of types”. (A survey of this evolution can be found in Church 1974, and detailed examinations of Russell’s theory in Landini 1998 and Linsky 2011.)

Russell and Whitehead thus possessed a notation for the two quantifiers, as well as a distinction between quantifications of the first and higher types. But this is not the same as possessing a conception of first-order logic, conceived as a free-standing logical system, worthy of study in its own right. There were essentially two things blocking the way. First (and in contrast to Peirce), their object of study was not multiple logical systems, but logic tout court: they show no interest in splitting off a fragment for separate study, let alone in arguing that the first-order fragment enjoys a privileged status. On the contrary: as with Frege, the ambition of Principia was to demonstrate that mathematics can be reduced to logic, and for Whitehead and Russell logic encompassed the full apparatus of ramified type theory (together with the axioms of infinity, choice, and reducibility). Secondly, although Principia provided an axiomatization of type theory (and thus can be viewed as specifying a conception of deductive consequence), Whitehead and Russell thought of their system as an interpreted system, stating the truths of logic, rather than as a formal calculus in the sense of Hilbert. Hilbert was to use their axiomatization as the starting-point for his own axiomatizations of various systems of logic; but until the distinction between logic and metalogic had been formulated, it did not naturally occur to anybody to pose the metalogical questions of completeness, consistency, and decidability, or to investigate such matters as the relationship between deductive and semantic completeness, or failures of categoricity; and it was only once such notions became the focus of attention that the significance of first-order logic became apparent.

7. Leopold Löwenheim

In 1915, Löwenheim published his landmark “Über Möglichkeiten im Relativkalkül”. This paper, written in the tradition of the Peirce-Schroeder calculus of relatives, established the first significant metalogical theorem; from certain points of view, it marks the beginning of model theory. Löwenheim considered a class of what he called “counting expressions” (Zählausdrücke) whose quantifiers range only over the domain of objects in the universe, but not over relatives; he then proved that, for any such counting expression, if it is satisfiable, it is satisfiable in some denumerable domain. In modern terminology, his “counting expressions” are formulas of first-order logic; but his terminology shows no influence either from Peirce’s logic of “first intention”, or from Russell’s theory of types. Löwenheim, like all logicians of this era, did not possess the distinction between an object language and a metalanguage. His proof is difficult to follow, and the precise details of his theorem—of what he believed he had proved, and what he had, in fact, proved—have been the subject of extensive scholarly discussion. (A survey of the differing interpretations is provided by Mancosu, Zach, & Badesa 2009, and a detailed reconstruction of the proof itself by Badesa 2004.) The paper appears to have had no influence until Skolem sharpened and extended its results in his 1920. Löwenheim, like Peirce and Russell, did not isolate an axiomatic system encompassing first-order logic, nor did he draw a distinction between syntax and semantics. Still less does he argue that his class of “counting expressions” is in some way logically privileged, and provides a favored foundation for mathematics. The Löwenheim theorem was in time to be recognized as isolating a fundamental property of first-order logic. But the full implications of his result were not to become clear until later, after Hilbert had introduced the metamathematical study of logical systems. (Incidentally, Löwenheim credited the elegant \(\Sigma\) and \(\Pi\) symbolism of Peirce for suggesting the infinitary expansions that were necessary to his proof; and it is difficult to see how he could have obtained his theorem with any of the other quantificational notations then on offer. He was still vigorously defending the advantages of the Peirce-Schroeder notation against the notation of Principia as late as Löwenheim 1940.)

8. David Hilbert and Paul Bernays

Let us briefly take stock of the situation as it existed in 1915. Peirce had differentiated between first-order and second-order logic, but had put the distinction to no mathematical use, and it dropped from sight. Both Frege and Russell had formulated versions of multi-level type theory, but neither had singled out the first-order fragment as an object worthy of study. The American postulate theorists, Edward Huntington and Oswald Veblen, had formulated various notions of completeness and categoricity, and Veblen had remarked that axiomatic deducibility might diverge from semantic implication (Awodey & Reck 2002: 15–19). But Veblen did not possess a precise characterization of formal deduction, and his observation remained inert. Löwenheim had proved a deep theorem about what in retrospect could be characterized as first-order formulas, but had not isolated a system of first order logic. A similar point holds for Hermann Weyl, who in 1910 proposed (in effect) to use first-order logic to make precise the concept of “definite property” in Zermelo’s axiom of separation. But this, too, is a retrospective characterization, and Weyl’s interest was in set theory, not in the study of a system of first-order logic.

