Medieval Mereology

First published Sat May 20, 2006; substantive revision Wed Aug 9, 2023

The term “mereology” is sometimes used to refer to any one of the formal languages that describe the part-to-whole relation. In this article, I will use the term more broadly to refer to any theoretical study (formal or informal) of parts, wholes, and the relations (logical or metaphysical) that obtain between them. In what follows I will survey some of the ways that philosophers in the medieval Latin West thought about parts and wholes. (While there is very little contemporary scholarship on medieval Arabic, Hebrew, or Byzantine mereology (although now see Thom 2019), many of the Latin notions and distinctions surveyed in this article surely have correlates in these traditions.) The article will highlight many of the key medieval mereological concepts and principles, and it will outline some of the fundamental issues that confront mereologists in the Middle Ages. Specific philosophers and their doctrines will be used to illustrate some of these concepts, principles, and puzzles. Many of these concepts and principles may seem strange to the modern student of parts and wholes, but behind this alien veneer one will see that medieval mereologists share many of our concerns about wholes, their parts, and the metaphysical implications of mereology.

1. Forums for medieval mereology

One can find discussions of parts and wholes throughout the medieval philosophical and theological literature. But there are two places where the student of medieval mereology can reliably look to find sustained reflections on parts and wholes as such, namely, treatments of division and the Topics. The main authority on division and the Topics is the Roman philosopher Boethius (c. 480–524 C.E.). Boethius is now most famous for his Consolation of Philosophy, but his influence on medieval philosophy is as much due to his commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories and On Interpretation, his theological treatises, and his handbooks on logic (see Chadwick 1981 and Marenbon 2003). Boethius’ treatment of division is found in his handbook On Division (De divisione). His treatment of the Topics is found in his handbook On the Topical Differences (De differentiis topicis) and in his commentary on Cicero’s treatment of the Topics (In Ciceronis Topica).

1.1 Division

The methods of “division” (Greek: diairesis, Latin: divisio) and “collection” (Greek: sunagoge, Latin: collectio) have their roots in Plato’s later dialogues, and they are common in Ancient Neoplatonic and Aristotelian treatises on logic. Plato tells us that collection and division provide us with a way to understand the relationships between some unity and some plurality (Phaedrus 265d–266b, and Philebus 16c–17a). Division is a process whereby any sort of unity is resolved into a plurality. Collection is the process whereby a plurality is collected into a unity.

For the Neoplatonists, division and collection are first and foremost applied to genera and species (such as Animal and Human), and instances of these universals (such as Brownie the donkey and Socrates). This primary mode of division is often interpreted as a logical exercise. In particular, it is a method for developing definitions of things, which can then be used in demonstrations. Collection is construed as a method for classification.

The primary purpose of division for Late Ancient philosophers is to determine the hierarchical relations between a universal and that which falls under it. But divisions are applied to a variety of other items. There is no single, canonical list of divisions (for an overview, see Magee 1998, xxxvii–xlix). The list presented by Boethius is the one bequeathed to the Latin West (On Division 877c–d). Boethius distinguishes between two broad categories: substantial divisions and accidental divisions. These divisions are divided further. Of the substantial divisions there are:

  1. The division of the genus into its species.
  2. The division of the whole into parts.
  3. The division of a word into its meanings.

Of the accidental divisions there are:

  1. The division of a subject into accidents.
  2. The division of accidents into subjects.
  3. The division of accidents into accidents.

The most important material for our purposes is Boethius’ treatment of the first and second substantial modes of division.

1.2 The Topics

“Topic” is the standard translation for the Latin term locus. (Note that the translators of Peter of Spain (2014) have chosen to render it as “place”, which is the basic meaning of the Latin term.) As Stump (1978, Part 2, and 1982) and Green-Pedersen (1984) have pointed out, the notion of the Topic evolves over the course of its use in ancient and medieval logic, but roughly put, medieval logicians think that the study of the Topics helps one to discover a number of self-evidently true propositions, or “maximal propositions”, that can serve as warrants for arguments. (See Peter of Spain, Tractatus V.3–4 (2014, 198–205).) For example, suppose that someone makes this inference:

If Socrates is human, Socrates is animal.

Students of the Topics claim that this inference is warranted by the following maximal proposition:

If a species is predicated of something, that species’ genus is also predicable of that thing.

The student of medieval mereology will be extremely interested in the maximal propositions presented in treatments of the Topic from the whole and the Topic from the part.

Following a well-established Ancient tradition, the Topic from the whole is usually divided into two sub-Topics:

  1. The Topic from the universal whole.
  2. The Topic from the integral whole.

From the beginning, the best medieval philosophers are aware of the subtleties of ordinary language. In particular, they are mindful of the distributive function of the adjectival term “whole” (totus/tota/totum). That is, the term “totus” can act like a universal quantifier and, hence, the phrase “totus x” can mean “all the parts of x taken together” or “the entire x” (see Section 2 below). This sensitivity to the distributive sense of “totus” might be what motivates medieval logicians to add further refinements to the theory of the Topics. Specifically, the Topic from the whole is routinely divided in a six-fold manner (see, e.g., Peter of Spain Tractatus V.11–18 (2014, 210–19); following Boethius’ terse remarks in De topicis differentiis II, 1189A–C; trans. Stump 1978, 52–53). In addition to the Topic from the universal whole and the Topic from the integral whole, there are these additional Topics:

  1. The Topic from the whole in quantity.
  2. The Topic from the whole in a respect (in modo).
  3. The Topic from the whole in place.
  4. The Topic from the whole in time.

The Topic from the whole in quantity classifies and considers propositions where the term is taken universally, such as “Every x is a y”, or “No x is a y”. The Topic from the whole in a respect considers a term in respect to some limiting qualification. So, for example, if x is white on its surface, then every part of x’s surface is white. The Topic from the whole in place classifies propositions bounded by the term “everywhere” or its cognates. So, if water is everywhere, then water is here (where “here” designates a “part in place”). And, finally, the Topic from the whole in time considers inferences that one can make from propositions bounded by the term “always” or “never”.

A full account of medieval mereology would consider carefully the details of all six sub-Topics. But of special interest to us are the treatments of the Topic from the integral whole and of the Topic from the integral part. In these discussions, medieval philosophers often consider whether the traditional maximal propositions associated with these Topics in fact describe the logical and metaphysical relations that hold between an integral whole and an integral part. Specifically, the maximal proposition that applies to integral wholes is:

If the whole is, then the part is.

The maximal proposition said to apply to the integral part in relation to its whole is:

If the part is not, the whole is not.

These maximal propositions are quite startling. They seem to entail, for example, that if Socrates exists, then his hand must exist, and if Socrates’ hand ceases to exist, then Socrates ceases to exist. As we will see in Section 4.2, such consequences do not escape the notice of medieval philosophers, and much of interest regarding the metaphysical implications of the Topics and their maximal propositions ensues.

2. Wholes

Sometimes the phrase “totus x (est)” can mean “x is whole”, in the sense that x is complete or not lacking anything. This is a sense of “whole” that Aristotle identifies in his Metaphysics and that he contrasts with the notion of being “mutilated” (kolobon) (Metaphysics 5.26 and 5.27, respectively).

Closely related to the sense of being complete, “whole” can have a distributive function and the phrase “totus x est y” (“whole x is y”) can mean all of x is y—that is, all the parts of x taken together is y. This is called the term’s “categorematic” sense. Medieval logicians also distinguish a second distributive sense of “whole”, which they call the “syncategorematic” sense of the term (see, e.g., William of Sherwood Syncategoremata [1941, 54]; Ockham Summa Logicae II, ch. 6 [Opera Philosophica I, 267–69]; John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 4.3.7–1; Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45). When “totus x est y” is interpreted syncategorematically, it means each and every part (quaelibet pars) of x is y.[1]

Finally, “whole” can signify a thing that is either composed of some things or divisible into some things. This usually is the sense of “whole” at work in discussions of collection and division.

The ancient practice of collection and division, and especially the proclivity to call both the products of collection and the things to be divided wholes, has a lasting influence on medieval mereology. For medieval philosophers a variety of items can be wholes. Universals, concepts, material objects, masses (such as water or gold), souls, and time can all be wholes—and this is only to mention some of the more common items studied by medieval philosophers. Thus, in general, anything that is composed out of other items or that can be divided into other items is a whole. But there are two important qualifications.

