Notes to The Normativity of Meaning and Content

1. Glüer & Wikforss (2009) carves out (part of) the same terrain in a slightly different, purely systematic way, treating CE and CD normativism as mutually exclusive claims implying opposite directions of metaphysical determination. The current, wider use of “ME/CE normativity” allows for the combination of ME/CE and MD/CD normativism and is entirely due to the actual shape of the debate to be outlined in this article.

2. Supervenience relations can be of many kinds. For instance, they can be one-one (equivalence relations) or many-one (“mere” supervenience relations). Some of them allow for analytic or ontological reduction, others do not. Soames (1997), for instance, distinguishes between determination by relations of necessary consequence and by relations of a priori consequence. He argues that the argument Kripke’s skeptic provides against determinate meaning facts suffers from equivocation between these two readings of determination (Soames 1997: 222ff, esp. 232). Whether supervenience is sufficient for metaphysical explanation is controversial; something stronger—often called “grounding”—might be required (see SEP article on metaphysical grounding for more on this).

3. Such principles can be of different kinds. For instance, they can be more or less holistic. According to a holistic determination principle for linguistic meaning the meanings of all the expressions of a language are determined together and by the whole of what is in \(S_B\) (cf. Pagin 1997). They can determine a single correct mapping, or effect rankings between different mappings according to some standard of “best fit” (for instance, being most “charitable” (Davidson 1973) or providing the best teleo-biological explanation (Millikan 1990; Neander 1995; Dretske 1986), thus potentially leaving an opening for indeterminacy (i.e., the possibility of more than one equally good “best” mapping).

4. There is a tradition of reading the rule-following considerations as ruling out realism about meaning/content (for instance Dummett 1959; Kripke 1982; Wright 1987b; Travis 2006; see also Hattiangadi 2007), the view that having meaning/content consists in having objective, judgment-independent conditions of truth or correctness. In this tradition, an anti-realist, epistemic conception of truth is used as the basic semantic concept in terms of which to understand meaning/content, and it is often argued that this is required precisely because there is no set of facts, no supervenience base capable of determining realist meanings/contents. Despite its partially revisionary character, semantic anti-realism does not rule out a substantive metaphysics of (anti-realist) meaning/content, however. It can be combined with either ME/CE or MD/CD normativism, or both.

This is not true, however, of radically quietist readings of Wittgenstein according to which substantive metaphysical claims about meaning/content cannot (sensibly) be made at all (cf. Boghossian 1989a). While normativism does not commit its proponents to the possibility of reducing meaning/content to the normative, or even to the possibility of an account of meaning/content in terms of substantive necessary and sufficient conditions, it does require the possibility of stating substantive necessary conditions on meaning/content (cf. McDowell 1991; 1992).

5. We shall assume that adopting meaning/content normativism is compatible with both cognitivist and non-cognitivist construals of normativity. This is not completely uncontroversial, however. For discussion see, e.g., Gibbard 1994, Wedgwood 2009. Jackson (2000) argues that non-cognitivism cannot be combined with the claim that belief is subject to constraints of rationality, where “rational” is understood as a normative term. Gibbard (2012) provides a detailed proposal for how an expressivist analysis can be applied to statements about meaning and mental content on the assumption that such statements are normative. For discussion, see, e.g., Hattiangadi 2018, Wikforss 2018.

6. Cf. von Wright 1963: 14; Schnädelbach 1990 [1992: 83ff]. In the German tradition, there is the distinction between Tun-Sollen and Sein-Sollen; see, for instance, Nicolai Hartmann’s Ethik (1925). See also G.E. Moore, “The Nature of Moral Philosophy”, in his Philosophical Studies (1922).

