Scientific disciplines frequently divide the particulars they study into kinds and theorize about those kinds. To say that a kind is natural is to say that it corresponds to a grouping that reflects the structure of the natural world rather than the interests and actions of human beings. We tend to assume that science is often successful in revealing these kinds; it is a corollary of scientific realism that when all goes well the classifications and taxonomies employed by science correspond to the real kinds in nature. The existence of these real and independent kinds of things is held to justify our scientific inferences and practices.
Putative examples of kinds may be found in all scientific disciplines. Chemistry provides what are taken by many to be the paradigm examples of kinds, the chemical elements, while chemical compounds, such as H2O, are also natural kinds of stuff. (Instances of a natural kind may be man-made, such as artificially synthesized ascorbic acid, i.e., vitamin C; but whether chemical kinds all of whose instances are artificial are natural kinds is open to debate. The synthetic transuranium elements, e.g. Rutherfordium, seem good candidates for natural kinds, whereas artificial chemical kinds, such as the entirely synthetic compound bismuth germanate, Bi4Ge3OO12, which is used in particle detectors, are, arguably, less obviously natural kinds.) The standard model in quantum physics reveals many kinds of fundamental particles (electron, tau neutrino, charm quark), plus broader categories such as kinds of kind (lepton, quark) and higher kinds (fermion, boson). Astronomy classifies the heavenly bodies: galaxies, for example, can be either elliptical, lenticular, or spiral.
Since kinds are revealed by science, a science can revise which kinds it holds exist: phlogisticated air was regarded as a kind until after Lavoisier’s chemical revolution. A science can even question a whole category of kinds, or sort and classify kinds differently as the science changes and new knowlege is gained. Before being superseded in this regard by the chemical elements, biological species were taken to be the best exemplars of kindhood. Yet now it is somewhat controversial to state that species are natural kinds. As the world changes, its kinds may change too. Rapidly mutating micro-organisms demand new classification systems. Kinds in the social sciences, such as economics or sociology, are even more problematic, since the changing norms and practices of individuals and societies may also be held to be constitutive factors in kind membership, and these norms and practices may themselves respond to our classification of people into kinds. These examples are troublesome because there is some tension between the existence of kinds and the mutability of the particulars which are supposed to fall under those kinds. In the case of atoms or galaxies, the particulars under study are typically long-lived and only slowly changing; viruses and economic structures, on the other hand, are more dynamic.
This article divides philosophical discussions of natural kinds into four areas: metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of science, and philosophy of language. The metaphysics of natural kinds asks whether we should think of our supposed natural kinds as genuinely natural. And if they are, what are natural kinds? And, finally, do natural kinds have essences? Philosophy of science is concerned with natural kinds because, as mentioned above, it is the use of natural kinds by the individual (‘special’) sciences that generates our interest in them. So we may ask, whether the kinds appearing in our best scientific theories do indeed satisfy the theories of natural kinds proposed by the metaphysicians. Philosophy of language takes an interest in natural kinds because basic issues are raised by the semantics of natural kind terms. For example, if we think of naming an entity and describing it as, semantically speaking, fundamentally different ways of talking about it, should we think of natural kind terms as functioning like names or like descriptions?
- 1. The Metaphysics of Natural Kinds
- 2. Natural Kinds in the Special Sciences
- 3. The Epistemology of Natural Kinds
- 4. The Semantics of Natural Kind Terms
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1. The Metaphysics of Natural Kinds
The principal metaphysical questions concerning natural kinds are fourfold. First, are the kinds that we think of as ‘natural’ kinds genuinely natural? Or are our classification processes more anthropocentric than that? Secondly, are our natural kind classifications really classifications into kinds? Thirdly, what are natural kinds? Are natural kinds any sort of entity at all? Are they basic ontological entities or are they derived from or reducible to other entities (e.g., universals)? Fourthly, do natural kinds have essences?
As regards the first question, the general problem is to determine which of the kinds to which science makes appeal, if any, correspond to real natural kinds—those existing in nature, so to speak—and which of these kinds are merely conventional—those whose boundaries are fixed by us rather than nature. The second question builds on the first by noting that in addition to classifying things in a natural way, classification by natural kinds, is also classification of things into kinds. What then is it to classify by kind? Then, if natural kinds are genuinely natural and genuinely kinds, what are they? Are there entities that are the natural kinds, and if so what can we say about the nature of such entities? Are they irreducible, basic, sui generis entities (alongside, for example, particulars and universals) (Ellis 2001; Lowe 1998)? Or can they be reduced, say to universals (Armstrong 1978, 1997; Hawley and Bird 2011) or to clusters of properties (Boyd 1991, Millikan 1999)? The third question asks whether there are properties that might be essential for kind membership. Natural kind essentialists hold that natural kinds have essences (Ellis 2001, 2002; Devitt 2008), where the essence of a natural kind is a property or set of properties whose possession is a necessary and sufficient condition for a particular’s being a member of the kind. That fact is a so-called essential fact concerning the kind; it is a fact that, in Fine’s terms, stems from the identity or nature of the kind (Fine 1994).
We can use answers to these questions to articulate the metaphysical commitment of a theory of natural kinds (Bird 2018). At one extreme the out-and-out conventionalist may claim that there is no natural sameness and difference in nature (or at least that our human classifications do not capture any such natural sameness and difference). Afortiori, there are no classifications into natural kinds, no entities that are natural kinds, and no natural kinds essences. At the other extreme, one might hold that there are natural distinctions between things, some of these distinctions are distinctions of kinds, that the natural kinds are a certain species of entity, that these entities are irreducible, and that they have essences. Intermediate views tend to be more popular. For example, a common view is that there are natural classifications by kinds, but there are no entities that are the natural kinds. Some hold that view and accept essentialism about natural kinds, while others hold that view and reject essentialism.