The next large step was taken by David Hilbert in his lecture course Prinzipien der Mathematik, delivered in Göttingen in the winter semester of 1917/18. Hilbert had lectured and published on foundational topics in the years 1899–1905; in the intervening time, as he concentrated on other matters, the publications had ceased, though the extensive classroom lecturing continued. He kept up with current developments, and in particular was informed about the logical work of Whitehead and Russell, largely through his student Heinrich Behmann. In September, 1917, he delivered his programmatic lecture “Axiomatisches Denken” in Zürich calling for an axiomatic treatment of logic along the lines he had earlier explored in his axiomatization of geometry, and explicitly proposing metalogical investigations:

When we consider the matter more closely, we soon recognize that the question of the consistency for integers and for sets is not one that stands alone, but that it belongs to a vast domain of difficult epistemological questions which have a specifically mathematical tint: for example (to characterize this domain of questions briefly), the problem of the solvability in principle of every mathematical question, the problem of the subsequent checkability of the results of a mathematical investigation, the question of a criterion of simplicity for mathematical proofs, the question of the relationship between content and formalism in mathematics and logic, and finally the problem of the decidability of a mathematical question in a finite number of operations. (Hilbert 1917: 412–413)

It was on this trip to Zürich that he invited Paul Bernays to return to Göttingen as his assistant in foundational matters. Although Bernays had little previous experience in foundations, this turned out to be a shrewd choice, and the beginning of a close and fruitful research partnership.

The Göttingen lectures that shortly followed the Zürich address (and that were recorded in an official protocol by Bernays) are a remarkable document, and mark the birth of modern mathematical logic. They are substantially the same as the published monograph known as “Hilbert and Ackermann” (1928), and even today, with modest supplementation, could serve as an introductory textbook for logic. Hilbert for the first time clearly distinguishes metalanguage from object language, and step-by-step presents a sequence of formal logical calculi of gradually increasing strength. Each calculus is carefully studied in its turn; its strengths and its weaknesses are identified and balanced, and the analysis of the weaknesses is used to prepare the transition to the next calculus. He begins with the propositional calculus, then moves to monadic quantificational logic (with an extended discussion of the calculus of classes, and of the Aristotelian syllogism), and then to the “function calculus”.

The function calculus is a system of (many-sorted) first-order logic, with variables for sentences as well as for relations. It is here, for the first time, that we encounter a precise, modern formulation of first-order logic, clearly differentiated from the other calculi, given an axiomatic foundation, and with metalogical questions explicitly formulated. Hilbert concludes his discussion of first-order logic with the remark:

The basic discussion of the logical calculus could cease here if we had no other end in view for this calculus than the formalization of logical inference. But we cannot be satisfied with this application of symbolic logic. Not only do we want to be able to develop individual theories from their principles in a purely formal way, but we also want to investigate the foundations of the mathematical theories themselves and examine how they are related to logic and how far they can be built up from purely logical operations and concept formations; and for this purpose the logical calculus is to serve us as a tool. (1917/18: 188)

This leads him next to introduce higher-order logic, and thence to a consideration of logical paradoxes and their resolution through Russell’s ramified theory of types; the axiom of reducibility is briefly discussed and adopted as a foundation for mathematics. The lecture protocol ends with the sentence:

Thus it is clear that the introduction of the Axiom of Reducibility is the appropriate means to turn the calculus of levels into a system out of which the foundations for higher mathematics can be developed.

This sentence appeared essentially unchanged when the 1917 lectures were re-worked as the monograph (Hilbert & Ackermann 1928).