7. These distinctions are often conflated; cf. for instance Searle’s very influential distinction between “regulative” and “constitutive rules” (Searle 1969: chap. 2.5). Cf. also Rawls 1955; Midgley 1959; von Wright 1963; Shwayder 1965; Schnädelbach 1990; Maitra 2011. This should be avoided as regulative rules or prescriptions clearly can be constitutive for a game or other practice or activity. Cf. Pagin 1987; Glüer and Pagin 1999; Williamson 1996; 2000; Kaluziński 2019; Reiland 2020; García-Carpintero 2022.

8. Von Wright uses “prescription” in a more narrow sense; his prescriptions are “man-made”, given by an authority to subjects and come with sanctions (von Wright 1963: 7f).

9. To have a complete account of constitutive rules, we need to know what it means for such a rule \(R\) to be in force. Does this force derive from the individual, from a whole collective of individuals, or something else? If \(R\) is in force for an individual subject \(S\), what kind of relation does \(S\) have to have to \(R\)? Is \(R\) in force for \(S\) iff \(S\) follows \(R\), i.e., acts with the intention of doing what \(R\)requires? Or iff \(S\) accepts \(R\) in some weaker sense such that \(R\) is in force even for \(S\)’s intentional violations of \(R\)? Or can \(R\)’s being in force for \(S\) be conceived of in complete independence of \(S\)’s intentional states regarding \(R\)? For treatments of these questions, cf. Pagin 1987, Kaluziński 2018, Reiland 2020.

10. However, ME normativity need not be construed prescriptively. We return to this briefly below.

11. Presumably, the notion of application can be extended to other terms in a suitable way, so as to allow the normativity thesis to apply to all meaningful expressions. Whiting (2008) argues that semantic norms do not govern the act of assertion but the more basic sentential act of producing a sentence. This has the implication that merely voicing a sentence could involve the violation of a semantic norm. In Whiting (2016), however, it is argued that normativism about meaning should be treated as one with the thesis that there is a norm governing assertion (the truth norm).

12. In response to Whiting 2009, Miller 2021 suggests that once it is made explicit that the notion of semantic correctness is always relativized to a language (\(w\) applies-correctly-in-\(L\) to \(x\)) it becomes clear that statements of correctness conditions are indeed platitudes and do not have any direct normative consequences.

13. Peregrin (2012) defends the claim that (CM) entails normativism on the grounds that the concept of truth is to be analyzed in terms of correct assertability. This goes beyond the simple argument since it presupposes a controversial analysis of the concept of truth. However, notice, even if one accepts the analysis and agrees that the central notion of semantic correctness is that of warranted assertability, it remains to be shown that the latter notion is to be understood in deontic terms.

14. In this context, it is also sometimes pointed out that anti-normativists do not deny that semantic categorization, like all categorization (such as sorting objects into chairs and non-chairs) can be used to generate normative consequences—taken together with a suitable norm. For instance, it may be that we ought to speak the truth. This norm, taken together with (CM), implies that \(S\) ought to apply “green”only to green objects. However, the normative force does then not derive from the categorization itself, but from the categorization in conjunction with the relevant norm (cf. Glüer&Wikforss 2009: 469).

15. Kaplan 2020 suggests that a non-normative, “descriptive” notion of correctness is incoherent since it would need to be fully accounted for in terms of how people are disposed to behave and this, he argues, cannot be done. However, the anti-normativist is not committed to dispositionalism, and dispositionalism may fail for reasons having nothing to do with normativity (we return to this below).

16. Here are the three main entries from Merriam-Webster:

  1. true or accurate, agreeing with facts,
  2. having no errors or mistakes,
  3. proper or appropriate in a particular situation.

17. Moreover, to the extent that there is a disanalogy, wouldn’t it be due to the (constitutive) nature of the relation between meaning and correctness conditions? In which case one might wonder whether the source of the normativity isn’t precisely the constitutivity of the relation, rather than meaning itself—as you would get the same type of practical consequences whenever there is a relation like that, independently of what the relata are.