1.1 Natural Classifications
1.1.1 Naturalism (weak realism)
A common view concerning our so-called natural kind classifications is that there are genuinely natural ways of classifying things. Intuitively, to group all instances of the metal zinc together is to engage in a natural classification, whereas to group together Trajan’s column, the number two, and Julius Caesar is to classify things in an arbitrary manner. The classifications ‘cars manufactured in Germany’, ‘culinary vegetables’, ‘altars’ are not arbitrary, but neither are they natural, since they reflect human interests. This view we call naturalism. It is often called realism because of the close affinity to scientific realism; indeed naturalism may be regarded as a consequence or component of standard scientific realism. Scientific realists hold that successful scientific theories represent theory-independent phenomena. Thus the theoretical posits of science reflect natural divisions in nature; for example, the periodic system for classifying the chemical elements reflects natural divisions between the elements. However, since ‘realism’ is also associated with ontological doctrines (e.g., realism about universals, modal realism etc.) it would be preferable to use weak realism (or, as above, naturalism) to label the ontologically uncommitted view that our classifications are often natural. (We will note below that not all natural classifications are classifications into natural kinds.)
Naturalism need not maintain that all the classifications we in fact take to be natural are indeed natural. Sometimes scientists and others err in the natural kinds they take to exist. There is no kind that is phlogiston or phlogisticated air. Many might suppose jade to be a natural kind of mineral, but it is not because there are two distinct minerals called ‘jade’. (See LaPorte 2004, 94–100 and Hacking 2007b for detailed discussions of jade.) Similarly, biologists now believe that reptiles do not form a natural kind. Naturalism is the view that there are in fact natural divisions among things, so that when we attempt to make a natural classification, there is a fact of the matter as to whether that classification is indeed genuinely natural.
Assuming that one is a naturalist about (some of) our classifications, what makes a classification into one of natural kinds? The following are often suggested criteria or characteristics of a natural kind classification (some of which are more contentious than others):
Members of a natural kind should have some (natural) properties
This is a necessary condition of kindhood, but not a sufficient condition, for objects of very different kinds may share some natural property. As Mill (1884) remarks, white objects do not form a natural kind. Natural properties here are often taken to be intrinsic properties. The latter claim, as will be discussed in Section 2.1, leads to problems with biological kinds. Some, it should be noted, hold that not all natural properties are intrinsic.
Natural kinds should permit inductive inferences.
This is a point emphasized by Whewell (1860) and Mill (1884), and is central to Quine’s (1969) discussion of natural kinds (see Section 1.2.1). On its own, this criterion also does not help distinguish natural kinds from sets of objects sharing some natural property, and in that sense does not go beyond Criterion 1. Criterion 2 is also a necessary but not sufficient condition on natural kind classifications.
Natural kinds should participate in laws of nature.
This may be considered as a stronger, metaphysical version of Criterion 2. It is correspondingly more contentious: if something is a duck, then it has webbed feet; but one need not hold that such inductively obtained conditionals regarding biological kinds must constitute laws of nature. Even if this is a necessary condition, like Criteria 1 and 2, it fails to be a sufficient criterion. For laws of nature may concern natural qualities and quantities that do not define kinds (e.g. Newton’s law of gravitation).
Members of a natural kind should form a kind.
Criteria 1–3 supply related conditions that fail to be sufficient for kindhood. We may expand on Mill’s example of white things, which do not form a natural kind; neither do negatively charged things, nor do things with a mass of 1 kg. It is not immediately clear what this criterion requires, but we may say that an adequacy condition on a satisfactory account of what kinds are must address this ‘kindhood’ question (Hawley and Bird 2011).
Natural kinds should form a hierarchy.
If any two kinds overlap at all, then one is a subkind of the other, or they are identical (Kuhn 2000; Ellis 2001, 2002). This is exhibited, for example, by Linnaean taxonomy in biology. No organism is a member of two distinct species or genera. If organisms from different species are members of the same genus, then all members of both species are members of that genus. (One might add that every organism is a member of some species and some genus. In which case, the Linnaean taxonomy provides a partition into species among all organisms and also within each genus.)
Natural kinds should be categorically distinct.
There cannot be a smooth transition from one kind to another (Ellis 2001). For then the borderline between them could not be one drawn by nature but is one that is somehow or other drawn by us. In which case the kinds would not be genuinely natural. This is exhibited by the chemical elements. Chlorine and argon are neighbours in the periodic table. There are no atoms that are intermediate between chlorine atoms and argon atoms, for the nucleus of an atom cannot have a number of protons between seventeen (chlorine) and eighteen (argon).
Naturalism about natural kind classifications contrasts with conventionalism (also called constructivism or constructionism), the view natural kinds don’t exist independently of the scientists and others who talk about them. John Stuart Mill expresses the contrast thus: “In so far as a natural classification is grounded on real kinds, its groups are certainly not conventional; it is perfectly true that they do not depend upon an arbitrary choice of the naturalist” (Mill 1884, bk. IV, ch. II). While the sciences do, it appears, employ classifications according to kinds, the conventionalist will maintain that the purposes of scientists are just one species of interest among many: others will include the interests of automobile enthusiasts, of cooks, and of religious people or sociologists of religion. Conventionalists (constructivists, constructionists) deny that any of our classifications, including those of science, are naturally privileged forms of classification. The classifications of botanists do not carve nature at its joints any more than the classifications of cooks.
