Philodemus of Gadara (ca. 110–ca. 30 BCE) was an Epicurean philosopher and epigrammatist who, having studied in the Epicurean school at Athens when it was led by Zeno of Sidon (c. 150–c. 75 BCE), moved to Italy, probably in the 70s BCE. There he may have lived in the Greek town of Naples, and perhaps also in Rome. Some of Philodemus’ poems, which were praised by Cicero, were preserved in the Palatine Anthology, and these were all that was known of his writing until the discovery in the mid-18th century of a trove of papyrus manuscripts in the ruins of a grand villa in Herculaneum, buried by the eruption of Vesuvius in 79 CE. The majority of these were philosophical works of his.
A self-proclaimed interpreter of Epicurus and the first generation of Epicureans, as well as the devoted follower of his master Zeno of Sidon, Philodemus’ claim on our attention does not rest on the originality of his philosophical doctrines. There may have been scope for such originality, especially in his approach to the liberal arts, traditionally neglected or even deprecated by Epicureans. What we can see in his work is the effort by a latter-day Epicurean to work out positions which the school’s founders may have put forward, but which were no longer up to date in the context of continuing debate among the Hellenistic schools. Further, he attempts to uphold a particular view of Epicurean orthodoxy against that held by rival Epicureans who had a different interpretation of a number of positions of the school, these too presumably developed in response to challenges and to positions of other schools which had advanced the state of the discussion in many areas. One battleground among these Epicurean rivals was the use of Epicurean texts, the importance of collecting and studying the entire corpus of the school’s founders’ works, their philological and philosophical exegesis, and the place of epitomes and compendia vis-à-vis the extensive and detailed works of the corpus. This concern for authority in the interpretation, upholding, and teaching of Epicurean orthodoxy, feeds into Philodemus’ concern for the healthy conduct of his school, for its life as a community of philosophers, both students and teachers, studying Epicurean and other texts while trying to lead the kind of philosophical life commended by the school.
- 1. Life
- 2. Writings
- 3. Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Philodemus was born in the Greek city of Gadara, now Umm Qais in Jordan, a fortified city on a ridge overlooking the southern tip of the Sea of Tiberias, whose main claim to fame in antiquity were its intellectual sons: besides Philodemus, the Cynic philosophers and poets Menippus, Meleager and Oenomaus and the rhetors Theodorus and Apsines all hailed from Gadara. Of Philodemus’ life before he came to Italy, we know little. Scholars generally infer from Cicero’s evidence that he was born around 110 BCE, and a rough indication of his birthdate is the fact that his epigrams (see Section 2.1) were not included in the ‘Garland’ edited, probably in the 90s BCE, by his countryman Meleager, in which the latest poet to have his work included was born around 120 BCE.
Philodemus spent time in Alexandria, perhaps around 90–86 BCE, before he went to Athens (Index Academicorum, PHerc. 1021 col. 34.3–5). His stay in the Egyptian capital, which had become a center of intellectual production, is perhaps when Philodemus met and became friendly with Antiochus of Ascalon as well as various other philosophers, perhaps including Epicureans, who may have urged him to move on to Athens to study with Zeno (on Philodemus’ time in Alexandria, see Fleischer 2016: 89–104, also Fleischer 2017b on Academics working in Alexandria at this time; on Philodemus’ account of the history of the Academy, see Section 126.96.36.199).
During his sojourn in Athens, Philodemus became attached to Zeno of Sidon, the head of the Athenian Garden. He became a lifelong devotee of Zeno, an admirer of his work collecting and studying texts of the first generation of Epicureans, as well as his mode of teaching, which is reflected in Philodmus’ treatise On Frank Criticism. He published some books on the basis of Zeno’s lectures—e.g., On Frank Criticism and On Signs— and defended Zeno’s views on, e.g., the recognition of the technical character of panegyric or ‘sophistic’ rhetoric, which he insisted was the view of the school’s founders, as well.
The date of Philodemus’ departure from Athens is unknown: he may have been part of the mass exodus of intellectuals and others in the wake of the Mithridatic Wars of 88–86 or of Rome’s campaigns in Asia of 74–65; perhaps he left Athens on the death of Zeno, to whom he proclaims his devotion. One source has a certain Philodemus driven from the Sicilian town of Himera when his teachings were thought to have incurred divine wrath in the form of an epidemic (Aelian, in Suda, s.vv. Himeraiai, sukophantein, and timôntai; cf. Sider 1997, 9–10). The reconstruction of the testimonium is somewhat difficult, and nothing says that it must have to do with our Philodemus. Still, it would not be unusual for an Epicurean to be accused of atheism, and new readings in Philodemus’ Index Academicorum (cf. Fleischer 2017b) show that he did indeed spend time in Sicily.
In any event, Philodemus’ arrival in Italy may not be placed long after 70. For in the historical record, Philodemus is known to us primarily as the Greek philosopher and poet associated with the Roman senator L. Calpurnius Piso Caesoninus (ca. 101–post 43, cos. 58) by Cicero (In Pisonem 68–72, 74; the name is supplied by the commentator Asconius ad 68: ‘He means Philodemus, who was at that time a most excellent Epicurean and whose poems are lubricious’; cf. Sider 1997: T2, 228–30). Here, Cicero speaks of Philodemus, without naming him, as Piso’s constant companion since the Roman, as a young man, sought his company, having heard this Epicurean advocate pleasure as the goal of life. Cicero notes that Philodemus was a gentleman when not in Piso’s company and that he cultivated arts for which Epicureans were not generally known, writing extremely elegant and witty poetry, and indicates (In Pis. 70) that Philodemus, eager to please, could not turn a deaf ear to Piso, a Roman senator, despite the latter’s tendency to ignore the fine distinctions with which the doctrine of pleasure was hedged about. If the accuracy of this polemical account may be relied upon, this would mean that Piso, who was born around 101 BCE, would have been at least 30—the minimum age for entry into the Senate—at the time of their meeting, though Cicero terms him ‘young man’ (adulescens).
By 55 BCE, when Cicero attacked Piso, Philodemus could be firmly associated with him. Philodemus addressed his book On the Good King according to Homer, to a young relation of Piso’s. He also addressed the fourth book of his Rhetoric to C. Vibius Pansa Caetronianus, who died fighting Antony at Forum Gallorum in April of 43. One reference to a Roman event, Antony’s supplying of dwarfs from Syria for gladiatorial games (De Signis col. ii.18), perhaps implies a terminus post quem of 40 (Last 1922, 177–80; contra, Sider 1997, 11). If he was born around 110, Philodemus could have lived into the later 30s.
Philodemus and Piso may have begun their association in Rome, where the rising young politician will certainly have spent much time, or else in Campania, well-known as a haunt of Epicureans, especially of Siro, teacher of Vergil and Horace, and where Philodemus too seems to have taught. Siro and Philodemus, whom Cicero calls ‘excellent men and very learned’, are associated as living in Naples and engaging in philosophical discussions (Cicero, On Moral Ends 2.119 [T1 Sider]). Several books of Philodemus’ On Vices address a coterie of poetically minded Romans, Vergil along with three other associates of Maecenas and friends of Horace: L. Varius Rufus, Plotius Tucca, P. Quintilius Varus (PHerc. 1082 col. xi, and a treatise on calumny in PHerc. Paris, 2; cf. Horace, Satires 1.5, 1.10 and Sider 1997: 19–23).
It is often assumed that Philodemus lived and worked, and perhaps even gathered an Epicurean circle of friends, in the luxurious villa on the edge of the Campanian seaside town of Herculaneum in the ruins of which the papyri of his works were found, dubbed ‘Villa of the Papyri’ (see Section 2.2.1). A nest of conjectures has been woven on the basis of the presence of the papyri in the Villa, especially of multiple copies of some of Philodemus’ and Epicurus’ works, as well as of an apparent draft copy of one work (the Index Academicorum, a manuscript that may be in the format of the ‘model book’ made to determine the length of further copies (On the Gods III), a few manuscripts that appear to bear stylistic corrections by Philodemus himself, if not in his own hand (see Essler 2017), and copies of the works of other Epicureans (Demetrius of Laconia, Colotes, Polystratus, Carneïscus, Metrodorus and Zeno of Sidon), along with (at least) two books by the Stoic Chrysippus. There is also a group of Latin papyri, apparently of non-philosophical character (a Latin poem on the battle of Actium in PHerc. 817 has long been known, and the historical work From the beginning of the Civil Wars by Seneca the Elder has recently been identified in PHerc. 1067), except perhaps for a manuscript of Lucretius. (On the contents of the library at Herculaneum, see Sider 2005 and Delattre 2006; on the identification by K. Kleve of a possible manuscript of Lucretius, see Delattre 2003.)
The conjecture that the Villa belonged to the family of Piso is supported by the presence in the tablinum of a bust, popularly known as the ’Pseudo-Seneca’ (MAAN 5616), which some scholars have identified as being of Philodemus’ patron Lucius Calpurnius Piso Caesoninus (consul in 58, d. ca. 42 BCE), and by the statue of Panathenaic Athena (MAAN 6007, from the square courtyard), a figure with whom Piso is associated by a statue base in Athens (on these statues see Mattusch 2005: 249–253, 147–151; on the Villa’s owner 20–23, 357–358); a bronze bust found in Herculaneum (MAAN 5601) of a young man identified as that of Piso’s son Lucius, consul in 15 BCE and also pontifex and prefect of the city of Rome until his death in 32 CE, is not clearly from the Villa; it is in any case clear that the family of the Pisones had a villa in the resort of Baiai on the other side of the Bay of Naples. (For discussion of theories of the Villa’s ownership, see Capasso 2010b.)
It is often thought that, if the Villa belonged to Piso, it may also have been where Philodemus himself lived and wrote, and that the book-rolls belonged to Philodemus’ own library, partly assembled in Athens before his arrival in Italy, and then increased by his own writings, which were, perhaps, copied in a scriptorium on the premises, as they were composed and, in some cases, recopied later (cf. Cavallo 1983). That at least the philosophical papyri belonged to Philodemus is plausible: but there are some reasons to doubt the rest of this pleasing speculation.
First, it is possible that more of the papyri were copied in the first century CE than has usually been thought, which would put them outside the lifetime of Philodemus. Rather a large number of scribes worked on the papyri, and there are indications that the copies we have were only some among many copies of the same works. There is little indication, too, that the papyri were actually copied in Herculaneum; and we have little understanding of whatever book trade existed in Campania in the first century BCE. While Naples was a prominent Greek city and may well have supported a trade in Greek books, as it certainly supported an Epicurean school led by Siro, Rome was now the center of the world (cf. Sedley 2003) and a place where Philodemus could have found many of the books he cited in his work.