18. This discussion is also inspired by passages in the Wittgensteinian discussion of a pure sense-datum language in Philosophical Investigations, paragraphs 243–271. Here, Wittgenstein argues that such a language is not possible because there would be no distinction between what seems right to the speaker and what is right.

19. It is important to clarify that pointing to the possibility of quussing is not the same thing as raising a normativity objection and raising a normativity objection to dispositionalism will require additional considerations. Ginsborg (2011a,b & 2012) suggest some such additional considerations. According to her interpretation of Kripke, the quus-hypothesis undermines those, and only those, candidates for the role of meaning determining facts that aspire to guide, instruct, or justify a speaker’s use of their terms. Since dispositionalism has no such aspirations, it is not vulnerable to quussing (2011b: 155; for criticism, see Haddock 2012; Verheggen 2015). Nevertheless, Ginsborg maintains, dispositionalism cannot be the full story; taken just by itself, it ultimately does fall prey to a normativity objection.That is, she argues that there is a version of the normativity objection that is more fundamental than those investigated in the debate so far. In this version, the relevant norms are not supposed to provide guidance, justification, or reasons for using expressions one way or another—according to her, it is precisely these requirements that generate vulnerability to quussing. Rather, sensitivity to the relevant norms is needed to secure understanding. The pure dispositionalist, Ginsborg argues, cannot distinguish the intelligent use of language from mere parroting or other automatic behaviour. For more on this issue see section 2.2.3.

20. An alternative reading of the notion of use in accordance with meaning is “transtemporal”, and turns on the idea that there has to be consistency over time. For instance, McGinn suggests that incorrect use amounts to “using the same expression with a different meaning from that originally intended” (1984: 60). One might try to motivate the requirement on consistency over time by appealing to considerations having to do with the determination of meaning; if so, the resulting ME normativity derives from MD normativity. For a criticism of this transtemporal construal see Boghossian 1989b and Whiting 2016.

21. See Davidson 1986b where this is the proposed account of non-standard uses like malapropisms. In his argument Davidson appeals to the constitutive role of the principle of charity in interpretation (the principle is discussed in section 2.2). Reiland (forthcominga) argues that the Davidsonian individualist perspective need be rejected and that then a semantically significant notion of linguistic mistake becomes available. According to Reiland, therefore, the real debate here concerns individualist versus communitarian accounts of meaning.

22. A related argument appeals to the nature of intentions (Wright 1984, 1987a; McDowell 1991). Kripke, at one point, stresses that the relation of meaning and intention to future action is normative, not descriptive (1982: 37). What he seems to have in mind is the idea that there is an internal relation between an intention and what fulfills it: if \(S\) intends to do \(A\), only doing \(A\) will fulfill her intention (ibid: 25). Similarly, it is suggested, if \(S\) intends “green” to mean green, then \(S\) has to do certain things in order for her intention to be fulfilled. The question is whether internal relations of this sort can support prescriptivity. A relevant consideration here is the principle, mentioned above, that ought implies the possibility of violation: If the relation between intention and future action is internal there is no possibility of violation, the reasoning goes, hence the relation cannot be both internal and prescriptive. (The principle is stressed by Mulligan 1999; Railton 2000: 3f; Williamson 2000: 241; Glüer 2001; Glüer & Wikforss 2009.)

23. This suggests a wide scope reading of the deontic operator. It should be noted, though, that since Millar replaces “ought” with “is committed”, on his construal of ME normativity the relevant normative consequences are not prescriptive.

24. For example, although Gibbard (2012) construes meaning statements as having a prescriptive content he denies that this has any metaphysical implications for the nature of meaning. The slogan he defends, he writes, is “the concept of meaning is normative, whereas the property of meaning is natural”(ibid. 25). For a discussion see Wikforss (2018).

25. Hattiangadi (2007: 194–195) also suggests that the proposal of Lance & O’Leary Hawthorne leads to a regress if construed as the thesis that the prescriptive meaning sentences serve to determine meaning.