We may distinguish between weak conventionalism and strong conventionalism. Weak conventionalism asserts that our actual classifications are not, or are very unlikely to be, natural. The principal ground for weak conventionalism is scepticism about the ability of science to uncover the natural principles of classification. We may attribute this reason for conventionalism to Locke (1690: III). It appears (although this is a matter of debate) that Locke thought that if there were real essences of species, these would be found in the shared imperceptible micro-structural properties of things, and that there may be such genuinely natural species but that science was ill-equipped to do better than speculate about them. (Locke also held, employing Criterion 6 above, that there would be ‘gaps’ or ‘chasms’ between genuine species but that observation showed only smooth gradations between the kinds we actually employ, which therefore must be conventional.)
Strong conventionalism, however, goes on to deny even that conventionalism is forced upon us simply by ignorance. It denies that there are any such natural divisions, known or unknown. Strong conventionalists claim that the differences and similarities that we attribute to things exist in virtue of, for example, the social function of the relevant concepts rather than in natural facts. For example, the concept of gender is used to mark a distinction of social role. The conventionalist treats natural kinds in the same way. The chemical elements, biological species, quarks, neutrinos and bosons are equally constructed by the activity of scientists. The key claim is that natural kinds are constructed rather than discovered. As Woolgar claims “there is no object beyond discourse” (1988, 73).
Hacking (1999) argues against the strong version of conventionalism (which he terms ‘universal constructivism’). The point of social constructivism is to reveal that some of our classificatory categories and practices, though they may appear inevitable, are actually contingent and relative to the practice of classification in the context of social institutions and norms. However, according to Hacking, some constructed categories reflect real divisions and so we need not be constructivists in the strong sense. There is still room to distinguish between constructed kinds that reflect real categories and those that do not.
For example, Hacking (1999, Ch. 5) distinguishes between ‘child abuse’ and ‘satanic ritual abuse’. Satanic ritual abuse is a socially constructed idea, but not a social kind. In the 1990s, there was an exhaustive investigation into satanic ritual abuse in Great Britain after a number of reported cases. However, an independent commission claimed that none of the charges were substantiated by evidence. Thus, our constructed categories are subject to empirical investigation. We must establish a referent class for our constructed categories. For example and in contrast, a kind such as child abuse is considered real. The emergence of the category can be traced to a definite time (1961) at a definite place (Denver) in the discussions of paediatricians. Moreover, the reference of the category was abused children. This reference dynamically changed as the idea became embedded in new legislation, incorporated in practices involving social workers, police, schoolteachers etc. (see Hacking 1999, Ch. 5.) But, importantly real instances of the category were found through empirical investigation.
The chief claim made by all varieties of conventionalism is that facts about the structure of the world are in some sense dependent on human beings, their concepts and their activities in society. The denial of this view, which we will examine in Section 1.2, is the claim that facts about the world are independent of human beings, their concepts and their activities, that is, that there are real independent natural kinds in the world. The claim that scientific facts about the world are dependent on human activity has been analysed in different ways by constructivists. Kukla (2000, Ch. 3) distinguishes (i) material, (ii) causal, and (iii) constitutive dependence. The first, and weakest, claim is material dependence, namely that scientific entities are constructed by the activities of scientists in the laboratory. Chemical reactions are brought about by scientists in the laboratory using purified chemicals in a controlled environment (Knorr-Cetina et al. 1983). The resultant kinds are merely the constructs of this highly artificial environment, along with the pragmatic interests of the scientists (i.e., what they are testing for and the methodology they choose to use). However, it is clear that scientists still abstract from a complex reality and in some circumstances the materials used are purifications of some naturally occurring materials. Indeed, material dependence is a rather weak kind of conventionalism and could even be made compatible with some versions of naturalism/realism (cf. Hacking 1983). Therefore, no general conclusion may be drawn about the natural world and its kinds, from the fact that scientists study scientific kinds in a highly idealized and controlled setting. The second element in Kukla’s three-fold distinction is causal dependence, which occurs when the relevant facts are caused to be true by the fact that they are believed to be true (e.g. belief that there will be a run on the bank can cause a run on the bank, Merton 1948). Hacking’s (1995) human, interactive kinds, such as person with multiple-personality disorder, may be regarded as instances, where the kind and its members are brought into existence by the belief that there are such kinds and people do belong to them. Lastly, the constitutive dependence thesis claims that convention is constitutive of the physical facts. Plausibly, conventions exist in virtue of people holding that they do. Woolgar’s constructivism is of the type that treats all scientific facts like conventions in this respect.
1.1.3 Promiscuous Realism
Dupré (1993) promiscuous realism claims that there are countless ways of taxonomizing the world into kinds. The structure of the world is vastly complex and can be categorized in many different cross-cutting ways, according to the different theoretical interests we happen to be pursuing. Nevertheless, Dupré insists that his view is not conventionalist, but rather that he is committed to naturalism and realism about natural kinds. He accepts that there are properties that members of natural kinds have in common, but denies that these are intrinsic properties of kinds (see Criterion 1 above). He also denies that there is a hierarchical structure of natural kinds in the world (see Criterion 5 above) and that kinds are categorically distinct (see Criterion 6 above).
