[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Simon Trépanier replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
Titus Lucretius Carus (mid-90s to mid-50s BCE) was the author of a Latin, six-book didactic poem on Epicurean physics, the De rerum natura, henceforth DRN, usually translated The nature of things or On the nature of the universe. Largely by accident, the DRN is our fullest source for Epicurean, atomist physics. Lucretius’ rendering of technical Greek prose into Latin verse, combined with the encyclopedic scope of the work, was a pioneering accomplishment in Latin literature, a contender for the most ambitious poem ever written. The DRN is complete but probably lacking its final revision. Allowing for some abridgments and simplifications, Lucretius reproduces Epicurean doctrine faithfully. He provides us with our most detailed account of the foundations of Epicurean atomism, and he is our sole Epicurean source for the doctrine of the atomic ‘swerve.’ In the more poetic openings of the individual books, he expresses his devotion to Epicurus and his confidence in Epicureanism as the path to happiness. The DRN is a nearly unique survival from antiquity of the anti-teleological and anti-providential materialist outlook. Among its philosophical highlights are: the scientific image of atoms as motes of dust in a sunbeam, and the denial of most phenomenal properties, including color, to the atoms themselves, both in book 2; the treatment of the fear of death in book 3; the criticism of teleological explanations of nature, from cosmic design down to body parts, in books 4 and 5; and, from book 5, the humanistic explanation of the origins of religion.
- 1. Life
- 2. The poem’s structure and lack of final revision
- 3. Poetic format
- 4. Epicurean background
- 5. Natural science
- 6. Ethics
- 7. Religion
- 8. Influence and reception
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
We know little about Lucretius’ life beyond what we can infer from his work. Our sole external reference comes from Cicero, in a letter to his brother Quintus serving with Caesar in Gaul, dated from February 54 BCE (Q.F. 2.10.3). Cicero agrees with his brother’s praise of the work, noting that it displays both brilliance and originality, but also considerable craftsmanship. Although Cicero and his brother may have read an earlier or partial draft, such a date for the poem we have is compatible with two main internal indicators.
First is the poem’s addressee, the Roman aristocrat, Memmius, named only in books 1, 2 and 5. While doubts are possible as to which member of the Memmii Lucretius so honoured, most likely he is C. Memmius, the praetor of 58 BCE, governor of Bithynia in 57, where the poets Catullus and Cinna served on his staff, and who was exiled in 52 BCE as the result of an electoral scandal. The story, attested in other letters of Cicero, that Memmius had plans to build on the site of Epicurus’ house (in Melite, not the Garden itself), has sometimes been taken as spite from a failed attempt at conversion, but it makes more sense as an offer of patronage by an Epicurean-Roman grandee that fell afoul of local sensitivities (Morgan and Taylor 2017). The friendship with Memmius to which Lucretius aspires (DRN 1.141) need not imply equal status for Lucretius but is also compatible with a patronage relation. The second indicator is Lucretius’ mention at DRN 1.41 of the current age as ‘this troubled time for our country’. The standard view, that this relates to the early 50s was challenged by Hutchinson (2001), who argued for 49–48 BCE, but for a rejoinder see Volk (2010). Krebs (2013), in support of the earlier date, shows some possible Lucretian influence on Caesar’s vocabulary in his Commentaries on the Gallic War.
Later biographical material contains a few plausible elements but is otherwise unreliable. Donatus’ life of Vergil claims that Lucretius died on 15th October 53 BCE, the same day Vergil reached manhood (donned his toga virilis). The date is possible, but the coincidence is obviously a passing of the poetic torch. Jerome gives his birth as 94 BCE and his death at age 44 or 39 (uncertain text; 39 best matches other evidence), but then relates a bizarre story that Lucretius was driven mad by a love potion and composed the DRN during the ‘intervals of sanity’ before he committed suicide. Thereafter Cicero edited or prepared the poem for publication. That the love philtre was administered by his wife is not in Jerome but turns up in medieval sources. Much of this is hard to take at face value (Holford-Strevens 2002). Cicero’s involvement in the initial diffusion, as opposed to editing of the DRN, is just possible, but he never mentions it in his later philosophical works. Otherwise, Jerome’s tale of madness does not square with the earliest reception of the DRN, the high esteem shown Lucretius in Vergil, Horace, Ovid and beyond.
To consider only the first of these, his influence on his younger contemporary Vergil (70–19 BCE) was central. Vergil’s admiration is made quasi explicit in the poetic blessing at Georgics 2.490–92: ‘Happy he who was able to know the causes of things and crushed underfoot all fear, inexorable fate, and the harsh roar of greedy hell’. In specifying the basis for this happiness, ‘knowing the causes of things’, Vergil evokes Lucretius’ title (rerum causas suggests rerum natura), yet also connects this universal knowledge to its practical aim: the banishment of fears of all kinds, including liberation from fatalism (the swerve) and the fear of death and the afterlife (Book 3). Peace of mind in the here and now, Greek ataraxia, achieved through the study of Epicurean, atomic physics, was the formal, therapeutic goal of Epicureanism. Vergil’s evocation thus knowingly sums up some of the DRN’s key themes, and flatteringly conflates Lucretius’ poetic accomplishments with the wisdom of Epicurus himself —flatteringly because in doctrinal matters Lucretius only depicts himself as following his master. More importantly, the beatitude Vergil attributes to him is hardly compatible with, and more than enough to dispel, Jerome’s suicidal madman.
Lucretius’ insanity and miserable end in Jerome seem rather motivated by early Christian hostility to the Epicurean denial of providence (Lactantius, sometimes using Lucretius as a source for Epicureanism, calls him ‘mad’), perhaps overlaid upon some now-lost poetic-fictional retribution for Lucretius’ attack on erotic love in the concluding sections of book 4, although that is only a guess. But even if our sole biographical source is not credible, its chronology remains compatible with our other information, that is, a life span ranging from the mid-90s to mid-50s BCE. Perhaps one last nugget of plausibility among the biographical dross is that a premature death, as opposed to suicide, does seem consistent with the unfinished status of the DRN.
2. The poem’s structure and lack of final revision
The six books of the DRN display a clear architectural design:
- Atoms and void as the sole permanent entities
- Atomic motion and atomic shapes; the properties of compounds
- The nature and mortality of soul; curing the fear of death
- Activities of the soul: sensation and thought, volition, dreams and emotions
- Our world: cosmology, origins of life, and history of civilisation
- Meteorological and terrestrial phenomena
The most obvious feature is the progression in scale of the subject-matter, in two-book increments. We start with the atomic level in books 1–2, move to the human scale in books 3 and 4, and then onto the cosmic in 5–6. Between each of the three pairs the first book concentrates on the nature or permanent properties of the subject, while the second depicts its powers and activity, the subject in action. Only the atoms, however, are indestructible and thus everlasting. All generated entities, from our souls to the cosmos, are compounds and so transient and destructible (on gods see section 7 below).
A second structuring feature is the direction given by the themes of birth and death. The opening hymn to Roman Venus features a spring scene of birth and joy, nature at her most benign and nurturing, while books 3 and 6 close on the theme of death. Book 3 argues for the mortality of the soul, and its final sections seek to remove the fear of death, while Book 6 ends with a dark and horrible portrayal of mass death adapted from Thucydides’ account of the Athenian plague in 430–426 BCE. A balance between the two halves of the work is also marked out by the one and only mention of Epicurus by name in the whole DRN, at 3.1042. This unique direct mention is already conspicuous, but its position at the end of book 3, at the very core of the poem, gives it more prominence.
Such large-scale symmetries show careful poetic design. At the same time, there are a number of indications that the DRN is lacking its final revision. The strongest sign of this is a passage from the opening of Book 4. Lines 4.45–53 recap the contents of books 1 and 2 and then announce as the next subject simulacra, Lucretius’ renderings of the eidola, the thin film of images constantly shed by all solid objects, whose stream is the object of vision. These are indeed treated next but, oddly 4.45–53 make no mention of the soul, the topic of book 3. Worse, the lines follow another programmatic passage, 4.26–44 also introducing the simulacra, but now given as the sequel to the discussion of soul. Together the two passages show that 4.45–53 are a left-over from an earlier draft. This relative imperfection, however, is also precious evidence for the development of the work. As pointed out long ago (Mewaldt 1908), it is evidence of a change of plan: at some point books 3 and 4 were interchanged. Interestingly, this first ordering of the material agrees with the order of exposition in Epicurus’s Letter to Herodotus.
A number of other features are less conclusive, but also suggest that a final revision was never executed. First, Books 1 to 3 as a group are shorter and more polished than 4 to 6. Second, the recurrence of the vital honey and woodworm passage from book 1 at the opening of book 4, with minor variations (1.926–950 = 4.1–25) is awkward. Some suspect that the book 4 version was slated for replacement, though some defend it. Third is the promise at 5.155 to discuss the abodes of the gods at some length (largo sermone), never taken up. Two final considerations, though inconclusive, also deserve mention. For some, the ending of book 6 as we have it is too bleak and lacking its moral, but others think it adequate as a closure, the readers being by then sufficiently instructed to draw the moral themselves. Lastly, the proems of books 1 to 3 appear to form an integrated pattern. The proems of 1 to 3 appear to mark out degrees of cosmic ascent as equivalent to degrees of Epicurean initiation: book 1 celebrates Venus/pleasure here on earth; the second proem locates readers among ‘the lofty sanctuaries of the wise’ (2.8), now free from the struggles of the unenlightened; the third proem raises us all the way to the level of gods (3.15–30), as if outside the cosmos. After that, however, the pattern is harder to discern.]
3. Poetic format
Lucretius writes in Latin verse to spread the gospel of Epicurus, who wrote in Greek prose two and a half centuries before him. A preliminary review may best allow us to consider how Lucretius adapted Epicurus’ message to his own poetic medium and Roman world. The present section covers poetic format, the next the Epicurean background and sources. Some readers may prefer to skip directly to section 5 on the contents of the DRN and read the next two sections once they are more familiar with the poem.