26. This raises the general question of the extent to which Kripekan normativity considerations can be isolated from the larger context within which they occur, i.e., the skeptical argument. It has been suggested that the focus on semantic correctness deflates Kripke’s arguments, leaving out his claims about justification and guidance, for instance (Kusch 2006: 62–64). Even if the skeptical conclusion can be avoided, it is held, the upshot of Kripke’s discussion is that traditional conceptions of meaning have to be rejected: Since there are no facts that serve to determine realist correctness conditions, we need to replace the realist construal of semantic correctness conditions as being judgment independent, with an anti-realist account of correctness conditions in terms of justification conditions. The normative dimension of meaning, ultimately, is to be found in the communal practice of relying on others and standing corrected (Wright 1980: 20; Hale 1997; Kusch 2006: 177–206). However, arguments have also been made in the reverse direction, suggesting that the dialectic in fact is quite different. Since proponents of the revisionary approach rely on the idea that meaning is normative, it has been suggested, their arguments do not touch the philosopher who denies that meaning is normative and rejects the move from correctness conditions to prescriptions. That is, if the normativity constraint need not be met, and if it suffices that we appeal to facts that serve to determine semantic (realist) correctness conditions, the skeptical challenge may appear less formidable and, as a result, the revisionary response less motivated (Hattiangadi 2007: 207).

27. One reason the prescriptive construal has played a central role derives from the assumed connection between normativism and anti-naturalism. It is the allegedly prescriptive character of meaning that is said to pose an insurmountable obstacle to naturalist accounts of meaning (see section 4 below). However, to the extent that normativism poses a challenge to naturalist accounts of meaning, it might also be that the axiological construal of ME normativism poses such a challenge.

28. We prefer the formulation in terms of metaphysical determination as it allows for forms of normativism construing the determination base as consisting of non-normative facts but using a normative principle of determination. Those reading Davidson as a normativist for instance might suggest that the principle of charity is precisely that: a normative principle determining meaning and content on the basis of non-normative, non-intentional facts (cf. Jackman 2004 [Other Internet Resources]).

29. Another set of questions arises from the commonly held view that normative facts themselves supervene upon or are grounded in non-normative facts. Consequently, even if meaning facts were grounded in normative facts, the latter might be located on some intermediate level of the order of metaphysical determination/grounding. MD normativism thus might come in more or less ambitious forms. For instance, it might just be a claim to the effect that the “immediate” grounds of meaning facts are normative. But it might also try to employ a distinction between levels of determination or grounding that are truly constitutive of a phenomenon and those that are not (cf. M. Greenberg 2005). Or it might be combined with the claim that normative facts do not supervene on, or are grounded in, non-normative facts (see also Liebesman 2018).

30. We might have the more ambitious goal of using conditionals like \((\MD_R )\) to analyze meaning in terms of (systems of) rules. This would presumably require not only strengthening such conditionals into bi-conditionals, but also specifying the relevant rules in non-semantic terms. That is, we would need to distinguish the meaning determining rules from other rules governing the use of expressions—without using semantic vocabulary. It is not clear that that is possible. For discussion, see Pagin 1987, esp. chapter 2.

31. Glock (2000) suggests that rules of form (CR) can indirectly determine meaning, for instance by taking this form:

In \(C\), uttering \(s\) counts as saying that \(p\),

where \(s\) is a sentence. It’s not obvious, however, that such a rule is truly constitutive; it does not seem to create the possibility of performing actions of the relevant kind, i.e., saying that \(p.\) Rather, saying that \(p\) seems to be possible independently of \((\CR_1)\). \((\CR_1)\) only provides one (among many possible) means of performing an action of this kind (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1998: 218f).