Dupré (1993, 28) argues that promiscuous realism about natural kinds reflects our classificatory practices within the context of both common sense and particular sciences. The kinds classified by common sense and scientific practice often cross one another. For example, in common sense we classify lilies as a certain kind of flower. However, in biological classification the genus Lilium comprises over one hundred species, including bulbs such as garlic and onions. Moreover, species with the name “lily” in common sense do not all in fact belong to the lilium genus in biological classification (e.g., Calla Lilies and Canna Lilies). Therefore, common sense and biological science provide us with pluralistic ways of taxonomizing lilies. Each is equally legitimate, according to Dupré, depending on our interests. Furthermore, Dupré (1993, 38) argues that cross-classification occurs even within the context of a science. Taking the biological classification of species as an example, he argues that there are countless ways of taxonomizing species, depending on the model of biological systematics that is used (see Section 2.1 below). There are equally legitimate, objectively grounded ways of classifying natural kinds. There is accordingly no unique way of carving nature at its joints; different systems of classification are equally acceptable, scientifically, and metaphysically.
1.2 Natural Kind Realism
Realism about natural kinds is the view that there exist entities that are the natural kinds. While naturalism about natural kind classifications is a matter of there being natural groupings and distinctions among things and as such has no ontological commitment, realism is an ontologically committed view. Since ‘(weak) realism’ is sometimes used to denote naturalism, we may distinguish by using the term strong realism for the stronger, ontological, claim that the natural divisions between kinds reflect the boundaries between real entities; i.e. the difference between silver and gold is not just a difference between two natural groups of thing, but is a difference between two distinct entities silver and gold.
The traditional realism versus nominalism debate is an ontological debate over whether in order to account for properties we need to invoke a class of entity, universals. There is an analogous debate as regards natural kinds, whether in order to account for our natural kind talk and our natural classifications, we need a special sort of entity in our ontology. The natural kind nominalist may accept that there are genuinely natural classifications, but will reject the idea that we should invoke any object as a consequence. For example, the nominalist might take the world to be made up of individuals, which can be classified as kinds in a natural way. But, the nominalist claims, there is no kind of entity beyond the individual instances of each kind. The (strong) realist maintains that we cannot explain the distinction between natural and non-natural classifications without appealing to certain entities, the natural kinds. The naturalism versus conventionalism debate discussed in the preceding section asked whether there is a genuine metaphysical difference between natural classifications and non-natural classifications; it is not obvious that the naturalist, who maintains that there is a metaphysical difference, is obliged to understand that difference in terms of an ontological category of entities that are natural kinds. The analogue in the debate over properties is whether there is a metaphysical distinction between natural properties and non-natural properties, between, in David Lewis’s terminology, sparse and abundant properties (Lewis, 1986). There is no immediate contradiction in the position of a nominalist who rejects universals, but who maintains that there is a metaphysical difference between natural properties and other properties. The realist in both cases argues that, ultimately, naturalism (about properties and about classification) requires a commitment to entities (universals and natural kinds respectively).
1.2.1 Quine on Natural Kinds and Induction
Quine is an example of a philosopher who accepts, to some extent, natural classifications into kinds. He holds (1969) that kinds are sets, so he does think that there are entities that are kinds, and to that extent he is a realist. That said, his realism is minimal, since sets are ubiquitous entities. Any coherent classificatory principle will determine a set of things thus classified, whether natural or artificial. Thus the ontology of natural kinds does not of itself explain there being natural kinds. Quine regards the notions of kind and similarity as “substantially one notion” (1969, 119) but denies that it is straightforward to give a definition of one in terms of the other. He does consider defining relative similarity thus: a is more similar to b than to c iff a and b share more properties than a and c do. But this will work only if properties are less abundant than sets are (since any two things are jointly members of any number of sets). And Quine regards such a notion of property as no clearer than the notion of kind.
Quine opens his discussion of natural kinds by asking “what tends to confirm an induction?” (see Criterion 2 above) (1969, 114). With Goodman’s new riddle of induction and Hempel’s paradox of confirmation in mind, Quine answers that it is the similarity or sameness of kinds between instances that permits an induction: two green emeralds are more similar than two grue emeralds when one of them is green and the other blue. It is the “dubious scientific standing of a general notion of similarity, or of kind” (1969, 116) that prompts the discussion alluded to above. An intuitive notion of similarity is used in our ordinary inductions. And the force of Darwinian processes gives us some reason to think that we have evolved an innate similarity space that corresponds to some natural similarities. At the same time, natural science, which developed from these primitive inductions, supported by similarities, is able to reveal deeper similarities that may contradict superficial similarities. For example, we have strong sense that things of the same colour are objectively alike, but science tells us that there is no deep similarity among like-coloured things. Quine thinks that in due course science will obviate the need for a general notion of similarity or kind: in each area of science more specific notions will take the place of the generic notion; this is a sign of the maturity of a branch of science. For example, in zoology we may replace talk of the similarity between two animals by discussion of the historical proximity of their closest common ancestor.
