Radulphus Brito

First published Fri Mar 2, 2018; substantive revision Thu Feb 1, 2024

Radulphus Brito († 1320/21) was an important thirteenth-century master of arts at the University of Paris. He was part of the group of medieval masters known as the modistae, principally because of their common appeal to the notion of modes of signifying (modi significandi) in their accounts of grammatical congruence. Brito’s philosophical work is largely unexplored, even though it is a crucial link between the philosophical discussions of the thirteenth and the fourteenth centuries. Among other things, he richly contributed to the development of medieval logic and philosophy of language. In fact, one can fairly consider his logic of intentions to be the pinnacle of the development of thirteenth-century Aristotelian logic. Brito was a prolific author, who commented on nearly all the Aristotelian corpus. Almost his entire philosophical work is extant, although most of it is unedited but several critical editions of his works are in progress.

1. Life

The important studies by William Courtenay (2005) and Jean-Luc Deuffic (2002) significantly increased our knowledge of Brito’s biography. He was born in the village of Ploudiry, in French Brittany, around 1270 and not later than 1273. He was a master of arts in Paris from around 1290 and probably began the study of theology in 1299, while still teaching in the faculty of arts. He read Peter Lombard’s Sentences in 1308/09 and obtained his doctorate in theology in 1313/14. Brito became Provisor[1] of the Sorbonne at some point between 1312 and 1315 and kept this function until at least 1319. He also held several ecclesiastical positions, which is a good indication of both his prominence within the university and excellent personal connections. Brito died in 1320/21.

2. Writings

Brito’s philosophical output consists mainly of question-commentaries on the corpus of Aristotle’s writings, Boethius’ logical corpus, and Priscian’s grammar. In all likelihood, these commentaries were produced during his career as a master of arts in Paris in the 1290s.

His grammatical and logical works, which are those that have been most thoroughly studied, consist of the following question-commentaries:

  1. Quaestiones super Priscianum minorem (= QPm)
  2. Quaestiones super librum De divisione Boethii (two versions)
  3. Quaestiones super librum Topicorum Boethii
  4. Quaestiones super artem veterem (= QAV)
    • 4.1 Quaestiones super Porphyrium (= QsP)
    • 4.2 Quaestiones super librum Praedicamentorum
    • 4.3 Quaestiones super librum Perihermeneias
  5. Quaestiones super librum Priorum Analyticorum
  6. Quaestiones super librum Posteriorum Analyticorum
  7. Quaestiones super librum Topicorum
  8. Quaestiones super Sophisticos Elenchos
  9. Quaestiones in librum Sex principiorum
  10. Sophismata

Although most of these works are only extant in manuscript form, there are editions of 1 (QPm-1980), 3 (QTB-1978) and 5 (QPA-2016), and editions of 2, 7 and 8 are forthcoming. There are also editions in progress of 9, 10, 4.1 and 4.2. There is a fifteenth-century edition (QR-1499) and a Renaissance Greek translation by Gennadios Scholarios (Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982) of 4, as well as a number of partial editions of 4–10. See in particular Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982 for an edition of the prooemium of 4.1.[2]

Much less studied is the remaining part of Brito’s philosophical corpus, which consists of the following question-commentaries:

  1. Quaestiones super libros I–XII Metaphysicae (= QMet)
  2. Quaestiones super librum Physicorum
  3. Quaestiones in libros De anima (= QDA)
  4. Quaestiones in parva naturalia (including Quaestiones De memoria et reminiscentia (= QDM))
  5. Quaestiones super librum Meteorologicorum
  6. Quaestiones super libros I–II Politicorum
  7. Quaestiones super librum Ethicorum (= QEN; two versions)
  8. Quaestiones in parva mathematicalia
  9. Quaestiones in librum De substantia orbis (the attribution to Brito remains uncertain; see QE-2008: 103)
  10. Quaestiones super librum De motibus animalium
  11. Quaestiones super Physiognomicam
  12. Quaestiones super librum De causis

Most of these works are also extant only in manuscript. There are editions in progress of 1 and 8. Only 7 (QE-2008) and 12 (QDc-2016) have been fully edited. Regarding 3, the questions on De anima I (QDA-2012-I) and on De anima III (QDA-1974-III) are fully edited, and there is a partial edition of the questions on De anima II (QDA-2012-II). Finally, there are partial editions of 1, 4–6 and 8.[3]

Almost completely unexplored are Brito’s theological writings, virtually all of which are unedited. These include a question commentary on Peter Lombard’s Sentences I–III, written in 1308/9 and preserved in the ms. Pavia, Biblioteca Universitaria Aldini 244 ff. 15–54. In addition, Prospero di Reggio Emilia reports a set of theological questions, preserved in ms. Vaticana lat. 1086, ff. 156rv and 196r–208r (see QE-2008: 103). And F. Stegmüller has attributed to Brito a set of questions on the Psalms, also preserved in the Pavia manuscript (see QE-2008: 103). The authenticity of the two latter items is still uncertain, however (see QE-2008: 103). Partial editions of the commentary on the Sentences are found in Rossini and Schabel 2005 and in QE-2008.