32. The acceptance required for the rules to be in force sometimes is argued to be very general and/or rather minimal. No particular rule needs to be accepted by, or guide the individual speaker. What is required instead is that their performances are appropriately assessable by other speakers (cf. Peregrin 2012; Kiesselbach 2014, 2020; Hlobil 2015 [all taking inspiration from Brandom 1994]; for critical discussion, cf. Kaluziński 2016; Reinikainen 2020).

33. Guidance normativism by itself is neutral on the question of whether an individual speaker could adopt, and follow, rules for her own idiolect (as, for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985: 169ff, hold), or whether it necessarily takes a community of speakers to put semantic rules into force. Many philosophers subscribe to “communitarianism”, however; they hold that so-called “solitary” languages, i.e., languages spoken by only one speaker, are impossible. When combined with MD normativism, communitarianism usually construes meaning determining rules as conventions adopted by whole speech communities. This is often motivated by an interpretation of Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations and the so-called “private language argument” according to which these show that the notion of a mistake does not have any application outside a whole community of speakers (among others, Kripke 1982; Wright 1980: 218–220; Peacocke 1981; McDowell 1984; M. Williams 1999). Another motivation is provided by, among others, Dummett. Dummett argues, first, that regular use by a whole community of speakers is a condition on an expression’s having linguistic meaning, and, second, that therefore a normative attitude towards the common language is required of each individual speaker (Dummett 1991: 85). Davidson questioned both steps of Dummett’s argument; while regularity of use usually makes communication easier there is, according to him, no regularity such that, on every particular occasion, accordance with it would be either necessary or sufficient for successful communication (cf. Davidson 1986b). Moreover, even if regularity were required, Davidson argued, it would not matter how it came about; communication would be possible whether or not the required regularity was a product of normative attitudes (cf. Davidson 1994; Glüer 2013 provides a survey of these discussions).

34. Applying a traditional belief-desire model, Glüer and Pagin (1998) suggest understanding guidance by a rule \(R\) in general by means of the following practical syllogism:

I want to do what \(R\) requires,
\(R\) requires that I \(\Phi\),
So, I want to \(\Phi\),

where \((\PA_i )\) is a pro-attitude (desire, intention, acceptance), and (B) a belief. They also argue that if a meaning determining rule \(R\) for an expression \(e\) requires \(e\) to be used correctly, there is no room for such rules in the explanation of speech acts: If a speaker wants to say that \(p\), a rule requiring them to use \(e\) correctly not only is of no help, there is no “slot” in the practical syllogism into which it would coherently fit (Glüer & Pagin 1998: 223f). It would thus seem that if an intentional condition on guidance by meaning determining rules can be integrated into a general model of reasons explanation, an alternative way of doing that is required.

35. Hlobil (2015) argues that following a rule \(R\) does not require “any prior or independent attitude towards \(R\)” (391, emph. added). The idea seems to be that there are kinds of rule-guided activity where performing the relevant act simply coincides with having the required attitude. The attitude is that of trying to get it right. And a case in point, according to Hlobil, is reasoning: “your trying to reason correctly just is your reasoning” (ibid.). But even if every act of reasoning also was an act of trying to reason correctly, one might wonder why we should think that the reverse holds. One might worry, that is, that it is possible to try to reason correctly and yet fail to reason (at all).

36. Miller argues that this interpretation of what Wittgenstein means in PI 219 when he says

When I obey a rule, I do not choose.

I obey the rule blindly.

is licensed by PI 201 where Wittgenstein famously declares that

there is a way of grasping a rule that is not an interpretation, but which is exhibited in what we call “obeying the rule” and “going against it” in actual cases.

Miller argues that

“blind” does not contrast with “intentional” (as in Boghossian’s reading). (…) Rather, “blind” contrasts with “based on an interpretation” (Miller 2015: 411).

This reading of Wittgenstein might appear problematic in the light of Wittgenstein’s explicit explanation of what he means by “interpretation”, i.e., “the substitution of one expression of the rule for another” (PI 202). In the light of this, it is not altogether easy to see why “not based on an interpretation” should amount to “not involving inference”. Cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2009 for discussion of the relevance of these passages to the question of whether intentional conditions on rule-guidance result in vicious regresses.