First, one should not assume that all wholes are mind-independent features of the world. Peter Abelard, for instance, argues that temporal wholes (such as days, weeks, or hours) and universal wholes are not things (res). Yet, provided that we do not reify these items, Abelard will allow us to treat items like days and hours as wholes consisting of parts, and he will allow us to talk about universals and their parts. (On temporal wholes, see Dialectica 554.14–23 and Logica Ingredientibus 2, 187.9–14. On universals, see Logica Ingredientibus 1, 10.8–16.18 and Logica Nostrorum 515.10–522.9. For a helpful overview of Abelard’s anti-realist metaphysics, consult King 2004.)

Second, some medieval philosophers, again motivated by their metaphysical commitments as well as their understanding of what wholes must be, will prefer to distinguish between “true”, or “proper”, wholes and quasi-wholes. Ockham, for example, insists that individuals are not actually parts of species and species are not actually parts of genera. These items are merely “parts”, and accordingly their corresponding species and genera are only “wholes”, in a figurative sense. Once this fact is appreciated, however, Ockham is willing to allow us to speak of a genus or a species as a “whole of a sort” (quoddam totum), since there is a legitimate sense in which a species “contains” individuals and a genus “contains” its species (Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii de praedicabilibus ch. 2, [Opera Philosophica II, 54]).

With these caveats in place, we can begin to explore the basic mereological categories that one finds in medieval treatments of mereology. As was noted, all manner of items can be wholes, but generally speaking medieval philosophers believe that this motley group can be organized under three broad categories: integral wholes, universal wholes, and potential wholes. It will soon become apparent that the category of integral wholes is quite broad. Indeed, it is so inclusive that some philosophers will feel pressure to introduce a fourth basic category, substantial wholes. But others will suggest that an integral whole is divisible into two distinct kinds of parts, quantitative parts and substantial parts. For this reason, I will consider the issue of substantial wholes and substantial parts in Section 3.1.

2.1 Integral wholes

Much of what we encounter in the material world is, or can be considered to be, a whole. Cars, houses, plants, and human beings are composed out of bits of metal, plastic, cellulose, or flesh and bone. These items are not only divisible into the components just mentioned; they are divisible into other parts such as carburetors, doors, leaves, and hands.

Medieval philosophers consider the wholes mentioned above to be either “continuous” or “contiguous” integral wholes, where a contiguous whole is a type of “discrete” whole. Continuous wholes are wholes whose parts share a common boundary. Discrete wholes are wholes whose parts do not share a common boundary. The parts of discrete integral wholes can be either close to one another, or relatively scattered. Contiguous wholes consist of parts that are discrete, but spatially close together. Discrete wholes whose parts are relatively diffuse are “disaggregated” integral wholes. (For a fairly comprehensive catalog of the kinds of integral wholes, see Anonymous Compendium Logicae Porretanum III.12.)

Whether an item is a continuous or contiguous whole will depend upon other metaphysical commitments. Some early medieval philosophers only have simple artifacts like fences and walls in mind when they talk about contiguous wholes. But others think that even more complicated man-made objects, such as wagons, houses, and clocks are contiguous, and not continuous wholes, because only substances are continuous wholes. Abelard and Aquinas both hold the latter position, and thus, that only individual donkeys, palm trees, human beings, and the like, are continuous wholes. Abelard thinks that this is true because only God can fuse parts together into a continuous unity. Human manipulations, no matter how skilled, are only capable of placing parts in close proximity to one another (Dialectica 417.4–37; 419.35–420.6). Drawing upon Aristotle’s reflections on form and matter (especially in his De Anima, Physics and Metaphysics), Aquinas thinks that only substances possess the kind of form that can inhere in each and every part of the whole and thereby make it truly one (Summa Theologiae I, q. 76, art. 8; Quaestiones de Anima q. 10; see also Pasnau 2002, 79–88). An artifact possesses a form that merely orders and arranges the parts of the whole. We can tell whether a form imbues its parts in the manner required of a substantial form by attending to the effect of the form’s existence on the functionality of the parts. The human soul inheres in the hands of a human being as a substantial form because if the soul were removed, that part would cease to function as a hand – indeed, Aquinas insists that this thing would cease to be a hand. By contrast, when the form of a car is removed from the items that make up the car, many of these items can still be car-parts. For example, a carburetor can still be a carburetor; it can be placed in another car and continue functioning as a carburetor.[2]

In addition to artifacts, plants, and animals, some medieval philosophers expand the class of continuous integral wholes to cover homogeneous masses, such as some gold or some water, and the class of disaggregated integral wholes to include scattered mereological sums, such as the sum of this mountain and this dog. However, one will not find any medieval philosopher who assents to the modern mereological thesis of universalism, or what David Lewis calls “unrestricted fusion” (1991, 74; cf. Simons 1987, 108–12 and the subsection on unrestricted fusions in the Encyclopedia entry on mereology). Peter Abelard comes close when he asserts that any two items, even ones belonging to different categories of being, can constitute a plurality (Dialectica 548.19–22; see also the anonymous twelfth-century Introductiones Montanae maiores, 69rb, where Abelard’s thesis is mocked). But one suspects that even Abelard, if pressed, might step back from assenting to a full-blown version of universalism for theological reasons. For in discussions of God’s simplicity, it is routinely noted that God is not intrinsically composite and that He cannot be combined with anything else and that nothing can be combined with Him (see, e.g., Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 3, arts. 7–8). This strong thesis about the lack of composition in God is maintained because being a part of something implies a certain sort of potentiality and incompleteness. If anything could be a part of a whole that also has God as a part, then there is something that God could be–namely, a part of this composite–that He currently is not. And even if He currently is a part of the sum of all things (for instance), given that some of the other parts are contingent beings, the sum of all things is contingent. Accordingly, God’s parthood is contingent, or has a potentiality. But God is fully actual and necessary. Hence, God cannot be a part of some greater composite.[3]

As a more general point, it must be remembered that medieval philosophers are for the most part working within an Aristotelian framework, and like Aristotle, their paradigmatic examples of unified composite things are substances. If a thing is not unified by a substantial form, then that thing has a lesser kind of unity. Humans and dogs are more unified than houses and wagons. Houses and wagons, nonetheless, are unified by a form— namely, an accidental form—and so they have a unity of a sort. Moreover, this kind unity will be greater than the unity of a mere collection of things. Hence, as a general rule, the more gerrymandered a collection of parts is, the more likely it is that this composite’s status as a whole will be called into question (see, e.g., Aquinas In Metaphysica expositio, Book V, lectio XXI §§ 1102–4; Jean Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 8.1.4).

In addition to material beings, some medieval philosophers allow non-material items to be integral wholes. For example, Ockham thinks that complex mental acts can be wholes, and Aquinas insists that actions such as penance are integral wholes (Ockham Quaestiones in physicam q. 6 [Opera VI, 407–10]; In De Int. I, prooemium, 6 [Opera II, 354–8]; Aquinas Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3). Abelard insists that temporal items are not integral wholes, but he seems to be in the minority. Non-material integral wholes do not sit easily under either the continuous or the discrete category, since their parts cannot be related to one another with respect to location. If asked to pick, medieval philosophers tend to label temporal wholes and events as continuous wholes, but they are not continuous in the way that a bronze rod is continuous. Their parts to not share some spatial boundary; they come one after another in continuous succession. For this reason, these wholes are sometimes called “successive” wholes (Anonymous Compendium Logiae Porretanum III.12). In addition to aggregates of time, processes (that is, things that take time to unfold) are also sometimes considered to be successive wholes (see, e.g., Aquinas Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3, ad 3).

In short, an astounding variety of items can be integral wholes. Yet, no matter how large this category becomes, most medieval philosophers insist that the class of integral wholes does not exhaust the domain of items that can be wholes. In particular, there are two types of item that require their own category: universals and the so-called “potential wholes”.

2.2 Universal wholes

Many non-material items are considered to be integral wholes. But most medieval philosophers mark off one special sort of non-material object, the universal, and treat it as a separate type of whole.

It was noted in Section 1.1 that universals, and especially species and their genera, are related to one another hierarchically. For instance, the species Human Being and the species Horse both fall under the genus Animal. Additionally, individuals are related hierarchically to their species and genera. Hence, Socrates and Cicero fall under the species Human Being and the genus Animal. These relations between universals and individuals are often described in the terms of collection and division. Cicero and Socrates and all other humans are collected into the species Human Being, and the species Human Being and Horse and all other species are collected in the genus Animal. Correlatively, Animal is divided into its species, and Human Being is divided into individual humans.