3. Grammar

3.1 The Subject Matter of Grammar

In his commentary on Priscian Minor, Brito endeavors to show that grammar meets the criteria a medieval discipline must meet in order to be considered a theoretical science. In doing so, he puts forth his own account of grammar as an independent theoretical, yet instrumental, science in terms of both subject matter and principles (for Brito’s theoretical grammar, see Pinborg 1967; Rosier-Catach 1983, 1999, 2010; Ebbesen 1998a.). Regarding grammar’s subject matter, Brito’s position is that, from the point of view of predication, signifying speech (sermo significativus) is the general subject matter. In fact, signifying speech is:

  1. the common predicate of what we firstly aim to know in grammar;
  2. that the existence of which is presupposed by grammar; and
  3. that the features of which are demonstrated in grammar (QPm; QPm-1980: 103–104).

However, from the point of view of attribution, the expression (oratio) can also be considered the subject matter of grammar, as everything that grammar considers is in one way or another related to it (QPm; QPm-1980: 104). More specifically, from the point of view of predication, the expression is discussed in the so-called Priscian Minor (books XVII–XVIII of Priscian’s Institutiones), which is exclusively concerned with the principles of grammatical expressions and with the demonstration of their features (QPm; QPm-1980: 107).

3.2 The Modi significandi or the Principles of Grammatical Speech

The principles of the grammatical expression—what makes an expression grammatical—are the modes of signifying (modi significandi) of its constituent parts (Rosier-Catach 1995), which are the parts of speech (partes orationis), i.e., noun, verb, participle, pronoun, preposition, adverb, conjunction, and interjection. The modes of signifying are, in turn, the formal constituent features of these parts (QPm; QPm-1980: 138–139).

A part of speech is the result of a series of hylomorphic compositions starting with articulated sound (vox). First, the word (dictio) is the result of the hylomorphic composition of an articulate sound (vox) and the relation of signification (ratio significationis).[4] This relation links the articulate sound to the thing signified (res significata, for res significata, see Rosier-Catach 1995), regardless of the thing’s different modes of being (modi essendi; for modi essendi, see Donati 2013). In fact, things and their modes of being are not identical. For instance, a horse may happen to be a particular horse, a universal horse, my horse, etc., but being particular, being universal, being mine, etc. are all different from being a horse.

A part of speech (pars orationis) is the result of the hylomorphic composition of a word and a mode of signifying. The mode of signifying, in turn, is derived from some of the modes of being a thing may have (QPm; QPm-1980: 164). For instance, a ‘walk’ has the mode of signifying of a qualified substance, because it indicates the action of walking as a qualified substance (QPm; QPm-1980: 192–193). This mode of signifying directly results from a particular mode of understanding (modus intelligendi) the action of walking, namely from understanding it as a qualified substance. Generally speaking, then, the modes of signifying are taken from their corresponding modes of understanding; and the modes of understanding, in turn, are taken from the modes of being of things. This is, in fact, the fundamental tenet of the modistic grammar to which Brito adheres: the modes of signifying follow from the modes of understanding things, which in turn follow from the modes of being of things. Note, however, that a walk is in itself an action and not a substance. But this is not a problem for grammar’s scientific status because a grammatical item takes its mode of signifying from the modes of being that things can have in general and not necessarily from the actual modes of being of a specific word’s significate (QPm; QPm-1980: 164). Consequently, every mode of signifying is ultimately grounded in a mode of being that has metaphysical reality, making the science of grammar grounded.

Having established that every mode of signifying corresponds, through a mode of understanding, to a thing’s mode of being, Brito goes on to introduce a distinction between active and passive modes of signifying, as well as between active and passive modes of understanding.[5] The passive mode of understanding and the passive mode of signifying are the mode of being as understood and the mode of being as indicated by the part of speech, respectively. Therefore, although the passive mode of signifying, the passive mode of understanding, and the mode of being are features of the same thing, they are conceptualized differently.

The active mode of understanding and the active mode of signifying are the intellectual apprehension of the mode of being and the corresponding relation of consignification whereby the part of speech indicates that mode of being (QPm; QPm-1980: 153). Hence, the active mode of understanding and the active mode of signifying are conceptualized differently; they are also features of different things, the former of a concept and the latter of a word. Nevertheless, they are linked by a causal relation, because the mode of understanding immediately causes the mode of signifying. Thus, the active modes of signifying and understanding are similar, arguably on grounds of the Aristotelian principle that effects resemble their causes (QPm; QPm-1980: 158).

Finally, the active and passive modes of signifying are notionally identical, but they are features of different things. This is because one and the same relation of consignification is considered on the one hand as a feature of a grammatical item and, on the other, as a feature of a thing. The same goes for the active and passive modes of understanding (QPm; QPm-1980: 170).

Since grammar is mainly concerned with the principles of grammatical speech, one could expect these principles to be the active modes of signifying—the formal features of the words that constitute a grammatical phrase. However, since the active modes are notionally identical to the passive ones, Brito claims that, from a formal perspective, both the active and the passive modes of signifying are the principles of grammatical constructions. The modes of being, on the contrary, are the principles of grammatical constructions only insofar as they are consignified by the parts of speech (QPm; QPm-1980: 173).