Another set of difficulties concern Philodemus’ connections with Herculaneum. There is good cause to link Philodemus with Naples, and the ‘humble shack’ to which he invites Piso for the commemoration of Epicurus’ birthday (see Section 2.1) may have been there or somewhere in the vicinity, perhaps including Herculaneum. Yet there is little or no ancient testimony associating him with Herculaneum: what has been thought to be the single mention of the town in the papyri themselves (PHerc. 312 col. 4 Gigante [T15 Sider]) is clear in associating Philodemus with Naples and with friendly philosophical discussion, but the toponym ‘Herculaneum’ is probably not to be read there, and in any event the text does not say that Philodemus lived there. Moreover, if Philodemus was likely dead by 30 BCE, about a century would pass between that event and the eruption that buried the villa and its library: why would the books have remained there during that period?
By far the largest number of the books—probably all or nearly all the philosophical texts—were stored on shelves in a small room with no furniture for reading; some others were in one or two small cabinets in the tablinum, off the square peristyle, where books might be read; still others were in traveling boxes (capsae) in several areas of the villa, e.g., at the near end of the long peristyle. The philosophical library was perhaps one isolated, specialized collection, acquired by a collector who also acquired Philodemus’ own library. It was perhaps left behind because unused and unwanted, while other books were removed from the villa before the final catastrophe. The presence of copies of Philodemus’ works made after his death indicates a continuing interest in his philosophy, however. Recent excavation and investigation are thought to show that the villa was built in one major construction effort, and decorative elements there date it to around 40 BCE (see Guidobaldi and Esposito 2010), in which case it could hardly have served as Philodemus’ home and workplace, and certainly not in 55 BCE, when Cicero puts him in close association with Piso.
Cicero says that Philodemus wrote very pleasant, elegant, clever verse to Piso and, at Piso’s urging, about him, mirroring the man himself in perfect verse descriptions of his lusts, immoral acts, banquets and adulteries. We do not have poetry of Philodemus’ which would confirm the latter description, but Philodemus is the author of 30 or more elegant epigrams anthologized in the ‘Garland’ of Philip of Thessalonica in the first century CE, which was in turn included in the ‘Palatine Anthology’ (AP) of the tenth century, ensuring the poems’ survival.
Philodemus’ epigrams are a varied lot. Most are mostly erotic poems, some addressed to a certain ‘Xanthippe’, whose name appears in various forms, and who he says marks the end, as does the coronis in a book, of the crazed or manic phase of his life (AP 11.41.7 = 4 Sider). The poems mention both Athens and Naples. A couple of them speak of banqueting or eating in moderation, one of which invites Piso to the feast in honor of Epicurus’ birthday, held on the twentieth of each month (AP 11.44 = 27 Sider):
Tomorrow, dearest Piso, your cultured companion drags you
To his humble shack at three o’clock
To feed you your annual dinner on the Twentieth. If you’ll miss
Sow’s udders and Bromius’ Chian wine,
Still you’ll see your faithful companions and hear
Things far more sweet than the Phaeacians’ land.
And if you ever turn your gaze on us too, Piso,
We’ll have a richer Twentieth, instead of a humble one.
This invitation to an Epicurean dinner raises the possibility that other epigrams of Philodemus might be viewed with an Epicurean eye, for example, when they portray conversations in which friends point out to the poet the need to avoid excessive grief at his own eventual death (AP 9.570 = 3 Sider) or the recent death of his friends (AP 9.412 = 29 Sider), though it is hard to think that all of them could or should be so interpreted (cf. Sider 1997: 32–39).
2.2.1 Discovery of the papyri: an exceptional legacy
Greek philosophical texts are usually known to us through the medieval manuscript tradition, transmitted, in the best cases, by manuscripts of the ninth or tenth centuries CE that were already, by that date, the products of many generations of copies, and perhaps too of a couple of scholarly editions. Fragments of ancient papyrus manuscripts give punctual insights into the state of some of these texts in earlier periods, from the late third century BCE to the sixth century CE, and can thus be used to help gauge the accuracy of the later manuscript tradition.
Before the mid-18th century, that Philodemus wrote properly philosophical works could, beyond a reference to his Collection of the Philosophers (D[iogenes] L[aertius] 10.3, cf. 10.24, and see Section 188.8.131.52), only be inferred from Cicero’s reference to him as a ‘very learned’ Epicurean, along with Siro (On Moral Ends 2.119). But in 1752 and 1754 a large trove of perhaps about 800 papyrus bookrolls was excavated from an opulent villa in the town of Herculaneum on the Bay of Naples. The eruption of Vesuvius that buried the town and the villa in October of 79 CE was also responsible for the preservation of these carbonized bookrolls, the first papyrus books to become known in Europe. The discovery sent a thrill through learned Europe, although the bookrolls’ extreme fragility, which made them practically impossible to unroll or separate into distinct layers without inflicting grave damage—various early attempts resulted only in the destruction of an unknown number of rolls—was deeply frustrating.
Philodemus’ philosophical works are exceptional in being known to us entirely from papyri copied during his lifetime or, at the latest, in the century after his death, which are, accordingly, excellent qua records of what Philodemus actually wrote. Most scribal errors in them were corrected at an early stage, and despite the usual obstacles to be encountered in texts on papyrus, (such as the absence of word-breaks and of a standard, comprehensive system of punctuation, and the arrangement of text continuously, in columns, rather than by chapters or sections), the result is a clean and intelligible text—where it can be read. Sadly, there is much that cannot be read (see Section 2.2.4).
2.2.2 Unrolling the papyri
The 18th c. learned community was perhaps even more dismayed when, in 1754–5, the last part of one of these books was finally unrolled, by Padre Antonio Piaggio, and proved to be a work of Philodemus’ attacking the art of music. Instead of the lost books of Livy or the plays of Aeschylus eagerly anticipated by scholars, the library turned out to consist mostly of Epicurean treatises, Philodemus being the author best represented amongst them, followed by Epicurus himself.
The first curator of all the objects excavated in Herculaneum, the Roman painter Camillo Paderni, had used the method of cutting lengthwise through the rolls of papyrus and peeling off their exterior portions (referred to as the ‘bark’ or scorza), sometimes pulverizing the rolls’ central, interior portions (now referred to as ’scorzatura totale’), sometimes leaving these untouched (’scorzatura parziale’). The exterior and interior portions of a bookroll were handled differently. The exterior portions took the form of a concave shell, representing all or part of the roll’s original height, comprising numerous papyrus layers with writing visible on the topmost of these (that nearest the middle of the roll and thus the end of the text). When this stretch of text had been copied, the layer of papyrus on which it was written could be scraped off—and thereby destroyed—to reveal the next layer underneath (which would thus be nearer to the beginning, not the end, of the text).
These surfaces or ‘fragments’ were necessarily discontinuous, each covering no more than half the circumference of a bookroll. Unmindful of how the fragments had come into being, the Neapolitan editors presented them in reverse order, with the later ones first. Moreover, since each piece of a roll had been assigned its own ‘papyrus’ number, the fact that a set of exterior ‘fragments’ and another set of interior columns had originally formed one bookroll was often forgotten. The papyrus numbered PHerc. 1427, for example, which ends with the title On Rhetoric I, contains four partial columns and the final seven columns, out of an original 237; but other parts of the same bookroll were removed from its exterior, opened, catalogued, and published, with little or no cognizance of their origin, as nine separate “papyri” (PHerc. 232, 234, 250, 398, 426, 453, 1601, 1612, 1619), all of which when reassembled in Nicolardi 2018 yield perhaps 30% of the original text.
It was the cores (midolli) of the bookrolls, containing the final parts of texts, that were opened using the ingenious mechanism invented by Piaggio yielding long portions of mostly continuous text, albeit interrupted by gaps of varying size. Such textual continuity is found usually only in the final portions of Philodemus’ books, some of which contain something like a peroration, others attacks on rival positions, especially those of other Epicureans, or a kind of mopping-up and delimitation of the book’s subject-matter. In a few, fortunate, cases, such as PHerc. 1004 from On Rhetoric, this final portion may cover a large percentage of the original roll’s length; usually, however, they represent (much) less than a third. The unrolling process was so painfully slow that in the first phase of the history of the ‘Workshop (Officina) of the Papyri’ (1754–98), only 18 papyri were successfully unrolled. Political unrest closed the workshop between 1798 and 1801, and in 1802 a new phase of unrolling began under the direction of an English cleric, John Hayter, whose work was financed by the Prince of Wales, the later George IV. During the next five years, over 200 rolls were unrolled, but little was published, due in part to the slowness of the Neapolitan academics entrusted with the task.
2.2.3 Early Publications and Modern Reading of the Papyri
These delays conspired with what many observers at the time considered the uninspiring nature of the works preserved in the papyri to dampen wider interest in and notice of them, despite their unique status. This state-of-affairs persisted until the unification of Italy (1861), when a new series of publications of facsimiles of the papyrus texts, engravings of drawings (Italian: disegni) made soon after the rolls were opened, appeared in quick succession (see the Bibliographical Note, infra). Now the texts of Philodemus finally became objects of sustained study by scholars interested in Epicureanism.
Nonetheless, numerous editions of Philodemus’ works, especially early ones, are unreliable. Many were not based on a reading of the papyri themselves, but rather on the disegni, which are frequently wrong, and this led editors to be bolder about changing the texts presented in these copies, filling in gaps, and interpreting the results than they might have been had they read the papyri instead. In many such cases, better reading of the papyrus has shown that the text ran very differently indeed from the conjectures that have commonly served as the basis of reconstructions of the views of Philodemus and others. One common problem has been the mistaking of what turns out to be a citation of an opponent for something Philodemus himself maintains (and vice versa).
There are other serious obstacles to understanding, especially the condition of the papyri themselves. The books were written on sheets of papyrus pasted together into lengths of, say, 8–16 meters, which were rolled up from right to left and therefore read from left to right, beginning to end. The texts are arranged in parallel columns, at times well over 200 of them, of 20–45 lines, each consisting of 16–40 letters; the numbers of lines and letters are fairly uniform in each roll.