Lucretius expounds his master’s message in Latin hexameter, adapting the inherited genre of didactic epic. Greek didactic epic, which starts with Hesiod, standardly features a teacher offering (fictional) live instruction on a given field of knowledge to a student or addressee in need of such instruction. This continues to be standard in Latin didactic (Volk 2002). In the DRN, Memmius, standing in for the audience, is depicted as a beginner, which may not have been the case. Lucretius is not the doctrinal, much less the divine authority of the DRN –that is Epicurus, on both counts– but he does actively instruct.
As his main Latin poetic influence, Lucretius adopts the archaic format and diction of Ennius (239 –169 BCE), whose epic the Annales on the history of Rome in 18 books, now known only from fragments, was the Roman national epic until displaced by the Aeneid. Couching his revolutionary message in this established format may have helped Lucretius make it more acceptable to his Roman audience and simultaneously prompt them to reflect critically on traditional Roman values (Nethercut 2021). A second important Latin influence appears to have been Cicero’s Aratea of c. 89 BCE, the orator’s youthful rendering in Latin verse of the first part of the Phaenomena by the Hellenistic Greek poet Aratus (Gee 2013 chapters 3 and 4, and appendix B for full parallels). The Phaenomena, published c. 276 BCE, is a work on astronomy and weather-signs. As was widely recognised, most of its subject-matter comes from the prose treatise of the same name by the fourth-century mathematician and scientist Eudoxus of Cnidus. One of the more popular poems of antiquity, the Phaenomena was at the forefront of a trend in Hellenistic didactic poetry, in which a poet could showcase his originality, learnedness and virtuosity by taking on obscure or challenging technical subjects. For Lucretius, since unobservable atoms and void, the most obscure topics possible (DRN 1.933 obscura de re), provide the subject-matter of the DRN, and given that Epicurus wrote in a clear but often complex Greek prose saturated with technical terms, on these two criteria it makes sense to view him as an heir to the Hellenistic tradition of learned didactic (Kenney 1970, Brown 1982, Gale 2007). To be sure, when at 1.921–30 Lucretius advertises his originality as the first Latin poet to attempt his subject, he tells us that he does so, at least in part, for ‘the high hope of renown’. This is not necessarily incompatible with Epicureanism, though it hardly flows from it (on Epicurean poetics see section 4). As for the challenge posed by Epicurean terminology, Lucretius recognised it (1.136–9) and met it by opting, on the whole, to avoid directly importing Greek technical terminology (Sedley 1998 ch. 2).
In a more important respect, however, the framework of Hellenistic didactic epic is less helpful if it implies that Lucretius merely used Epicureanism to generate some sublime poetry. On the contrary, Lucretius’ missionary fervour make it clear that the medium serves the message and that the aim of the poem is to convert the hearer to Epicureanism (Asmis 2016). This relation is most clearly set out in the important ‘honey and wormwood’ passage, from which I quote DRN 1.936–47:
But as with children, when physicians try to administer rank wormwood, they first touch the rims about the cups with the sweet yellow fluid of honey, that unthinking childhood be deluded as far as the lips, and meanwhile may drink up the bitter juice of the wormwood, and though beguiled be not betrayed, but rather by such means be restored and regain health, so now do I: since this doctrine commonly seems somewhat harsh to those who have not used it (haec ratio plerumque videtur/ tritior esse quibus non est tractata) and the people shrink back from it, I have chosen to set forth our doctrine to you in sweet-speaking Pierian song, and as it were to touch it with the Muses’ delicious honey… . (transl. Rouse-Smith with modifications)
Poetry sweetens the bitter medicine needed to restore the patient, so that Lucretius subordinates his poetic activity, honey, to the cure and salvation that is instruction in Epicureanism (for more on the passage, Gale 2020). At the same time, this image of benevolent deception is more complicated than it looks, since the medicine is not actually bitter, it only ‘seems’ so to those who have not experienced it. Indeed, no later than the opening of Book 3, Lucretius depicts himself as a bee flitting through Epicurus’ works, feasting on the honey of his ‘golden words’ (3.13, fuller quote in 4). The medicine has become the honey, it appears, at least for those who have converted to Epicureanism.
The goal of philosophical conversion leads us to a last important Greek poetic influence, the philosopher-poet Empedocles of Acragas (490–430 BCE). Lucretius singles Empedocles out for explicit praise at 1.729–33, even as he turns to criticize his elemental theory from an atomist perspective. Empedocles was the father of Greek four-element theories and was recognized as the canonical champion of Greek philosophical didactic poetry. Although we know his work only through fragments, the great number of identifiable allusions or borrowings in the DRN from Empedocles, along with the clustering of Empedoclean themes in the opening of Book 1, make it clear that Lucretius was positioning himself as the Roman Empedocles (Jobst 1907, Kranz 1944, Furley 1970, Sedley 1998, ch. 1). Empedocles’ goal was to convert the hearer to new ‘scientific’ understanding of the world. In one summing-up passage, he explains how all things (‘all that was, all that is, and all that will be hereafter’, a Homeric formula he adapts to his own aims) are to be understood as the products of the four eternal elements, earth, air, fire and water, acting under the alternating influence of two moving-psychological powers, Love and Hate (On nature 1.265–72 Laks Most 2016 D 73). This effectively downgrades the world of experience to the rank of temporary products of a more fundamental, invariant principles. Despite other important differences, this is close enough to the atomist picture, both systems being attempts to save appearances from the Eleatic challenge (Mourelatos 1987; Wardie 1988; Burnyeat 2017). Empedocles was also widely celebrated for his use of imagery. In particular, he pioneered a new type of epic simile, one that displays multiple points of correspondence between a given biological process and –usually– a technological analogue. Lucretius’ own careful use of imagery and poetic vividness owe much to Empedocles (West 1969, Schiesaro 1990, Garani 2007, Taylor 2020).
Since 1998, the Strasbourg papyrus, eds. Martin and Primavesi, has shown that Empedocles’ commitment to the afterlife of the soul most likely stood alongside his scientific cosmology, not in opposition to it. Although scholarship has only begun to reckon with this new factor, it appears to make the new Empedocles even more suitable as a Lucretian model (for a sketch of how this might have worked, Trépanier 2007). The clearest instance of this crossover between science and religion is section d of the papyrus, where Empedocles loudly laments his meat-eating sins even as he turns to describe the origins of living creatures from the earth. This contrast in tones seems a plausible predecessor to Lucretius’ own two styles, the juxtaposition of cool technical sections with impassioned rhetorical passages. Next, if more controversially, the compresence in Empedocles of (Pythagorean?) religion and Early Greek science suggests that the instruction itself was framed as an ‘assimilation to the divine’. That is, the scientific quest for knowledge was understood as both natural and a form of divinization for the pupil. This was an important theme in later philosophy, Plato especially, but no less so in Epicureanism. In both cases it also requires redefining the concept of divinity against more popular inherited notions (see section 7).
4. Epicurean background
Epicurus (341–270 BCE), an Athenian citizen, began teaching and amassing disciples in Mytilene on the isle of Lesbos and then at Lampsacus on the coast of Asia Minor before establishing his school in Athens in 306 BCE. In a property later known as the Garden, Epicurus and his friends lived a closed community life devoted to philosophy, in retreat from politics, and practiced an austere to ascetic lifestyle. The latter was the case despite Epicureans’ commitment to hedonism (Tsouna, 2020). Outside accusations of hedonism were thus strictly correct, but not sympathetic or informed. In Athens, alongside his collaborators Metrodorus (331–278 BCE) and Hermarchus, who succeeded him in 270 BCE, Epicurus continued to produce instalments of his On nature, which eventually totaled 37 volumes. The monumental On nature appears to have been the foundational text for Epicureanism, so much so that school members could make shorthand references among themselves to individual book numbers, omitting the title (reconstruction in Sedley 1998 ch. 4). Even so, it was only one of many works produced by Epicurus and the first generation of Epicureans, collectively referred to by later Epicureans as ‘the men’ (Mitsis ed. 2020 has surveys of all aspects of Epicureanism; on the life of the school, see ch. 1 by Dorandi)
By the late Hellenistic period, the Garden was one of the four main philosophical systems that competed for the allegiance of the educated elite. Although all were originally headquartered in Athens, by the first century BCE the schools had representatives and active branches throughout the Mediterranean. In first-century Italy, the Epicureans seems to have been especially successful in recruiting prominent Romans, for example Atticus the banker, Cicero’s friend and correspondent, Cassius, the future assassin of Caesar, and Caesar’s father-in-law L. Calpurnius Piso Caesoninus. The last of these was closely associated with or more likely the patron of Philodemus of Gadara (c. 110–30 BCE), a prominent Epicurean philosopher and accomplished poet, who taught in the area of the Bay of Naples. The damaged and difficult-to-read carbonized papyrus rolls first recovered in the 18th century at the Villa dei Papiri in Herculaneum are to all appearances Philodemus’ working library. They include Philodemus’ own philosophical works, some drafts or teaching texts, a good number of classic Epicurean texts, among which books from the On nature, sometimes in multiple copies, a number of standard works from rival schools, and even a few Latin manuscripts (Del Mastro 2014; Capasso 2020).
The Epicureans were noted for their doctrinal conservatism, with orthodoxy controlled by appeal to the textual authority of the works of ‘the men’ (Sedley 1989). Lucretius is in keeping with this when he writes in the proem to book 3:
You I follow, O glory of the Graecian race, and now on the marks you have left I plant my own footsteps firm, not so much desiring to be your rival, as for love, because I yearn to copy you… You are our father, the discoverer of truths, you supply us a father’s precepts from your scrolls, from your pages, illustrious man, as bees drink all they can in the flowery glades, so we likewise feed on your golden words, golden, ever most worthy of life eternal. (3.3–13 Rouse-Smith transl. with modifications).
As noted above, his own reverence for and enjoyment of these Greek prose texts does not require the honey of poetic inducements, but to Lucretius the Epicurean, they are all at once authoritative, beneficial, and supremely enjoyable. It is worth noting, however, that the order of comparisons made in the fuller passage, not quoted above, rely on established poetic tropes used when a minor poet invokes the example of a master (Volk 2002: 108–115). Lucretius therefore, in the act of affirming his faith in Epicurus the philosopher, retroactively casts Epicurus in the mold of a master poet. This shows an active capacity to shape and color the material.