In the course of his lectures, Hilbert addresses the metalogical questions he had stated in “Axiomatisches Denken”, and (at least tacitly) shows how the questions of completeness, consistency, and decidability are to be answered for the propositional case. The completeness question for first-order logic is not explicitly raised in Bernays’s record of the lectures, though an attentive reader would easily have recognized it as an open problem. The following summer, Bernays produced a Habilitation thesis in which he developed, with full rigor, a Hilbert-style, axiomatic analysis of propositional logic. He presents the axiomatic system as an uninterpreted formal calculus; provides it with a semantics; and then proves the completeness theorem linking the syntax to the semantics in the form, “Every provable formula is universally valid, and vice versa”. He then proceeds to investigate questions of decidability, consistency, and the mutual independence of various combinations of axioms.

The Hilbert 1917 lectures and the 1918 Bernays Habilitation are a milestone in the development of first-order logic. In the lectures, for the first time, first-order logic is presented in its own right as an axiomatic logical system, suitable for study using the new metalogical techniques. It was those metalogical techniques that represented the crucial advance over Peirce and Frege and Russell, and that were in time to bring first-order logic into focus. But that did not happen at once, and a great deal of work still lay ahead. In the 1917/18 lectures Hilbert’s sequence of logical calculi were presented as stepping-stones on the way to full higher-order ramified type theory, which he continued to regard as the “right” logical framework for investigating the foundations of mathematics. It was characteristic of Hilbert to break complex mathematical phenomena into their elements: the sequence of calculi can be viewed as a decomposition of higher-order logic into its simpler component parts, revealing to his students precisely the steps that went into the building of the full system. Although he discusses the functional calculus, he does not single it out for special attention. In other words (and as with Peirce three decades earlier) first-order logic is introduced primarily as an expository device: its importance was not yet clear.

Moreover, Hilbert’s own treatment of the metalogical issues is somewhat hasty and informal. He experiments with several versions of the concept of “completeness”: one has the sense that he was rapidly breaking new ground, and was not yet certain which concepts would prove the most fruitful. His proof of the completeness of propositional calculus is a mere sketch, and relegated to a footnote; the parallel problem for first-order logic is not even raised as a conjecture. Even more strikingly, when Bernays eventually in 1926 published his Habilitation, he omitted his proof of the completeness theorem because (as he later ruefully said) the result seemed at the time straightforward and unimportant. (For discussion of this point, see Hilbert [LFL]: 229. For readily available general discussions, see Sieg 1999, Zach 1999, and the essays collected in Sieg 2013; for the original documents and detailed analysis, see Hilbert [LFL.)

In other words, even in Göttingen in the 1920s a full understanding of the significance of the ideas Hilbert had introduced in 1917 was missing. The Hilbert school throughout the 1920s regarded first-order logic as a fragment of type theory, and made no argument for it as a uniquely favored system. It was not until the monograph Hilbert & Ackermann 1928 (and the contemporaneous “Bologna Lecture”, Hilbert 1928) that Hilbert explicitly called attention to the completeness of first-order logic as an open question. That set the stage for the work of Gödel: but before coming to that, we need to take a chronological step backwards.

9. Thoralf Skolem

Skolem in the winter of 1915–16 visited Göttingen, where he discussed set theory with Felix Bernstein; there is no sign that he met Hilbert. He was already at this time familiar with Löwenheim’s theorem, and knew of its paradoxical implications for Zermelo’s axiomatization of set theory: specifically, that a first-order axiomatization of the theory of non-denumerable sets would have a denumerable model. He did not at the time publish on these topics because, as he later said:

I believed that it was so clear that the axiomatization of set theory would not be satisfactory as an ultimate foundation for mathematics that, by and large, mathematicians would not bother themselves with it very much. To my astonishment I have seen recently that many mathematicians regard these axioms for set theory as the ideal foundation for mathematics. For this reason it seemed to me that the time had come to publish a critique. (Skolem 1922: appendix.)