Quine’s conception of natural kinds is liberal. Not all sets are natural kinds, but any set whose members share a natural property are a natural kind. So the set of white objects is at least a candidate natural kind and Quine asserts that positively charged objects form a natural kind. One might wonder whether an up quark, an uranium nucleus, a hydronium ion, a charged water droplet, and a balloon that has been rubbed on someone’s jumper all belong to one kind. The literature on natural kinds (cf. Mill 1884) has tended to adopt a more restricted conception of kinds, although articulating that conception is not straightforward. This question is related to the link that Quine draws between kinds and what it is that confirms induction. If one adopts the narrower conception of kinds, then one will hold that a law such as ‘positively charged objects repel one another’ does not concern kinds at all, but nonetheless may be confirmed by instances of objects that are positively charged repelling one another. So the real answer to “what tends to confirm an induction?” is not “natural kinds and their instances” but is “natural properties and their instances”. A further reason for taking this view is that inductions often concern relations (such as the repulsion between two objects). But we do not suppose that objects that enter into a natural relation form a natural kind, nor that there is a natural kind of ordered sequences of objects satisfying a given natural relation.
1.2.2 Cluster Kind Realism
Following Quine, some realists have expanded upon his intuition that a natural kind’s members share a natural property by counting families of such properties that are contingently clustered in nature (Boyd 1991, 1999a; Millikan 1999). These families of properties cluster together over time either because the presence of some properties in the family favours the presence of others or because there are underlying internal mechanisms and/or extrinsic contextual mechanisms which tend to secure the co-occurrence of the properties. A natural kind is any such family of co-occurring properties that may be employed in inductive inferences or for the purposes of scientific explanation. Cluster kind realists will readily concede that, depending on the case, environmental pressures may affect and alter the set of properties associated with a kind over time. Therefore, in such cases, none of the properties themselves need be individually necessary for kind membership.
Richard Boyd (1999) considers biological species to be paradigmatic natural kind clusters, where the clustering is due to a homeostatic mechanism. Homeostatic property clusters (HPCs) occur when mechanisms exist that cause the properties to cluster by ensuring that deviations from the cluster have a low chance of persisting; the presence of some of the properties in the cluster favours the presence of the others. A homeostatic mechanism thereby achieves self-regulation, maintaining a stable range of properties. In the case of species, the homeostatic mechanisms may be intrinsic (e.g. gene exchange within a population or developmental factors) or extrinsic (e.g. a species’s evolutionary niche provides common selective factors). Since individuals inherit their basic characteristics from their parents, and very few people are taller than 2.5m, we can expect the next generation to contain few people of that height. Height can, however, be affected by environmental factors; a mutation can cause offpring to have genes different from their parents that might cause greater than usual height, and malfunctioning of the pituitary gland can cause an excess of growth hormone. So there can be individual cases of excessive height. But they will remain rare because such gigantism and acromegaly are accompanied by serious complicating disorders and often result in premature death. Consequently, these individuals are less likely to reproduce than others. Even greater extremes of height (e.g. 4m) are just not possible, since the same developmental factors would prevent the individual from being viable at an earlier stage in life.
Colouration across a species is often uniform when it is a camouflage against predation. The more specific the ecological niche occupied, the more uniform will colouration and other features be. Deviations will lead to decreased fitness and will be selected against. Obligate mutualistic symbiosis often provides very specialized ecological niches; consequently certain key properties must be present in order for an individual to survive. Certain beard worms, such as Riftia pachyptila, live at ocean floor thermal vents and have no digestive tract; instead they supply hydrogen sulphide and methane to bacteria in their trophosomes, which oxidise the hydrogen sulphide and methane on behalf of the worm. As a result the worm cannot lack any property essential for the survival of the bacteria to which it is host. Such homeostatic mechanisms do not preclude deviations from the standard combinations of properties—mutations do occur. Homeostasis just means that usually such mutations will not persist. The rare benevolent, or even merely neutral, mutations may persist and flourish, in which case there will be variation and change. Environments may change, perhaps locally, also leading to variation and change (e.g. the famous peppered moth). Consequently, it will not always be the case that property P in a homeostatic property cluster F is a necessary condition of an individual belonging to the relevant kind.
One potential problem with the HPC view account is that homeostatic mechanisms are not clearly delineated in the account. In other words, the role of mechanisms in maintaining the stability of property cluster is not addressed in Boyd’s original account. Craver (2009) is skeptical about our attempts to give a fully realist account of the homeostatic property clusters because conventional elements are involved in deciding when two mechanisms are of the same kind and also in identifying when one mechanism ends and the other begins. Tobin (2017) argues that there is an overlapping problem for mechanisms which is similar the overlapping problem often discussed in the natural kinds literature.
Slater (2015) claims that the HPC view can be made clearer by focusing on the special sort of stability a cluster of properties might makes it successful for inductive and explanatory purposes, in favour of an appeal to mechanisms. Slater calls this view the Stable Property Cluster account of natural kinds.
In such cases, the boundaries of the natural kind are vague. Cluster kinds nevertheless do form a kind (Criterion 4 above). Members will have at least some properties in common (Criterion 1). Since the emergence of cluster kinds is not entirely random and a causal-historical account can be provided in virtue of stable homeostatic mechanisms, cluster kinds are sufficiently robust to support induction (Criterion 2) and perhaps even laws of nature in some cases (Criterion 3). Conversely, because the boundaries between natural kinds are vague, a cluster kind realist will reject the claim that natural kinds are categorically distinct (Criterion 6). She may be neutral on whether they always form hierarchies (Criterion 5). That said, not all clusters need exhibit the flexibility and vagueness of these biological, homeostatic cases. In other cases the clustering may be directly due to the laws of nature. Thus the laws of physics rule out fractional nuclear charge, with the consequence that the chemical elements are kinds that have clearly defined boundaries and nuclear charge is a necessary and sufficient condition of kind membership.