There are holes (‘lacunae’) of varying size; surfaces may have been badly abraded in the process of unrolling; ink may have faded, or even vanished altogether; glues used to hold the papyri together and mount them have in some cases penetrated and darkened them. Significant advances in reading the papyri have been made, however, especially by the use of microscopes (first in 1970, then, from 1995, with built-in illumination) and, from 2000, of digital photographs taken mostly in the near-infrared region (‘multi-spectral images’). The problems of continuity posed by the way in which the papyri were opened and read have also recently been addressed in a systematic way. Guglielmo Cavallo’s study (1983) of the scribal hands used in the papyri allowed the texts to be grouped and dated, and it allowed the recognition that numerous pieces had once belonged to the same roll. These technical and philological advances, which have dramatically improved and extended our access to Philodemus’ thought, now require the re-edition of all texts of Herculaneum papyri. There are also newer technical methods which may soon change the situation again by providing three-dimensional images of opened papyri or even reading still rolled-up pieces without opening them.
2.2.4 Reconstructing Philodemus’ philosophical oeuvre
In many texts we have lost the pages placed at the end of a roll, on which a scribe would write the work’s author and title (and sometimes more information too, such as the number of columns or standard lines the bookroll contained); nearly all the title-pages from the beginnings of the rolls have been lost, as well. Many such orphaned rolls have been assigned to Philodemus indirectly, on the basis of the nature of the bookroll and of the hand in which it was copied, and of the work’s style and content. Scholars have also given titles to some works based on their content and, in some cases, relying on references to such titles in other works of Philodemus’. A related difficulty is posed by the possibility that titles may have taken various forms, as in the papyri of On Vices, where the title-pages at the beginning of the rolls seem to have had a somewhat fuller title, those at the ends of the rolls a shorter version. The point is relevant because Philodemus’ philosophical production can of course be rightly described and evaluated only on the basis of an accurate list of his writings. Most attributions of works to Philodemus are generally accepted by scholars; conjectured titles, however, should often be understood as exempli gratia.
184.108.40.206 Individual books
Daniel Delattre’s work (2007) on the pieces of papyrus now securely attributed to On Music IV, Dirk Obbink’s on the first half of On Piety (1996), and Richard Janko’s on On Poems [I] showed how to ‘reconstruct’ bookrolls, by identifying which items in the catalogue of papyri belong to a given roll, working out their original locations within it, and re-ordering the copies of their fragments.
The best reconstructions to date are thus able to give a clear impression of the structure of a whole book, as with On Music IV, On Poems I, Rhetoric II, and VIII. In these books Philodemus summarises the work—often in the form of a number of relatively short quotations—of one or more opponents: in On Music IV, the Stoic Diogenes of Babylon; in On Poems I, the literary theorist Crates of Mallos, along with others referred to as ‘critics’ (kritikoi). Philodemus then goes back over the quotations in order, refuting each of their positions, often several times over.
An extreme example of this procedure occurs at the end of Rhetoric VIII (cf. Blank 2007a). There the statement attributed to Aristotle as a reason for his decision to teach rhetoric, ‘It is shameful to be silent while allowing Isocrates to speak’, is dissected and rejected over the course of ten columns with arguments such as a reductio (why not say that it is shameful to sit idly while allowing Farmer Brown to till the soil?) or an ad hominem (the practice of political rhetoric is itself shameful, but then Aristotle and his pupil Theophrastus not only collected the laws of various places, but also wrote about such low subjects as perfumery and metallurgy).
220.127.116.11 Multivolume works and projects
Philodemus’ philosophical projects, and the sweep of his argumentation, are not, however, confined to the level of individual books. Besides self-contained, single-volume (‘monobibloi’) works—e.g. On the Stoics, On the Good King according to Homer—a large number of books belong to multi-volume projects. Thus we have only the fourth—probably final—books of On Death and On Music; On Signs III; On the Gods I and III; Books I, II, III, IV, VI, VIII, and perhaps also VII of On Rhetoric. In no case can we be sure that we have the entirety of any such project, though there are perhaps signs in some bookrolls that they were meant to be the last in a series, as at the end of On Music IV, while in other cases, the nature of the treatment seems to bring the subject to a conclusion, as in On Death IV.
For the most part it is unclear how all these works were organized. In some cases (e.g., On Poems I-II and On Rhetoric I-III), Philodemus has plotted the course of more than one book at once, but we do not know if an overall plan was present from the beginning, or if books at first composed separately were later added to the set. The most complex problems arise with regard to the multi-volume work On Vices, which is discussed below. Understanding the organization of such works would give us a clearer picture of Philodemus’ methods and philosophical aims.
18.104.22.168 Ethical works
A large percentage of Philodemus’ known works deal with what may be classed as ethical matters (see further, Section 22.214.171.124 below). Most of the ethical works of Philodemus are practical in outlook, assuming rather than arguing for the tenets of Epicurean ethical theory, on which they are always founded (Section 126.96.36.199).
188.8.131.52.1 On ethics as a whole
There are two Herculaneum treatises which treat the systematic basis of ethics. One is a kind of introductory treatment of Epicurean ethics, for which On Choices and Avoidances would be an appropriate title and which was probably written by Philodemus, who mentions such a work of his own (at PHerc. 1424.28.5; formerly called Ethica Comparetti after its first editor). The other is On Epicurus, a biographical, or rather hagiographical, work based largely on citations of the founder’s works (see further, Section 184.108.40.206).
220.127.116.11.2 On individual ethical topics
Philodemus composed at least two multi-volume works on explicitly moral subjects. One was On Vices, or, as the titles of some of its books indicate, On Vices and their Opposing Virtues and Those in whom and Concerning what things they occur. Individual books of this set seem to have borne individual titles, two of which are known: On Flattery (On Vices Book 1: PHerc. 222+223+1082+1675 and perhaps a couple of other fragmentary pieces; PHerc. 1457, dealing with vices similar to flattery, may have been either a second book or the conclusion of the same book, carried over onto a second roll, giving the treatise a structure like that of Book 10) and On Arrogance (On Vices Book 10: PHerc. 1008); two other books whose title indicated that they belonged to the set, but whose individual titles are lost, dealt with household management (On Vices Book 9: PHerc. 1424) and greed (PHerc. 253). These four books are all written in the same hand, and another by the same scribe, dealing with slander (PHerc. Paris. 2), is also likely to have been part of the overall work On Vices. Besides having been written by the same scribe, evidently as part of a fairly uniform edition, at least three of these books were addressed to the circle of Roman poets Plotius Tucca, Varius, Virgil and Quintilius Varus (PHerc. 253 fr. 12.4; On Flattery, PHerc. 1082.11.3; On Slander, PHerc. Paris. 2 fr. 279.10–11).
That Philodemus composed these books as part of a coherent series is clear not only from the presence of both individual descriptive titles and generic titles in the rolls of this edition, but also from the end of On Arrogance: ‘We shall end this treatise here, but we shall add to it the treatment of the other vices which we think we should discuss’. Still, in the course of these books, Philodemus also refers to others, which may or may not have been part of the series: On Beauty and On Eros, which contained remarks intended to prevent people from falling prey to flattery (cited at PHerc. 1457 fr. 23.8–10); On Wealth (mentioned at PHerc. 1424.12.17–25; we have the first book in PHerc. 163 and perhaps another book in PHerc. 209); On Wealth and Poverty (perhaps contained in PHerc. 1570; or perhaps this is another name for On Wealth), On the Extravagant and Simple Lifestyles, and On Choices and Avoidances (cited in PHerc. 1424.28.5).
It is unclear exactly how this series as a whole justified the descriptive title On Vices and their Opposing Virtues and Those in whom and Concerning what things they occur. Not all its books are clearly centered on or titled after ‘vices’. Nor does the work appear to have contained any books which were clearly written about ‘virtues’ opposite to the ‘vices’, such as a book on friendship as an opposite to flattery; it has been speculated that such might have been the relationship between the book about household management and one which is perhaps about greed (philarguria) and which survives in a number of fragmentary pieces written in the hand of On Vices (PHerc. 253, 465, 896, 1090, 1613 and frs. 8–10 and 12 of 1077). Individual books, however, may correspond in some way to the overall title. Thus, On Flattery and On Arrogance analyze the vices of their subtitles, contrast them with the attitude and practice of the Epicurean philosopher (i.e., the virtues) and describe the ‘character’ type afflicted with the vice in question, as well as those characters which are of the same genus or in some way bound up with the main vice, with due attention to the particular nature and danger of each character and the situations in which it is found.
Key to understanding the ethics of managing an Epicurean community is Philodemus’ treatise (PHerc. 1471) dedicated to the school’s practice of frank criticism (parrhêsia). Its full title runs Of the books On Characters and Modes of Life written as epitomes from the lectures of Zeno, Book [ ?], which is On Frank Criticism, and testifies to the existence of a second series of Philodemus’ ethical works.
Another book with clear relevance to the conduct of the school and the understanding of the sage’s role in it is On Anger (PHerc. 182). As reconstructed, the remains of this book’s final title page allow the possibility that it was part of a larger work, and its subject, along with those of books On Madness and others which could be called [On Malicious Joy (or On Jealousy)], or [On Dismeasure], has led some to propose that Philodemus wrote a series of books on the passions. Certainly, the passions (pathê) are close to the heart of Hellenistic ethical discussion and play an important role in one’s ability both to lead a good, happy life and one’s ability to profit from being in a community of philosophers.
2.2.5 Philodemus’ philosophy
18.104.22.168 Philodemus’ conception of philosophical discourse
22.214.171.124.1 The ‘great men’
Philodemus does not claim to be an original philosopher. He insists that his views are based on the doctrines of Epicurus and of his first generation of pupils—Metrodorus, Colotes, Polyaenus, Hermarchus (cf. PHerc. 1005 III 8–17 and fr. 107.9 ff.), whose works he cites constantly as proof of the correctness of his claims about Epicurean doctrine and its proper interpretation, often in opposition to the interpretations of other Epicureans contemporary with or somewhat older than himself. The death of Hermarchus marks, for Philodemus, the end of the authoritative generation of Epicureans. To Hermarchus were bequeathed the books of Epicurus—perhaps some of the very copies eventually owned by Philodemus and found in the Villa—and he was the last of the disciples to have participated in philosophical discussion with and, thus, in the formation of the philosophy of the founder.