37. For instance, an analogy has been drawn between the explanation of speech dispositions by means of systems of semantic rules and the evolutionary explanation of animal traits and behavior by natural selection. In each case, there are regularities of behavior the explanation of which is non-intentional, but which are nevertheless not merely accidental. But explanations of speech dispositions by means of (institutionalized) systems of rules are only quasi-evolutionary; the crucial explanans is not natural selection, but the system of rules that exists prior to the individual speaker’s acquisition of language (cf. Sellars 1954; Searle 1995). While such explanation might work well for the use an individual speaker learns to make of the expressions of an existing language, whether any distinction between rule-explained and merely regular behavior has been substantiated now depends on substantiating a further distinction: that between a system of rules and one of mere regularities. To take Sellars’ example: Why would the bee dance instantiate mere regularities that receive a truly evolutionary explanation, while a human natural language instantiates a system of rules? (Cf. Glüer 2002: 173f.)

38. Steglich-Petersen (2013b) suggests that for belief formation to be guided by, for instance, the truth rule the existence of a causal mechanism by means of which relevant differences in output beliefs are effected is sufficient. An analogous suggestion could be made for guidance by meaning determining rules or norms. Glüer & Wikforss (2015b) argue that, as long as we are concerned with an intuitive conception of rule-following or rule-guidedness, the possibility of deviant causal chains makes it highly improbable that any true sufficiency claim will be forth-coming along these lines.

39. According to Ginsborg, a primitively normative attitude is an intentional attitude, a judgment even—thus preventing her account of meaning (and content) determination from being fully reductive in the naturalistic sense (2011a: 252; 2018b). But it is a judgment only minimally different from a brute, “natural” reaction, a judgment “not in the first instance to be identified with the acceptance of some proposition as true” (Ginsborg 2011b: 177). Its content need not consist in more than an awareness of primitive appropriateness in the form of “this is appropriate to that” (cf. 2011b: 169f; 2012: 137).

40. Primitive normativity thus is a notion not only needed in an account of meaning determination, but in any account of rule-following in general. According to Ginsborg,

it is only if we endorse the pretheoretical intuitions on which I am relying [intuitions regarding the primitive appropriateness of certain responses, but not others] that we can make sense of there being justification in terms of rules in the first place. (2012: 249)

Ginsborg’s thought then seems to be that we are entitled to our intuitive judgments of primitive normativity precisely because there would be no rule-following whatsoever unless these judgments were warranted (cf. 2012: 240f, 249). On the assumption that meaningful use of expressions indeed is a case of rule-following, an assumption quite clearly implicit in Ginsborg’s writings, this would of course also hold for intuitive judgments of appropriateness regarding the use of these expressions. Moreover, Ginsborg seems to hold not only that the primitively normative attitudes required by meaning amount to warranted judgments, but to judgments corresponding to objective normative reality: “on the position I shall defend”, she writes, “ expressions have meaning only in virtue of there being ways in which they ought to be applied” (2012: 132, emph. added).

41. Miller points out in the paper that on this point Ginsborg agrees with the argument laid out by Stroud in a series of papers (2000, 2011).

42. Boghossian (2003: 39) withdraws his earlier claim that meaning is essentially normative, suggesting that the “the linguistic version of the normativity thesis, in contrast with its mentalistic version, has no plausibility whatever…”. But see Boghossian (2008) where he argues that there is a sense in which meaning is normative (as noted in section 2.2.1 above).

43. Again, it is not immediately clear that (C) could be strengthened into a bi-conditional, at least if such a bi-conditional is supposed to provide an analysis of \(M\) has content \(p.\) Such an analysis would have to specify the rule or norm in question without using the concept of content. It is not clear, for instance, that the rules of rational reasoning—which many think are promising candidates here—themselves can be specified without using the concept of content.