This language of collection and division invites medieval philosophers to call the divisible items wholes, and the products of these divisions parts, but most medieval philosophers are not tempted to think that universals are literally composed out of individuals or lesser species. There are noteworthy exceptions. For example, an anonymous twelfth-century philosopher carefully articulates and spiritedly defends a version of what is often called the collection (collectio) theory of universals (Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus et speciebus §§ 84–153 (2014, 158–85)). But, in general, universal wholes are clearly marked off from other kinds of whole, and their behavior is thought to be distinct from the behavior of potential and integral wholes.

There is one significant complication. In his On Division, Boethius distinguishes between the division of a genus and the division of a whole (877c–d, see also In Cic. top. 331.18–19). But then under his treatment of the ways to divide wholes, he notes that one way to divide a true whole is to divide a universal into its subordinate individuals (887d). That a universal can be a true whole will matter below when we try to uncover the properties that differentiate one kind of part-whole relation from others (Section 3.3).

2.3 Potential wholes

In addition to integral wholes and universal wholes, Boethius introduces a third basic type of whole to medieval philosophers: the whole consisting of “powers” (potentiae) or “virtues” (virtutes) (On Division 888a). These wholes are often called “virtual wholes” or “potential wholes”. This article will follow that practice, but it should be understood that in medieval contexts “potential” usually signifies something that is in some respect not fully actualized, and, hence, in some contexts “potential whole” and “potential part” refer to things that are possibly, but not actually divided, as when a continuum with a certain magnitude is potentially divisible but not actually divided into halves or fourths, or when a substance is said to be potentially divisible into its elemental constituents (see Pasnau 2011, 606–629). This standard sense of “potency” is even at work in the potential wholes that Boethius is talking about, since the soul’s powers are typically related to the soul’s “operations”, or activities, and these activities are clearly not always occurring. A soul might have the power to see or the power to think, even though it is not presently seeing or thinking. Nonetheless, these Boethian potential wholes are actual and actually possess these potential parts; they are not “potential” in the sense that they are possible things or things that are merely capable of being divided.

Potential wholes are curious items. They are particulars, not universals. Yet potential wholes are not composed out of their parts in the way that, for example, a house is composed out of bricks and wood. Indeed, the most commonly discussed kind of potential whole is a soul. But for Aristotelians souls are forms and it is generally held that forms are mereologically simple. Thus, souls ought to be mereologically simple. That Boethius, or for that matter, Aristotle asserts that souls have parts is therefore initially quite puzzling. (For a list of the places where Aristotle talks about the parts of the soul as well as a defense of the claim that we should take Aristotle’s use of the term “parts” seriously, see Johansen 2014.)

Further reflection, however, shows us that a soul (and especially a human soul) is a complicated thing. It has a variety of capacities, which seem to be really distinct from one another and possibly from the soul itself. Some of these capacities even seem to be contrary to one another. For example, a soul seems to be capable of psychic conflict. There is a lot of pressure then put on this putatively simple, yet obviously complicated thing, and therefore it is hardly surprising that there is a robust medieval debate over the nature of the parts or powers of the soul (see Perler 2015). Some think that the pressure is too great to sustain and that one substantially simple thing cannot be the subject of all these capacities. Two common reasons are given for the soul’s being really divided in a substantial manner. First, it seems that really distinct operations must stem from really distinct sources, and since operations are accidents of substances, this would seem to imply that the operations of a soul must stem from distinct substantial sources. Second, according to Aristotle, the rational capacities do not require a bodily instrument to operate, where the other capacities do. This leads some medieval Aristotelians to conclude that whereas the non-rational capacities arise from the matter of the thing, the rational capacities must come from some external source. This, in turn, suggests that a human being has at least one substantial form that is rooted in and arises from the matter, and another substantial form that comes from an external source. If all of this is right, then humans at least either have several souls, or one substantially composite soul, where the parts are viewed as “incomplete” substances that combine to form one “perfected” soul (see Pasnau 1997; Perler 2014). Others, and most famously Aquinas and his followers, hold that a living thing can only have one substantial form and therefore only one soul (Pasnau 2002, 126–30). These “unitarians” must come up with an answer to how the powers do not in fact divide the soul into souls, especially those unitarians like Aquinas who hold that the powers of the soul are really distinct from the soul itself. (In fact, according to King (2008), the dominant view in the medieval period is that the soul’s powers are really distinct from the soul’s substance.) A commonly proposed solution is that the powers “flow out” from the soul’s essence and that the subordinate powers of the soul are “virtually present” in the soul (see Shields 2014 for an analysis of Suárez’s version of this solution; also Perler 2015).

In keeping with the introductory nature of his treatise, Boethius remains silent about many of these issues and instead focuses on the logical nature of the soul considered as a whole consisting of powers. Unfortunately, what he says actually makes matters all the more obscure since he notes that the division of a potential whole resembles both the division of a genus and the division of a whole:

For in that each and every part of it entails the predicate “soul” it is brought into connection with the division of the genus, each and every species of which necessarily entails the genus itself. On the other hand, in that not every soul is composed of all parts but each one is composed differently, in this it is necessarily brought into connection with the nature of a whole. (On Division 888c–d [trans. Magee 1998, 41])

Some earlier medieval philosophers take Boethius’ statement as an invitation to reduce the soul, and the potential whole in general, to either a genus or an integral whole. (One of the first attempts to place the division of soul under the division of the genus is found in a short letter from a mysterious ninth-century thinker identified only as “Master L”. The letter is preserved in the manuscripts of St. Gall, and is transcribed by De Rijk (1963, 75–78).) However, the attempt to reduce soul to either a genus or an integral whole appears doomed, for potential wholes do not fit well under either category. Souls are particular, and hence, they cannot be universals of any kind, let alone genera. On the other hand, by introducing the potential whole as an additional kind of whole, Boethius appears to be signalling that potential wholes do not have parts in the same way that other true wholes have parts: Socrates can be separated into his hands, feet, and so forth; a chemical mixture can be reduced back into its ingredients. Even a universal whole can be separated into independently existing parts, namely, the individuals that are its parts. But a soul is neither constructed out of its powers, nor does it appear to be separable into freestanding parts: the powers must be powers of a soul.

We begin to see some progress in the twelfth century. For example, in a treatise that has been attributed to the young Peter Abelard we learn that there are two definitions of soul, a “superior” one in virtue of which the soul “has an affinity with a universal whole”, and an “inferior” definition in virtue of which soul has an affinity with an integral whole:

This is the superior definition of “soul”: soul is a quality with respect to which a body is made to be alive. It is in accord with this definition that “soul” is predicated of its parts individually, and thus the power of knowing is a quality with respect to which a body is made to be alive, and the power of sensing is a quality with respect to which a body is made to be alive. This is the inferior definition of “soul”: soul is a quality constituted out of rationality, out of sensibility, and out of vegetability (vegetabilitate). And it is with respect to this definition that [soul] cannot be predicated of its parts taken singularly, since one cannot say that the power of thinking is that which is constituted out of rationality, sensibility, and vegetability. ((ps?) Abelard, De divisionibus 194.12–22)

This solution helps to explain the strange predicative behavior of soul and its powers. It also, interestingly, provides us with a solution to what a potential part is: The soul turns out to be a quality composed in a fairly familiar sense of “composition” out of other qualities. The commentator thus attempts to explain the tricky notion of potential-parthood in terms of more understandable relations, namely, the predication relation and the relation of an integral part to its whole.

In his commentary on Boethius’s text, Albert the Great takes a different approach (In de Div. tract. 4, ch. 1; Loe ed., 75–9). He refers to the view that a potential whole is some sort of intermediary between a universal and an integral whole, but then he proceeds to give a different explanation why a potential whole is a whole: It is a whole because the full and complete list of the capacities will produce the full and complete account of the soul in so far as it is the principle of life and self-motion. But it does not follow from this that any given particular soul will have all of the powers and capacities on the list. Albert also hastens to add that while a full list of the capacities of soul gives us the substance of the principle of life and motion, under this description we are not attending to a substance in the absolute sense. We, thus, should not conclude that a soul is divisible in the way that an integral whole is divisible. That is, these capacities need not answer to little substances or parts of substances that constitute the soul. To help us to see his point, Albert offers an example of another potential whole:

And again a regime (regnum) is a whole of this kind, given that it consists of its powers, namely, the king, the prefect, the superintendent, and others of this sort. (In de Div. tract. 4, ch. 1; Loe ed., 75)

Albert is thinking of the regime in terms of an act or role, which is analyzable and hence consists in smaller roles and their associated powers. The complete list of the roles in regimes would give the whole of what it is to be a regime. But like individual souls, a particular regime will require some of these roles and their attendant powers, but it need not possess all of them. Moreover, a difference in role does not imply a difference in subject. The same person could perform some or even all of these distinct roles.