A grammatical phrase is formed when the modes of signifying of its constituent parts are grammatically compatible with each other (QPm; QPm-1980: 132). Note, however, that grammatical compatibility is ultimately grounded in real compatibility. Hence, ‘a man runs’ is a grammatical construction, because the mode of signifying of ‘a man’ (i.e., the mode of the qualified substance) and that of ‘runs’ (i.e., the mode of being performed) are compatible with each other. These modes of signifying are in turn compatible with each other because the modes of being that ‘a man’ and ‘runs’ consignify are compatible with each other.

4. Logic

4.1 The Subject Matter of Logic and Its Division: The Methods for the Acquisition of Scientific Knowledge and the Syllogism

According to Brito, as grammar, logic is a theoretical and instrumental science, which deals with the methods for the acquisition of scientific knowledge (modi sciendi, hereafter ‘methods of knowledge’) (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 301). However, since the syllogism is the method of knowledge acquisition par excellence, and that to which all the other methods of knowledge are subordinated, it can also be considered as the subject matter of logic.

For a medieval master like Brito, the science of logic is first and foremost contained in Aristotle’s organon (see entry on Aristotle’s logic). Hence, Brito’s account of logic as a science explains the division of the organon into six treatises as a reflection of a division of the syllogism into its different kinds (the demonstrative syllogism, the dialectical syllogism, etc.) and its constituent parts (simple words, assertions, etc.). Accordingly, Brito’s first division of logic proceeds as follows: the syllogism considered only with regard to its moods and figures is the subject matter of the Prior Analytics. The syllogism considered according to the epistemic quality of its premises is the subject matter of the Topics and of the Posterior Analytics, the former dealing with the syllogism from probable premises and the latter with the syllogism from necessary premises. The syllogism from premises that appear to be probable but under closer examination turn out not to be probable at all is, in turn, the subject matter of the Sophistical Refutations. Now, since the syllogism can also be analyzed with respect to its constituent parts, the Categories deals with its simple parts—simple words—insofar as they can be sorted into different kinds (substance, quality, quantity, etc.). Finally, the De interpretatione deals with the complex parts of the syllogism—assertions that become its premises and conclusion (what in other contexts is sometimes called a propositio complexa)—as well as with the simple parts of the assertion, i.e., the subject and predicate terms (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 301 and 303).

4.2 The Subject Matter of Logic and Its Division: The Logic of Second Intentions

Brito also presents us with the most developed account of thirteenth-century logic of intentions (for Brito’s logic, see Pinborg 1967, 1971, 1975a; Ebbesen 1998a). His logic of intentions considers the subject matter of logic to be second intentions[6] (intentiones secundae), which are best understood as logical notions applied to first intentions. A first intention is the first intellectual apprehension of a thing—the unqualified concept that only grasps what a thing essentially is. A second intention, in turn, is a first intention qualified according to a logical notion. For instance, the concept of human understood as substance because its content is the substantial form of individual humans, or understood as species because its content actually informs several individuals specifically identical, etc. (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 307).

Since first and second intentions are essentially related to an object of cognition, depending on whether the cognitive relation is taken from the side of the thinking subject or from the side of the object, first and second intentions can be abstract or concrete. Accordingly, human, insofar as it is known through its concept, is a concrete first intention; its concept is an abstract first intention. On the other hand, human, understood as a species of animal, is a concrete second intention; the concept of human thus understood is an abstract second intention, etc. (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 307).

Brito goes on to claim that, from another perspective, the subject matter of logic is concrete second intentions. The subsequent division of logic must then correspond to a division of concrete second intentions. Such a division is deduced from the three cognitive operations of the intellect: apprehension, composition/division, and deduction (Ebbesen and Pinborg 1981-1982: 309). A second intention is a logical notion qualifying the object of some of these intellectual operations. Correspondingly, the Categories deals with concrete second intentions understood through intellectual apprehension (e.g., human as substance, whiteness as quality, etc.). De interpretatione deals with concrete second intentions understood through composition and division (e.g., human as subject, white as predicate, a human being white as an assertion, etc.). Both Analytics, the Topics, and Sophistical Refutations deal with concrete second intentions involved in syllogistic deduction. In other words, these treatises deal with things insofar as they are related to a syllogistic process, e.g., with the premise that every human is an animal (in the Prior Analytics), with the probability of a human being white (in the Topics), with the necessity of every human being an animal (in the Posterior Analytics), etc. (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 309 and 311).

Of particular importance is the difference between concrete second intentions as they are dealt with in the Prior Analytics on the one hand, and in the Topics and the Posterior Analytics on the other. For the Prior Analytics deals with second intentions related to a syllogistic process, regardless of whether its premises are probable or necessary, whereas the Topics and the Posterior Analytics deal with those second intentions related to syllogistic processes where the premises are qualified as probable or necessary, respectively. Therefore, while the Prior Analytics deals with the intentions involved in a syllogistic deduction only with regard to its mood and figure, the Topics and the Posterior Analytics deal with these intentions with regard to their probability and necessity (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 311 and 313).