126.96.36.199.2 Zeno of Sidon
Philodemus’ authority for many of his claims about the content and interpretation of Epicurean teaching is his own teacher, Zeno of Sidon. In Rhetoric II, for example, Philodemus defends Zeno’s view that the first Epicureans denied forensic and political rhetoric the status of ‘arts’ or ‘expertises’ (technai), while conceding it to ‘sophistic’ or panegyric rhetoric (cf. Blank 2001). Elsewhere, Philodemus gives an extended defence of Zeno’s running of the school, his conception of the Epicurean wise man, his attitude toward and use of the founders’ texts, and his balanced understanding of Epicurus’ hostility toward the liberal arts, in opposition to some recent Epicureans, who are criticized for their ‘laziness regarding books’ and who, Zeno said, had only a superficial knowledge of the principal texts, based on epitomes. The title of the book (PHerc. 1005/862 and 1485) in which this argument is conducted, and which was apparently the first of a set, is only partially preserved, as Pros tous […], which, to compound the difficulty, could mean either that it is addressed ‘to’ certain persons whose identity is now lost, or that it is written ‘against’ them. It has been published under the titles Against the [sophists] and To the [companions in the school (hetairous)] (thus, ad contubernales in Latin, and is now read as, for instance, Against those [no good at knowing the books] (Puglia 2015) or Against those [who claim to know the books] (Del Mastro 2014).
Some of Philodemus’ books are described as based in whole or part on the lectures of Zeno (e.g. On Signs III, On Frank Criticism); the term hupomnêmatikon, which appears in some end-titles, may indicate that, being similarly dependent on lectures or seminars, they are in the style of a ‘notebook’ or ‘commentary’ (hypomnêmatikon, cf. Blank 1997). Zeno’s collection and interpretation of the founders’ texts is praised and defended by Philodemus in a number of places, and he was clearly devoted to him, describing himself as ‘Zeno’s faithful suitor while he lived, and tireless singer of his praises after his death, especially for all his virtues, in addition to his possession (ka[to]chais) and inspiration (theophoriais) by Epicurus’ (Pros tous […] XIV 6–13). Zeno seems, in fact, to have been for Philodemus a model second only to Epicurus himself of the wise man and leader of an Epicurean community. It is to the running of an Epicurean community, the role of the sage in it and the relations between its members that much of Philodemus’ work is devoted.
We do not know any of the other books from the same series of summaries based on the lectures of Zeno, who was evidently the source and model of Philodemus’s ideas about how to run an Epicurean school. They are often thought to have included On Conversation (PHerc. 873, apparently Book 2, according to the final title), and On Gratitude (PHerc. 1414) because those topics also relate to conduct and relations among school members; the titles of these two bookrolls, however, evidently lacked any indication that they belonged to a larger work; the final title of PHerc. 873 is in the same hand as the front and back titles added to the uniform edition of the books of On Vices which may indicate that the book belonged rather to that series.
Epicurus was perhaps the originator of the Hellenistic debates over the nature and existence of a ‘criterion of truth’, which allows us to separate true from doubtful or false beliefs. This debate, conducted by both philosophers and medical writers, also concerned methods of proof and sign-inference to extend knowledge beyond our immediate perceptions (overview in Allen 2001).
The final portion of On Signs III is all we have of the work, the full title of which was apparently On Phenomena and Sign-inferences (sêmeiôseôn). It comprises four sections (labeled here §§1–4, followed by column and line numbers from DeLacy and DeLacy 1978) and reports the ways in which three Epicureans responded to criticisms of their theory of sign-inference. First is Philodemus’ teacher, Zeno (§1, §2); then Demetrius Laco (§3, xxviii 13–xxix 19), whose interest in proof is known from Sextus (M 8.348); and finally another, unnamed, colleague (§4, xxix 20–xxxviii 22). The authors of the initial criticisms are unknown, but probably include the Dionysius who is named as author of replies to the Epicurean rebuttals of the first round of criticisms (§1, vii 5–viii 21; Zeno’s replies occupy viii 21–ix 26), and he may be a Stoic or Peripatetic. On the other hand, the method favored by the opponents, EM or the elimination mode (anaskeuê, which is not the same as contraposition, as scholars used to think), is not positively attested as Stoic.
Both the EM and the Epicurean similarity mode (SM) of sign-inference move to the non-evident from the evident. We do not know how the opponents defined what is evident, but the SM starts from empirical generalisations that have been, in their turn, built up from individual observations, and, ultimately, from perceptions and feelings, these being two of the standard Epicurean criteria. The experiences of others (if reliable), accessed through research (historia), as well as things proved earlier, may also furnish suitable starting-points for the construction (sunthesis) of inferential transitions (metabaseis) to the non-evident. All this empirical input is most often referred to as ‘things hereabouts’ (ta par’ hêmin), and it stands in opposition both to perceptible things outside our experience, e.g., from living things here to those in chilly ‘Britain, if any’ (§1, v 35–6), and also to those that are in principle imperceptible, as from moving things hereabouts to atoms moving in the void.
Epicurus himself had appealed to what is evident to provide positive ‘attestation’ (epimarturêsis) of true beliefs about perceptibles ‘hereabouts’, and ‘contestation’ (antimarturêsis) of false beliefs about theoretical items such as atoms, and about extremely distant perceptible objects; always provided it is explanatorily adequate, lack of evidence of any kind against a theoretical belief is sufficient grounds for taking it to be true, (Ep. Herodot. 80, Ep. Pythocles 86–88; each such belief will constitute a true explanation of this type of phenomenon in one or other of the infinite number of world-systems in the universe). In On Signs, in contrast, what phenomena ‘conflict’ (antipiptein, makhesthai) with, if they do, are empirical generalizations, which are thereby falsified (e.g., §1, xvii 28–xviii 16). Thus while Epicurus argues that the non-existence of void is contested by the phenomenon of movement, these Epicureans argue that nothing evident contests the local generalization that moving things hereabouts all move through empty spaces.
Such localized empirical generalizations are produced by the Epicureans’ method of ‘applied reasoning’ (epilogismos), i.e., reasoning applied to experience: similarities (homoiotêtes) and differences among things in our experience are collected and scrutinized so as to identify properties belonging to all, or all observed, local members of some kind or group without exception. These properties can then safely be projected, by sign-inference, to all or any other members of the kind, as, for example, it is inferred that mortality belongs to all human beings everywhere (e.g., §4, xxxiii 24–32)—a type of sign-inference that the Epicureans claim is simply not captured by the EM (e.g., §1, xvii 8–11). While local generalizations are all constructed by the detection of similarities, in the case of imperceptibles property-projection will rather be by analogy (§4, xxxvii 24–xxxviii 8, the DeLacys’ unfortunate translation of homoiotês as ‘analogy’ notwithstanding): atoms, e.g., are analogous, but not identical, to macroscopic bodies in their property of solidity.
Epilogismos must be conducted with due diligence and caution (e.g., §3, xxix 1–4), but this seems an inadequate defense against the possibility raised by their opponents that counter-examples to generalizations—unique individuals or rare species—may always exist undiscovered. More convincing is the response that, since freaks and rarities were discovered empirically, to project the existence of such things into unknown realms is simply to apply the SM (e.g., §3, xxviii 29–37). While this does not prove that the EM is superfluous, it does raise another unsettled question, whether all these Epicureans believe that there is only one mode of sign-inference, the SM, or two (as suggested by Zeno in §1, e.g., xii 2–31). It is probably helpful to see this problem in light of a basic disagreement that emerges in On Signs between the Epicureans and their opponents: that the Epicureans are mainly concerned, not with arriving, somehow or other, at true beliefs, but with how we can be certain that our beliefs are true, experience being the only secure foundation for any property-projection. Sign-inferences here and in other sources often take the form of a conditional (sunêmmenon), such as: ‘If there is smoke, there is fire’, or a para-conditional (parasunêmmenon), such as ‘Since there is smoke, there is fire’ (equivalent to a conditional plus its antecedent), and the EM is built around a criterion of truth for conditionals: the antecedent must be ‘eliminated’, or negated, simply by the ‘elimination’ of the consequent (§1, xii 1–14). In the void/movement case, then, if movement is a sign of void, elimination of void thereby eliminates movement, and the inference seems to be valid by the EM.
But the author of §4, at any rate, insists that it is only because we have observed that moving things hereabouts, despite other differences, all share the property of moving through empty spaces, that we affirm that the same thing holds without exception in non-evident places too (xxxv 36–xxxvi 7). The full form of this sign-inference would therefore run: “Since moving things hereabouts all move through empty space, all moving things move through empty spaces; and since all moving things move through empty space, and there are moving things, there is such a thing as empty space”. But if assurance (diabebaiôsis) that the conclusion is true is produced in all cases by experience of similar cases (xxxvii 31–35), whether a sign is similar to what it signifies—as with the revelation that all human beings are mortal by their being so hereabouts—or it is not, as with movement’s being a sign of void (xxxi 1–7), then there will indeed be only one mode of sign-inference, and the EM, which does not proceed in this way, will be excluded.
A second major disagreement is that the Epicureans apparently claimed that SM sign-inferences had a ‘necessitating’ (anankastikos) character, which their opponents denied (e.g., §1, iv 5–37; §2, xxvi 25–6). There has been modern debate over whether the Epicureans meant that the premisses of SM sign-inferences necessitate their conclusions, as in deductive arguments (Barnes 1988: 107–111), or that SM sign-inferences are ‘cogent’ and ‘demand assent’ and may be thought of as inductive arguments, which antiquity called epagôgê and in which the premisses do not necessitate the conclusions (Long 1988: 136–40).
Perhaps, however, the important point is rather that SM sign-inference is concerned with the relation between an individual object and its properties, a relation of metaphysical necessity (e.g., §1, viii 32–6; §4, xxxiii 35, xxxv 22–9). It is these necessary properties that epilogismos seeks to identify (e.g., §1, xvii 3–11; §4, xxxv 4–31) and that sign-inference should project: they help constitute the nature of a thing (cf. §1, xv 11–12; §3, xxiv 6–8). When he rebuts the opponents’ objection that SM sign-inferences are not necessitating, therefore, Zeno adduces the kind of property from which a sign-inference should proceed. Thus whatever necessity an SM sign-inference has comes from the metaphysical necessity of a property-property pairing, which is expressed in a qua truth: “For when we say that, since those hereabouts are such, those in the unknown realm are also such, insofar as those hereabouts are such, in this way we believe that something unknown is conjoined with them. For example: since humans hereabouts, qua humans, are mortal, then if there are humans anywhere, they too are mortal” (§4, xxxiii 24–32). Each of the four senses of ‘qua’ discussed in the next lines joins properties with the force of necessity and is used in sign-inferences (xxxiii 24–29).