3. Parts

Many kinds of item can be wholes, and many kinds of item can be parts of these wholes. In general, any item that composes a whole is a part, and any item that is a product of a division of some whole is a part of that whole. The only clear restriction on what can be a part is that no part is identical to its whole. In other words, no medieval philosopher countenances what contemporary mereologists call improper parts. (On the contemporary notions of part, or improper part, and proper part consult the entry on contemporary mereology, and also Simons 1987, 9–11.)

We will first consider the kinds of things that can be parts of integral wholes (Section 3.1). We will then turn to the parts of universals (Section 3.2). As it will turn out, some of the things that can be parts of universals can also be parts of integral wholes. This will prompt us to consider several criteria that medieval philosophers use to distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes (Section 3.3). Finally, we will return to consider potential wholes in light of these criteria for distinguishing universals from integral wholes (Section 3.4).

3.1 Parts of integral wholes

Consider the paradigmatic integral whole Socrates. Socrates is composed out of a soul and a body. His body is composed out of flesh, bone, and blood. And the flesh, bone, and blood in turn are ultimately created by combining the four basic elements, Earth, Air, Fire, and Water. All these components of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates.

Socrates is divisible into a number of other parts. We can cut Socrates in half, and thereby create the top half of Socrates and the bottom half of Socrates. We can also divide Socrates into his hands, feet, torso, heart, and so forth. All these products of the divisions of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates as well.

Medieval philosophers separate this plethora of integral parts into a number of distinct categories. The top and bottom halves of Socrates are often called quantitative parts, since they divide Socrates solely with respect to a quantity, or measure. Flesh, bone, and blood, as well as the elements that compose these components also are often called quantitative parts, for they comprise Socrates’ matter, and matter is often associated with quantity.

Not all medieval philosophers think that the elements are parts of Socrates. Abelard, for example, believes that the elements are ingredients, but not every ingredient is a part. Strictly speaking, only those items that compose some whole and remain in that whole after composition are parts of the whole (Dialectica 575.18–36). Hence, even though the flour is an ingredient of the bread, the flour is not a part of the bread. The flour has been altered by a chemical change, and so it does not remain once the bread is baked. Likewise, while the elements combine into a chemical mixture that becomes flesh, the earth and water that make up flesh are no longer present. Only the crumbs and flesh are properly parts of the bread and Socrates respectively.

Many later medieval thinkers effectively agree with Abelard on this point. The elements that compose my body only exist in actuality when my body has been dissolved back into elemental matter (see Ward 2014, 125–44). While I am alive, these elements only exist “virtually” or “potentially” in me. Some medieval philosophers went so far as to suggest that most or even all the parts of a substance exist only in potency when the substance is actual (see Pasnau 2011, 606–29).

Medieval philosophers also like to draw a distinction between the homogeneous and heterogeneous parts of Socrates’ body. Heterogeneous parts are such that, if they are themselves divided, their constituents are not of the same type as the original. For example, a hand is composed out of fingers, knuckles, and a palm. It is also, from another viewpoint, composed out of muscles, skin, and sinews. No part of the hand is a hand. However, some of the hand’s parts are homogeneous. Muscle, skin, and blood are each homogeneous, since every bit of muscle is muscle, every bit of blood is itself blood, and every bit of skin is also skin.

The distinction between heterogeneous and homogeneous parts is bequeathed to medieval philosophers by Aristotle and Boethius. Aristotle imposes a loose hierarchy on these types of parts, claiming that the heterogeneous parts are composed out of homogeneous parts (History of Animals 486a13–14). This in turn suggests that the division of a whole into its parts is best initiated by dividing it into its heterogeneous parts, and only then into its homogeneous parts. Boethius is less explicit, suggesting that there may be many equally acceptable ways to begin to divide up a thing into its parts (On Division 888a–b).

Many of the heterogeneous parts of Socrates are best defined in terms of their function, not their measure. For example, hands are discriminated from feet based on what functions they perform for an animal. Many medieval philosophers believe that these functions are provided either by the form or the soul of the animal. For this reason, many medieval philosophers call functionally defined parts “formal parts”, or parts secundum formam, but in order to avoid any confusion, I will refer to parts of this sort as functional parts. The fourteenth-century philosopher Walter Burley tells us that the functional parts “remain the same so long as the whole remains the same and complete” (De toto et parte, 301). In other words, so long as Socrates’ soul occupies his body, and provided the hand is not cut off, Socrates’ hand remains a hand. Burley contrasts functional parts with material parts, and he places homogeneous parts such as flesh, bone, and blood under this category. Socrates’ material parts are in constant flux; Socrates is constantly losing and replacing bits of flesh and blood.

In addition to the functional parts, Socrates’ substantial form (or forms) and his matter (either his prime matter or his proximate matter en masse) can be considered parts of Socrates. But here there is some question as to whether form and matter are integral parts of Socrates. What Boethius says is ambiguous.

There is also a division of the whole into matter and form. For in one manner the statue is constructed out of its parts, and in another manner out of matter and form—i.e. out of bronze and its shape (species). (On Division 888b [Magee 1998, 40])

It is striking to learn that the form and the matter of the statue are not “parts”, especially since they are products of a division. Moreover, if a core meaning of “part of x” is “that out of which x comes to be” (cf. Boethius’ On the Trinity 2), then the form and the matter of a thing ought to be the primary parts of that thing. Bronze without its form is merely bronze, not a statue; Socrates’ matter without Socrates’ substantial form is not a human. Clearly, then, Boethius cannot mean that form and matter are not parts in any sense.

The task, then, is to determine what kind of parts form and matter are, and especially what kind of parts substantial form and matter are. Aquinas routinely distinguishes between the “quantitative” parts of a thing and the form and the matter, which he calls “parts of the essence” (Summa Theologiae I, q. 8, a. 2, ad 3; I, q. 76, art. 8; III, q. 90, a. 2). However, he does not provide a clear answer to the question whether the part of an essence is a type of integral part, or whether it is a distinct kind of part. Other philosophers present a less ambiguous line: only parts that make up some quantity can be integral parts (see, e.g., Lambert of Auxerre Logica 126; Peter of Spain Tractatus V.14 (2014, 212–4); Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45). Accordingly, many medieval thinkers will propose that in addition to potential, subjective, and integral parts, there is a fourth kind of part, which I will call a substantial part.[4]

There are other good reasons why medieval philosophers might be motivated to distinguish the integral parts of a thing from the substantial parts of the same thing. Firstly, the form does not behave like the integral parts of the thing, since for many Aristotelians (and especially, as we saw above, for Aquinas and other unitarians) the form has the unique capacity to be present “as a whole” in each material part of the thing. Integral parts, by contrast, are thought to be unable to be present in more than one place at the same time, and for this reason, the integral parts of a thing are said to sit side-by-side, or “part outside of part” (pars extra partem). Secondly, substantial parts require something else to perfect them (see Albert of Saxony Sophismata 49). Matter by itself is incomplete; it is only potentially this or that thing. Matter needs a form in order to actually be this or that thing. Form, too, is in a sense an incomplete substance. A dog’s form, for instance, is in need of some matter in order to be the form of this dog. But more fundamentally, given the Aristotelian critique of Platonic forms–specifically, the critique of the notion that a form can exist independently of matter–many medieval thinkers will insist that a form is incomplete in the sense that it cannot exist unless it is part of a substantial composite. Finally, distinguishing between substantial parts and integral parts captures an important intuition about substances: Socrates can lose and gain matter without compromising his existence. But if Socrates were to lose either his matter in total or his substantial form, he would cease to exist.