Brito’s logic of intentions also allows him to explain away a concern that had troubled earlier commentators of Aristotle’s logic, such as Nicholas of Paris and Robert Kilwardby, namely the fact that simple words, such as ‘man’, are discussed in the Categories, De interpretatione and Prior Analytics (see Mora-Márquez 2015b: 71). If, they thought, a discussion of simple words belongs in logic at all, then it ought to be found in precisely one treatise. However, since logic, for Brito, deals with human as a concrete second intention rather than as a word or a thing, the problem does not arise. In fact, the Categories discusses human insofar as it is a substance; the De interpretatione insofar as it is a subject of predication; and the Prior Analytics insofar as it is a term, i.e., the major, minor or middle term of a syllogism (QsP; see Ebbesen & Pinborg 1981–1982: 313).

Finally, Brito’s logic of intentions results in a major departure from the logical tradition represented by Kilwardby and his contemporaries: the exclusion of truth from the realm of logic (see Mora-Márquez 2015b: ch. 4). According to Brito, logic does not deal with truth because it does not deal with real things per se, and real things, regardless of whatever second intentions they may fall under, are the truth-makers of assertions (QPm; QPm-1980: 138–139). The truth of an assertion such as ‘every human is an animal’[7] depends on a real identity holding between man and animal—a real identity that is independent of the fact that human is a species, a subject, a substance, etc. In other words, such an identity is independent of the logical notions that qualify the cognitive apprehension of man. Despite this, second intentions do play a role in the validity of deductions that have ‘every human is an animal’ as a premise, for second intentions are the principles of a syllogism’s validity. But they are not the principles of an assertion’s truth or falsity, and hence truth is no longer a logical concern.

5. Psychology

5.1 The Science of the Soul

In his question commentary on Aristotle’s De anima I, Brito asks about the subject matter of the science of the soul (for Brito’s psychology, see De Boer 2012, 2013). With respect to this question, earlier scholars usually take one of two main opposing positions: the subject matter of psychology is either simply the soul, or it is the body that has a soul, i.e., the animate body. Brito opts for the second position: the subject matter of the science of the soul is the animate body, with an emphasis on its being animated. Two arguments support his position: the science of the soul studies the operations and features specifically related to the animate body’s having a soul (growth, nutrition, sensation, and understanding). Hence, its subject matter ought to be the possessor of those operations and features—the animate body. Accordingly, this science does not study the soul, that which makes the animate body animate, without any consideration of its relation to the body; rather, it studies the entire composite of body and soul, and more specifically, the body that has a soul (QDA-2012-I: 276). Therefore, the science of the soul approaches the soul not as an entity totally detached from the body it animates, but rather as the cause of the set of operations and features that separate living beings from inanimate bodies.

5.2 Body/Soul Relation and the Definition of the Soul

In his commentary on De anima II, Brito goes on to discuss the description of the soul as the substantial form of the living body. The discussion is directly related to the debate between those (like Albert the Great) who describe the soul as the extrinsically given perfection of the living body, and those (like Thomas Aquinas) who describe it as the living body’s intrinsic substantial form. The first group of commentators refrained from describing the soul as the substantial form of the body because this seemed too close to the materialist account of Alexander of Aphrodisias, who seemingly would hinder the possibility of separating the human soul after the body’s death. Albert, then, describes the soul as that which extrinsically perfects (perficit) a material body that has life potentially—a material body capable of performing the operations causally related to being alive. Aquinas, however, opts for a description more in accordance with Aristotelian doctrine: the soul is the intrinsic substantial form of the living body, for that which separates animate from inanimate bodies must belong essentially, and intrinsically, to animate bodies as their form. Brito sides with Aquinas and describes the soul as the substantial form of the body. His position is supported by two arguments: a substantial form is that due to which something receives its specific name (e.g., ‘horse’); when this form is removed, its subject goes by that name only equivocally (e.g., a dead horse is called ‘a horse’ only equivocally); since the soul is that due to which an animate body is said to be animate, and since its removal makes the body animate only equivocally, the soul must be the substantial form of the animate body (QDA-2012-II: 319). More importantly, the substantial form is that due to which individuals belonging to a natural kind can perform the specific operations that distinguish them from other kinds belonging to the same genus. Hence, since the soul is that due to which the animate body can perform its specific operations of growth, nutrition, sensation, and understanding, the soul must be described as the substantial form of the animate body (QDA-2012-II: 320).

Accordingly, Brito also considers the animate body—the hylomorphic composition of body and soul—to be an essential unity—a unity where the body is the material part and the soul is the formal part (QDA-2012-II: 325). Like Aristotle, Brito dismisses as misleading the question about the metaphysical link that binds soul and body together in an essential unity. In fact, there is no such link that belongs essentially and intrinsically to the animate body. If it existed, it would be either material or formal. It cannot be material, because whatever is material is also potential, and whatever is potential is unable to connect in actuality body and soul. If it were formal, it would be either a substantial or an accidental form. It cannot be a substantial form, for then the animate body would have two substantial forms—a possibility that Brito categorically rejects. And it cannot be an accidental form, because the possession of accidents naturally implies the possession of a substantial form that serves as their support. Hence, we end up with an additional substantial form that supports the accident that binds body and soul. Consequently, the cause of the union of body and soul can only be an extrinsic agent that does not belong essentially to the animate body (QDA-2012-II: 326).