Despite such coloring, Lucretius makes it clear that he will not deviate from his master’s doctrinal path. Indeed, two of the greatest peculiarities of the DRN relate directly to this faithfulness. First, as best we can tell, Lucretius’ presentation of Epicurean physics is not ‘live’, in the sense that it makes no attempt to update or defend the Epicurean system in light of later scientific developments, for instance the victory of ‘head’ over ‘chest’ as the seat of the soul, thanks to the discovery of the nerves by Hellenistic doctors (von Staden 1989, Leith 2020). Second and related to the first is the absence of any explicit inter-school polemics, especially the kind one would come to expect from reading the works of Philodemus or the dialogues of Cicero. The main named philosophical adversaries in the work are the three Presocratic philosophers deployed at 1.635–920 as the champions of alternative theories of matter. Although it is tempting to infer that the various anti-teleological or anti-providential critiques in the DRN are aimed at the Stoics, Furley, in an influential (1966) article argued that in all suggested instances the polemical targets are more likely Platonic or Aristotelian (fullest reply in Schmidt 1990, with counter-reply in Sedley 1998 ch 3). At most, the Stoics may be included among the implicit targets of various anonymous views criticised by Lucretius, but none of these are ever named. The closest we get is an alleged Latin pun where, in calling the followers of Heraclitus stolidi, ‘stupid’, some think Lucretius is referring to Stoici, the Stoics (Bailey 1947 vol. II on 1.641 and 1.1068).
How should we understand this? Before considering some possible answers, it will be useful to include two more factors: the question of Lucretius’ sources, and second, the school’s views on poetry.
The problem of Lucretius’ sources is to a certain extent academic since, as just seen, we can be confident that Lucretius reproduces Epicurean doctrine faithfully. Despite that, and while also recognizing that we only have access to a fraction of the material that may have been available to Lucretius, a bit of stock-taking will help clarify the background.
First, then, there is the material we possess. Thanks to Diogenes Laertius’ recycling of them into Book 10 of his Lives of the Philosophers, we have three letters by Epicurus himself. These are: the Letter to Herodotus: a brief summary of his physics; the Letter to Pythocles on celestial phenomena, which exemplifies the Epicurean use of multiple explanations for those phenomena not open to closer examination; the Letter to Menoeceus: a more basic introduction to his moral philosophy. Beyond that, we have ancient collections of maxims culled from the corpus, especially the Key doctrines, plus various ancient reports, fragments and list of titles of lost works, to which we can add the material from Herculaneum, which includes portions of the different books On nature and those of other Epicureans, Philodemus foremost. (The most up-to-date collection of all material, with extensive notes, is the French translation by Delattre and Pigeaud eds. 2010).
Among these sources, we can eliminate the Letter to Herodotus, in other respects the most relevant extant text. Lucretius cannot have relied on it, because the DRN is a larger and more detailed treatment. Importantly, Lucretius’ case for atoms and void is the fuller one, designed for beginners. Interestingly, though, as noted above, the Letter’s order of exposition matches that of the DRN, or at least the order we can discern before Lucretius changed the order of books 3 and 4. If we next consider the On nature, it will be uncontroversial that it was in some sense Lucretius’ ultimate source, but also obvious that Lucretius will not have wanted to reproduce all of its contents. In any case, the 37 books of On nature were not a single continuous exposition, although certain sections of it did function as sequential units.
Beyond that, the evidence is too complex for detailed examination, so we can pass instead to scholarly theories. Over a century ago Giussani (1896), followed by many, for example Bailey (1947 vol. I pp. 24–5), suggested that another known summary, the lost Great Epitome, was Lucretius’ main source. The appeal here is that the putative source seems to be closer in scale to the DRN, and possibly more suited to beginners, but other than that there is very little to go on. Later in the 20th century the trend was towards recognizing more Lucretian autonomy in shaping and organizing the material (Clay 1983, Schrijvers 1999). Against that, the most detailed investigation into this background so far, Sedley 1998, argues that the first 15 books of the On nature were Lucretius’ main initial source, which he gradually reshaped and compressed. Even for those who disagree with its thesis, this study is the starting-point for subsequent discussion, because it is the first to incorporate developments in Herculaneum papyrology since the 1970s, importantly our improved knowledge of the On nature, to which Sedley himself has contributed significantly.
Since that study, the most significant development has been G. Leone’s magisterial (2012) edition of On nature II, whose best-preserved sections deal with the Epicurean doctrine of the eidola, the thin films of atoms emitted by all larger bodies and which form the external basis of vision. On the one hand, the new edition seems to reinforce Sedley’s thesis, in so far as we can now see that the order of exposition found in On nature II is indeed reproduced both in the Letter to Herodotus and in Lucretius. In the Letter to Herodotus, section 45 is on infinite worlds, followed by sections 46–48 on the eidola. In Leone’s 2012 edition, columns 1–6, though poorly preserved, clearly mention the infinity of atoms being responsible for an infinity of worlds, kosmoi. Then, although we lack textual evidence for a transition, what remains of the next 114 columns deal with the eidola. In Lucretius, provided we factor in the swap of books 3 and 4, we have the same sequence: after the conclusion of DRN 2 on infinite worlds, the simulacra are dealt with at DRN 4.54–216 (= book 3 in the earlier draft). On the other hand, and somewhat bafflingly, this makes it more difficult to imagine the contents of On nature I, since that single book now seems insufficient to cover all the material abridged into Herodotus sections 37–44. For that reason, Sedley had argued that the eidola section of Book 2 must have covered no more than a fifth of that book (1998 p. 112). But Leone’s edition suggests something more like four fifths.
From sources let us now consider one final peculiarity of the DRN, the apparent clash between the project itself, a didactic poem on Epicurean physics, and the reported hostility to poetry in Epicureanism. This topic has been much discussed, but it is possible to think that its paradox has been overplayed, especially in earlier scholarship (start rather at Obbink ed. 1995; full survey in McOsker 2020). Epicurus is indeed reported to have been critical of poetry, perhaps not specifically relating to verse itself, but as part of the broader Epicurean rejection of conventional ideas and the central role played by poetry in ancient education. So far, this is merely the ‘ancient quarrel between poetry and philosophy’ (Republic 607b5–6) with an Epicurean twist. More narrowly, Epicureans’ hostility to verse may have been sharpened by the wish to demarcate themselves from the early Stoics’ embrace of poetry as making a positive contribution to elevated or sublime content. Philodemus, in order to record his contempt for the view, reports that the Stoic Diogenes of Babylon reported that the earlier Stoic Cleanthes claimed: ‘meters, melodies, and rhythms approach as closely as possible to the truth of the contemplation (θεωρίας) of divine things (θείων)’ (Philodemus On Music 4, ed. Delattre 142.5–22; discussion in Asmis 2017). We also have reports of Epicurean arguments criticising the use of verse as not adding anything to the content. That is, Epicureans held that the arguments and doctrines were what helped us achieve peace of mind, ataraxia, and literary format does not contribute anything to that (Sextus Empiricus Adv. Math. 1.299). Closer to Lucretius, there is the case of Philodemus, who wrote extensively on poetics and rhetoric and was himself an accomplished poet. The fact that Philodemus was a poet makes a complete ban on poetry in Epicureanism very unlikely, as opposed to, perhaps, a distinction between poetry as entertainment and more serious philosophical content. More positively, both Philodemus and Lucretius display a wide and deep knowledge of literature. Yet Philodemus did not write poetry on philosophical topics, so there remains a gap between Philodemus and Lucretius.
We can now review attempts make sense of these features as a whole, namely Lucretius’ anachronistic reliance on Epicurus alone, the absence of inter-school polemics, and the possible clash with his own’ school’s views on poetry. To account for these, a range of motivations have been suggested. Perhaps the least generous view is that, operating mainly as a poet, Lucretius found in Epicureanism, or rather its foundational texts, an engaging subject for poetry (Volk 2002). More generously, we can imagine that even if Lucretius was a committed Epicurean, he may have been isolated from the philosophical mainstream and not fully conversant with the most up-to-date version of his denomination, and even something of a fundamentalist, seeing no need to go beyond the master’s words (Sedley 1998 ch. 3). More generously still, the narrowing of focus we find in the DRN could have been a deliberate simplification for the sake of a more appealing introductory work. The mix of philosophical argument, rhetoric and poetic imagery found in the DRN is typical of protreptic literature, which must avail itself of imagery and rhetorical persuasion to render the hearer more receptive to its philosophical arguments (De Lacy 1948; on emotional appeal, O’Keefe 2021; on rhetoric Markovic 2008). Poetry, moreover, is the best medium in which to express the intense emotional impact of such conversion, in this instance the ‘heavenly delight… and awe’ (3.28–9 divina voluptas… atque horror) Lucretius felt at Epicurus’ revelation of the true nature of the universe. One of Lucretius’ favorite images, used no less than four times in the DRN, is that of illumination: our fear of the unknown, before Epicurus illuminated it, makes us like children afraid of the dark.
On any reading of Lucretius’ motivations, it will be helpful in to keep in mind some simplifications that he has made in the material. First, the single divine savior Epicurus replaces the plural authority of ‘the men’ and their different works. Second, technical language is largely avoided. Third, Lucretius focuses mainly on introductory exposition and uses a starker set of contrasts between error and truth, darkness and illumination, before and after Epicurus. That is at the expense of more extensive or complex technical content, of dealing with developments in contemporary science or of scoring points in inter-school polemics. Two positive features, however, are not lost in the translation to Latin verse. First, Lucretius retains a strong commitment to clarity and careful organization (stoicheiosis) of the system, with explicit statements of points needing proof, supporting arguments, transitions between points, and a general care not to rely upon points not yet proven. Second is an appeal to empirical data and careful use of analogies to construct theories. Among these Lucretius will often seek out examples familiar to his own Roman audience, an effective way of carrying points.