If one draws a sharp distinction between integral parts and substantial parts, the next natural thought would be to distinguish between integral and substantial wholes. The trouble is that in many cases the same thing seems to be both an integral whole and a substantial whole. Socrates, for example, has a quantity, and he is surely divisible into smaller quantities. It seems to follow that Socrates is an integral whole. But Socrates is also composed of matter and substantial form. So, he is a substantial whole. One could reject the notion that Socrates is an integral whole. But, then, what is it that has Socrates’s size? Socrates’ size is supposed to be an accident of Socrates, not of a part of Socrates. It is perhaps for this reason that some medieval philosophers try a different approach. As we already noted, Walter Burley draws a distinction between material parts and parts secundum formam (which we called “functional” parts, above). Related to this, Burley also draws a distinction between the whole considered in relation to its matter (secundum materiam) and the whole considered in relation to its form (secundum formam) (De toto et parte, 301). Socrates considered formally—i.e. as a unity of this form with some matter—persists through time and change. Socrates considered materially is constantly in flux. That is, Socrates on Monday is not the same whole materially as Socrates on Friday, because the sum of material parts belonging to Socrates on Monday is not identical to the sum of material parts on Friday. The distinction between the whole considered formally and the whole considered materially will play a role in some medieval theories of persistence, and we will pursue this use of the distinction in short order (see Section 4.2). But, first, we must consider the parts of universals and the special problems that the parts of universals entail.

3.2 Parts of genera and universal wholes

Genera are divisible into their subordinate species, whereas what Boethius calls “universal wholes” are divisible into their subordinate individuals. In the medieval tradition that follows Boethius, these subordinate items are said to be “subjective” parts of the universal whole or the genus, since the part is a subject and the whole is predicable of the part. Socrates is a subjective part of Human Being and a subjective part of Animal, and Human Being and Animal are predicable of Socrates. That is, Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is an animal. However, to be a true subjective part, not only must the name of the whole be predicable of the part, the definition of the whole also must be predicable of the part. A statue of Socrates could in some contexts be called a human. For example, suppose someone points to the statue and says, “That’s a man.”, and then she points to another statue and says, “And that’s a horse.”. This person is saying something intelligible, but the statue of Socrates cannot be a subjective part of Human Being, since the statue is not a rational mortal animal; in substance it is some marble shaped like a human with certain features. Socrates, however, is a subjective part because he is a human being and a rational mortal animal. Likewise, the statue of a horse is not a horse in the proper sense, that is, in the same sense that the Black Stallion and Mr. Ed are horses.

Genera and universal wholes both consist of subjective parts, but they differ with respect to the items that are their subjective parts. This fact might explain why Boethius places universal wholes under the broader class of true wholes. Boethius offers four criteria for distinguishing between genera and true wholes (On Division 879b–d):

  1. The genus is divided by means of a qualitative difference, whereas the whole is divided by means of a quantitative difference.
  2. The genus is naturally prior to its species, whereas the whole is naturally posterior to its parts.
  3. The genus is the matter for its species, whereas the parts are the matter for the whole.
  4. The species is always the same thing as its genus, while the part is sometimes not the same thing as its whole.

Some of these criteria could be interpreted in a manner such that the universal consisting of individuals falls under the category of true wholes. Consider, for example, criterion (a). The genus Animal is divided by considering what sort (qualis) of animal something is. Human Being is a rational animal, Horse is an irrational animal. In contrast, Human Being is not divided with respect to what sort of human being Socrates is. Socrates and Cicero are both rational animals. The difference between Socrates and Cicero is due to the fact that this bit of matter which makes up Socrates is different from that bit of matter which makes up Cicero. A difference in matter is typically considered to be a quantitative difference. Hence, the parts of the universal whole Human Being appear to be distinguished by quantity rather than quality.

However, some of the other criteria do not clearly mark genera off from universal wholes. Consider, for example, the second criterion. Boethius seems to have something like this in mind when he articulates difference (b): the parts of a genus are dependent upon the genus, whereas the whole is dependent upon its parts. In other words, if there are no animals, there can be no dogs or humans. In contrast, the house depends upon its parts. If you take away the roof and floor, the house ceases to exist. But universal wholes seem to behave like genera, not houses. If we annihilate individual humans, we do not eliminate the universal Human Being. Therefore, difference (b) does not cleanly demarcate genera from universal wholes.

The third and fourth criteria present their own special problems, since it is far from clear how to interpret these differences, let alone whether the universal whole behaves like the genus or the true whole.

Thus, it is not clear that Boethius’s four criteria adequately separate universals divided into universals from universals divided into individuals. It may be that the better division is that between universal wholes and integral wholes, not genera and true wholes, and indeed many medieval philosophers seem to take this route.

This strategy, however, only provides some relief from the puzzles that seem to arise from Boethius’ four criteria. As we will see in the next section, there is still much more to be done to secure a clear and principled distinction between universal wholes and integral wholes.

3.3 Distinguishing universals from integral wholes with respect to their parts

Boethius and the majority of his readers assume that universal wholes and integral wholes are irreducibly distinct kinds of whole. But there are some questions, many raised by minority parties among those who studied Boethius, about whether a clear, principled distinction between these two kinds of whole can be maintained.

To see how these questions can be raised, consider one particular integral whole that Boethius himself seems to countenance, namely, the integral whole consisting of all the human beings on the planet (On Division 888c). Granted, this is a very large and diffuse discrete whole. But if we allow crowds and flocks to be integral wholes, there seems to be no principled reason to reject the existence of the sum of all humans. (And, again, medieval logicians would have had the authority of Boethius as support.) At the same time each of these human beings is a subjective part of the universal Human Being. If wholes are distinguished by the type of parts that they have, it seems that the universal Human Being just is the integral whole composed of all human beings.

Peter Abelard reports that there were some medieval philosophers who drew this very conclusion. Abelard describes and attacks this “collection theory” of universals in his Logica Ingredientibus (1, 13.18–15.22). For fuller presentations and evaluations of Abelard’s critique, one should consult Henry (1984, 235–59), Freddosso (1978), and Tweedale (1976, 113–15). Here I will give only one objection: Abelard thinks that the collection theory gets the relation of dependence between the universal and the individuals backwards. According to Abelard, the collection theory is committed to the view that when Socrates dies, the universal Human Being is changed, and if one believes, as Abelard does, that a discrete integral whole is identical to the sum of its parts, then the Human Being that has Socrates as a part is not identical to the Human Being without Socrates. There is a new Human Being. But this, Abelard insists, is contrary to the orthodox understanding of universals, which states that while the individuals that fall under a universal are impermanent, the universal itself is permanent. Indeed, Human Being would exist even if every human being were annihilated.

Yet, whatever one ultimately makes of the collection theory and Abelard’s counterarguments, this much is clear: the difference between integral wholes and universal wholes cannot be defined solely and simply in terms of the kinds of items that are parts of these wholes. Substances can be parts of both. Rather, the distinction between universal wholes and integral wholes must be maintained in terms of more nuanced constraints or properties.

Many medieval philosophers focus on the fact that every part of a universal whole taken singularly must accept the predication of the name and the definition of the whole, whereas this is not true of each and every part of an integral whole (Aquinas Summa Theol. III q. 90, art. 3; Walter Burley De toto et parte, 302; and Buridan Summulae 8.1.4). For example, Socrates and Plato are both parts of the universal whole Human Being, and Human Being is predicable of both Socrates and Plato. That is,

Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is a rational, mortal animal.


Plato is a human being, and Plato is a rational, mortal animal.

This is true of every part of Human Being. In contrast, an integral whole is not predicable of its parts taken singularly. That is, one cannot say that

This piece of wood is a house.

Integral wholes are only predicable of their parts taken all at once.

This wood and this stone and these other parts taken together are a house.

This seems to give us a principled way to exclude some items from the universal whole Human Being and thus to distinguish it from the integral whole consisting of all human beings. For this seems to be right: only whole human beings are parts of Human Being. That is, Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being, but Socrates’ finger and Cicero’s head are not parts of Human Being, even though the latter are parts of the integral whole consisting of all human beings. Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being because Socrates is a human being and Cicero is a human being. The parts of Socrates and Cicero are not parts of Human Being because Socrates’ hand is not a human being and Cicero’s head is not a human being; whereas they are part of the integral whole consisting of all the humans, since Transitivity seems to hold for integral parts: if x is a part of y and y is a part of z, then x is also a part of z. (It should be noted, however, that some medieval authors were suspicious of an unrestricted form Transitivity, even for integral wholes. See Arlig 2013 for details.) There is also this: while it is true that some of the parts of the sum of all human beings will accept the predication of the name and definition of Human Being, if one examines the matter carefully, it turns out that the definition of the sum of all human beings is not the same as the species Human Being, for the sum of all human beings is not itself a rational, mortal animal.