Brito defends, then, the correctness of Aristotle’s definition of the soul as the act of an organic physical body that has life potentially. In keeping with the description of the soul as a substantial form, the soul is defined as the first actualization of the animate body. The rest of the definition singles out the specific kind of body the soul actualizes. First, the body in question is natural and not artificial, for the actualization of the body by the soul creates an individual belonging to a natural kind and not an artifact like a table. Second, it is organized (i.e., organic), for it involves an interconnected set of fundamentally different parts whereby the different operations of the animate body are carried out (QDA-2012-II: 328). Finally, it has life potentially, quite simply because there cannot be something actual in a certain respect that was not previously potential in the very same respect. In other words, one could not be an actual living being if one’s body did not first possess the potentiality to be alive (QDA-2012-II: 329). Consequently, according to Brito, Aristotle’s definition of the soul correctly places the soul in the class of substantial acts or forms, just as it correctly singles out the specific kind of matter that this act or form actualizes—an organic physical body that has life potentially.

5.3 Faculty Psychology

Brito’s explanation of why the animate body must be organic also shows his commitment to a faculty psychology. He says:

Every form that has several capacities and operations […] requires its subject to have multiple organs in order to perform those operations; the soul has several faculties and several operations; therefore etc. […] [T]he vegetative faculty has the capacities of nutrition, growth, and generation; and these capacities have different operations: the capacity of nutrition must preserve the substance of what is nourished; the capacity of growth must lead it to a perfect quantity (ducere ad perfectam quantitatem), and the capacity of generation must preserve the species. The sensitive soul also has multiple capacities: the capacity of sight, of hearing, of smell, etc., which have different operations. Also, the common sense has several capacities, as imagination (potentia ymaginativa) and memory (potentia memorativa). Therefore, the soul requires multiple organs in its body in order to perform those operations. Also, the intellectual soul insofar as it is intellectual does not have a bodily organ; however, its operation depends on some bodily power (virtus) that is in an organ, i.e., on the phantasia. (QDA-2012-II: 328–329)

Consequently, the parts of the organic body are instruments for the operations specifically performed by living beings; operations that are divided into three different kinds: vegetative (bodily, non-cognitive), sensitive (bodily, cognitive) and intellectual (non-bodily, cognitive). These operations must, then, correspond to three specifically different faculties of the soul, which are responsible for the actualization of the organic body’s potential with regard to those operations (QDA-2012-II: 343 and 345).

5.4 Cognitive Psychology

The soul has two cognitive faculties: the sensitive and the intellectual. The sensitive faculty is bodily in the sense that its operations necessarily use bodily organs (QDA-1974-III: 102). This faculty involves powers that are divided into external and internal senses (sight, hearing, taste, smell and touch, and common sense, estimation, memory and phantasia, respectively),[8] depending on whether their operations are performed through external or internal organs (i.e., the eye, the ear, the tongue, etc., and the three ventricles of the brain) (QDM; Ebbesen 2016: 36). The most complex animals must have both internal and external senses, because for their self-preservation they must have the capacity to form sensory representations of external objects, whether they are present or absent (QDM; Ebbesen 2016: 35). All of these senses perform different cognitive operations that take different objects, e.g., sight takes color, hearing takes sound, estimation takes the harmful and the useful, memory takes sensorial representations, etc. (QDM; Ebbesen 2016: 38). Moreover, each of these senses contributes in a specific way to the formation by the phantasia of a unified sensory representation (a phantasma) of the external object.

5.5 Intellectual Cognition

The intellectual faculty, in turn, does not use a bodily organ in its operations. According to Brito, however, every single case of intellectual cognition takes as a starting point a phantasma or image (QDM; Ebbesen 2016: 40). This does not mean that the image is itself the object of intellectual cognition. On the contrary, Brito emphasizes in several places that the object of intellectual cognition is the essence (quod quid est) of the thing (QDA-1974-III: 174; cf. QDM; Ebbesen 2016: 41). For instance, what is known through intellectual cognition is neither the image of the apple nor the external apple, but the essence of the external apple that the image represents.

The intellectual cognition of an essence involves two operations that correspond to two different powers of the intellectual faculty: the operations of abstraction and intellection by the agent and the possible intellect. Since the essence in both the image and the external thing has material existence, and since the object of intellectual cognition must be immaterial, a power is necessary that makes the essence immaterial. This power is the agent intellect—an active power that, through its act of abstraction, makes immaterial the essence that the image represents materially (QDA-1974-III: 212).

Brito rejects two alternative accounts that explain this act of abstraction either as

  1. the impression of a disposition in the image, or as
  2. the removal of the accidental features that accompany the essence in the image.