The Epicureans are epistemological realists who postulate that we naturally form conceptions corresponding to types of object and property in our experience. The metaphysical necessity of property-property pairing explains why the best test of a conditional or of a particular sign is that it is inconceivable that the antecedent exists and the consequent does not (§4, xxxiii 1–7), why someone making a sign-inference on the basis of the evident “locks away in inconceivability” the proposition that things hereabouts are such, but things elsewhere are not such (§1, xv 37–39).
As with On Signs, what remains of a badly damaged treatise on the senses attributed to Philodemus (PHerc. 19/698, ed. Monet 1996) takes the Epicurean theory of perception, with its description of the atomic basis of the senses and their irrationality, as a background against which to discuss developments of the theory due to the confrontation with opponents, in this instance Stoics and Aristotelians. Of special concern are: the unity of sensation (I-VIII) and the ‘common sense’ (XX-XXVII) as opposed to the particular objects of each sense (XXVIII-XXIX); and the rejection of Stoic ‘grasping’ (katalêpsis) once one admits the Epicurean theory of ‘affection’ (pathos), which includes both perceiving and perceiving that one is perceiving (IX-XVII).
188.8.131.52.1 The principles
Philodemus’ ethical theory is very much that of Epicurus, with its focus on the attainment of ‘the congenital goal’ of pleasure and concomitant rejection of what does not lead to that goal or even distracts from it. Probably, the systematic treatment of Epicurean ethics put in the mouth of ‘Torquatus’ by Cicero in On Moral Ends 1.29–72 reflects a position with which Philodemus would have agreed and its source was perhaps Philodemus himself or, more likely, Zeno (Tsouna 2001). It is the rational calculation of pleasure which guides our correct moral choices, and the calculus is stressed in both Torquatus’ account (1.32–33) and [On Choices and Avoidances] (IV 10–VI 21, etc., Indelli-Tsouna 1995; see Tsouna 2007: 13–31 for a fine overview of Philodemus’ ethical position).
We make moral errors, therefore, by failing to calculate pleasures and pains correctly in making moral choices, which happens when we do not keep in mind ‘the most important things’ (ta kuriôtata) or rules of Epicureanism. Philodemus thinks it important not only to understand, but also to memorize the cardinal tenets, which help us to measure our choices and avoidances by the naturally given ends, not merely—as some Epicureans held—because knowing the cardinal tenets lends tranquillity of mind ([On Choices and Avoidances] XI 7–20). He also argues, in Pros tous […], that easily memorized, abbreviated formulations of the cardinal maxims are useful, and he gives us (IV 9–14) the pithiest formulation of Epicurean tenets, the ‘Fourfold Drug’ (tetrapharmakos logos): ‘god is not fearsome, death not frightening, the good easily got, the bad easily endured’. The reader is advised constantly to bear in mind these four tenets, which are grounded by Philodemus in various places, including in [On Choices and Avoidances], where they are called simply ‘The Four’.
Understanding the cardinal tenets of Epicureanism and keeping them in memory will help us deliberate, but deliberation may still be inhibited by our desires, which must therefore be well understood by us, together with their causes. Desires may arise in us and may affect us in different ways, depending on our physical and mental constitution and on our situation in life. In many cases, we fail to take into account the sources of our desires when we make moral choices, not recognizing, for example, that the desire for great wealth or reputation is ‘empty’ or vain ([On Choices and Avoidances] V-VI). We may also fail to perform the hedonic calculus correctly due to a false assignment of value to goods, considering reputation or wealth, for example, great goods which cause us pain when we are denied them. Such failures will occur especially when we suffer from vices of character and when we are in the grip of the passions, and Philodemus gives profound treatments of both these subjects.
184.108.40.206.2 Types of character
The treatment of character-types (as in some of the books of On Vices) is in part a continuation of Peripatetic treatises (such descriptions are included, for example, in Aristotle’s Ethics and Rhetoric, the Aristotelian books on Virtues and Vices and Physiognomics), and Theophrastus’ chapter on the obsequious man (Characters 5) is quoted in extenso in On Flattery, while a letter On the Relief of Arrogance by Aristo (very probably the third century Peripatetic scholarch from Ceos, despite renewed arguments that he was rather Aristo of Chius, the Stoic) is summarized in the final fourteen columns of On Arrogance. It appears that Philodemus may have been preceded in his use of character sketches by another Epicurean, perhaps a contemporary of Philodemus, Nicasicrates of Rhodes, with whom he takes issue in various places.
There is little doubt that the vices treated by Philodemus were very widespread in the late Roman Republic, and it is likely that his work was in part meant to instruct those who had to live in that society about the alternative provided by Epicureanism. Perhaps Philodemus also intended to provide the poetically minded friends to whom the work was addressed with instruction on how to manage their own relations with others, including their patrons and members of their philosophically oriented discussion groups, and with raw material, in the form of character descriptions and analyses, for their poetry. Sider 1997: 21 notes that Horace, who was an associate of the four addressees of On Vices, says (Ars Poetica 438–452) that, if one read him one’s verses, Quintilius (one of the four) would not flatter, but offer honest criticism as a true friend would do, acting like Aristarchus and not saying: ‘Why should I offend my friend over trifles?’. Such a connection between criticism and friendship is not a standard topic of Hellenistic literary criticism, but it is central to Philodemus’ ethical works, where it appears as the art of frank criticism.
Most of all, the subjects treated in these books serve the needs of a philosophical community and its leader, who must deal with characters such as the various kinds of flatterers or lovers of flattery or the manifold arrogant types among its members, hangers-on and their families, preventing them from harming the cohesion and mission of the community, while warding off misunderstandings of the sage as arrogant or sycophantic himself. Philosophy provides the cure for the vices, but this cure is effected in the context of the Epicurean community, with its physician/sage leader and the practice of frank criticism among all its members.
220.127.116.11.3 Discourse within the school
On Frank Criticism is a kind of manual of frankness, which it treats as a technical expertise of how to criticize other members of the Epicurean community. The expert practitioner of this art is the Epicurean sage, the community’s leader, who must look at the errors in the behavior of his companions, including other sages and even himself, diagnose the moral errors and circumstances which led to that behavior, and know what therapy to apply. The poor, the rich, the old, and women, among others, are all prone to particular misconceptions and behaviors which hinder their progress in philosophy and toward the happy life; they are also liable to react in particular ways to therapy. Therefore the sage must know when to criticize mildly or harshly or even give the impression of being angry. In addition, the other members of the community must learn to criticize themselves and one another, bringing complaints to one another and to the sage.
On Conversation deals with technical precepts about silence and speaking, recognizing the power of silence, the importance of contemplation, and the art of knowing when and to whom one should speak or keep silent. What little we have of On Gratitude deals with the gratitude which is properly given to one’s teacher and the relation between gratitude and friendship. This theme ties in with the share of money one receives in gratitude from one’s philosophical companions in exchange for philosophical discourses, which Philodemus in the treatise on household management from On Vices says is the best source of income for a philosopher (PHerc. 1424.23.23; for the treatise on household management, see now Tsouna 2012).
18.104.22.168.4 On Anger and On Death IV
Epicurus stresses that anger is not compatible with the blessed life of the gods (Ep. Herodot. 77), who are neither won over by our deserving deeds nor infected by anger (Lucretius 2.646–51); the latter is one of the false opinions which harm our happiness by corrupting our relation to the gods (Lucretius 6.68–79). Seneca cites Epicurus as saying that “immoderate anger gives rise to madness” (Ep. Mor. 18.12=fr. 484 Usener), and he explains, from his own Stoic point of view, that it is not the gravity of the cause, but rather the kind of soul it affects, that determines whether sparks grow into the flame of anger; Philodemus would agree, at least as regards uncontrollable rage.
Philodemus conceives of the passions as both affective, involving the condition of both body and soul, and cognitive, requiring judgments such as, in the case of anger, that someone has harmed one intentionally and severely and that one is justified in one’s desire for revenge at that harm. Epicurus qualified the anger that brings on madness as ‘immoderate’, leaving open the possibility that there might be a ‘moderate’ anger which is less harmful. Though he agrees with Epicurus that the gods, who should be our ethical role models, are untouched by anger (Piet. 1147 ff. Obbink), it is, according to Philodemus, natural for us human beings to feel anger and desire revenge at certain harms or slights. However, it is harmful to us to feel an unnatural anger, one which is incommensurate with the harm we actually suffered at someone’s hands.
This distinction between the natural ‘bite’ or pang of anger and the destructive fury of unnatural anger is central to Philodemus’ understanding of anger. Some of us have a disposition (diathesis) that is ‘irascible’ and are prone to feel anger where others might not be so roused. Such a disposition is the result of false opinions regarding the importance of being injured or slighted, the effect these should have on our well-being, and the desirability or even pleasurability of taking revenge. ‘Empty’ (kenê) anger, Philodemus says, is an evil: it arises from a wholly bad disposition and it has bad consequences; on the other hand, ‘natural’ anger is not an evil: it may indeed ‘bite’, but its bite is very brief (37.46–38.11, ed. Indelli 1988). Whether or not it was original with him, Philodemus’ distinction between ‘natural’ and ‘empty’ anger is evidently based on Epicurus’ basic distinction of ‘natural’ and ‘empty’ desires, the latter depending on empty beliefs (KD 29, 30). Natural anger affects one who reasons correctly, based on correct beliefs about goods, evils, and the natural goal; empty anger affects those who, due to their false opinions on these matters, have an irascible disposition and feel slights against them more vehemently and lastingly, desiring what they believe will be a sweet revenge.
The philosopher is a physician of the soul, and Philodemus insists that it is not impossible to escape the diseases of the soul, if we can avoid ‘false’ or ‘empty’ belief about the type and magnitude of evils (6.8 ff.). Where the preserved portion of the treatise picks up (1.6 ff.), Philodemus is arguing against Timasagoras, apparently an Epicurean who disagreed with Philodemus and Zeno on various ethical questions. Timasagoras apparently argued that anger was always and entirely bad, and that it forced itself on its victims as a kind of necessity which one was powerless to fight or to treat in others. He seems to have insisted that only rational argument could be used, in an effort to alter false opinions before anger strikes, discounting the usefulness of speeches harshly denouncing anger: the evils of anger are so evident to all that it is ‘nonsensical’ to think that criticizing it does any good (1.9–27). Further, Timasagoras thought that those in the throes of anger are incapable of reasoning on the basis of observed facts about their passions (anepilogistous 7.8–9).