Chakravarrty (forthcoming) argues that natural kind realism has run its course and that attempts to be more liberal about multifarious natural kinds have meant that more recent natural kind realist accounts dissolve into conventionalism. Alternatively, many more recent realist account of natural kinds attempt to cling on to natural kind realism by buttressing it to other forms of realism. For exmaple, theorist have identified what is (mind-independently) real with other things (property clusters, correlations, mechanisms, structures and so on). According to Chakravarrty this is to conflate sui generis natural kind realism with other kinds of realism (e.g. realism about property clusters or realism about mechanisms).
1.2.3 Fundamentalism and Reductionism
As mentioned above (introduction to Section 1.2), natural kind realism may be understood as an analogue of realism about universals. A further question is whether these are simply analogues or in fact related positions. Perhaps natural kinds just are (a species of) universals or are reducible to universals. Within realism, that reductionist view can be contrasted with natural kind fundamentalism, which holds that not only are there natural kinds (as entities), but also that natural kinds find a basic and sui generis place in our ontology. We illustrate three positions within naturalism about natural kinds: (i) naturalism without (strong) realism; reductionist realism; fundamentalist realism.
According to David Armstrong (1997, 67–8) “The kinds mark true joints in nature. But it is not clear that we require an independent and irreducible category of universal to accommodate the kinds”. Armstrong’s view is naturalistic, since there are genuine natural divisions; but he is also resistant to realism. If there were natural kinds they would be universals. But the properties shared by all and only the members of a kind will typically be very complex. For example, he considers whether there is some description of human DNA. There may be, but it would be too complex to qualify as a genuine universal. And there is no reason to suppose that this complex universal would do any causal or nomic work. So there is not simply an identity between natural kinds and a subcategory of universals, the natural kind universals (e.g., the universal of being gold, or of being a human)—according to Armstrong’s argument there are no natural kind universals. He does concede that the case is stronger for basic kind universals, such as electronhood, where a few properties (the electron’s mass, charge, and spin) are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for kind membership.
Hawley and Bird (2011) argue that natural kinds are complex universals. A complex universal is a universal whose parts are universals (just as a complex particular is a particular whose parts are particulars). In the case of the electron the fundamental universals (the electron’s mass, charge, and spin) do combine to form a complex universal. Since an universal is wholly located where the universal is located, every entity that instantiates electronhood also instantiates its component universals, the electron’s mass, charge, and spin. Not every collection of universals constitutes a natural kind, just as not every collection of particulars constitutes a natural (complex) particular. The facts that explain the clustering of properties explain why these universals compose a complex one. Not every complex universal is, like electronhood, precise. Some are vague, and this fact can accommodate the indeterminacy of kind constitution implied by Boyd’s view of the clusters in the case of biological kinds.
Like Hawley and Bird, E. J. Lowe takes natural kinds to be entities (1998, 2006a, 2006b). Thus Lowe is a natural kind realist. Furthermore, he takes natural kinds—substantial universals in his terminology—to constitute an irreducible ontological category (one category in his four-category ontology). Hence he is a natural kind fundamentalist. Lowe argues that recognizing the ontologically fundamental distinction between substantial universals (natural kinds) and non-substantial universals (properties) accounts for the laws of nature in a manner that, while avoiding the problems of a regularity account, may nonetheless do without Armstrong’s second order relation of necessitation, itself a relational universal (Armstrong 1983, 75–110). Consider the law that planets travel in ellipses. According to Lowe’s account, this should be understood as a matter of the kind planet being characterized by the property travels in an ellipse. (One might query whether all laws can be given this form and so whether the fact that some general truth is a law should be explained this way. For what makes planets travel in ellipses is the fact that they have mass and hence little to do with their being planets. For example, Kepler’s law is an application of Newton’s laws, but the latter concerns quantities (mass, distance), which should be understood as universals not kinds.)
As in Lowe’s ontology, natural kinds play a fundamental role in the ontology of Brian Ellis (2001, 2002). For Ellis the term ‘natural kind’ covers three hierarchical categories: natural kinds of objects (substantive kinds), natural kinds of processes and events (dynamic kinds), and natural kinds of properties and relations (property kinds). The chemical elements and compounds are substantive kinds; the different chemical reactions are dynamic kinds; a tetrahedral molecular structure is a (structural) property kind (whose species include the particular tetrahedral structures of methane, carbon tetrachloride, silicon tetrafluoride and so forth). Ellis is uncommitted on whether the dynamic kinds are independent of the other two types of kinds; but these are independent of one another. Each kind is a universal, and the three categories of kind therefore form three categories of universal. Thus the substantive kinds—the familiar kinds of thing and stuff—are universals, but these are not reducible to property universals. Ellis notes that laws of nature have a hierarchical structure: Kepler’s laws of planetary motion are an application of Newton’s laws. He argues (2001, 90) that the only satisfactory account of this is fact that natural kinds also exist in hierarchies (see Criterion 5).
Do natural kinds have essences? When discussing kinds and essences we need to distinguish two quite different claims. The first claim is that the kind a particular belongs to is essential to that particular: if a belongs to kind K, then it is an essential property of a that it belongs to K. The second claim is that the kinds themselves have essential properties: for each kind K there is some property Φ of the kind such that it is essential to K that Φ(K). What is the logical relation between these two claims? The first claim may be strictly consistent with the denial of the second, but it may be difficult to motivate the first without having reason to accept the second. Would one think that some object’s nature requires it to belong to kind K without thinking that there is some distinctive (essential) property characteristic of all Ks?