5. Natural science
Epicurus advanced atomist explanations to an unsurpassed degree, yet Epicurean science remained subordinate to the ethical aim of freeing us from anxiety in the quest for peace of mind (Key doctrines 10–13, Letter to Herodotus 37 and 81, Letter to Pythocles 85). In Lucretius, this ethical goal is often left implicit, with ethical material concentrated in the proems (see section 6). Officially, Lucretius proposes two programs for the work as a whole. The first curriculum (1.50–61) announces the poem’s subject as ‘the high system of heaven and the gods’ and the primordia rerum, ‘first-beginnings of things’, in other words, a cosmology, including gods as part of the world, the whole underwritten by a set of first principles. This is a fairly standard ancient scientific program. But Lucretius immediately follows that up with the claim that it is not science, but religion, specifically the human fear of divine governance, that oppresses mankind and ruins happiness. We are then told, in a second curriculum (1.127–35), that the nature of soul must be joined to the previous topics, to dispel such fear. The two together cover the full Epicurean project, although Lucretius does not formally subordinate the first to the second.
Book 1 introduces the foundational principles of the system, atoms and void.
1.147–482: Causation, method, and metaphysics.
Lucretius starts from the observed regularities of nature to argue that nothing comes from nothing and nothing is reduced to nothing (147–264). We then get a first methodological point that even invisible bodies can have observable effects. Lucretius supports the claim by reference to air and wind and illustrates it through an epic simile offering an analogy between a windstorm and a mountain river in flood and extends the point by noting the inability of the individual senses to perceive the other senses’ ‘proper sensibles’ (265–328). Lucretius next makes the case for void as necessary for motion, or rather that motion is inconceivable without void, and rebuts some counter examples (329–417). Following that, ‘the all’, that is the universe, is asserted to consist of body and void; these two are the only per se entities, no third per se thing being conceivable. All other things therefore are dependent on these and inherit their properties. Lucretius distinguishes properties that are inseparable (coniuncta, Greek συμβεβηκότα) from others that are accidental (eventa, συμπτώματα). Even time or facts about the past, like the Trojan war, do not have a stand-alone existence but are dependent on our world and will not survive it.
1.483–634: Atoms and their minimal parts
The case for atoms follows (483–615). All perceptible bodies must be compounds of body and void, but since destruction into nothing is impossible, there must be a limit to destruction, ‘pure void’ and ‘voidless body’. Compound bodies must be made of minute, indestructible bodies, stress-tested over infinite time. Lucretius does not use the Greek word atomos, ‘uncut(able)’, though Cicero had tried individuum, preferring terms that denote their generative capacities, such primordia ,‘first things’, or corpora prima, ‘first bodies’. Epicurean atoms are not physically divisible, but they are theoretically analyzable into multiples of minimal or ‘partless’ parts (615–34). A minimum unit must be conceded to account for differences in size and shapes of atoms. There must also be differences among atoms themselves, for if atoms could be reduced to a standard minimum unit, no variety in generation would be possible. In Lucretius, however, the discussion of minimal parts is much abridged (see also 2.478–580; on atoms, Konstan 2020; on minima, Verde 2013).
1.635–920: Rival theories of matter refuted
From the positive case for atomism, Lucretius veers to a critique of three rival theories of matter. Three Presocratic philosophers are put forward as representatives of these theories. First comes Heraclitus (635–711), leader of the monists, advocate of the single element fire, with generation operating by rarefaction and condensation. Empedocles is the champion of the four-element theorists (712–829) and he generates all things by union and dissolution, and finally Anaxagoras, advocate of an indefinite pluralism, who posits an indefinite number of ‘homoeomerous’ or ‘like-parted’ stuffs (830–920) which merely vary in local concentration. The section may have been imported from elsewhere. One can suspect an Epicurean and/or doxographic source at work, whether Epicurus himself (Sedley 1998) or a later one (Montarese 2012). The key point that Lucretius stresses is that only atomism can accommodate change while keeping the first principles, the atoms themselves, completely invariant.
1.951–1118 Infinite universe and space; critique of geocentrism
Following the simile of the honey and the wormwood (921–50), book 1 concludes with a dizzying transition from microcosm to infinite universe (951–1051). Lucretius argues that void or space cannot be bounded: there is always further to go in all directions. And if so, then body, as well as space, must be infinite, for without infinite body, creation would run out of matter. (Lucretius here is relying upon the Epicurean doctrine that up and down are universal, as he will explain in book 2.) The infinite universe was a legacy from earlier atomists and had been subject to criticism from Plato and Aristotle, who argued that the world was finite and unique, with earth at the center. This is why Lucretius adds a critique of geocentric cosmology to his positive case for the infinite universe (1052–1113).
Book 2 covers atomic motion, atomic shapes, and the emergent properties of compounds
2.62–332: Atomic motion and the swerve (for this section, see Fowler 2002).
Lucretius resumes his exposition with atomic motion, offering the famous scientific image of motes of dust in a sunbeam (simulacrum et imago ‘likeness and image’ 112) to illustrate ceaseless atomic motion, within or outside of compounds. Atoms travel at a constant but unimaginably high speed, meeting no resistance in the pure void. They are much faster even than particles of light —fire being a compound— whose constitutive atoms pull and push one another, causing the particles to have a lower aggregate velocity (150–64). Atomic rebounds merely redirect them, without loss of speed. There is a universal up and down, however, and the weight of atoms will lead them to fall through space, at uniform atomic speed.
It is at this point that Lucretius introduces the doctrine of the atomic swerve or clinamen, a minimal deviation by atoms from their straight course that occurs randomly, at no specific time or place (216–93). The swerve, attributed to Epicurus in our sources but not attested in our surviving works, is brought in to answer a narrow hypothetical problem: what would happen if atoms were all traveling downwards, like drops of rain? Since they travel at equal speed, they could never overtake each other, nor could they shift from their straight downward trajectory and collide, so that no atomic compounds could ever get going. Lucretius maintains that a minimal deviation –best imagined as a one-minimum lane-shift on a highway, rather than a change in direction, an offramp– must take place in order to ensure that collisions (and eventually worlds?) can arise. The account as we have it (216–50) is already too brief. But now, quite surprisingly, Lucretius links it to a second factor, voluntary action (251–93). Taking voluntary action as a self-evident fact, he asserts that it stands as second independent reason requiring a minimal swerve, lest volition be trapped within an infinite causal chain. The exact meaning of this section has been much debated. Indeterminism in ancient atomist theory cannot help but remind us of indeterminism in modern quantum physics, which has sometimes been invoked to support psychological indeterminism, thereby inviting us to do the same for Lucretius. Yet the apparent lack of recourse to the swerve in some substantial surviving sections of On nature book 25, where Epicurus argues for human agency over causal determinism, leaves it unclear how widely Epicurus relied on the swerve. Some think a swerve is involved in every voluntary animal action; a more minimal view requires only that the swerve grant minds, those most subtle of physical bodies, enough slack from the chain of causation, over time, to develop an independent domain of agency (survey in Englert, 2020; on Epicurus against determinism, Kamtekar 2021).
Lucretius returns to atomic motion to assert the permanence of matter and motion (308–332). Atomic motion does not cease in bodies at apparent rest, but in cosmic settings the atoms settle into regular patterns, presumably within compounds, producing regular properties. To support this Lucretius uses the analogy of distant views: just as sheep pasturing on a hill are reduced, at a distance, to white dots on a green background; similarly, the clamor and flashing armor of a legion being drilled dies down, from a nearby mountain top, to a mere gleam on the plain.
2.333–729 Atomic shapes and their combinations.
There is a great variety of atomic shapes, with many small variations (333–477). Like animals, atoms can be classed into types or species without also requiring that all individuals of the species be completely identical. These atomic types underlie the diversity, but also the finite regularity, of phenomenal properties and sensations. From line 380 and following Lucretius offers examples of the contrasting properties of various materials, but his inferences from these perceptible properties to their microstructures is problematic if referred directly to atoms (Bailey 1947 vol. II p. 866) instead of to compounds or ‘molecules’. The number of atomic types or shapes, we next learn, is unimaginably large, but not infinite, since the atoms are finite multiples of finite minima and all atoms are imperceptibly small; but there is no limit to the number of atoms of each exact shape (478–580).
A fuller account of compounds is then promised by the announcement that nothing perceptible consists of only one type of atom (581–88). Instead, however, Lucretius offers an allegorical image of ‘mother earth’, the great repository of all stuffs, rendered through the image of the Asiatic goddess Cybele, the Magna Mater (2.598–660). From the surviving final sections of On nature 14, where Epicurus criticizes Plato in the Timaeus for reducing fire to a single pyramidal atomic shape, it does seem that Epicurus recognized the four elements as (the most?) basic types of atomic compounds (Wigodsky 2007). Lucretius does not delve into this, however, and stresses instead the complexity of visible bodies. Such variety and complexity do not threaten the regularities of nature, since they all proceed from finite and fixed atomic shapes.
2.730–1022 Properties of atoms and emergent properties of compounds
The next section completes the introduction of atoms by distinguishing between atoms, whose only inseparable properties are shape, size and weight, and the emergent properties of compounds. Atoms lack color (730–841), heat, moisture or smell (842–64). As for sensation, it is also an emergent property of living things, and atoms do not have it (865–900). This somewhat alienating thought is then capped with the grand and slightly less alienating poetic idea of the cycle of life (991–1022, a recap of 2.569–80). We are all children of heaven and earth, since we grow from the elements and die back into them; within our world, the emergence and then disappearance of life are in constant balance, secured by the indestructibility of the atoms.
2.1023–1174 Infinite Worlds.
As did book 1, book 2 ends with the infinite universe. This time the infinite universe is the basis for arguing that there are other worlds than ours; since space is infinite, we cannot be unique (1048–89). Worlds occur by chance, when the sufficient material conditions are met, without any need for gods (1090–1104). The growth and decay of worlds is not a metaphor, but closer to a biological fact. Lucretius ends book 2 on the pessimistic note that our world is already in decay (1105–74; but contrast 5.325–37 where it is said to be young).
Book 3 is on the nature and mortality of soul, concluding with the fear of death.