The former, (i), is rejected because whatever is impressed in a material power immediately becomes material, and hence the impression of a disposition in the image cannot make the essence immaterial (QDA-1974-III: 218). The latter, (ii), is rejected because either the result of the removal remains in the phantasia—a material power—and we end up again with the same problem as in (i), or the result is transferred to the possible intellect and we end up with a problematic transfer of an accidental form from one subject to another—from the organ of the phantasia to the soul (QDA-1974-III: 230). An accident only has being in a substance; hence, if the transfer of accidents from one subject to another were possible, one would need to posit a time t where the accident has no supporting substance, which is impossible. Brito’s own account is that the agent intellect functions as a ‘light’ that enables the essence in the image to trigger a corresponding act of intellection without any removal, impression, or transfer of a form. Brito explains his point by means of an analogy with seeing milk’s whiteness: thanks to the action of light, the milk’s whiteness is seen, without other features of the milk being seen, e.g., its sweetness; but the action of light on the milk involves neither the impression of a disposition on the milk’s whiteness (namely, visibility) nor a real removal of the whiteness from the sweetness (QDA-1974-III: 237). In fact, the milk’s whiteness is in itself potentially visible and the action of light does nothing more than to make it actually visible. The same goes for the agent intellect: it makes the essence in the image, which is in itself potentially intelligible, be actually intelligible.

The essence in the image thus illuminated, but neither really separated from the image nor transferred anywhere, triggers the act of intellection of the possible intellect—the passive power of the intellectual faculty. This power is passive precisely in the sense that it cannot trigger its own operation; rather, this operation must be triggered by the essence of the thing with the assistance of the agent intellect (QDA-1974-III: 122). Finally, the act of intellection comes about when, thanks to the action of the agent intellect, the actually intelligible essence in the image is actually understood by the possible intellect, thus causing the formation of the essence’s concept in the soul.

6. Metaphysics

6.1 The Science of Metaphysics

Assuming that Aristotle’s Metaphysics (Met.) is a systematic account of a particular subject, Brito follows the majority of medieval commentators by beginning his inquiry with the question “What is the subject matter of metaphysics?”. In the first question of the first book he asks whether the subject matter of metaphysics is being. Traditionally, the question arises because of Aristotle’s treatment of:

  • (i) being in general in Met. Γ 1–2 and E 1;
  • (ii) being as applied primarily to first substances in Met. Z–Ξ; and
  • (iii) being as applied to the causes of being in Met.. A 1–2, E 1 and Λ.

Therefore, it seems necessary to determine whether the proper subject matter of metaphysics is:

  • (i) being in general;
  • (ii) first substances; or
  • (iii) separate substances.

Depending on which subject matter is posited, metaphysics would be considered

  • (i′) as a science about what it is to be;
  • (ii′) as a science about material things; or
  • (iii′) as a science akin to theology.

In his solution to the question, Brito considers only positions (i) and (iii), the first of which he attributes to Avicenna and the second to Averroes. He sides with Avicenna and supports his position with both authoritative and epistemological arguments: the subject matter of metaphysics is being, not only because Aristotle says so in Met. Γ.1.1003a20–23, but also because, just as the science of being as being must do, Metaphysics deals with the parts and attributes of being in general (e.g., in its discussion of first substances, form and matter, truth and unity, etc.), as well as with its causes and principles (e.g., in its discussion of the causes of being in Metaphysics. A and E) (QMet: I.1).

Averroes’ position is dismissed for methodological reasons: first, metaphysics cannot be equated with theology, because the latter must posit God and proceed to the demonstration of his attributes, but Met. E presumably contains an inquiry into God’s existence. Second, metaphysics is not the science of separate substances, because the inquiry into the notion of being is also concerned with material substances (QMet: I.1).

6.2 Essence and Being

Brito also contributes to the medieval debate on whether there is a fundamental difference between a thing’s essence and its being or existence (essentia et esse). In his reply to the question whether being belongs to the essence of things, Brito, like Siger of Brabant before him, takes issue with Aquinas’ position, according to which being is something added to the essence of a thing, though not as an accident. Aquinas’ position posits an odd constituent of things, which is neither essential nor accidental, but, as Brito calls it, “fictional” (figmentum) (Ebbesen 2001: 476).

Brito’s position is that essence and being are identical (QMet: IV.2). His argument can be summarized as follows:

  1. A thing x has being either by itself (i.e., essentially) or by something else, say by \(x_{1}\).
  2. If by itself, then being belongs to its essence; if by \(x_{1}\), then \(x_{1}\) has being either by itself or by something else, say by \(x_{2}\).
  3. If by itself, then the same conclusion must obtain with respect to x; if by something else, then there would be an infinite regress.
  4. Therefore, x has being by itself.

Brito’s opponents attack either step 2 or step 3 of his argument. The objection to step 2 states that a thing’s being does not need to have being, in the same way that the whiteness that makes something white need not be white; so, \(x_{1}\) need not have being. A first objection to step 3 rejects the infinite regress, because there may be a \(x_{n}\) that has being by itself—the first cause (QMet: IV.2). According to a second objection to step 3, not everything is such that its being and essence differ, so some \(x_{n}\)’s being and essence can be the same without this leading to the same conclusion with respect to x.

Brito’s position is clearly articulated in his reply to these objections. In fact, whatever is predicated of a thing is predicated on the basis of something that is either essential or accidental to it. If being is not predicated essentially, then it must be predicated by means of an accidental attribute. But according to Brito accidents have being,[9] therefore step 2 stands. Moreover, if being belongs to the essence of some \(x_{n}\), which is not the first cause, then it must belong to the essence of any \(x_{n}\), which is not the first cause; therefore, step 3 also stands. And no \(x_{n}\) can be the first cause, because, Brito tells us, being is an intrinsic and formal disposition of things, which the first cause cannot be (QMet: IV.2; cf. Donati 2013: 348). In other words, the predication of being cannot be based on something that is neither essential nor accidental; and whoever claims that it is based on something accidental will be committed to an infinite regress. Consequently, being is predicated essentially of things, i.e., it belongs to them essentially.