Skolem’s first major papers were his 1920 and especially his 1922. In the first he proved (or re-proved) in a more perspicuous form the downward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem. In the second he provided a new proof of that result. He also criticized Zermelo’s axiom of separation, which had taken the form: Given a set S and a definite proposition \(\phi(x)\), there exists a set S of all elements s of S such that \(\phi(s)\). Here the concept of “definite proposition” was left somewhat imprecise. Skolem’s proposal was to identify “definite propositions” with the formulas of first-order logic (with identity). Although Skolem declared this identification to be “natural” and “completely clear”, he did not explicitly argue for the restriction of quantifiers to the first level. He then gave the earliest satisfactory first-order formulation of Zermelo’s set theory, and then applied the Löwenheim-Skolem result to obtain the Skolem paradox.

These technical results were of great importance for the subsequent debate over first-order logic. But it is important not to read into Skolem 1922 a later understanding of the issues. Skolem at this point did not possess a distinction between the object language and the metalanguage. And although in retrospect his axiomatization of set theory can be interpreted to be first-order, he nowhere emphasizes that fact. (Indeed, Eklund (1996) presents a compelling argument that Skolem did not yet clearly appreciate the significance of the distinction between first-order and second-order logic, and that the reformulation of the axiom of separation is not in fact as unambiguously first-order as it is often taken to be.)

Skolem’s remarks about first-order logic require careful interpretation (see, e.g., Ferreirós 2001: 470–74), but clearly must be viewed against the backdrop of the Grundlagenkrise of the 1920s, and of the debates between Hilbert, Brouwer, and Weyl. There are two broad tendencies within logic during these years, and they pull in opposite directions. One tendency is towards pruning down logical and mathematical systems so as to accommodate the criticisms of Brouwer and his followers. The aim was to avoid the paradoxes, to delimit the territory of “legitimate” mathematics, and to place it on secure foundations. Set theory was in dispute, and Skolem explicitly presented his 1922 results as a critique of set theoretical foundations. Weyl already in 1910 had been led by his examination of Zermelo’s system to formulate a set of logical principles that in retrospect (and despite the idiosyncratic notation) can be seen to be a form of first-order logic. In general, both Weyl and Skolem inclined, on methodological grounds, towards some sort of constructivism as a means of avoiding the paradoxes; and this meant that they viewed quantification over, say, the totality of subsets of an infinite set as something to be avoided: whatever one’s grasp on the notion of “all integers”, the notion of “all properties of integers” was far less firm. To put the matter slightly differently: the very point of axiomatizing set theory was to state its philosophically problematic assumptions in such a way that one could clearly see what they came to. But this aim would be compromised if one already presupposed in the background logic the problematical notion of “all subsets” that one was attempting to elucidate. One possibility was to restrict oneself to first-order logic; another, to adopt some sort of predicative higher-order system.

Similar broadly constructivist tendencies were also very much in evidence in the proof theoretical work of Hilbert and Bernays and their followers in the 1920s. Already by the time of Hilbert’s 1921/22 lectures Hilbert had identified the introduction of the (classical) quantifiers as the crucial step where the transfinite entered logic. Hilbert, like C. S. Peirce long before, thought of the quantifiers as infinite conjunctions and disjunctions, and from the early 1920s onwards it was well understood in Göttingen that, for the programmatic goals of the Hilbert consistency program to be carried out, a finitary analysis of the quantifiers was necessary. The epsilon-substitution method was the principal device Hilbert introduced in order to attempt to attain this result. (A survey of this research is provided by Sieg 2009 and in the introductory notes to Hilbert [LFL].)

But despite these constructive tendencies, many logicians of the 1920s (including Hilbert) continued to regard higher-order type theory, and not its first-order fragment, as the appropriate logic for investigations in the foundations of mathematics. The ultimate hope was to provide a consistency proof for the whole of classical mathematics (including set theory). But, in the meanwhile, researchers still were somewhat unclear about certain basic distinctions. Hilbert at times fails to observe the distinction between a first-order axiom-schema and a second-order axiom; Brouwer’s intuitionism is sometimes identified with “finitism”; the relationships between completeness (in several senses), categoricity (also in several senses), and first-order and higher-order logic were not yet understood. Indeed, Gregory Moore points out that even Gödel, in his 1929 proof of the completeness of first-order logic, did not fully understand the notion of categoricity and its relationship to second-order logic (Moore 1988: 125).