3.94–416: the nature and structure of soul
The soul is a body and not a harmony of parts in tension; it is a biological part of the body, like an organ, which remains active when the body is at rest, but it is unable to survive separation from it (94–135). Lucretius distinguishes two main parts of soul (136–76). The animus, roughly mind, is the controlling part and center of consciousness, located in the chest, the anima more like the nervous system, spread throughout the body (on partition, Verde, 2020; broader background in von Staden 2000). Both parts are bodily since they act and are acted upon. A more detailed elemental analysis of the soul follows (177–322): the animus is made of fine and mobile particles. It is a composite of breath, heat, air plus a fourth finest and nameless stuff. The nameless stuff initiates movement, which imparts it to breath, heat and air; these then move the body. They form a single body or mixture, but with small variations among individuals. These elemental-humoral ‘idiosyncrasies’ run from excess fire (= prone to anger) to excess air (= too placid). Although these imperfections cannot be eradicated, they can be controlled with training. Mind and body cannot survive apart, but each will eventually be dissolved into their constituent atoms (323–416).
3.417–829: Thirty proofs of the mortality of soul
Lucretius offers an epic catalogue of thirty arguments for the mortality of soul, mostly turning upon the interdependency of soul and body for life. Lines 425–669 argue against post-mortem survival, 670–783 against pre-existence, while 784–829 return to more general considerations. These proofs seek to undermine older traditional beliefs in the afterlife and underworld (Hades) or attack Platonic reincarnation and the immortality of the soul. The final section of the book shifts from the fact of death as the end of all sensation, to argue that death is not to be feared (see section 6).
Book 4 explains the activities of soul: perception, thought, dreams, and emotions
4.26–215: the existence and nature of the simulacra
Simulacra (Greek eidola) are thin atomic films that are constantly emitted in all directions from all larger aggregates, preserving the structure or shape of the original object (26–109). They are extremely fine, form spontaneously and swiftly, and travel at great speed.
4.216–822: sensation and thought.
Sight and related phenomena are treated first (216–378). Vision is due to the multiple impacts of a stream of simulacra, while other sensations are due to other kinds of effluences or direct contact. Lucretius examines a number of visual puzzles to show that the eyes are never wrong, rather the mind generates false inferences. This leads to an Epicurean critique of skepticism and a defense of the infallibility of the senses (469–521). Lucretius replies to the sceptic that reason cannot refute the senses and any attempt to deny knowledge through the senses is self-defeating, the very concept of true and false being anchored in sense-experience. (522-721). The working of the other senses is discussed before turning to thought (722–822). Mental visions and dreams are a sort of attenuated inner vision reliant on the impact of even finer simulacra directly onto the soul. These simulacra are so abundant, at all times, that the mind can focus on any of them; even fantastical imaginings are real enough, since the images, like clouds, are constantly forming and coalescing into all manner of shapes.
4.823–1057: Functions of the body and soul
Lucretius deals with a number of bodily functions, from nutrition to voluntary motion, sleep and dreams, before transitioning to a more general critique of erotic love (1058–1287). The transition is handled by a pointed refutation of teleology aimed at the notion of body parts as designed to serve a purpose (823–57). In all cases, Lucretius replies, their existence preceded their use. Unlike artefacts, which serve a purpose that already exists, for example, cups for drinking or beds for sleeping, sight was not designed before there were eyes to see.
Book 5 contains a cosmology, describes the origins of life and the history of civilization.
5.91–770: Our world
Our world had a beginning and will have an end (91–109). Before expanding on each of these, Lucretius offers a refutation of creationist accounts (110–234). The gods do not dwell in the world, nor did they make the world for man. Even supposing they did, awkward questions can be raised. What were the gods up to before they built the world for us? Where did they get the scientific knowledge needed to plan life? And so on. At 195–234, Lucretius rejects the idea that the world was designed for human use. In fact, the world is barely able to sustain us. Most of it cannot support agriculture and agriculture itself is hard work, with crops sometimes failing. Why are there so many beasts and pests? They seem to thrive even without help, while humans are completely helpless when born. Next the mortality of the world is inferred from the mortality of its component parts, the four elements, each of which is destructible (235–415). Against the upholders of an eternal world, Lucretius asks: why does human history not reach further back than the Theban and Trojan wars?
Our world did not arise through intelligence or design, but because, in the infinite universe, as atoms work out randomly all possible combinations, at some point an accumulation of atoms of a suitable kind to form our world occurred (416–508). The formation of the earth is followed with an account of the heavens (509–771). In his account of the nature and movements of the sun, moon and stars, Lucretius has recourse to the Epicurean mode of ‘multiple explanations’, to be used for phenomena where we cannot determine, among a number of possible explanations –and excluding divine causation– which one applies. In such cases we should stay open to all of them. Of each we can be confident that, even if not the case in our world, it will be true in some other world (526–33 and also 6.703–11; on the background, Epicurus’ Letter to Pythocles and Hankinson 2013).
5.772–1457: Life on earth, early man, history of civilization
Lucretius returns to the early earth and the origins of life (772–925). The account, marked throughout by the conspicuous absence of gods or teleology, is one of the most detailed and influential in the ancient anti-creationist tradition. First, grasses and plants sprouted from the earth, who, as mother of all, produced animals from wombs inside the earth and quasi-milk for those first animals. That fertility was of brief duration, however. The key analogy is the earth as a female animal. A limited amount of still-occurring spontaneous generation, small insects from mud, underwrites the legitimacy of the comparison, while the notion of a limited period of fertility explains why large creatures were once produced but are no more (795–836). Lucretius allows for many early defective creatures and semi-Darwinian false starts that died off because they were not viable, could not reproduce, or find advantageous arrangements, as in domestic animals (878–925). Although much of this non-teleological account owes an obvious debt to Empedocles’ zoogony, with its phase of random, monstrous cross-species combinations of limbs (Diels-Kranz B 57-61), Lucretius corrects the earlier theory by arguing against even temporary crossings of the species boundary (Schrijvers 1999, Campbell 2003).
Early man was solitary, not social, and much sturdier (926–1010). Lucretius outlines the hardships of life before agriculture, fire, clothing, society or law or marriage, but balances that with the absence of the many ills civilization has brought, such as warfare or the perils of navigation. This same balance runs through the history of civilization that closes the book (1011–1457). As is now widely recognized, Lucretius is not a progressivist, nor does he see humanity as fallen from a past Golden Age of innocent happiness and self-sufficiency. At each technological advance he points out the drawbacks of the new stage. The advances are prompted by nature, without divine inventors, as mankind recognizes the usefulness of shelter, clothes, fire, marriage, friendship and family life, the last of which is framed in Epicurean ethical terms, justice as a social contract (1011–1027). The origins of language are not due to a primeval name-giver, but an innate human impulse to make sounds and the posterior recognition of the utility of designating objects through sounds (1028–90). A similar story goes for fire and cooking (1091–1104), the foundation of cities and the rise of kings and property (1105–35), later replaced by laws and the fear of punishment (1136–60). After outlining the origins of belief in the gods (1161–1240; see section 6), Lucretius continues with the arts of war, metals, weapons (including a weird account of unsuccessful experiment of bulls, boars and lions trained for war), clothing, agriculture, music, and simple rustic pleasures, leading to the final improvements in war and the arts. These accounts are mere reconstructions, since these origins are mostly unavailable to investigation, but even without offering multiple alternatives, Lucretius must think it sufficient to provide for each discovery a plausible, non-divine origin.
Book 6 explains meteorological and terrestrial phenomena
In keeping with the two-book pattern, book 6 describes the world in action, doing so by tackling successive meteorological and earthly phenomena often viewed in popular belief as divine manifestations. The multiple explanations featured in this section can be matched from doxographic sources, but the pattern of the book is shaped by Lucretius. In each case there is an emphasis on destruction or the threatening aspects of nature, building to the final account of the Athenian plague, all in responsion to Book 1’s theme of birth and generation (Jope 1989). Lucretius reviews thunder and lightning (96–422), waterspouts (451–534) clouds and rain, before passing to terrestrial level with earthquakes (533–607), mount Aetna and volcanoes (639–711), the pestilential fumes of lake Avernus (738–839) and other strange springs and fountains. An extensive account of magnetism –a special challenge for atomism– comes next (6.906–1089), and then various pestilences (1090–1137), followed by the gruesome case study of the Athenian plague. Throughout Lucretius encourages an attitude of demythologizing detachment before the uncanny or invisible, thanks to the denial of divine causation and recognition of the ‘finite capacity’, finita potestas, of all natural processes (6.64–5, cf. 1.76).]
The DRN’s opening, perhaps channeling Empedocles, proposes religion, or rather wrong religion, as the obstacle to human happiness, for which the cure is physics. Yet as the work progresses Lucretius provides a richer picture of Epicurean ethics, including Epicurean hedonism, and outlines a wider range of obstacles to human happiness. Lucretius does not give a full presentation of Epicurean ethics, though the end of Book 3 on death comes close, but the proems offer brief sermons or strenuous pleas for Epicurean values mixed with pointed diagnoses of contemporary malaises. Thanks to these, by the end of the 6 books, Lucretius manages a reasonably full picture of Epicurean ethics and its goal of peace of mind, the capacity to ‘face all things with a calm mind’ placata posse omnia mente tueri (5.1203).
The proem of book 1 opens with a hymn to Venus as world-governing deity (1.21) and a prayer for her to intervene with Mars, god of war (1.29–44), both of which are problematic for Epicurean theology (see section 7). But the hymn also celebrates the generative and attractive side of nature, Venus as ‘pleasure of gods and men’ hominum divomque voluptas (1.1). The proem of Book 2 (1–61) also opens with pleasure (iucunda voluptas 2.4), but a more refined psychological pleasure, that of knowing you have escaped ills and are above the fray in the ‘lofty sanctuaries of the wise’ (2.7). Lucretius follows this with the normative claim that nature calls for nothing else than freedom from pain and a mind at peace. Other apparent goods such as luxury, social status or glory do not profit the body or the mind. None of these, moreover, can dispatch the fear of death; only reason or philosophy can do that. The opening of book 3 concentrates upon the praise of Epicurus, whose teachings dispel all fear, so that in contemplating nature, as revealed by him, we seem to leave the world behind us, to experience divine pleasure and awe divina voluptas… atque horror (3.1–30).