There is a complication that is raised by considering wholes that are composed of homogeneous parts. Boethius himself illustrates the problem with the example of a bronze rod, which he believes is a homogeneous substance (On Division 879d). Recall that if something is a homogeneous substance, then every part of that thing is also the same substance. That is, if y is a homogeneous whole and x is a part of y, the name and definition of y is also predicable of x. Every portion of bronze can take both the name and the definition of bronze, and hence, it seems that every part of the bronze rod meets the standard of being a subjective part. Therefore, it seems that the bronze rod is a universal, which is clearly absurd.

Boethius resolves the puzzle of the rod and its parts by noting that while it is true that each portion of bronze is bronze, it is not true that a portion of the original quantity of bronze is that original quantity of bronze (Boethius On Division 880a) Boethius’ solution is often repeated ((ps?) Abelard De divisionibus 169.33–36; Albertus Magnus In de Div. tract. 2, ch. 5 (Loe ed., 35); and Radulphus Brito In de Top. II, q. 9 [1978, 45]; cf. Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 3, art. 7).

The solution points to another difference between integral wholes and universals. As Abelard puts it, every integral whole “draws together” (comprehendere) some quantity (Dialectica, 546.21–27). The suggestion is that when some items compose an integral whole, that whole will be measurable with respect to some quantity or other. The integral whole that is measured by some quantity need not be composed out of material elements. Consider the mereological sum of the angel Gabriel and the angel Michael. If this sum is a whole (and there seems to be no reason to deny this), it seems it is an integral whole. However, there are some integral wholes which do not seem to embrace any quantity, namely, thoughts and actions. So there is need to locate yet another difference between universal wholes and integral wholes.

The last difference that we will consider is this: Universals, like Human Being or Horse, are not literally composed out of their species. Integral wholes, such as Socrates or a house, are composed out of their parts (John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4; Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii 2.16 [Opera II, 54]). Composites are dependent upon their components. Socrates is composed of his body and his soul. If these components did not exist and combine to form Socrates, Socrates would not exist. Components are often, but not necessarily, temporally prior to the whole that they compose. For example, the house is composed by bits of wood, stone, and iron, and these parts existed prior to the existence of the house. Universal wholes are neither dependent upon their parts, nor are the parts of a universal temporally prior to it. The species existed long before Socrates or Cicero, and will exist long after Socrates and Cicero. Indeed, Human Being can exist, even if no individual human being exists.

Unlike the appeal to quantity, the composition criterion can be applied to thoughts and actions, for a complex thought requires the simpler concepts that compose it, and penance requires that the actions that constitute penance occur.

On the other hand, it appears that a universal is also a composite. Every universal except for the most general of genera, can be said to be “composed” out of a genus and a differentia. These parts are sometimes called “essential” parts of the universal since the genus and differentia together constitute the essence of the universal (Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 8, art. 2, ad 3; and I q. 76, art. 8), although to avoid confusion we perhaps ought to call them definitional parts. The essence of a universal is usually encoded in its definition. For example, the definition of Human Being is rational mortal animal. Animal is the genus, and rationality and mortality are the differentiae.

Many medieval philosophers try to dampen this criticism by suggesting that the universal is, strictly speaking, not composite; it merely mimics composition (again, see Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii 2.16). Perhaps this is a viable response, but there is another problem with the composition requirement: it does not tell us why all the parts of integral wholes are integral parts. It was already observed in passing that not all parts of an integral whole are plausibly components of their wholes. Consider Socrates. The elements are strictly what compose Socrates. It is only when Socrates is composed that other parts, such as his hands and feet, come into existence. Or put another way, it is false to say that one makes a human being by cobbling together hands, feet, and head. Such a creature would be Frankenstein’s monster, not a human being.

In sum, a number of proposals are offered for how one can distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes. But perhaps no single proposal is universally embraced because of the bewildering variety of items that are integral wholes. An obvious solution would be to reduce the number of items that can be integral wholes or integral parts. And as we have seen already, some philosophers in fact do this in certain cases, as when Abelard eliminates temporal wholes. However, based on what we presently know, no medieval thinker attempts anything like a systematic eliminative project in mereology as such. (Thus, while Ockham, for instance, famously undertakes a comprehensive and severe eliminative project in ontology, he does not attempt to develop a systematic theory of what can and what cannot be a part. Rather, for him, the question whether “part” is being used either properly or figuratively tends to arise within a specific context and the resolution often appears to be developed on a case by case basis.)

3.4 Parts of potential wholes

Potential wholes add further complications. Like genera, and unlike integral wholes, it is usually assumed that potential wholes are not literally composed out of their parts. Potential wholes, or at least the subjects underlying them, are items that are fundamentally simple. But, in another respect, the parts of the potential whole behave like parts of an integral whole. Different souls can possess only a selection of the capacities associated with soul, and so in a sense, there is a construction of a specific soul’s total capacity out of many discrete capacities and powers. And no one power by itself exhibits or stands in for the whole soul.

The question thus arises as to how one can distinguish powers as parts from both subjective and integral parts. Here we will look briefly at only one account. Aquinas separates potential wholes from both universals and integral wholes by considering two parameters: the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole’s essence, and the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole’s power (Summa Theologiae I, q. 77, art. 1, ad 1). The universal whole “is present to each of its parts in its entire essence and power”. It is for this reason that each part of the universal is a subjective part. In contrast, the integral whole is not in each of its parts either in respect to its entire essence or in respect to its power. Hence, the integral whole is not predicable of any one of its parts taken singularly. Finally, the potential whole is present to each of its parts with respect to its entire essence, but not with respect to its full power. This is why, even though one’s soul is non-composite and cannot be cut up, the operation of thinking does not entail along with it the operation of sensing.

4. Mereology and metaphysics

Medieval philosophers are well aware that the study of wholes and their parts has numerous applications in metaphysics. I will conclude this survey by examining two applications. First, I will look at how theorizing about parts and wholes informs medieval reflections on identity at a time. Second, I will consider how mereology influences medieval theories of persistence through time and survival through change.

4.1 Identity

Medieval philosophers think that no part is identical to its whole.[5] The reasons why this is true are as varied as the types of parts and wholes themselves. If x is a quantitative part of y, then x is lesser in quantity than y. A donkey’s form is not identical to the donkey, because this donkey is a composite of the donkey’s form and something else, namely, the donkey’s matter. Socrates’ soul is not identical to the human being who is Socrates, for the human being is a composite of body and soul. Socrates is not a universal, even though he is a human being. And the extension of Animal is greater than the extension of Human Being.

However, there is another question that does divide medieval philosophers. Consider an integral whole. An integral whole is composed out of its parts. But is it true that an integral whole is no thing other than the sum of these parts? Some philosophers, such as Abelard and Ockham, argue that the whole is no thing other than the sum of its parts. Others, such as Duns Scotus, argue that the whole is some thing which is really distinct from the sum of its parts. (On the debate between Ockham and Scotus, see Cross 1995, Cross 1999, and Normore 2006.) The former philosophers perhaps base their position on passages from Boethius’ treatments of mereology such as this:

Every thing is the same as the whole. For example, Rome is the same as that which is the whole citizenry. Each and every thing is also the same as all its parts when they are gathered together into a unity. For example, a man is the same as the head, throat, belly, feet, and the rest of the parts gathered together and conjoined into a unity. (In Cic. top. 285.24–28)

Those who claim that the whole is not identical to its parts often appeal to Aristotle. For example, an anonymous commentator on Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations argues that “the five are not the two and the three” on the grounds that Aristotle has shown in his Metaphysics that “the composite, in general, is something other than its component parts” (Quaestiones super Sophisticos Elenchos q. 831 [1977, 346]; cf. Aristotle Metaphysics 8.6, 1045a9–10).

Peter Abelard provides one of the most sophisticated solutions to this problem. Abelard emphatically asserts that the whole is no thing other than the sum of its parts (Dialectica 344.34–5, and 550.6–7; cf. 560.34–561.2). But this is surely false. Consider a house. A house is composed out of a specific sum of boards and bricks. Yet these boards and bricks could be sitting together on the building site without being arranged as a house. Hence, it is hard to see how the house is no thing other than the sum of the parts.