10. Kurt Gödel

So matters remained unclear throughout the 1920s. But the constructivist ambitions of the Hilbert school, the focus on the analysis of the quantifiers, and the explicit posing of metalogical questions had made the emergence of first-order logic as a system worthy of study in its own right all but inevitable. The crucial technical breakthroughs came in 1929 and 1931 with the publication, by Gödel, first, of the completeness theorem for first-order logic, and then of the incompleteness theorems. With these results (and others that soon followed) it finally became clear that there were important metalogical differences between first-order logic and higher-order logics. Perhaps most significantly, first-order logic is complete, and can be fully formalized (in the sense that a sentence is derivable from the axioms just in case it holds in all models). First-order logic moreover satisfies both compactness and the downward Löwenheim-Skolem property; so it has a tractable model theory. Second-order logic does not. By the middle of the 1930s these distinctions were beginning to be widely understood, as was the fact that categoricity can in general only be obtained in higher-order systems. Lindström was later to show (1969) that no logical system satisfying both compactness and the Löwenheim-Skolem property can possess greater expressive power than first-order logic: so in that sense, first-order logic is indeed a “natural” entity.

But the technical results alone did not settle the matter in favor of first-order logic. As Schiemer & Reck point out (2013), well into the 1930s, even after the principal metalogical results had been achieved, logicians such as Gödel, Carnap, Tarski, Church, and Hilbert & Bernays continued to use higher-order systems (generally in some version of the simple theory of types). In other words, even after the metalogical results there was a choice to be made, and the choice in favor of first-order logic was not inevitable. After all, the metalogical results can be taken to show a severe limitation of first-order logic: that it is not capable of specifying a unique model even for the natural numbers. Hilbert in 1917/18 had treated first-order logic as a mere stepping-stone, and the metalogical results can be taken to confirm the wisdom of his approach: If you want categoricity, then you are forced to move to a higher-order system.

At this point in the 1930s, however, several other strands of thinking about logic now coalesced. The intellectual situation was highly complex. The famous papers by Carnap, von Neumann, and Heyting at the 1931 Königsberg congress had identified the logicist, formalist, and intuitionist schools: their debates were to shape thinking about the foundations of mathematics for the next several decades. A search for secure foundations, and in particular for an avoidance of the set-theoretical paradoxes, was something they shared, and that helped to tip the balance in favor of first-order logic. In the first place (as Weyl and Skolem had already pointed out, and as was at least implicit in the Hilbert program) there were good constructivist and philosophical reasons for avoiding higher-order quantification wherever possible, and for restricting one’s logic to the first order. Secondly, several unambiguously first-order formulations were now given of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, and also of von-Neumann-Bernays-Gödel set theory (which permits a finite axiomatization). The first-order nature of these theories was stressed in a number of publications from the 1930s: by Tarski (1935), Quine (1936), Bernays (1937), and Gödel (1940). As a practical matter, these first-order set theories sufficed to formulate all existing mathematical practice; so for the codification of mathematical proofs, there was no need to resort to higher-order logic. (This confirmed an observation that Hilbert had already made as early as 1917, though without himself fully developing the point.) Thirdly, there was an increased tendency to distinguish between logic and set theory, and to view set theory as a branch of mathematics. The fact that higher-order logic could be construed as (in Quine’s later phrase) “set theory in sheep’s clothing” reinforced the other tendencies: “true” logic was first-order; higher-order logic was “really” set theory. By the end of the decade, a consensus had been reached that, for purposes of research in the foundations of mathematics, mathematical theories ought to be formulated in first-order terms. Classical first-order logic had become “standard”.