6.3 Modi essendi and Apparentia

Although being is not equivocally predicated relative to substance and accident, it is not predicated completely univocally either (Ebbesen 2001: 477). In fact, Brito develops his own account of the analogy of being, according to which being is predicated of substances and accidents with respect to a single concept, but under different modalities (Donati 2013: 338). The predication of being has reality in the ontological structure of things, specifically in metaphysical constituents called presentations (apparens) or modes of being (modus essendi). A thing’s presentations or modes of being are properties of the thing that manifest themselves in its perceivable operations (Donati 2013: 344; Ebbesen 2001: 479). These presentations explain both the common attribution and the different ways in which being is attributed to substance and accident, without having to appeal to a multiplicity of forms. The common predication of being to substance and accident is supported by a common mode of being: their esse formaliter—the principle of being that formally exists in both of them (Donati 2013: 345). The different modalities of predication, in turn, are taken from the substance’s capacity to exist in its own right and by the accident’s dependence on the substance for its existence, which are modes of being of the substance and of the accident, respectively.

6.4 Universals

Brito’s contribution to the medieval debate on the ontological status of universals is found in his reply to the set of questions left unresolved by Porphyry in his Isagoge. In his commentary on this text, Brito raises the question whether the universal exists independently of any intellectual operation. His reply is negative or positive depending on whether the question concerns the actual or the potential universal. In doing so, Brito puts forth a moderate realist position with respect to the external existence of universals (see also Sirridge 2008).

On the one hand, the actual universal does not exist independently from the intellect, because its being depends on a separation from matter performed by the active power of the intellect (QsP; see Pinborg 1980: 86). The actual universal is the cognition of an essence, and hence it is evidently dependent on the intellect’s activity (QsP; see Pinborg 1980: 100).

On the other hand, the potential universal exists independently of the intellect, because it is an essence that has as one of its modes of being the capacity to be separated from matter by the agent intellect. But the essence and its modes of being are in themselves external and independent of such an intellectual separation (QsP; see Pinborg 1980: 86 and 92). Therefore, the potential universal exists independently from any intellectual operation.

However, in a subsequent question (QsP; q.8) Brito also presents a way in which the actual universal can be said to exist in the external world. For, as was explained above in Brito’s logic, any cognition is an abstract or concrete intention depending on whether we consider it from the perspective of the cognitive subject or from the perspective of the thing understood. Hence, the actual universal understood as a concrete intention (i.e., as the thing understood) has external existence, although not independently of the intellect. Still, understood as an abstract intention (i.e., from the perspective of the cognitive subject) the actual universal exists only in the soul (QsP; see Pinborg 1980: 114).

In sum, Brito’s realist position states that the universal has external existence in at least two senses: first, potentially, in the essence with the intrinsic capacity of becoming the object of universal cognition; second, actually, in the essence actually known through universal cognition by virtue of its modes of being.

7. Ethics

7.1 The Commentaries on the Ethics

Radulphus Brito has been identified as the author of two anonymous sets of questions on Aristotle’s Ethics. The first one (previously known as the ‘Vatican commentary’) was ascribed to Brito by Costa after a suggestion by René-Antoine Gauthier (QEN; QE-2008: 99–137). The second set of questions is preserved in a sole manuscript, Vat. Lat. 2173 and was recently edited by Costa (see QE-2023). The first commentary was written around 1295, when Brito was a master of arts, and the second some years later, most likely when he was studying theology.

7.2 Philosophical Happiness

Philosophical happiness is discussed in books I and X of Brito’s commentaries on the Ethics. Following in the footsteps of Aquinas (cf. Summa theologiae, I.II 3.4), Brito holds the essence of happiness to consist in the intellect’s actual knowledge of God and the separate substances. Happiness, thus, amounts to the intellectual union of man with the highest beings. But despite Aquinas’ strong influence on his position, Brito’s notion of human happiness is still ‘radically Aristotelian’, as he fervently defends the Aristotelian ideal of philosophical life, or bios theoretikos (QEN; QE-2008: 171–176). As a result, Brito establishes the superiority of the contemplative life over the active life (or of philosophical life over political life). The contemplative life is the highest form of life for a rational creature and that towards which active life must aim as an end. This conception of philosophical happiness is the same we find in other Parisian commentaries on the Ethics from the same period, particularly the Anonymous of Paris (ms. BnF lat. 14698: see Costa 2010), the Anonymous of Erlangen (ms. Universitätsbibl. 213), the Anonymous of Erfurt (ms. Amplon. F. 13) and Giles of Orleans (ms. Paris, BnF lat. 16089).