Philodemus, for his part, agrees with Bion the Cynic and Chrysippus, who relied on denunciations of anger, while criticizing them as neglecting to do much more than this to treat it. Although physicians tell their patients the truth about the gravity of their illness and its consequences, the patients often do not fully grasp these strictures and their danger—sometimes entirely, sometimes by faulty reasoning—and thus neglect to avoid them, thinking them not very serious. But when these evils are ‘placed before their eyes’, patients are rendered ready to seek treatment (4.4 ff.; on Philodemus’ methods of treatment, see Tsouna 2009). Indeed, this section of the text is followed by a lengthy catalogue (8.20–31.24), perhaps borrowing from Bion’s On Anger and Chrysippus’ Therapeutic On Passions, of the evils caused by anger for those who experience it, those on whom the lash of anger’s revenge falls, and others, family, friends, and society.
One place where anger has negative consequences is in Epicurean communities, where it can obstruct students’ progress in philosophy and interfere with the practice of frank criticism which is central to the interactions between members. If students are irascible, they will not tolerate the kind of frank criticism meted out to them by their companions and teachers (cf. 36.24–5): they will take it as a slight and go into a rage. In fact, the teacher’s use of harsh reproof when he judges that the student’s resistance requires such an approach, may even give the mistaken impression that the teacher himself is irascible and that the anger he expresses is immoderate and harmful. The last part of Philodemus’ treatise (34.16 ff.) deals precisely with the question of whether the sage, whose life is meant to emulate that of the blessed gods, is subject to anger. While his critique of anger and its consequences has generally assumed that these are bad, Philodemus here concentrates on the distinction between natural and empty anger. Natural anger is unavoidable and not harmful; it may even be helpful in certain situations (37.20 ff.). Philodemus argues against Nicasicrates (37.5) and other Epicureans that the sage is subject only to natural, and never to empty anger. This is a consequence of the sage’s correct understanding of what is to be chosen or avoided and his ability to reason correctly about the passions and their consequences.
Philodemus here distinguishes the two kinds of anger by different terms, ‘anger’ (orgê) for the mild and natural kind, ‘rage’ (thumos) for the unnatural and destructive kind. While it appears that his opponents pointed to passages where the first generation of Epicureans spoke of the sage as subject to thumos, Philodemus says that there are two different naturally-acquired, and therefore criterial, preconceptions (or ‘anticipations’, prolêpseis), one more general and one more precise (45.2). Thus, when Epicurus or Metrodorus spoke of the thumos of the sage, they used the term according to the broader conception and should be interpreted as saying that the sage was subject to natural anger or orgê. Very difficult and controversial is the interpretation of the reasonings applied to experience (epilogismoi, see Section 22.214.171.124) used by his Epicurean opponents to show that the sage will feel thumos and their rebuttal by Philodemus (cf. Delattre 2009).
Philodemus’ approach to anger is especially close to his treatment of the fear of death in On Death IV (PHerc. 1050, ed. Henry 2009). As the text becomes legible for us, Philodemus is apparently arguing traditional Epicurean points to show why death is not to be feared, including: we do not have reason to fear being dead nor will we lack good things while we are dead, as we lack all sensation, and all good and bad is found in sensation (1–2); we ought not to worry, as does the Stoic Apollophanes, that the sundering of the union of body and soul will necessarily be excruciating for us, since the myriad pores in our skins provide an easy exit for the fine atoms of the soul (7); and an early death is not bad, even if one has achieved perfect happiness in life, as did Epicurus’ student Pythocles, since such a life is perfect at every point and would not be improved by its extension (12–17).
From this point on, however, Philodemus’ treatise takes a more distinctive tack. As in On Anger, here too he is at pains to recognize that we feel a ‘natural bite’ or pang in certain circumstances. In this section of the book, Philodemus goes through a number of things often alleged as causes of the reluctance or fear to die. He begins with the idea that it is natural for one who was making progress in philosophy to feel a stab of pain that he should die before he could reach perfect happiness (17.32 ff.). Yet such a person also enjoys certain consolations, such as the knowledge that his example may convince others to make progress in philosophy; surely, he will also feel joy in the goods philosophy has given him already. A sage who has achieved perfect happiness will lose nothing by having it cut short, while a fool would not gain anything from a longer life. In the following paragraphs Philodemus continues this contrast between those fears which cause a ‘natural pang’ and are viewed with ‘sympathy’ (20.2–3) and those which are rejected as ‘irrational’, looking at their justification in the context of a good or a bad life. Thus, the fear that one’s enemies will gloat over one’s death is vain (mataion, often synonymous with ‘empty’) and inexcusable (20.4–5), since neither the good man nor the bad will have any inkling of such rejoicing once dead, as they will have no sensation, and the good man’s demise will hardly be the object of gloating from people of sense, whose opinion he should alone respect. Similarly (21), it is ‘insane’ to gloat over and ridicule the dead, because if they were bad, they are now free of their evil, and if good, they are no worse off now. It is also vain to be pained at the thought of dying leaving no children behind (22–4): one will be remembered by friends, especially philosophical ones, one’s name will be worn by others in the course of future time, and one’s children may not be as worthwhile custodians of one’s legacy as one’s friends.
By contrast, leaving behind dependents who would now have no support in the midst of life’s catastrophes and would be in want of the necessities of life does cause a ‘very natural bite’ and stirs tears in the sensible man (25.1 ff.). But this pain will not be ‘great’, since such a man’s dependents will feel good about his life and accomplishments, as will he himself; he will plan for the care of his dependents and appoint guardians for them. If one is so foolish as not to do this, it is still foolish to worry about others’ misfortunes which would occur after one has left one’s own behind. The thought of dying in a foreign country, especially if one leaves behind close relatives at home, causes a ‘natural bite’ even to thinking men. But this should be only a ‘prick’, not a great pain (25.37 ff.). On the other hand, Philodemus shows no sympathy with various other fears, such as dying in one’s bed rather than in battle, dying while in poor physical condition, or having only a modest funeral. To this list is added the fear of dying at sea: this is not worse than any other death, and what happens to one’s body is not worse at sea than elsewhere. It is how one lives one’s life that matters, not the manner of one’s death: if one dies at sea in a battle worthy of memory by future generations, or in search of learning, or for one’s friends’ sake, these are all worthwhile; but if one has spent one’s life at sea in search of mercantile profit, that is pitiable (32.31 ff.). The same considerations apply to those sentenced to death, whether deservedly or undeservedly (33.37 ff.), and to those pained at the prospect of not being remembered after their death (35.34 ff.).
It is this thought that the important thing is how one lives, rather than that or how one dies, that dominates Philodemus’ concluding paragraphs (37.18 ff.). In contrast to Lucretius’ brilliant conclusion (3.894–1094), where an emotional funeral speaker’s points are dismissed by Epicurean argument, Philodemus has expressed sympathy for those who have lived according to rational principles and yet, being human, are affected by certain thoughts about death. His own brilliant peroration concludes with praise of such a life. To be snatched away by death as by something unexpected and strange is stupid: “we all live in a city with no fortification against death”, which has many approaches to us. The sensible person, having received what suffices for a happy life, will live “laid out in a burial shroud” and ready to face death; the dronelike person gives no thought to the mortality and evanescence of his constitution. Even if a sensible person forgets his mortality for a time, he can, when death approaches, quickly remember the condition of his life and face death unperturbedly.
126.96.36.199.5 The Epicurean evaluation of the liberal arts
In his treatment of the life of Epicureans and their communities, Philodemus also addresses claims by disciplines in competition with philosophy for the attention of students and the conduct of adult life. Epicurus and his followers were well known in antiquity for their rejection of the Greek cultural or musical education (paideia)—generally thought to consist in the ‘liberal arts’, especially grammar (the study of language, poetry, and prose), rhetoric, music—as an institution which at best distracted one from philosophy, the only route to happiness, and at worst instilled in the young false notions, such as those of the gods of poetry, and bad patterns of thought or dispositions. Epicurus addressed a young man who had just come to study philosophy with him accordingly: “I call you blessed, Apelles, because you have set out for philosophy undefiled by any paideia” (Athenaeus, Deipnosophistae 13.588A = fr. 117 Usener 1887).
Paideia involved the learning of arts or technical disciplines, technai, considered indispensable to leading a life worthy of a free man. For Epicurus, philosophy was the only discipline considered indispensable to a worthwhile life and only insofar as the study of nature enabled philosophers to care for their soul by casting out suffering on account of false assumptions about the world and enabling them to enjoy undefiled pleasures (Ep. Men. 122, KD 12; Porphyry, Ad Marcellam 31 = fr. 221 Usener). Accordingly, we hear mostly about the hostility of Epicurus and his direct pupils to other disciplines, for instance, that Metrodorus said that one should freely admit not knowing “on whose side Hector was” or any of Homer’s verses (Plutarch, That it is Impossible to Live a Pleasant Life following Epicurus 1094D = Metrodorus, On Poems I, fr. 24 Körte), or that Epicurus is said to have prescribed that the sage will not orate before festival gatherings (D.L. 10.120a = fr. 572 Usener). Yet in the same passage we hear that the sage will leave writings behind (fr. 566 Usener) and will be the only one who can converse correctly about music and poetry, though he will not devote himself to composing poetry (fr. 568 Usener, where what is said about writing poetry is, however, obscure and disputed: see, e.g., Asmis 1995: 22, 32 f. and Sider 1995: 35 f.).
It is possible that Epicurus explained his position on the sage’s relation to the ‘liberal arts’ and their practice in a work such as On Modes of Life, but no such explanations explicitly quoted from him have come down to us. Of Philodemus, on the other hand, we have a large number of books in which the philosopher’s use or avoidance of certain aspects of technical disciplines are made a central feature of the conduct of an Epicurean life. These works include the fourth and apparently last book On Music (PHerc. 1497), a number of books On Rhetoric (the main pieces are: Book 1, PHerc. 1427; Book 2, PHerc. 1674 and 1672, two copies of the text, the former beginning earlier and the latter continuing after the former ends; Book 3, PHerc. 1506 and 1426, two copies of the same text; Book 4, PHerc. 1007/1673 and 1423, two copies of the same text, partially overlapping); Book 6 (see Dorandi 2018), PHerc. 1669; PHerc. 1004, a lengthy book whose number is not clear, but may be Book 7; Book 8, PHerc. 1015+832, one roll split into top and bottom parts); and five books On Poems (Book 1, cf. Janko 2000; Book 2, PHerc. 994+1676; Book 3, PHerc. 1087 and 1403; Book 4, PHerc. 207; Book 5, PHerc. 1425 and 1538, two copies of the same text).