Abelard will respond by drawing a distinction between the essentia, or concrete being, of a thing and the “conditions” (status) which a thing may possess or be in. True, the sum of boards and bricks must possess the appropriate arrangement in order to be a house (Logica Ingredientibus II, 171.14–17; and Dialectica 550.36–551.4). But when the sum takes on a specific structure it does not take on an extra part. Whatever they are, Abelard makes it very clear that structures and arrangements like those found in houses are not things (res), and only things can be parts. The imposition of a structure upon the sum of the boards and bricks does not add a part to the thing that is that sum, and hence, the sum of the boards and bricks is the same in essentia as the house—they are the very same thing. Nevertheless, there can be different conditions in which this thing is. When the sum of boards and bricks are arranged in one way, they are in the condition of being a house. When they are arranged in other ways, they are not in this condition. In short, to claim that the house is no thing other than the sum of its parts does not imply that the sum is in the state of being a house when the sum exists.

Abelard’s solution will only work if he can motivate the claim that a thing taking on a new condition does not make a new thing. And medieval realists went after such reductivist programs in much the same way that some contemporary realists do. Specifically, they often presented truth-maker challenges, or “anti-Razor” arguments (see Maurer 1984): If at one time this sum of boards and bricks is not a house and at another time it is a house, then there must be some item in reality, some thing, that is absent at the former time and present at the later time. The task, of course, is to identify the right sort of thing that can be such a difference maker.

But let us move on to consider another related puzzle about identity at a time. Abelard’s characterization of numerical sameness and difference seems to give us the tools to answer a common medieval puzzle which I will call the Problem of the Many Men. Versions of this problem can be found in a number of medieval works (see, e.g., Abelard Theologia Christiana III, § 153 (1969, 252); William of Sherwood Syncategoremata (O’Donnell ed., 60); Albert of Saxony Quaestiones in Physicam I, qq. 7–8, and his Sophismata 46, 25va–vb). The puzzle can easily be generated using a crude understanding of numerical sameness. Assume that Socrates’ body is perfectly intact: he has all his limbs, and their parts. Now consider every part of Socrates’ body except one finger. Call this whole W. W is not numerically the same as Socrates, so it appears that they must be numerically distinct. Socrates’ whole body is imbued with the soul of a man. But it also happens that W is imbued with the soul of a man. So, there are now two numerically distinct men where it initially appeared there was one. But it gets worse. Considering the body apart from one finger was only one of an indefinite number of such considerations. And by the same reasoning, these other bracketed wholes composed from Socrates’ body are also men. Hence, it is easy to generate an indefinite number of numerically distinct men where commonsense tells us that there is only one.

Abelard might appear to be capable of unraveling this puzzle by employing his distinction between difference in essentia and numerical difference, which he presents most clearly in his analysis of the Trinity (Theologia Christiana III, § 139 and §148 (1969, 247 and 250–1); see Brower 2004, 226–34). Abelard’s notion of sameness and difference in essentia is informed by his appreciation of the notion of mereological overlap (see the section on Basic Principles/Other Mereological Concepts, in the entry on mereology). His appreciation of mereological overlap in and of itself is a watershed, since he is one of the first (and perhaps one of the few) medieval philosophers to clearly understand this phenomenon.[6] According to Abelard, x is the same in essentia as y if and only if every part of x is a part of y and every part of y is a part of x. In other words, x is the same in essentia as y if and only if x and y mereologically coincide. If x is the same in essentia as y, then x is numerically the same as y. However, if x is not the same in essentia as y, it does not follow that x is numerically distinct from y. This is because x and y could overlap—that is, share at least one part—even if they do not coincide. Thus, Abelard’s answer to the Problem of the Many Men is that while there are many overlapping men, each of which is different in essentia from the others, this does not entail that there are an indefinite number of numerically different men. One might, however, wonder whether Abelard has completely dispelled the hint of paradox generated by the initial puzzle. After all, it would be nice to know which of these overlapping, but non-coincident wholes is Socrates. All that Abelard’s theoretical tools allow us to do is to say that while there is this whole which is imbued by Socrates’ soul and there is that whole which is imbued by Socrates’ soul, these wholes are not numerically many and, thus, there are not numerically many men where intuitively we thought there was only one (see Normore 2006, 749).

Most medieval philosophers tackle the Problem of the Many Men in another manner. Albert of Saxony, for example, resolves the puzzle by claiming that nothing which is a part of something else can be a numerically distinct existing being (Quaes. in Arist. Physicam I q. 8, 131–32; Sophismata 46, 25vb; cf. Fitzgerald 2009). Socrates’ body less the finger is not a distinct human substance, since it is a part of a human substance, namely, Socrates. Therefore, even if we grant that there are many things present, there are not many distinct humans present where we thought that there was only Socrates. If that appears to be an argument by stipulation, the reader might find William of Sherwood’s elaboration on this strategy helpful (Syncategoremata (O’Donnell ed., 61)). William concedes that, because Socrates-less-the-finger is perfected by a human soul, it can in a certain respect be said to be a human being. But in this respect Socrates and Socrates-less-the-finger are perfected by the same soul and if one wants to count humans, one counts human souls. Thus, Socrates and Socrates-less-the-finger are not numerically distinct humans. On the other hand, if Socrates-less-the-finger is considered as a part of something larger that is also perfected by the same soul, then in this respect Socrates-less-the-finger is numerically different from Socrates, but it is not a human being. Considered in terms of its being a part, Socrates-less-the-finger is a part of a body of a human being, and a body of a human being is not a human. Hence, we count too many humans only if we ignore these different respects under which the premises of the argument can be made true.

4.2 Persistence

Medieval philosophers also worry about the identity of objects over time and through change. Medieval examinations of identity over time, or persistence, are often occasioned by reflection on the maximal proposition associated with the Topic from the integral whole, which states:

If the whole is, the part is.

This maximal proposition, however, implies

If the part is not, the whole is not.

But this seems to entail that if Socrates’ hand does not exist, Socrates does not exist.

There is an innocent interpretation of this Topical maxim. Recall that “the whole x” can mean the complete x. Accordingly, to say that the whole is destroyed if the part is destroyed, is merely to say that the whole is incomplete or “mutilated” if a part is removed. It might also be the case that “the whole x” merely signifies all the parts of x taken together. On this reading, the maximal proposition would merely imply that, if x does not exist, then the whole consisting of x and some other parts does not exist. And, indeed, Boethius seems to mean only this:

For if a part of the whole perishes, the whole—namely, the [whole] whose one part was destroyed—will not exist. (On Division 879c [Magee 1998, 14]).

Boethius’ assertion that the whole consisting of x and all the rest will perish when x perishes leaves it open whether the remaining parts are still, say, Socrates or a house. Naturally, the creative parts had to be present in order to create Socrates or the house. For example, this sum of wood, cement, and nails is the sum of the creative parts of a house. If there had been no nails, wood, or cement, there would have been no house. Still, commonsense tells us that the creative parts need not remain present after the house has been created. Some boards and some nails may be replaced in the house, but this does not compromise the existence of this house.

Despite the appeal of commonsense, there were some medieval philosophers who took the maximal proposition to imply that if Socrates loses a finger, Socrates ceases to exist. At least at one point in his career, Peter Abelard appears to seriously entertain the radical reading of the maximal proposition (Henry 1991, 92–139). Abelard himself might have eventually backed away from this view (Martin 1998), but there are reports that suggest some of Abelard’s followers, the so-called Nominales, wholeheartedly embraced the extreme interpretation of the maximal proposition. One of the positions associated with the Nominales was that “nothing grows” (nihil crescit), and there is a surviving commentary on the Categories with Nominalist features where the author argues that any addition, removal, or even relocation of a part compromises the identity of the thing itself (Ebbesen 1999, 397). This extreme interpretation is derived from the judgment that each whole is the same thing as a unique set of parts. This house must be composed out of these nails, these boards, and this cement. If I use other nails or other boards, I could make a house, but not this very house. This premise is no doubt controversial, but Abelard and many of his contemporaries have principled reasons for holding it. Abelard believes that the ultimate pieces of the universe are tiny, indivisible bits of matter, souls, and perhaps some forms. The items that we experience are composites of these elements. Each element is self-identical. Composite beings are individuated by the elements that make them up, and in the case of complex, composite beings—such as artifacts and substances—by the arrangement that these bits have. Given such a universe, it is quite plausible to assume that the identity of a composite item is solely determined by its parts. It would then easily follow that the removal or addition of a composing element entails that the new whole is not identical to the old whole. Another whole similar to the original might exist after the mereological change take place, but strictly speaking the two wholes are not identical.