The conclusion of book 3 (830–1094), following the demonstration of the mortality of body and soul, seeks to remove the fear of death. Death according to Epicurus is the end of all sensation, it is ‘nothing to us’ (830). To fear being dead –as opposed to dying– is to suffer from a conceptual muddle. The hard fact is that you will not be at your own burial, nor will you be nibbled by worms in the ground or suffer torments or rewards in the afterlife, because you will no longer exist. In what has become known as the symmetry argument (Warren 2004), Lucretius argues that, just as we calmly accept our non-existence before life, we should view the time after it with the same indifference. This therapeutic mix of emotion and argument is only one of many in the close of book 3, which combines philosophical argument with rhetorical and poetic techniques to great effect.
Not as magnificent, but more appropriately comic is the attack on erotic love concluding book 4 (1058–1287). Lucretius demotes cosmic Venus from the proem of 1 to human sexual desire and dismisses erotic passion as simply an excessive form of a natural desire. Lucretius’ attitude seems less philosophical than middle-aged or medical, with emphasis on practical sexual education. We are informed that women also have a libido, what positions are best for conception, and that devotion and clean habits are the basis of stable attachment.
The proems of 5 and 6 concentrate more directly on Epicurus. The proem of 6 (1–95, especially 10–33) contains the most explicit summary of Epicurus’s moral benefactions in the poem. Building on the account of civilisation from book 5, it places Epicurus in historical Athens, and explains how, despite having every material need satisfied, the Athenians were still unable to achieve peace of mind. For this they needed Epicurus to teach them the limits of fear and pleasure and a scientific understanding of the world (31–2). The function of the last, as Lucretius expands in managing the transition to the meteorological subject of the book, was to banish fear of the divine (50–67), which was particularly linked to the heavens in the imagination and liable to insinuate itself into our thinking through ignorance of the workings of nature (see section 7).
The gruesome depiction of the Athenian plague concludes the poem (6.1138–1286). As noted, its focus on death and suffering corresponds to the poem’s opening scene with Venus and birth. Epicurus taught that suffering could be resisted through mental focusing on the joys one had already experienced, while extreme pain could be endured through the knowledge that it would be short-lived (Key doctrines 3 and 4). Though moderns tend to find this less than convincing, Epicurus put it into to practice for the benefit of his disciples in recording how he coped successfully with the painful circumstances of his own death (Diogenes Laertius 10.22). In the later summing-up formula of Epicurean ethics, such cheerful endurance was the final ingredient in the ‘fourfold remedy’ for happiness: ‘God holds no fear, death no worries; the good is easy to get; evil easily endured’ (Philodemus, Against the Those who Claim to be Readers, PHerc 1005, 4.9–14). Although Lucretius dwells on the helpless mental anguish of the Athenian plague victims, he does not offer an explicit Epicurean remedy. Some hold that the ending we have, which merely depicts the ailment and not the cure, is the one Lucretius intended because, thanks to all we have learnt, we can supply it ourselves. For others, the ending still awaits its final revision, because it is hard to imagine that Lucretius, having dealt with the first three explicitly in the poem, would have left the fourth merely implicit.
Lucretius opens the DRN with a traditional prayer to anthropomorphic Venus, as a world-governing deity (1.21), to support his poetic project and to pacify her lover Mars (1.21–40). This is already problematic, but the opening sequence is made even more puzzling by the immediate sequel, a clear statement of the most important Epicurean departure from popular belief about the gods, the denial that they intervene in the world, because that is incompatible with their eternal happiness, 1.44–9:
For the nature of divinity must necessarily enjoy immortal life along with the greatest peace, far removed and separated from our affairs; for without any pain, without any danger, itself mighty by its own resources, needing us in nothing, it is neither moved by benefactions nor touched by anger. (transl. Rouse-Smith with modifications)
The passage is fully orthodox (Key doctrines 1, Letter to Menoceus 123) and the same lines recur later at 2.644–51, after the Magna Mater passage, where they make much better sense as a correction, from an Epicurean standpoint, of the preceding allegorical treatment of the earth as mother of the gods. But the brutally abrupt way the lines undercut the prayer to Venus is difficult. Many editors have suggested that 1.44–9 are an intrusion and should be removed or at most reflect an incomplete draft (defense in Bailey 1947 vol. II pp. 601–4; survey in Butterfield 2020). But regardless of whether we keep or reject 1.44–9, it seems likely that Lucretius meant us, later on and from hindsight, to reinterpret the opening scene in some way more compatible with Epicureanism.
Lucretius next describes the intellectual hero, whose ‘flight of the mind’ liberated humanity through science (61–79; Epicurus, again in hindsight, though not named), followed by the example of human sacrifice of Iphigeneia (80–101), to condemn wrong religion. (The example is quite literary: human sacrifice was not a feature of Roman religion.) The main focus thereafter is natural science, the atomic world free from divine governance, and Lucretius does not return to the gods themselves until book 5. At 5.146–55 we learn that the gods have exceedingly fine bodies, so that they cannot be seen or touched, only grasped by the mind (that is, via especially fine simulacra, see below). Accordingly, they do not dwell in the world. Lucretius’ promise to tell us where they dwell (5.155) is never fulfilled, but other Epicurean sources hold that the gods dwell in the inter-cosmic voids. In Lucretius this much seems strongly implied by the imagery used at 3.14–30, when the world falls away as we experience divine pleasure.
The origins of human belief in gods are given later in book 5 as part of the history of civilisation (1161–1240). Early men, both with waking mind and in their dreams, had visions of the gods as beings of great beauty, stature and strength. As these figures did not seem to age, they attributed to them eternal life (1169–82). It was then that, unable to puzzle out the workings of the heaven, they ‘took shelter’ by, as it were, handing over the governance of the world to these gods. That, for Lucretius, was the great fall. At 1204–1240 Lucretius offers some impressive lines on nature’s capacity, still now, to cow and grind down humanity, as when we contemplate the majesty of the heavens or are shaken up by the thunder and lightning of a powerful storm.
Lucretius’ fullest positive account of the Epicurean gods and of human piety is given in the proem of book 6 at 68–78:
Unless you spew all these errors out of your mind, and put far from you thoughts unworthy of the gods and alien to their peace, their holy divinity, impaired by you, will often do you harm, not that the supreme power of the gods is open to insult, so that it should in wrath thirst to inflict sharp vengeance, but because you yourself will imagine that they who are quiet in their placid peace, are rolling great billows of wrath, you will not be able to approach their shrines with placid heart, you will not have the strength to receive with tranquil peace of spirit the images (simulacra) that are carried to men’s minds from their holy bodies, declaring what the divine shapes are. (transl. Rouse-Smith)
In the Letter to Menoeceus 123 Epicurus enjoins us to ‘think of a god as an indestructible animal’ and explains that to form a proper conception of the divine, we must reject all that is incompatible with that core notion (as above 1.44–9). What this book 6 passage adds is an explanation of how we must make ourselves receptive to the gods, so that their images may impinge upon our minds. The result is that it is we who are in large part responsible for shaping our conception of the gods. Peace of mind, while mostly an Epicurean end in itself, in this case also becomes instrumental to the formation of a proper conception of the gods.
Still, there are problems. Since our access to the gods proceeds exclusively through simulacra, and it is all too easy to form a wrong conception of the gods, one can worry how any certain conception about them is possible (why no multiple explanations here?), or why we should think that these gods are anything above and beyond those simulacra, or again if it actually matters that there should be such beings, since they do not answer prayers or punish wrongdoing. Add to that the numerous difficulties and awkward questions that must be overcome to support the extra-cosmic life of such anthropomorphic gods with quasi-bodies and quasi-blood (see Cicero On the nature of the gods 1.43–9), and one can see how Epicurus’ ancient critics felt free to accuse him of atheism, the extra-cosmic gods merely providing plausible denial. An echo of that tension is still heard in the modern scholarly debate about these gods, confronting realists, who hold that Epicurus really was committed to the existence of these gods (Konstan 2011) and idealists, who hold that we are mostly responsible for constructing our own conception of an ideal life (Long and Sedley 1987 section 23; Sedley 2011). Perhaps the only relative certainty is that Lucretius, who above distinguishes the gods from their simulacra, is officially a realist, as is Philodemus (Essler 2011).
Yet however that theoretical debate comes out, it makes little difference at the practical level, where the exemplarity of the gods is far more important. By focusing our minds upon the perfect life we conceive these gods to live, we can find or construct models on how best to live out our own finite span. Such exemplarity in turn appears to be the best way to understand the various claims made by the Epicureans, followed by Lucretius, that Epicurus himself was a paradoxical ‘mortal god’ (deus ille fuit 5.8) who taught his followers how to lead ‘a life worthy of the gods’ (3.322) that is, a life lived as far as possible in imitation of the blessed and imperturbable gods (Erler 2002). The exemplary life Epicurus led – and often in other Epicurean literature his immediate disciples as well – could function as a suitable model for such ‘focusings’ of the mind.
One last aspect of Lucretius’ deification of Epicurus that appears to go beyond his status as model is his depiction as the greatest benefactor of humanity in the proem of Book 5. This, however, may owe more to the popularity of Euhemerism at Rome in the first century B.C. than anything Epicurean. Euhemerus (active c. 300 BCE) proposed that the gods of myth had originally been men, who had been granted immortality in recognition of their discoveries or gifts to mankind, and whose names recorded their accomplishment, for example ‘Bacchus’ for wine. This rationalistic work had an understandable vogue in the Hellenistic period, where divinization of kings was not infrequent, and had been translated into Latin by Ennius. Lucretius claims that Epicurus’ benefactions surpass the discoveries of agriculture, wine, and even the heroic deeds of Heracles, so that he should count as the greatest benefactor of mankind. Whereas these benefactors only improved mankind materially, Epicurus purged our hearts from troubles and desires (5.49–51). The passage is in good part a rhetorical exercise in which Lucretius shows that he can beat the Euhemerists at their own game, while also subtly undermining them, since Epicurus hardly strove after immortality, as shown by the past tense fuit (Gale 1994 appendix 1). More obviously the sequence serves the literary function of introducing the main topic of the last third of the book, the growth of civilisation. But unlike the discoverers celebrated and immortalised by Euhemerus, Lucretius’ discoverers in 5.1011–1457 are all anonymous.