The second claim, essentialism about kinds, does not obviously imply the first, individual essentialism. To see this, consider the following two cases that would seem to show that the latter does not imply the former (Bird 2018). The first case is chemical/physical. A nucleus of neptunium-239 may undergo beta decay, in which one of its neutrons emits an electron leaving a proton. As a consequence the nucleus now has one more proton and so is a nucleus of neptunium no longer but is now a nucleus of plutonium. This description is consistent with the claim that it is essential to neptunium that nuclei of neptunium atoms have 93 protons whereas it is essential to plutonium that its nuclei have 94 protons. But one may also claim, as the description implicitly suggests, that one and the same nucleus persists through this transformation. If that is so, then a particular has retained its identity while undergoing a change of kind. That kind essentialism does not entail essentialism of kind membership is also demonstrated by a second, biological, example. According to Mayr’s biological species concept, a species is a reproductively isolated breeding population. Thus a new species can be created by the advent of reproductive isolation, which will typically split existing populations (Matthen 2009). And so the existing organisms in at least one (and arguably both) of the newly isolated (sub-)populations will belong to a new species. And if species are natural kinds, this is an example of particulars changing their kinds. But this account of species is consistent with the view that species have essences (LaPorte 1997, 2004, 11–12). (As a matter of fact, most essentialists accept that an object’s kind is essential to it. The point being advanced here is that this claim does not follow immediately from the claim that kinds have essences.)
1.3.1 Arguments for Essentialism
It has been widely held that essentialism, and natural kind essentialism in particular, is a consequence of the semantic arguments concerning reference put forward by Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975a). These arguments support semantic externalism, the view that the reference of a speaker’s term can depend on facts external to the speaker herself (e.g. facts concerning prior uses of the term). However, Salmon (1979, 1982) has argued persuasively that only trivial essentialism can be inferred from such arguments; stronger essentialist theses are derived only on the basis of unstated essentialist premises. For example, consider the following argument, reconstructed by Donnellan and discussed in Salmon (1982, 161–75):
P1: It is necessarily the case that: something is a sample of water if and only if it is a sample of dthat (the same substance that this is a sample of). P2: This [the liquid sample] has the chemical structure H2O. P3: Being a sample of the same substance as something consists in having the same chemical structure. Therefore C: It is necessarily the case that: every sample of water has the chemical structure H2O.
(Salmon 1982, 166)
P3, however, is not free of non-trivial essentialist import. According to Salmon, deriving essentialism via the theory of reference is question-begging. Nonetheless, the fact that essentialist conclusions seem so plausible may be taken as evidence that there exist strong essentialist intuitions, and the arguments from Kripke and Putnam can be framed in non-semantic terms and thereby motivate essentialism directly—indeed many of Kripke’s arguments are not framed in semantic terms at all.
Several of Kripke’s exemplary cases concern theoretical identities; these are typically identities of the form C = T, expressed using a common name for a kind, ‘C’, and a technical identification of the kind, ‘T’, typically thereby telling us what that kind is. Examples: light is a stream of photons; water is H2O; lightning is an electrical discharge; gold is the element with atomic number 79. This might give the impression that Kripkean essentialism is just a matter of the necessity of identity. However, in several of his discussions Kripke does provide separate, independent arguments on the one hand for the (necessary) necessity of being T for being C and on the other hand for the (necessary) sufficiency of being T for being C. In general, where K is a kind and P is some property, arguments for □∀x(Kx→Px) can be decoupled from arguments for □∀x(Px→Kx).
For example, in his discussion of gold, Kripke argues that something that is superficially like gold in appearance but lacks the property of having atomic number 79, would not be gold. This establishes that, of necessity, having atomic number 79 is necessary for being gold, but does not show that possession of this property is sufficient for being gold. Similarly, argues Kripke, if we were to discover a population of animals with the appearance of tigers but which turn out to be reptiles, we would deny that such creatures are tigers. Being mammalian is necessarily a necessary condition of being a tiger, but of course not a sufficient condition
Putnam’s (1975a) Twin Earth thought experiment, in a non-semantic guise, leads to a similar conclusion. We imagine there is a planet, ‘Twin Earth’, exactly like Earth in all readily observable respects. Every person and thing on Earth has a twin equivalent on Twin Earth. However, there is no H2O on Twin Earth. Instead, there is a liquid that shares the manifest properties of water (e.g., its being colourless, tasteless, odourless, good for drinking, etc.). This liquid is composed not of H2O molecules but of very different molecules to which we assign the made-up formula ‘XYZ’. Despite its superficially water-like properties, intuitively XYZ is not water. What prevents XYZ form being water is the fact that XYZ is microstructurally different from H2O. If intuition is reliable in this respect, then (i) possessing water’s superficial properties is not sufficient to make something a sample of water, and (ii) being composed of molecules of H2O is necessary for something’s being a sample of water. (For more on Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment, see Section 4.2.3.)
It is natural to use the expression ‘the essence of …’, which implies sufficiency as well as necessity: possession of the essence of K suffices for membership of K, as well as being necessary for it. According to the foregoing, not all the arguments of Kripke and Putnam establish what the essence of some kind is, rather they establish only what we may call a partial essence, conditions that are necessary but not sufficient. This is clear in some other of Kripke’s arguments. Thus it is only a partial essence that someone originates with the gamete (sperm and egg) from which they in fact originate, since they might have a monozygotic (identical) twin who has the same origin. A further question is whether there is a full essence (the essence) for everything that has a partial essence.