188.8.131.52.6 The uses and the dangers of expertises
Sextus Empiricus says that the Epicureans attacked the liberal arts because they “contributed nothing to the perfection of wisdom” (M 1.1). He incorporates Epicurean critiques—for which he appears to have used Epicurean sources including, perhaps, Zeno of Sidon and even Philodemus himself—into his own attacks on the liberal arts. Sextus’ attacks routinely distinguish between highly technical, theoretically oriented versions of the arts and lower, more practical versions: ‘higher grammar’ treats the nature of linguistic elements and studies the interpretation and judgment of poetry and prose, while ‘lower grammar’ or ‘grammatistic’ deals with the simple art of reading and writing (1.44–5); a technical art of music is the science of melodies, tones, rhythms, etc., not the simple experience of music (6.1–4). It is only the higher versions of the arts that Sextus attacks, while the lower versions he considers ‘useful for life’.
In his On Household Management, Philodemus says that many arts have both non-technical and more technical forms. Thus, of baking and cooking there is a non-technical skill, which anyone can learn as useful for providing sustenance, and something like that is true also of money-making; but there is also an empirical expertise (empeiria entechnos) of each of these, practiced by those who bend all their efforts to succeeding in them and, e.g., amassing and keeping as much money as possible. The Epicurean should acquire only the former of these, not the latter: he should, for example, be able to provide a living for himself, his family, and his friends, but he should not become expert at getting and keeping money and concentrate on that, which would take him away from the pursuit of philosophy and require him to place an unreasonable importance on wealth (xvi.25–39, xvii.2–40). If one takes the point of view of the Epicurean sage, focused on philosophy, one will keep money-making and all other arts in their proper place, learning as much of them as is necessary to secure the philosophical life and even adding incremental enjoyments to it, while avoiding complex bodies of technical rules and the driven, professional pursuit of any art.
Philodemus defines the common Greek conception of technê as “a state or disposition arising from observation of certain common and elementary things extending through many particular cases, which grasps something and which accomplishes something of such a sort that none of those who have not learnt it can do in a similar way, whether fixedly and firmly or conjecturally” (Rhet. 2a, PHerc. 1674.xxxviii.2–18 Longo). An artisan or expert, therefore, must have general rules which he can apply to particular cases in order to produce results with a better rate of success than could otherwise be achieved. Yet any technê worth an Epicurean’s attention could have only a small body of rules, even if another technê dealing with similar subject matter had many rules.
The same distinction underpins Lucretius’ account of the history of culture. Early conceptions of value were reversed as humans became more sophisticated; so, bronze was originally valued higher than gold, as it was more useful, but gold came to be prized more highly (5.1241 ff.). Men learned from the birds how to sing and please the ear; they enjoyed themselves after their rustic picnics, pleasing their bodies without much effort when they began to dance without a regulated rhythm (numerus), which made them smile and laugh and helped keep them awake. Now too, guards keep awake in this way, and they have learned to respect regular rhythms, but they do not enjoy themselves any more than did their primitive ancestors (5.1379 ff.). In general, Lucretius says, human labor is vain and the development of the arts led to misery and war (5.1430 ff.).
These Epicurean principles also determine Philodemus’ attitude to the arts. He thinks that a certain harmless enjoyment can be got from arts such as music and poetry, so long as one acquires only a simple knowledge of them, avoiding the complex technologies developed by the professional practitioners of those arts. The complex rules, he thinks, are useless and even counterproductive, being based on arbitrary decrees (themata) laid down by the professionals.
In the case of music, Philodemus argues that one ought not to practice assiduously to become a proficient performer, distracting oneself from the needful pursuit of philosophy, when the innocent enjoyment which is all the benefit that can be got from music is available to anyone who just listens to the performances available to the public (Mus. 4, col. 151.8–239 Delattre = PHerc. 1497.37). The claims of music theorists such as Damon of Oia and Diogenes of Babylon that music has a crucial role in soothing the passions of adults and in forming the character of the young, he dismisses: music as tone, melody, rhythm, affects only the irrational ear, while any effect on character or behavior must come from the words or poetry in songs, which is alone capable of affecting our reason (e.g., 146.30–147.11 = PHerc. 1497.32–3; cf. Sextus, M 6.19 ff.).
As for poetry, Philodemus thinks that, while there is no natural criterion of good verse, there are ‘conceptions’ (ennoiai, here, apparently the same as prolêpseis) of good and bad verse, which allow a universal judgment (koinê krisis) of poetry based on criteria which exist, whether or not one recognizes them. Such poetry does not require detailed analyses or rules, attention to which spoils one’s ability to judge according to the common conceptions, so treatises on poetry should concentrate on giving general principles which allow the expression of the preconceptions of the good poem (Poem. 5, xxx.25–33 Mangoni). For poetry the aims should be to imitate the diction which also teaches useful things and to have a content which is between what wise and vulgar people would say (Poem. 5, xxv.30–xxvi.20, cf. Janko 2000: 131 and n. 1). After all, the sage will rather express what is crucially useful for life in philosophical prose, while poetry will be a pleasant adjunct or pastime. This will apply to both writing and reading, neither of which should require much study or effort, if it is not to be destructive of the philosophical life.
The best way for the Epicurean to earn a living is to share his philosophical discourses with those who are able to understand them, and from them to receive gifts of thanks and veneration, as Epicurus did. These discourses should be “truthful, free of competition, and, in brief, serene, since earning one’s living by sophistic or competitive speeches is no better than doing so by demagogic or sycophantic ones” (On Household Management xxiii.22–36). In his books on Rhetoric, Philodemus consistently attacks both the art and the practice of political and forensic oratory: these do not qualify as arts and their practice is destructive of happiness. He insists that there can be no expert method or science of consistently persuading crowds. There is, instead, the Epicurean technê of ‘frank criticism’, which is practiced between individuals in an Epicurean community.
Now, Philodemus thinks that, unlike political and forensic oratory, ‘sophistic’ is a true technê, recognized as such by the early Epicureans (e.g., Rhet. 2a, PHerc. 1674 xxxvii.10–16 Longo [cf. Blank 2003: 73]), “an expertise of composing discourses and making displays”, but he does not think that the Epicurean should give speeches at public assemblies or waste his time in the schools of the sophists learning tricks that could only engender distrust in juries or assemblies. The ‘sophistic’ rhetoric he grants technical status has method enough to qualify it as such, “but not much of it, just as poetics does not either” (Rhet. 2b, PHerc. 1672 xxii.29–39 Longo): since there is one naturally beautiful kind of discourse, one should ignore the kind of discourse composed according to arbitrary themata (Rhet. 4, PHerc. 1007/1673 vii.6–14, p. I 151 Sudhaus). Further, a good speech of praise, the goal of the sophistic display speaker, must praise qualities that are truly praiseworthy and actually possessed by the subject of praise, but knowledge of such things is common property, not something learnt in the rhetorical schools (xla.1–24, p. I 220–1 Sudhaus). Sophistic rhetoric, the only kind worth considering a technê, should thus be added to the arts that rely on the kind of understanding available to rational persons in common, rather than on rules invented by its practitioners (cf. Blank 1995 and 2009a).
We have two books of Philodemus’ work On the Gods. In Book I Philodemus inveighs against the popular conception of divinity, with its jealous, lascivious, capricious, punishing gods. In agreement with Epicurus and Lucretius he argues that such false assumptions about the gods, like the fear of death, make us miserable. Book III deals with various questions about the gods, including their location, aspects of their lives such as their mode of nourishment, respiration, sleep, and the fact that they speak Greek. He argues against the Stoics that, while the gods have foreknowledge of the future, omniscience, and omnipotence, they remain absolutely aloof from human affairs, as any interference in our world would spoil their perfectly carefree, toil-free, happy lives.
In his book On Piety, Philodemus defends the Epicureans against accusations of atheism, giving examples from the writings of Epicurus and Metrodorus to prove their belief in the gods’ immortality and their encouragement of Epicureans to participate in the ordinary cult observance of the gods. Epicureans have good reasons to uphold belief in divinity, not only on civic grounds, but also because a proper understanding of the gods gives us models of perfect happiness that we can emulate. In promotion of the proper understanding of the divine, Philodemus gives an extended critique of the distortions promulgated in poetry and in other philosophers’ works (on Philodemus’ theology, see now Essler 2011).
184.108.40.206 Biographical and other Historical Works
The only book of Philodemus cited in extant ancient literature is his Collection of the Philosophers, the tenth book of which is Diogenes Laertius’ source (10.3) for the statement that Epicurus’ three brothers, Neocles, Chairedemos, and Aristoboulos, did philosophy together with him (sunephilosophoun). The Herculaneum library has given us fragmentary remains of a number of works on the history of various schools, particularly one (called by earlier editors the Index Academicorum) on the Platonic Academy, from Plato to Aristos of Ascalon, and another on the Stoa, from Zeno to Panaetius (the Index Stoicorum), and it is possible that they, along with other, more fragmentary books, belonged to the Collection. These books contain numerous historical and biographical anecdotes along with chronological indications, many from Apollodorus’ Chronicle, and fit well alongside the genre of philosophical histories sometimes referred to as ‘Successions’ (diadochai) of philosophers (see Arrighetti 2003). Philodemus even refers to his own relations with some of the later Academics, especially Antiochus of Ascalon (see Dorandi 1990b).
As we have seen (Section 220.127.116.11.3), the day-to-day conduct of an Epicurean community was a central topic of his works. Accordingly, special place in Philodemus’ oeuvre is reserved for works about the Epicurean school itself, dealing with the example set by its founder and by certain of his students. The tenth book of the Collection, which like Diogenes Laertius’ own tenth book apparently dealt with Epicurus, may well have been the culmination of Philodemus’ historical work and was only one of a host of books about their own school written by Epicureans. Philodemus too wrote other books on the school. In his two books On Epicurus (PHerc. 1232 and 1289; see Section 18.104.22.168.1), he outlined Epicurus’ life and cited letters of Epicurus and his friends to show the school’s founder as a model of the philosophical life. In another book, perhaps titled something like Courses (pragmateiai) of Epicurean Memoirs (PHerc. 1418, also 310 and perhaps others), Philodemus portrays a number of early Epicureans by means of extracts of letters of the school’s founders (see Arrighetti 2003).