8. Influence and reception
Whether or not Lucretius operated on the margins of the Roman world, there is no doubt that by the next generation, in poetry at least, his work became mainstream and his influence extensive (Hardie 2009). In imperial Latin prose, with the exception of Seneca in his Natural Questions, he is mainly discussed as a poet. His transformation into a philosophical source for Epicureanism is first seen in the hostile Lactantius and the more ambivalent Arnobius (Gatzemeier 2013). In Latin poetry he was read continuously until the end of antiquity (Hardie 2020); his presence in late antique Latin prose remains largely unexplored.
The DRN reached us through two 9th century Carolingian manuscripts both now in Leiden, O and Q (on the early textual history and for discussion of the unusual ‘capitula’ see Butterfield 2013). Lucretius re-entered circulation when he was rediscovered in 1417 by the papal secretary Poggio Bracciolini (on the story of that discovery, Greenblatt 2011). Later in the same generation the migration of Diogenes Laertius’ Lives of the Philosophers to Italy, followed by its translation into Latin and various first printings, allowed Epicurean ideas to be studied first-hand and eventually play a leading but hardly exclusive role in the scientific revolution and the rise of early modern moral thought, especially social contract theories (on Renaissance dissemination, Palmer 2014 and 2020; on the influence of ideas, Wilson 2008). Lucretius’ early modern reception is now a flourishing scholarly enterprise and most recent collections of essays on Lucretius have a substantial section devoted to this aspect (for a start, see Gillespie and Hardie 2007 and Mitsis 2020). Though Epicurean ideas were suspect, and an easy label for accusations of atheism and crude hedonism, the DRN was never put on the Index of banned books, so long as it was kept among the learned. But early translations into vernacular languages were banned (Prosperi 2020). Many of Lucretius’ most open humanist critics were also his best students and editors. Denys Lambin’s watershed 1563 edition and commentary praises Lucretius as the ‘sweetest’ of all Roman poets but points out the ‘correct’ Aristotelian answer for every Lucretian-Epicurean departure. Montaigne studied Lucretius intently and used the DRN as a regular quarry for arguments, see for example the presence of book 3 in his essay ‘Que philosopher, c’est apprendre à mourir.’ Pierre Gassendi’s Christianity-compatible atomism, built up out of Lucretius and Book 10 of Diogenes Laertius, did more to re-establish empiricism and attack Aristotelianism than produce much in the way of atomism-based science, although it did open up theoretical space for later scientists, in Britain more so than in France (Jones 1989).
A. Editions and Commentaries
- Bailey, C., 1947, Titi Lucreti Cari De Rerum Natura Libri Sex, 3 vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press. (Fullest edition with translation and commentary.)
- Brown, P.M., 1984, Lucretius: De Rerum Natura I, Bristol: Bristol Classical Press.
- –––, 1997, Lucretius: De Rerum Natura III, Warminster: Aris and Phillips.
- Brown, R.D., 1987, Lucretius on Love and Sex. A Commentary on De Rerum Natura IV, 1030–1287, with Prolegomena, Text and Translation, Leiden: Brill.
- Butterfield, D., 2013, The Early Textual History of Lucretius’ De Rerum Natura, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Campbell, G., 2003, Lucretius on Creation and Evolution. A Commentary on De Rerum Natura Book Five Lines 772–1104, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Costa, C.D.N., 1984, Lucretius De Rerum Natura V, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Deufert, M., 2017, Prolegomena zur Editio Teubneriana des Lukrez, Berlin; Boston: De Gruyter.
- –––, 2018, Kritischer Kommentar zu Lukrezens De rerum natura, Berlin; Boston: De Gruyter.
- –––, 2019, Titus Lucretius Carus. De rerum natura. Bibliotheca scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana, Berlin; Boston: De Gruyter.
- Ernout, A., Robin, L., 1962, Lucrèce, De rerum natura, commentaire exégétique et critique, 2nd edition, Paris.
- Fowler, D., 2002. Lucretius on Atomic Motion. A Commentary on De Rerum Natura 2.1–332, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Gale, M., 2008. Lucretius: ‘De Rerum Natura’ V, Warminster: Aris and Phillips.
- Giussani, C., 1896, Studi Lucreziani (Volume I), Ermanno Loescher: Torino.
- Godwin, J., 1986. Lucretius: ‘De Rerum Natura’ IV, Warminster: Aris and Phillips.
- –––, 1991. Lucretius: ‘De Rerum Natura’ VI, Warminster: Aris and Phillips.
- Kenney, E.J., 2014, Lucretius: De Rerum Natura Book III, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd edition.
- Piazzi, L., 2005, Lucrezio e i Presocratici. Un commento a De rerum natura 1, 635–920, Pisa: Edizioni della Normale.
- Smith, M.F., 1992, Lucretius, ‘De Rerum Natura’, with an English translation by W.H.D. Rouse, 2nd edition, revised with new text, introduction, notes and index, London and Cambridge, Mass: Loeb Classical Library.
See Bailey and Smith, above. Also:
- Delattre, D. and J. Pigeaud (eds.), 2010, Les Épicuriens, Paris: Gallimard. (Includes translations of many Herculaneum papyri, introductions and detailed notes.)
- Englert, W., 2003, Lucretius, On the Nature of Things, Newburyport, Mass.: Focus.
- Latham, R.E. and Godwin, J., 1994, Lucretius, On the Nature of the Universe, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
- Melville, Sir Ronald, 1997, Lucretius, On the Nature of the Universe, with introduction and notes by D. and P. Fowler, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Smith, M.F., 2001, Lucretius, On the Nature of Things, Indianapolis and Cambridge, Hackett.
- Stallings, A.E., 2007, Lucretius, On the Nature of Things, Harmondsworth: Penguin
C. Secondary Literature
- Algra, K.A., Koenen, M.H., Schrijvers, P.H. (eds.), 1997, Lucretius and his Intellectual Background, Amsterdam: Royal Netherlands Academy of Arts and Sciences.
- Asmis, E., 1983, ‘Rhetoric and Reason in Lucretius’, American Journal of Philology, 104: 36–66.
- –––, 2016, ‘Lucretius’ Reception of Epicurus: De Rerum Natura as a conversion narrative’, Hermes, 144(4): 430–61.
- –––, 2017, ‘The Stoics on the Craft of Poetry’, Rheinisches Museum, 160: 113–151.
- Bright, D.F., 1971, ‘The plague and the structure of the De rerum natura’, Latomus, 30: 607–32.
- Brown, R D., 1982, ‘Lucretius and Callimachus’, Illinois Classical Studies, 7: 77–97; reprinted in Gale 2007: 328–50.
- Burnyeat, M., 2017, ‘“All the World’s a Stage-Painting”: Scenery, Optics, and Greek Epistemology’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 52: 33–76.
- Butterfield, D., 2020, ‘Critical Responses to the Most Difficult Textual Problem in Lucretius’, in O’Rourke 2020: 19–39.
- Capasso, M. 2020, ‘Philodemus and the Epicurean Papyri’, in Mitsis 2020: 379–429.
- Classen, C.J. (ed.), 1986, Probleme der Lukrezforschung, Hildesheim: Olms.
- Clay, D., 1983, Lucretius and Epicurus, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Commager, H.S. Jr., 1957, ‘Lucretius’ interpretation of the plague’, Harvard Studies in Classical Philology, 62: 105–21; reprinted in Gale 2007: 182–98.
- Dalzell, A., 1972–3, 1973–4, ‘A Bibliography of Work on Lucretius,1945–1972’, Classical World, 66: 389–427; 67: 65–112.
- De Lacy, P., 1948, ‘Lucretius and the history of Epicureanism’, Transactions of the American Philological Association, 79: 12–35.
- Del Mastro, G., 2014, Titoli e annotazioni bibliogiche nei papiri greci di Ercolano (Quinto Supplemento a Cronache Ercolanesi), Naples: Centro internazionale per lostudiodei Papiri Ercolanesi ‘Marcello Gigante’.
- Dorandi, T., 2020, ‘Epicurus and the Epicurean School’, in Mitsis 2020: 13–42.
- Edwards, M.J., 1989, ‘Lucretius, Empedocles and Epicurean polemic’, Antike und Abendland, 35: 104–15.
- Englert, W., 2020, ‘Voluntary Action and Responsibility’, in Mitsis 2020: 221–49.
- Erler, M., 2002, ‘Epicurus as deus mortalis: Homoisis theoi and Epicurean Self-Cultivation’, in D. Frede and A. Laks (eds.), Traditions of Theology: Studies in Hellenistic Theology, Its Background and Aftermath, Leiden: Brill: 159–81.
- Essler, H., 2011, Glückselig und unsterblich. Epikureische Theologie bei Cicero und Philodem. Mit einer Edition von PHerc, 152/157, Kol. 8–10, Basel: Schwabe.
- Fish, J. and K.R. Sanders (eds.), 2011, Epicurus and the Epicurean Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Fowler, D. 1989, ‘Lucretius and politics’, in M. Griffin, J. Barnes, (eds.), Philosophia Togata, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 120–50.
- Furley, D.J. 1966, ‘Lucretius and the Stoics’, Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, 13: 13–33; reprinted in Furley, Cosmic Problems, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989, 183–205.
- –––, 1978, ‘Lucretius the Epicurean: on the history of man’, Entretiens Hardt, 24: 1–37; reprinted in Furley Cosmic Problems, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989, 206–22.
- Gale, M. 1994, Myth and Poetry in Lucretius, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2001, Lucretius and the Didactic Epic, London: Bristol Classical Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2007, Oxford Readings in Classical Studies: Lucretius, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2007, ‘Lucretius and previous poetic traditions’, in Gillespie and Hardie 2007: 59–75.
- –––, 2020, ‘Lucretius’, in Mitsis 2020: 430–55.
- Garani, M., 2007, Empedocles Redivivus: Poetry and Analogy in Empedocles and Lucretius, New York and London: Routledge.
- Gee, E., 2013, Aratus and the Astronomical Tradition, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Gillespie, S. and P. Hardie (eds.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to Lucretius, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Godwin, J., 2004, Lucretius, London: Bristol Classical Press.
- Gordon, C., 1962, A Bibliography of Lucretius, London, Hart-Davis.