11. Conclusions

Let us now try to draw some lessons, and in particular ask whether the emergence of first-order logic was inevitable. I begin with an observation. Each stage of this complex history is conditioned by two sorts of shifting background consideration. One is broadly mathematical: the theorems that had been established. The other is broadly philosophical: the assumptions that were made (explicitly or tacitly) about logic and about the foundations of mathematics. These two things interacted. Each thinker in the sequence starts with some more or less intuitive ideas about logic. Those ideas prompt mathematical questions: distinctions are drawn: theorems are proved: consequences are noted, and the philosophical understanding is sharpened. At each stage, the question, “What is logic?” (or: “What is the correct logic?”) needs to be assessed against both the mathematical and the philosophical background: it makes little sense to ask the question in the abstract.

Let us now consider the question: When was first-order logic discovered? That question is too general. It needs to be broken down into three subsidiary questions:

  • \((\alpha)\) When was first-order logic first explicitly identified as a distinct logical system? This question has a relatively straightforward answer. First-order logic was explicitly identified by Peirce in 1885, but then forgotten. It was independently re-discovered in Hilbert’s 1917/18 lectures, and given wide currency in the 1928 monograph, Hilbert & Ackermann. Peirce was the first to identify it: but it was Hilbert who put the system on the map.
  • \((\beta)\) When was first-order logic recognized as being importantly different from higher-order systems? This is a more complicated question. Although Hilbert isolated first-order logic, he did not treat it as especially significant, and he himself continued to work in type theory. An awareness of the fundamental metalogical differences between first-order and higher-order logic only began to emerge in the early 1930s, mostly, though not exclusively, at the hands of Gödel.
  • \((\gamma)\) How did first-order logic come to be regarded as a privileged logical system—that is, as (in some sense) the “correct” logic for investigations in foundations of mathematics? That question, too, is highly complicated. Even after the Gödel results were widely understood, logicians continued to work in type theory, and it took years before first-order logic attained canonical status. The transition was gradual, and cannot be given a specific date.

Equipped with these distinctions, let us now ask: Why was first-order logic not discovered earlier?

It is striking that Peirce, already in 1885, had clearly differentiated between propositional logic, first-order logic, and second-order logic. He was aware that propositional logic is significantly weaker than quantificational logic, and, in particular, is inadequate to an analysis of the foundations of arithmetic. He could then have gone on to observe that second-order logic is in certain respects philosophically problematic, and that, in general, our grasp on quantification over objects is firmer than our grasp on quantification over properties. The problem arises even if the universe of discourse is finite. We have, for example, a reasonable grasp on what it means to speak (in first-order terms) of all the planets, or to say that there exists a planet with a particular property. But what does it mean to talk (in second-order terms) of all properties of the planets? What is the criterion of individuation for such properties? Is the property of being the outermost planet the same as the property of being the smallest planet? What are we to say about negative properties? Is it a property of the planet Saturn that it is not equal to the integer 17? In that case, although there are only a finite number of planets, our second-order quantifiers must range over infinitely many properties. And so on. The Quinean objections are familiar.

Arguments of this sort had been made in the scholastic disputes between realists and nominalists: and Peirce was steeped in the medieval literature on these topics. He need not have gone so far as to make point \((\gamma)\), i.e., to argue that first-order logic is specially privileged. That would in any case have run contrary to his logical pluralism. But he did have the tools to make point \((\beta)\), and to emphasize that there is an important gulf separating second-order logic from first-order, just as there is an important gulf separating first-order logic from the Boolean propositional calculus. Why did he not make these points already in 1885?