Epicureans were largely excluded from the philosophical project of synthesizing Academic, Peripatetic, and Stoic doctrines which came to prominence beginning in Philodemus’ own day. The Epicureans themselves had a reputation for doctrinal orthodoxy and for attributing any or all of their true statements to one or more of the school’s founders (cf. Numenius, On the Academics’ betrayal of Plato, fr. 24.22–36 = Eusebius, Praeparatio Evangelica 14.5.3 and Seneca, Letters to Lucilius 33.2–4). A number of later Epicureans relied almost exclusively on the earliest Epicurean texts, never mentioning those of later generations. This is most famously the case for Philodemus’ contemporary, Lucretius, but also for the second century CE Epicurean Diogenes of Oenoanda. The same tendency can be seen in other philosophers, as well: Seneca cites sayings of Epicurus, on the grounds that the truth is common property, while the Academic Plutarch attacks texts of the first-generation Epicurean Colotes. Philodemus’ own texts, however, along with those of Demetrius of Laconia and Polystratus, show that there was indeed a good deal of infighting among members of the school, at least after its first generation, much of it centered on differing interpretations of the founders’ doctrines.
Diogenes Laertius 10.3’s citation of Book 10 of the Collection of the Philosophers is the only explicit mention of a philosophical work of Philodemus among ancient authors. Close correspondence between some of the last part of On Piety and Cicero’s On the Nature of the Gods 1.25–41 may indicate that Cicero used Philodemus’ book as a source, or that the two had a common source, perhaps Zeno of Sidon. Cicero may also have used contemporary Epicurean sources for the views put by Epicurean surrogates in some of his other works: his character ‘Cicero’ mentions his (or Torquatus’) friends Siro and Philodemus as authorities to whom Torquatus could appeal for help against the attack made on Epicurean ethics by ‘Cicero’ (On Moral Ends 2.119). The approach to the liberal arts signaled by Sextus Empiricus in M 1–6 as characteristic of ‘the Epicureans’ is very similar to what we see in Philodemus’ works, as explained above (Section 22.214.171.124.5); Philodemus and/or Zeno probably served as Sextus’ sources for this material.
Once the philosophical works of Philodemus began to be edited and to come to the attention of scholars in the later 19th century, his influence begins to be seen, albeit sporadically. C. S. Peirce, who was impressed by Epicurean philosophy, especially the clinamen or ‘swerve’, studied Philodemus’ On Methods of Inference together with his student Allan Marquand, whose Ph.D. thesis included the first English translation of the book. It was apparently from Philodemus that Peirce took the term ‘semiosis’ in his characerization of semiotics as ‘the doctrine of the essential nature and fundamental varieties of semiosis’ (cf. Fisch  1986 and Deledalle 2001).
Recently, scholars of early Christianity have become interested in the ways Epicureans held their school together, especially Epicurus’ use of letters, many of which explained points of doctrine and served as epitomes of his major works. These scholars have related Philodemus’ remarks on the conduct of an Epicurean school and the relations between more advanced and less experienced members, especially in his book On Frank Criticism, to the work of the Apostle Paul and his pastoral Epistles (cf. Glad 2004).
The number of Philodemus’ philosophical books and the complexities of their preservation in papyri with multiple parts and, at times, in multiple copies, makes it impractical to give a complete list here. Luckily, there are now several fairly complete bibliographies online, to which the reader is referred below, with links. What follows here are notes intended to orient further reading on both general and particular topics, and a list of works referred to in the present article.
General accounts of Philodemus are given by Gigante 1995, Erler 1994 and, most recently, Longo Auricchio et al. 2011. All these works discuss Philodemus’ life and list his works, with extensive bibliography.
In the secondary literature, references to texts of Herculaneum papyri are usually given in terms of the inventory number, then column or fragment number, then line number (e.g., PHerc. 1497.21.14; often, columns have Roman numerals). Older publications will refer to the volume and page number of the engraved facsimile, e.g., V(olumina) H(erculanensia)2 XII 67. Many publications give volume and page numbers of a standard late-19th or early 20th century edition, as for Sudhaus 1892–6 and Jensen 1907 and 1911.
Introductions to the Herculaneum library are given by Gigante 1995, Capasso 1991, Delattre 2006. Del Mastro 2005 is an online database of papyri, with descriptions, bibliographies, and one image of the writing of each papyrus), building on the prior descriptions and bibliography of Gigante 1979 and its bibliographical supplements in Capasso 1989 and Del Mastro 2000. Travaglione 2008 (cf. Del Mastro 2010) provides a comprehensive listing of the papyri and their actual condition.
For the study of the bibliological and palaeographical aspects of the Herculaneum papyri, Cavallo 1983 is fundamental, along with Capasso 1991 and Del Mastro 2014. Studies useful for studying the grammar and orthography of Philodemus papyri are found in a number of the introductions to recent editions, especially Obbink 1996 and Janko 2000, in many articles in Cronache Ercolanesi, as well as in Crönert 1903. There are also special lexica: Vooijs 1934, Vooijs-van Krevelen 1941, and Usener 1977.
The first publications of some edited texts of Herculaneum papyri were in the series Herculanensium Voluminum quae supersunt. Tomus I-XI, Naples: Regia Typographia 1793–1855, the so-called ‘Collectio prima’ (VH). These were followed by publications in two volumes of some of the drawings made for William Hayter in Naples between 1802 and 1806: Herculanensium Voluminum Pars Prima, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1824 and Pars Secunda, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1825. The drawings present in the Officina dei Papiri in 1806, when Hayter took them away, and now kept in Oxford’s Bodleian Library, are known as the O disegni; they can be viewed in digital photographs via the website of the Friends of Herculaneum Society (see Other Internet Resources: Online Texts, below). These drawings were replaced in Naples with new drawings, and others were made as new papyri were opened (’N disegni’, dating from post-1806; earlier drawings of PHerc. 1008, 1424, 1674, 1675 which were in the hands of the Greek scholar Pasquale Baffi at the time of his execution for participation in the Parthenopean Revolution of 1799, still exist in Naples, alongside those made later of the same papyri). The majority of the drawings kept in Naples were engraved and published in the series Herculanensium Voluminum quae supersunt. Collectio altera, Naples: Museum Publicum 1862–76 (VH2), and it was in those volumes that most of the texts became known to scholars; only one volume was published of a third collection, Herculanensium Voluminum quae supersunt. Collectio tertia, Milan: Hoepli 1914.
With the publication of drawings of the texts, scholars outside Naples began to study and edit them. A number of the texts from the late 19th and early 20th centuries remain standard references, but as they were made primarily on the basis of the disegni, with only sporadic consultation of the papyri themselves, they must now be redone. In some cases, new editions of parts of these texts have been and continue to be published, e.g., Longo Auricchio 1977 (Rhetoric I-II), Ranocchia 2007 (On Arrogance cols. 10–24).
Since 1970 the International Center for the Study of the Herculaneum Papyri (CISPE), founded by Marcello Gigante, has published a journal, Cronache Ercolanesi (CErc), dedicated to studies of Herculaneum, including studies of Philodemean philosophy and editions of texts. The ‘Notiziario’ at the back of each annual issue gives a list of scholars working on editions of individual papyri, so that scholars interested in particular texts may contact those engaged in editing them. CISPE also sponsors a series of editions, La scuola di Epicuro, now up to 19 volumes (plus 5 ‘supplements’ containing Epicurean texts not from Herculaneum). These are often the most recent and authoritative editions of their texts, with Italian translation and commentary. Since the 1990s a team of scholars has been working, originally with the support of the National Endowment for the Humanities, to publish Philodemus’ works on music, rhetoric, and poetics; the first volume in this series is Janko 2000. The newest editions often follow the helpful format for Herculaneum texts devised by Obbink 1996, giving the papyrus text in columnar format and textual apparatus on the left-hand (verso) side of each opening, while the right-hand (recto) side gives the text in continuous lines and an English translation. Recent editions of Philodemus’ books include translations into a modern European language; French translations of a number of his books are found in Delattre and Pigeaud, eds., 2010.
- Allen, J., 2001, Inference from Signs: Ancient Debates about the Nature of Evidence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Arrighetti, G., 2003, ‘Filodemo biografo dei filosofi e le forme dell’erudizione’, Cronache Ercolanesi, 33: 13–30.
- Asmis, E., 1984, Epicurus’ Scientific Method, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 1990, ‘Philodemus’ Epicureanism’, in W. Haase and H. Temporini (eds.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt II, 36(4): 2369–2406, Berlin-New York: De Gruyter.
- –––, 1995, ‘Epicurean Semiotics’, in Manetti, G., ed., Knowledge through Signs: Ancient Semiotic Theories and Practices, Turnhout: Brepols, 155–185.
- –––, 1999, ‘Epicurean epistemology’, in K. Algra et al., The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 260–294.
- –––, 2009, ‘Epicurean empiricism’, in Warren 2009, 84–104.
- Auvray-Assayas, C. and D. Delattre, 2001, Cicéron et Philodème: La polémique en philosophie, Paris: Éditions rue d’Ulm.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The books from Herculaneum.
- A bibliography for the Herculaneum Papyri, including much about Philodemus and his works, by W. B. Henry.
- Chartes is an online database of information serving as a guide to the Herculaneum papyri. It allows one to find information about the state of each numbered piece of papyrus in the Naples collection, including the identification (if any) of the work it contains, its unrolling date(s), drawings, etc., along with a photo showing its handwriting; it also gives information and links to bibliographical items publishing or mentioning each papyrus.
- The T(hesaurus) H(erculanensium) V(oluminum) Project, hosts digitized versions of an increasing number of texts of Herculaneum papyri. Designed for those who have suggestions for emendations and interpretation of the texts, the site enters the best texts available, displayed in the columnar format of the papyrus, and allows users to suggest improvements.
- Philodemus Translation Project, a site hosted by the Classics Department of UCLA, with images and explanations of some papyri of Philodemus’ Rhetoric.
- Officina dei Papiri Ercolanesi, ‘Marcello Gigante’, hosted by Biblioteca Nazionale di Napoli ‘Vittorio Emmanuele III’ webpages for the section of the Library in which the papyri are conserved and studied. Explanatory materials on the page I Papiri Ercolanesi.
- Würzburger Zentrum für Epikureismusforschung, a site containing many resources for the study of ancient Epicureanism, including Philodemus and the papyri of his works.
The author would like to thank Catherine Atherton for her advice in editing this article and for supplying material on Philodemus’ On Signs from her own ongoing work on that text.