- Hankinson, R. J., 2013, ‘Lucretius, Epicurus, and the Logic of Multiple Explanations’, in Lehoux, Morrison and Sharrock 2013: 131–151.
- Holford-Strevens, L., 2002, ‘Horror Vacui in Lucretian biography’, Leeds International Classical Studies, 1(1): 1–23.
- Holmes, B., 2005, ‘Daedala lingua: crafted speech in De rerum natura’, American Journal of Philology, 126: 527–85.
- Hutchinson, G., 2001, ‘The date of De rerum natura’, Classical Quarterly, 51: 150–62.
- Inwood, B. and J. Warren (eds.), Body and Soul in Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Jobst, F. X., 1907, Über das Verhältnis zwischen Lukretius und Empedokles (Inaugural Dissertation); Munich: Buchdruckerei von Max Steinbach.
- Jope, J., 1989, ‘The Didactic Unity and Emotional Import of Book 6 of de Rerum Natura’, Phoenix, 43(1): 16–34.
- Kamtekar, R., 2021, ‘Experience and Preconception in Epicurus’ Refutation of Determinism’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 60: 203–38.
- Kennedy, D., 2002, Rethinking Reality. Lucretius and the Textualization of Nature, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
- Kenney, E.J., 1970, ‘Doctus Lucretius’, Mnemosyne, 23(4): 366–392; reprinted in Classen 1986: 237–64 and Gale 2007: 300–327.
- Kleve, K., 1978, ‘The philosophical polemics in Lucretius’, Entretiens Hardt, 24: 39–71.
- Kollman, E.D., 1971, ‘Lucretius’ criticism of the early Greek philosophers’, Studi Classici, 13: 79–93.
- Konstan, D., 2008, A Life Worthy of the Gods: The Materialist Psychology of Epicurus, revised and expanded edition (in part originally published as Some Aspects of Epicurean Psychology, Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1973), Las Vegas: Parmenides Publishing.
- –––, 2011, ‘Epicurus on the gods’, in Fish and Saunders 2011: 53–71.
- Kranz, W., 1944, ‘Lukrez und Empedokles’, Philologus 96: 68–107.
- Krebs, C., 2013, ‘Caesar, Lucretius and the dates of the De rerum natura and the Commentarii’, Classical Quarterly, 63(2): 772–779.
- Laks, A. and G. W. Most (trans. and eds.), 2016, Early Greek Philosophy (Volume V: Western Greek Thinkers, Part 2; (Loeb Classical Library, 528), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Lehoux, D., A.D. Morrison, A. Sharrock (eds.), 2013, Lucretius: Poetry, Philosophy, Science, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Lehoux, D., 2013, ‘Seeing and Unseeing, Seen and Unseen’, in Lehoux, Morrison, and Sharrock 2013: 131–151.
- Leith, D., 2020, ‘Herophilus and Erasistratus on the Hēgemonikon’, in Inwood and Warren 2020: 30–61.
- Leone, G., 2012, Epicuro. Sulla natura, Libro II, Napoli: Bibliopolis.
- Long, A.A. and David Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Markovic, D., 2008, The Rhetoric of Explanation in Lucretius’ De Rerum Natura, Leiden: Brill.
- Martin, A. and O. Primavesi, 1998, L’Empédocle de Strasbourg (P. Strasb. gr. Inv. 1665–1666): Introduction, édition et commentaire, Berlin/New York/Strasbourg: De Gruyter.
- McOkser, M., 2020, ‘Poetics’, in Mitsis 2020: 347–76.
- Mewaldt, J., 1908, ‘Eine Dublette in Buch IV des Lukrez’, Hermes, 43: 286–95; reprinted in Classen 1986: 31–40.
- Mitsis, P. (ed.), 2020, The Oxford Handbook of Epicurus and Epicureanism, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Morgan, Ll. and B. Taylor, 2017, ‘Memmius the Epicurean’, Classical Quarterly, 67(2): 528–41.
- Montarese, F., 2012, Lucretius and his Sources: A Study of Lucretius, De rerum natura I 635–920 (Sozomena 12), Berlin and Boston: De Gruyter.
- Mourelatos, A.P.D., 1987, ‘Quality, Structure and Emergence in Later Pre-Socratic Philosophy’, in Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, 2: 127–194.
- Nethercut, J. S., 2021, Ennius noster: Lucretius and the Annales, Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press.
- Nussbaum, M.C., 1994, The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Obbink, D. (ed.), 1995, Philodemus and Poetry. Poetic Theory and Practice in Lucretius, Philodemus, and Horace, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- O’Keefe, T., 2020, ‘Lucretius and Philosophical Use of Literary Persuasion’, in O’Rourke 2020: 177–94
- O’Rourke, D. (ed.), 2020, Approaches to Lucretius. Traditions and Innovations in Reading the De Rerum Natura. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Reinhardt, T., 2002, ‘The speech of nature in Lucretius’ De Rerum Natura 3.931–71’, Classical Quarterly, 52: 291–304.
- –––, 2008, ‘Epicurus and Lucretius on the origins of language’, Classical Quarterly, 58: 127–40.
- Rösler, W., 1973, ‘Lukrez und die Vorsokratiker: doxographische Probleme im 1. Buch von De rerum natura’, Hermes, 101: 48–64.
- Schiesaro, A., 1990, Simulacrum et Imago: Gli argomenti analogici nel De rerum natura, Pisa: Giardini.
- Schindler, C., 2023, Lucretius (Brill Research Perspectives in Humanities and Social Sciences), Leiden: Brill.
- Schmidt, J., 1990, Lukrez, der Kepos und die Stoiker: Untersuchungen zur Schule Epikurs und zu den Quellen von ‘De Rerum Natura’ (Studien zur klassischen Philologie: Volume LIII), Lang: Frankfurt am Main
- Schrijvers, P.H., 1999, Lucrèce et les sciences de la vie (Mnemosyne supplementum), Leiden: Brill.
- Sedley, D., 1988, ‘Epicurean anti-Reductionism’, in J. Barnes and M. Mignucci (eds.), Matter and Metaphysics, Naples: Bibliopolis: 295–327.
- –––, 1989, ‘Philosophical Allegiance in the Greco-Roman World’, in J. Barnes and M. Griffin (eds.), Philosophia Togata, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 97–119.
- –––, 1998, Lucretius and the Transformation of Greek Wisdom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2011, ‘Epicurus’ theological innatism’, in Fish and Saunders 2011: 29–52.
- Segal, C., 1990, Lucretius on Death and Anxiety, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Serres, M., 2000, The Birth of Physics (original title: La Naissance de la physique dans le texte de Lucrèce, 1977), Manchester: Clinamen Press.
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- Von Staden, H., 1989, Herophilus: The Art of Medicine in Early Alexandria, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––. 2000, ‘Body, Soul and Nerves: Epicurus, Herophilus, Erasistratus, The Stoics and Galen’, in J.P. Wright and P. Potter (eds.), Psyche and Soma: Physicians and Metaphysicians on the Mind-Body Problem from Antiquity to Enlightenment New York: Oxford University Press: 79–118.
- Tatum, W.J., 1984, ‘The Presocratics in book one of Lucretius’ De rerum natura’, Transactions of the American Philological Association, 114: 177–89.
- Taylor, B., 2020, Lucretius and the Language of Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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- Tsouna,V., 2020 ‘Hedonism’, in Mitsis 2020: 140–88.
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- –––, 2020, ‘The Partition of the Soul. Epicurus, Demetrius Lacon, and Diogenes of Oenoanda’, in Inwood and Warren 2020: 89–112.
- Volk, K., 2002, The Poetics of Latin Didactic: Lucretius, Vergil, Ovid, Manilius, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2010, ‘Lucretius’ prayer for peace and the date of De rerum natura’, Classical Quarterly, 60: 127–131.
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- –––, 2004, Facing Death: Epicurus and his Critics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2007, ‘Lucretius and Greek philosophy’, in Gillespie and Hardie 2007: 19–32.
- West, D., 1969, The Imagery and Poetry of Lucretius, Edinburgh: Edinburgh Press.
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- Wiseman, T.P., 1974, ‘The Two Worlds of Titus Lucretius Carus’, in Cinna the Poet and Other Roman Essays, Leicester, Leicester University Press: 11–43.
D. Influence and Reception
- Gatzemeier, S., 2013, ‘Ut ait Lucretius.’ Die Lukrezrezeption in der Lateinischen Proza bis Laktanz. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
- Greenblatt, S., 2011, Swerve: How the Renaissance Began, London: Bodley Head.
- Hadzsits, G.D., 1935, Lucretius and his Influence, London: Longman.
- Hardie, P., 2009, Lucretian Receptions. History, the Sublime, Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- ––– , 2020, ‘Lucretius in Late Antique Poetry: Paulinus of Nola, Claudian, Prudentius’ in P.R. Hardie, V. Prosperi and D. Zucca eds. Lucretius, Poet and Philosopher. Background and Fortunes of De rerum natura, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter: 127–144.
- Johnson, W. R., 2000, Lucretius and the Modern World, London: Duckworth.
- Johnson, M.R. and C. Wilson, 2007, ‘Lucretius and the history of science’, in Gillespie and Hardie 2007: 131–48.
- Jones, H., 1989, The Epicurean Tradition, London and New York: Routledge.
- Miller, J. and Inwood, B. (eds.), 2003, Hellenistic and Early Modern Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Palmer, A., 2014, Reading Lucretius in the Reniassance, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- ––– , 2020, ‘Humanist Dissemination of Epicurus’ in P. Mitsis 2020: 616–40.
- Prosperi, V., 2020, ‘Lost in Translation. The Sixteenth Century Vernacular Lucretius’ in Hardie, Prosperi and Zucca 2020: 145–66.
- Wilson, C., 2008, Epicureanism at the Origins of Modernity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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Other Internet Resources
- Sedley, David, “Lucretius”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2023 Edition), Edward N. Zalta & Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2023/entries/lucretius/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]
- Lucretius, De Rerum Natura, English translation by William Ellery Leonard
- Lucretius, De Rerum Natura, Latin Text.
- Lucretius, a short podcast, by Peter Adamson.
- Leeds International Classical Studies, Volume 1: Lucretius.