Any answer can only be speculative. One factor, a minor one, is that Peirce was not himself a nominalist. Another is that he operated within a variety of logical systems: he was temperamentally eclectic, and not disposed to search for the “one true logic”. There are also technical considerations. Peirce, unlike Hilbert, does not present first-intentional logic as an axiomatized system, nor does he urge it as a vehicle for studying the foundations of mathematics. He does not possess the distinction between an uninterpreted, formal, axiomatic calculus and its metalanguage. As a result, he does not ask about questions of decidability, or completeness, or categoricity; and without the metamathematical results a full understanding of the differences in expressive power between first-order and second-order logic was not available to him. One of the strongest arguments against second-order logic—that quantification over all subsets of a denumerable collection entails quantification over a non-denumerable totality—could not even have been formulated until Cantor’s Theorem was known. The logical and set-theoretical paradoxes were not yet discovered, and Zermelo had not yet axiomatized the theory of sets: so Peirce lacked the acute sense of motivation to discover a “secure foundation for mathematics”. And of course Peirce had no inkling of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems, or the Skolem paradox, or the sequence of metalogical theorems that were to bring first-order logic into sharp focus. He provided a flexible and suggestive notation that was to prove enormously fertile, and he was the first to distinguish clearly between first-order and second-order logic: but the tools for understanding the mathematical significance of the distinction did not yet exist. (As Henri Pirenne once remarked, the Vikings discovered America, but they forgot about it, because they did not yet need it.)

A related point holds for Frege and Russell. They possessed the conception of a hierarchy of logical levels, and in principle they, too, could have isolated first-order logic, and thus have accomplished step \((\alpha)\). But they never considered isolating the lowest level of the hierarchy as a free-standing system. There are both philosophical and mathematical reasons for this. As a philosophical matter, the logicist project aimed to show that “mathematics can be reduced to logic”: and they conceived of the entire hierarchy of types as constituting logic. And then, as a mathematical matter, second-order logic was necessary to their construction of the integers. So they had no compelling reason, either philosophical or mathematical, that would have led them to focus on the first-order fragment.

There is here an instructive contrast with Peirce. Peirce, in the spirit of the 19th-century algebraists, was happy to explore a lush abundance of logical structures: his attitude was fundamentally pluralist. The logicists, working in the analytical tradition, were more concerned to discover what the integers actually are: their attitude was fundamentally monistic and reductionist. But in order to single out first-order logic as was done in the 1930s, two things were needed: an awareness that there were distinct logical systems, and an argument for preferring one to the other. Peirce had the pluralism: the logicists had the urge to find a “correct” system: but neither had both.

Let us now turn to the question, Was the emergence of first-order logic inevitable? It is impossible to avoid counterfactual considerations, and the answer must be more speculative. And here, too, it is necessary to distinguish between the inevitability of the technical results \((\beta)\), and the inevitability of point \((\gamma)\).

Let us start with point \((\beta)\). By 1928, the metalogical results can fairly be said to have been inevitable. Hilbert & Ackermann had isolated and described first-order logic; the distinction between mathematics and meta-mathematics was by then well understood; they had shown how to prove the completeness of the propositional calculus; and they explicitly raised the completeness of first-order logic as an important open problem. It was certain that, within the next few years, some enterprising logician would provide an answer: as it happened, Gödel got there first. It would then have been an obvious next step to inquire about the completeness of higher-order systems. So within a few years of Hilbert & Ackermann the basic metalogical theorems would have been established.

If that is correct, then Hilbert’s decisive step in the 1917/18 lectures was not the isolation of first-order logic—i.e., not step \((\alpha)\). That was a comparatively insignificant matter. That step had already been taken explicitly by Peirce, and tacitly by Weyl and Löwenheim. Hilbert did not treat it as important, and appears to have viewed it primarily as an expository device, a means of simplifying the presentation of the logic of Principia Mathematica. The important step in 1917 was rather the introduction of techniques of metamathematics, and the explicit posing of questions of completeness and consistency and decidability. To pose these questions for systems of logic was an enormous conceptual leap, and Hilbert understood it as such. His own first attempts, made in his 1905 Heidelberg address, had collapsed under the criticisms of Poincaré, and he had struggled to find a satisfactory formulation. And even after he had introduced his metalogical distinctions in his papers of the 1920s, logicians of the caliber of Russell and Brouwer and Ramsey had difficulty in understanding what he was attempting to do. This development was in 1917 anything but inevitable: and without the introduction of the metalogical techniques the history of logic and proof theory in the 1920s and 1930s would have looked very different. Would the Gödel theorems ever have been conceived? Would the work of Löwenheim or Skolem or Zermelo independently have led to an investigation of the metalogical properties of first-order logic? One can in retrospect imagine an alternative path to the technical results \((\beta)\), but there is no reason to suppose that they were fated to emerge either when they did, or as they did.