7.3 Human Freedom, Free Will and Responsibility

Brito’s accounts of human freedom and moral responsibility heavily depend on Godfrey of Fontaines. Godfrey, a theology master, is the author of an important set of quodlibetal questions, where he offers a strongly intellectualist account of the psychology of human acts (or of free agency). After Aquinas’ death in 1274, two main notions of human agency were opposed, especially among theologians. On the one hand, voluntarist theologians proposed that intellect and will are the two main faculties of the intellectual soul, with the intellect being a cognitive power, and the will an active, or dynamic, power. Since the perfection of the will is greater than that of the intellect, will is the main agent of human action. Intellectual knowledge is only a condition sine qua non of free action. In other words, the intellect’s function is merely to present to the will the objects of action. On the other hand, as a critical response to voluntarism, intellectualism proposes that the intellect’s main function is to act responsibly. Thus, intellectualist theologians, such as Godfrey, hold that the intellect’s function is not only to present to the will the objects of action, but also to judge about the good and evil of possible actions. Moreover, voluntarist theologians consider will to be an active power, whereas the intellectualists consider it a passive one insofar as it is moved by the judgment it receives from the intellect. Accordingly, voluntarist theologians raise against the intellectualists the charge of determinism, since in the latter’s position, the will’s action would not be properly free. On the other hand, intellectualist theologians reject the voluntarists’ consideration of will as a cognitive power, as it would perform the intellect’s judgment about good and evil.

For Brito, free will (liberum arbitrium) depends entirely on intellectual judgment:

When something appears to the will as a good, the will desires it, until deliberation and the intellect’s judgment make something else appear to be better. Thus, when the will is brought towards a good object, it doesn’t pursue it immediately, but it first deliberates about its contrary, its consequences, its accidents and circumstances, and so the discourse of reason can make something, which appeared as good, appear as evil. And this is how free will works. (QEN 60; QE-2008: 322)

Brito thinks that the will necessarily desires something that appears as good. If there were no means to restrain the will, this would certainly be a form of determinism. However, for Brito, the intellect has the power to restrain the will. By deliberating about the extent to which the object is good, the intellect can eventually come upon negative aspects in it and obstruct the action of the will.

7.4 Moral Virtue

Regarding the essence of moral virtue, Brito holds different positions in his two commentaries on the Ethics. In this change of position, Brito reveals an interesting use of theological sources. In the first commentary, he holds that will is the subject of justice, while the sensitive appetite is the subject of the remaining moral virtues (QEN; QE-2008: 276–279, 426–428). Here Brito roughly replicates Aquinas’ position (cf. Summa theologiae, II.II 58.4). However, in his second commentary, Brito adopts the more Aristotelian position of Godfrey of Fontaines (Quodl. XIV),[10] according to which all the moral virtues are dispositions of the sensitive appetite. Thus, Brito opposes, on the one hand, Aquinas and Henry of Ghent, for whom all moral virtues are dispositions of the will, and, on the other hand, Peter of Auvergne, for whom all virtues exist both in the will and in the sensitive appetite.


Primary Literature (edited)

  • [QPm-1980] Quaestiones super Priscianum minorem. Edited by H.W. Enders and J. Pinborg, in Radulphus Brito. Questiones super Priscianum minorem, Stuttgart and Bad Canstatt: Fromann-Holzboog, 1980 (2 volumes).
  • [QR-1499] Quaestiones Radulphi super artem veterem. Venetiis per J. Rubeum et Albertinum fratres, 1499 (It includes: Quaestiones super Porphyrium; Quaestiones super librum Praedicamentorum; Quaestiones super Aristotelis libro Perihermeneias).
  • [QTB-1978]] Quaestiones super libros Topicorum Boethii. Edited by N.J. Green-Pedersen and J. Pinborg, in Green-Pedersen & Pinborg 1978.
  • [QPA-2016] Quaestiones super librum Priorum Analyticorum. Edited by Gordon A. Wilson, in Radulphus Brito. Quaestiones super Priora Analytica Aristotelis, Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2016.
  • [QE-2023] Questiones super librum Ethicorum Aristotelis. Edited by I. Costa, (Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Mediaevalis, 294), Turnhout: Brepols, 2023.
  • [QE-2008] Quaestiones super Ethicam. Edited by I. Costa, in Le ‘questiones’ di Radulfo Brito sull’ «Etica Nicomachea»: Introduzione e testo critico, (Studia Artistarum, 17), Turnhout: Brepols, 2008.
  • Quaestiones super librum De anima.
    • [QDA-2012-I and QDA-2012-II] Book I and partially book II edited by Sander de Boer, in De Boer 2012.
    • [QDA-1974-III] book III edited by W. Fauser, in Der Kommentar des Radulphus Brito zu Buch 3. De anima: Kritische Edition und Philosophisch-historische Einleitung, Münster: Aschendorff, 1974.
  • [QDc-2016] Quaestiones super librum De causis. Edited by I. Costa and M. Borgo, in Costa & Borgo 2016.

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The authors would like to thank Sten Ebbesen, David Bennett and an anonymous referee for their helpful suggestions both in relation to the language and the content of this entry. The first author is also grateful to the Knut and Alice Wallenberg Foundation (Sweden) and Riksbanken Jubileumsfonden (Sweden) for their financial support.

Copyright © 2024 by
Ana María Mora-Márquez <ana.maria.mora.marquez@gu.se>
Iacopo Costa <iacopo.costa@gmail.com>

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