Most medieval philosophers are not as extreme as the Nominales. Of course, there are those parts that are required to keep the whole intact, but there are also those parts that can be lost without compromising the integrity of the whole. If we were to cut off Socrates’ head, he would perish. But if we amputate Socrates’ right hand, it seems that Socrates would not cease to exist. He would merely lack a hand. The parts required to keep a whole intact are called “principal”. Ones that could be lost without compromising the integrity of the whole were called “secondary” parts (Anonymous Introductiones maiores Montane 71va–72rb; Albertus Magnus Commentarii in De div. tract. 2, ch. 5 (Loe ed., 33–4); Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4). Examples of principal parts would be the foundation of the house, the heart of a cat, and the brain of Socrates. Examples of secondary parts are a brick in the house, a strand of hair belonging to the cat, and a fingernail of Socrates.

In the Twelfth century there was a heated debate about how to determine whether this or that part is principal (see Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 3–20 (2014, 122–29; Arlig 2013), for as Abelard pointed out the following account is insufficient:

x is a principal part of y if and only if the removal of x entails the destruction of y.

Abelard reminds his audience that even the extremist can accept this account of principal parts; the only difference is that on his account every part is a principal part (Dialectica 549–52).

The best answer that twelfth-century thinkers come up with is that a principal part of x is that which, when removed, compromises the form of x (Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 23–6 (2014, 130–31); Arlig 2013, 106–10). Many later medieval philosophers followed suit. At least in the case of substances, the substantial form could do the metaphysical work of guaranteeing persistence through time and change (Pasnau 2011, 689–92). For example, we have already seen that Burley draws a distinction between the whole secundum formam and the material whole. The whole considered formally persists so long as the form persists. The whole considered materially is the only whole compromised by changes in material parts (De toto et parte, 301). Most commonsense objects are identified with a whole considered with respect to form, and so there would be no reason to think that these things are substantially compromised by material changes. (The fate of artifacts, would be different, as their forms are merely accidental forms. A mereological change in the case of an artifact would seem to entail that the initial artifact is replaced by another one. But later medieval philosophers do not seem to be all that troubled by these implications. Whether theologians could stomach all the consequences that this view of artifacts entails (for example, for whether something remains ritually pure after it has been chipped) may be another matter. But this is an area whether further research is needed.)

This basic Aristotelian picture is complicated, if not outright altered, by several very influential fourteenth-century thinkers, including Ockham and Buridan (Normore 2006; Pasnau 2011, 692–702). We will consider Buridan’s theory of identity over time and change (Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione 1.13; Quaestiones in Physicam 1.10; with English paraphrase in Pluta 2001). According to Buridan, there are three senses of numerical sameness: (1) x is “totally” the same in number as y, (2) x is “partially” the same in number as y, and (3) x is numerically the same as y in a “less proper” way. Something is totally the same in number if all its parts remain the same and it neither acquires nor loses any parts. In this strictest of senses, no corruptible thing whatsoever persists through mereological change. Something is partially the same in number if its “most principal part” remains numerically the same. This is the sense that allows us to claim that Socrates is numerically the same man now as that man ten years ago. In particular, it is Socrates’ intellective soul which is the principal part and guarantor of persistence through change. Finally, something is less properly the same in number if there is merely a continuous succession of beings that maintain a similar shape, disposition, and form. This less proper mode of numerical sameness allows us to claim that the Nile River here today is numerically the same river as the Nile back in Herodotus’ time. While it is probably not a surprise to learn that rivers are the same in number only in a less proper sense, it is striking that Buridan goes on to assert that plants and non-rational animals too can only be numerically the same in this less proper sense (Quaestiones super De gen. 1.13 (2010, 114–15)). Buridan’s reason for thinking this is that non-rational creatures do not have the sort of soul that can act as a guarantor of less proper identity; rather, non-rational souls are themselves altered when the material parts are altered. Thus, over the span of a normal lifetime, neither the matter nor the form of a horse or an orchid remains numerically the same in anything other than a less proper sense.[7]

Buridan’s account appears to commit him to the view that the addition or subtraction of even tiny and seemingly inconsequential parts can bring about substantial change: strictly speaking we do not have one horse, but rather a succession of horses unified by three facts, namely, (1) these successive beings have some of the same parts, (2) this line of succession is continuous, and (3) each member in the line of succession is a horse. The picture we get has many similarities to the accounts of identity that we get in early modern thinkers like Hobbes and Locke. Thus, it is tempting to think that we are witnessing in Buridan’s work one more way in which the Aristotelian scholastic edifice is being eroded to the point that it will quickly crumble in the seventeenth century (see Pasnau 2011, 703 f., and Lagerlund 2012, esp. pp. 481–2).

5. Concluding remarks

Medieval philosophers study a variety of wholes and parts, and they often do so with a remarkable degree of sophistication. To be sure, some aspects of medieval mereology are idiosyncratic, but many of the puzzles that medieval philosophers wrestle with are analogous to ones that interest contemporary students of logic and metaphysics. Medieval philosophers are particularly attuned to the relationship between mereology and various problems in metaphysics, and many of their solutions to puzzles of identity and survival are embraced by philosophers in other periods. Even the idiosyncratic aspects of medieval mereology reveal a sophisticated appreciation of three fundamental questions in mereology, namely, what items are wholes, what items are parts, and under what conditions is one item a part of another item. This survey can only hint at the richness of medieval mereology. In part, this is due to the overwhelming number of medieval authors who say something or other, somewhere or other, about parts and wholes. But it is also due to the fact that there are still more texts to be unearthed, properly edited, and studied with care. Based on what we have already discovered, we should be confident that we will find many more interesting reflections on parts and wholes and that we will uncover further connections between medieval mereology and more recent theories of parts and wholes.


Ancient and Medieval Texts Cited

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  • –––, Quaestiones super octo libros Physicorum Aristotelis, Paris, 1509. Reprint as Kommentar zur Aristotelischen Physik, Frankfurt a. M.: Minerva, 1964.
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  • Lambert of Auxerre, Logica (Summa Lamberti), F. Alessio (ed.), Florence: La Nuova Italia Editrice, 1971.
  • Peter Abelard, Logica ‘ingredientibus’, pt. 1: Glossae super Porphyrium, in Peter Abaelards Philosophische Schriften. I. Die Logica ‘Ingredientibus. 1: die Glossen zu Porphyrius, Bernhard Geyer (ed.), Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, no. 21, pt. 1. Münster: Aschendorffshen Buchhandlung, 1919.
  • –––, Logica ‘ingredientibus’, pt. 2: Glossae super Praedicamenta Aristotelis, in Peter Abaelards Philosophische Schriften. I. Die Logica ‘Ingredientibus’. 2: die Glossen zu den Kategorien, Bernhard Geyer (ed.), Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, no. 21, pt. 2. Münster: Aschendorffshen Buchhandlung, 1921.
  • –––, Logica ‘nostrorum petitioni sociorum’: glossula super Porphyrium, in Peter Abaelards Philosophische Schriften. II. Die Logica ‘nostrorum petitioni sociorum: die Glossen zu Porphyrius, Bernhard Geyer (ed.), Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters, no. 21, no. 4. Münster: Aschendorffshen Buchhandlung, 1933.
  • –––, De divisionibus incipit, in Scritti filosofici, M. Dal Pra (ed.), Milan: Fratelli Bocco, 1954.
  • –––, Theologia Christiana, E. M. Buytaert (ed.), Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Mediaevalis, no. 12, Turnhout: Brepols, 1969.
  • –––, Dialectica, 2nd ed., L. M. de Rijk (ed.), Assen: Van Gorcum, 1970.
  • Peter of Spain, Tractatus [= Summule Logicales], L. M. de Rijk (ed.), Assen: Van Gorcum and Company, 1972. For a slightly revised Latin text with English translation see Peter of Spain 2014.
  • –––, Summaries of Logic, B. P. Copenhaver with C. Normore and T. Parsons (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Porphyry, Isagoge, A. Busse (ed.), Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca, no. 4, pt. 1, Berlin: George Reimer, 1887.
  • Pseudo-Joscelin, De generibus et speciebus, P. King (ed. and trans.), Oxford Studies in Medieval Philosophy, 2 (2014): 104–211
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  • Radulphus Brito, Quaestiones super libro Topicorum, N. J. Green-Pedersen (ed.), Cahiers du l’Institut du Moyen-age Grec et Latin 26 (1978): 1–92.
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  • William of Sherwood, Syncategoremata, R. O’Donnell (ed.), Mediaeval Studies, 3 (1941): 46–93.

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