A subtler issue arises if we turn now to point \((\gamma)\) and ask: Was it inevitable that first-order logic would come to be regarded as a “privileged” logical system? As we saw, the metalogical results of the 1930s do not settle the primacy of first-order logic. The “privileging” came later, and seems rather to have depended on philosophical considerations: the need to avoid the set-theoretical paradoxes, a search for secure foundations for mathematics, a desire to accommodate the objections of Brouwer and Weyl, a sense that higher-order logics were both methodologically suspect and avoidable. All these things show the continuing influence of the Grundlagenkrise of the 1920s, which did so much to set the terms of the subsequent philosophical understanding of the foundations of mathematics.

It is therefore important to stress that an alternative history was possible, and that the Grundlagenkrise was entirely absent from Hilbert’s logical writings in 1917/18. The names of Brouwer and Weyl are nowhere mentioned. Hilbert is of course aware of the paradoxes (which he had known about since 1897), but had long believed that Zermelo’s axiomatization had shown how to avoid them. Nor do we find in his writings any quest for the “one true logic”. On the contrary. Both in 1917/18 and in the unpublished lecture notes from the early 1920s the emphasis is on using the new metalogical techniques to explore the strengths and weaknesses of a diversity of logical systems. The work is explicitly undertaken in the spirit of his studies of the axioms of geometry. He will take up a system, explore it for a while, then drop it to examine something else. In his pluralism and in his pragmatic, experimental attitude he is closer to Peirce than to the logicists.

The Grundlagenkrise and his public, polemical exchanges with Brouwer came later, and they gave a distorted picture of the motivations behind his logical investigations. What was the impact of these philosophical debates on the technical aspects of his program? For the formulation of first-order logic, and for the posing of metalogical questions, the answer is easy: there was no impact whatsoever. The contents of Hilbert & Ackermann 1928 were already present in the 1917/18 lectures. As for Hilbert’s proof-theoretic research of the 1920s, the main lines of development emerged quite independently of Brouwer and Weyl. The polemics might have added a sense of urgency, but it is hard to detect any influence on the actual mathematics.

So even if we imagine the philosophical Grundlagenkrise entirely removed from the picture, the technical results of the Hilbert school would not have been significantly affected. The completeness and incompleteness results would, in all likelihood, have arrived more or less on schedule. (It is worthwhile to note that Bernays and Hilbert had contemplated the possibility of various sorts of incompleteness as early as 1928: see the discussion by Wilfried Sieg in Hilbert [LFL]: 792–796.) But those results would have emerged in a very different philosophical climate. The incompleteness theorems would likely have been greeted as an important technical contribution within the broader Hilbert program, rather than as its dramatic refutation. Perhaps (as Angus Macintyre 2011 has suggested) they would have been viewed more like the independence results in set theory, with less talk about the limits of mathematical creativity.

In other words, far from being inevitable, the emergence, towards the end of the 1930s, of first-order logic as a privileged system of logic depended on two things, each independent of the other. On the mathematical side, it depended on Hilbert’s introduction of metalogical techniques; on the philosophical side, it depended on the arguments of the Grundlagenkrise. Neither of these things was inevitable: nor was the fact that they occurred at roughly the same time. With a different history, Hilbert’s flexible attitude might have prevailed, and there might have been more emphasis on higher-order systems, or on the exploration of algebraic logics, infinitary logics, category-theoretic systems, and the like: in short, on logical pluralism.

It is worthwhile to observe that, as the philosophical concerns of the Grundlagenkrise have receded, and as new approaches from the direction of computer science and homotopy theory have entered the field, the primacy of first-order logic is open to reconsideration.


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Other Internet Resources

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I am grateful to Erich Reck for comments.

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William Ewald <>

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