44. Alex Byrne calls this the “pleonastic sense of ‘concept’” (Byrne 2005). Note the contrast with the meaning of linguistic expressions that this notion of concept induces: On this notion of concept, the connection between a concept and “its meaning” or “its content” is not arbitrary, or even contingent; quite the contrary, a concept would naturally seem to be a meaning or a content; the meaning or content of the corresponding linguistic expression. There is here, thus, no route to normativism via arbitrariness; rather, the idea of norms governing the “use” of concepts seems to derive from the idea of essential relations, such as inferential relations, between contents.

45. In the case of belief there is also the general question of whether beliefs are voluntary in the first place (Alston 1988; Shah & Velleman 2005; B. Williams 1973; McHugh 2013, 2014; Booth 2917; Bergamaschi Ganapini forthcoming; Vermaire 2022). If not, the idea that belief is intrinsically prescriptive stands in prima facie conflict with the principle that “ought” implies “can”. In this respect, both \((\NB_1)\) and \((\NB_2)\) are, prima facie, more problematic than \((\ME_1)\), since the application of expressions is something that is clearly within the voluntary control of \(S\) (see Schmidt 2020 for an argument for why responsibility for our attitudes does not require control over them; Côté-Bouchard 2019 for a novel take on this issue).

46. Another proposal is that the norm of belief is made conditional on \(S\) considering whether \(p\): “If \(S\) considers whether \(p\), then \(S\) ought to believe \(p\) iff \(p\) is true” (Wedgwood 2002: 273). This proposal is criticized by Bykvist & Hattiangadi (2007: 281) and Greenberg (2020). For a response to Bykvist & Hattiangadi (2007), see Wedgwood (2013). More recently, Greenberg (2020) has argued for a “conditional truth norm” (initially put forward by McHugh 2012): “If one has some doxastic attitude towards \(p\), one ought to believe that \(p\) if and only if \(p\) is true”.

47. It has also been suggested that the normativity of belief should be construed in terms of “role oughts”, and that these are not subject to the principle that ought implies can (Chrisman 2008 Feldman 2001). Each role comes with criteria of excellence and these, in turn, imply obligations: Teachers ought to be clear, parents ought to be care-giving, etc. Norms for actions, therefore, derive from norms of being. Similarly, as human beings we play the role of believers, of creatures with intentional states, and being engaged in this role we ought to do it well: We ought to believe that which is true (for instance). Hence, on this view, (NB1) is a norm of belief even if it places impossible demands on ordinary subjects. Another option would be to regard the norms in question as merely axiological. Thus, it could be claimed that it is essential to belief, and constitutive of content, that true, or knowledgeable, or rational belief is intrinsically valuable (Karlander 2008). If this is meant to be a conceptual a priori truth, it certainly is controversial, however.

48. Since the appeal to teleological norms involves the idea that the norms constitutive of a telos determine mental content it constitutes a form of CD normativism (see section 3.2).

49. So is \((\NB_2)\), of course, and the same questions concerning guidance can be raised with respect to it.

50. For criticisms of the so-called “no-guidance argument”, cf. Steglich-Petersen 2010; 2013a. For responses, see Glüer & Wikforss 2010b; 2015b.

51. It has also been argued that the problem concerning guidance is solved if \((\NB_1)\) is supplemented with the subjective norms of rationality: \((\NB_1)\) guides, but via these further norms (Boghossian 2003: 39; Gibbard 2005: 343; Shah 2003: 471; Wedgwood 2002: 282). See section 3.2 below. For a critical discussion of the appeal to subjective norms in defense of belief normativism see Glüer & Wikforss (2015b).

52. Note, also, that the argument presupposes that conceptual necessity implies metaphysical necessity. Otherwise it might be asked why the alleged conceptual links between the concepts of content and belief should entail that what is essential to belief is also essential to content.

53. Green (2021) proposes an argument of this sort which he suggests does not rely on contentious assumptions about mental content. According to Green judgment and content are metaphysically inter-constitutive and since belief is essentially normative so is content. It is not completely clear how direct the argument is, however. Green grants that contents can exist whether they are judged or not but suggests that possession of concepts requires the ability to make some particular “inferential or otherwise doxastic transitions” (2021: 168). The constitutive relation would thus seem to hold between belief and concept possession, rather than belief and content (the view is discussed in the next section).

54. These operate with different underlying concepts of correctness, so if we want to define belief by its “aim” or constitutive norm, we will have to settle for one of them. We might also have the more ambitious goal of defining something like belief \(B\) has content \(p\) by means of a (system of) biconditional norm(s) of one of these kinds. This would require distinguishing these norms from others (also or possibly) governing belief without using the concept of content. It is at least not obvious that this is possible (see also note 30)

55. For a normative inferentialist like Brandom, for instance, the question in effect concerns the relation between normative inferential role and truth conditional content, and he tries to show that the latter can be analysed in terms of the former. Gibbard (2005) suggests that, in general, objective oughts can be reduced to subjective ones. Therefore, he argues, there is nothing problematic about the prima facie weird consequence of objective epistemic normativity that every non-normative fact whatsoever analytically entails a normative fact: You objectively ought to believe that \(p\) iff \(p\). See also Gibbard (2012: 82–84) for a discussion of the relation between the subjective and the objective ought.

56. As remarked above, there is an ongoing debate as to whether there can be practical reasons for belief. For overviews see Marušić 2011; Reisner 2018; see also, e.g., Basu 2018; Leary 2017; Rinard 2019. The question can be formulated in terms of epistemic value: Is the rationality solely determined by epistemic value as writers such as Owens (2003) and Shah & Velleman (2005) insist, or is epistemic value just one value among others determining the rationality of actions and beliefs alike. Gibbard (2005), for instance, holds the latter view.

57. Because of the commitment to explaining the “objectivity of concepts”, commentators such as Rosen (1997) and Glüer and Wikforss (2009) interpret Brandom as offering a realist account of content. Other commentators, however, take what is on offer to be a form of expressivism (e.g., Gibbard 1996).

58. Reiland (2020) proposes an account of being in force for constitutive rules implementing this feature. In his “Rules of Use” (forthcomingb) he argues that it can be applied to MD rules. As the account of being in force involves intentional components it is at least doubtful that it would be applicable to CD rules, however.

59. This would accord with Glüer and Wikforss’s (2009) claim that CD normativism ends up “with rules you cannot even intend to follow” (60). It also provides a way of understanding what it means to say that an intentional condition on rule-following requires there to be a fundamental level at which rule-following is “blind” (Wright 2007, see also above, section 2.2).

60. Tracy (2020) claims that guidance normativism does not need to hold that “certain norms guide belief formation”. It only needs to hold that “certain norms ought to guide belief formation” (2020: 336f). Now, if it holds for every instance of belief formation that it ought to be guided by some norm, it would seem to follow that there are no instances of belief formation that cannot be norm-guided. But as we just saw, the suggested regress-avoiding move might land the guidance normativist in precisely a situation where for every instance of norm- or rule-guided belief formation there is another that cannot be so guided.

61. It is instructive to compare the contemporary debate between naturalists and normativists about meaning, content, the propositional attitudes, or the intentional in general with that between psychologists and (neo-Kantian) normativists regarding the “laws” of logic around the turn of the previous century. It is recorded in quite some detail in Husserl’s Prolegomena (1913). Husserl here came to adopt a third position according to which these laws are neither prescriptions nor psychological laws, but what he called “ideal”. He greatly influenced Frege in this.

Copyright © 2022 by
Kathrin Glüer <>
Åsa Wikforss <>
Marianna Ganapini <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free