The fact that such arguments show only that F is an essential property of K means that they are invulnerable to complaints that not everything with F is K. For example it is sometimes complained that water cannot be essentially H2O for the following reasons (a) water is a liquid, whereas a substance comprised of H2O can exist as a solid or a gas; (b) a single H2O molecule is not a sample of water because it does not have the properties we can ascribe to samples of water (such as a temperature); (c) water is not simply H2O but is a polymer-like substance held together by hydrogen bonds. These observations are consistent with the claim of Putnam’s argument that necessarily all water is composed of H2O molecules.
The arguments so far considered show that the superficial properties associated with a kind are, in those cases, not sufficient for kind membership, and so some further property (often a microstructural property) is a necessary condition. Kripke also provides arguments that show that many of the superficial properties typically associated with a kind are not even necessary. Kripke examines Kant’s claim that it is a priori that gold is a yellow metal (Kripke 1980, 118). Let us imagine that the yellow appearance of what we have always taken to be samples of gold is just an optical illusion. Intuitively, we would conclude that we had previously erred in thinking that gold is yellow—we would not conclude that there is no gold. Likewise, one might ask whether animal species are characterized (necessarily) by superficially available qualities, for example, whether a tiger is, by definition, a large carnivorous quadrupedal feline, tawny yellow in colour with blackish transverse stripes and a white belly (Kripke 1980, 119–121). Again, we may consider that these features of the individual animals we have held to be tigers are in fact illusory; that those individuals and others of the same species are, for example, three–legged but that an optical illusion made us think otherwise. This suggests that satisfying a set of readily observable ‘superficial’ properties is not necessary for membership of the tiger kind.
The foregoing arguments from Kripke lead to the conclusion that the relevant kinds are not characterized of necessity by the readily observable properties of their instances. They do not show what does characterize those kinds. Kripke takes the view that, in most cases, it is certain microstructural properties that determine the nature of these natural kinds, as evident in his endorsement of the identities: ‘water is H2O’; ‘gold is the element with atomic number 79’, ‘light is a stream of photons’. Such essential properties of kinds are features, therefore, that may be unknown even to competent users of a relevant kind concept. Consequently, these are essences that, when known at all, are known a posteriori.
While the arguments just considered suggest a microstructural essence for the chemical and physical kinds considered, they do not have the consequence that every natural kind must have a microstructural essence. Kripke regards material individuals as having historical essences. In the light of cladism in biology, one may regard biological taxa as having historical essences also, and this is consistent with the general picture given to us by Kripke and Putnam, even if they themselves once thought that biological kinds had microstructural essences (McGinn 1976; Kornblith 1993, 111; LaPorte 2004, 64). Cladism is the most commonly accepted system of biological classification that groups organisms according to their shared phylogenetic ancestry. Cladism has replaced the Linnean hierarchical system of biological classification where organisms were grouped according to their shared morphological characteristics (see Section 2.1 below).
Kripke does not distinguish ‘essential property’ from ‘necessary property’. Fine (1994) notes that the claim that P is a necessary property of X is not the same as the claim that P is an essential property of X: the latter implies the former but the former does not imply the latter. The arguments for essentialism discussed above do not note this distinction and move quickly from claims about necessity to claims about essence: having shown that necessarily anything that is gold is made up of an element with atomic number 79, Kripke concludes that having atomic number 79 is an essential property of the kind gold. Fine’s point may not be an insuperable obstacle to establishing essentialism via the arguments of Kripke and Putnam. For it may be held, as Fine holds, that essences concern the nature or identity of things. One may then argue that the arguments of Kripke, Putnam, and others do appeal to intuitions concerning the nature and/or identity of natural kinds, and so the inferences to essentialism from claims about necessity are legitimate in these cases.
The Kripke–Putnam arguments for essentialism are, in effect, direct appeals to intuition. For Ellis and Lowe, the dialectical basis for essentialism is that essentialism is a core part of what they each take to be the optimal metaphysical system. Ellis (2001, 145–50) regards his essentialist metaphysics as supported by his argument that it yields a stronger argument for scientific realism. In particular, for Ellis the essences of natural kinds explain the laws of nature: laws are grounded in the world’s natural kind structure, which includes not only natural kinds of thing but also natural kinds of process and event. Above it was mentioned that for Lowe (2006, 144) laws concern natural kinds; by contrast, for Ellis laws are grounded in essential facts about kinds. As a consequence, the laws of nature are metaphysically necessary. This has the advantage of explaining what natural necessity is (it is just metaphysical necessity), but at the cost of denying the intuitive contingency of laws. Lowe, on the other hand, holds that laws can be grounded in the contingent possession of properties by kinds, and so need not be metaphysically necessary.In conclusion we note that some anti-essentialists argue that there is no non-question begging way of motivating the appeal to essences. Hugh Mellor (1977, 309) argues that the existence of essences in essentialist accounts of natural kinds is simply a gratuitous assumption. Others use examples from the empirical sciences such as biology to argue that essentialism is too limited to capture the kinds we find in the special sciences (Dupré 1981, 1993). In particular, essentialist accounts of kinds seem to construe them as immutable or static, whereas examples from the natural sciences include mutable and dynamic kinds, as we see in Section 2.1 below.
1.4 Natural Kind Eliminativism
Recently, there has been a debate about the usefulness of natural kind classification in philosophy of science. Some philosophers have argued that the concept of natural kinds should be eliminated on the grounds that it does not play a useful role in scientific classification. David Ludwig (2018) and Ian Hacking (2007a) have argued for eliminating the concept of natural kind altogether. The arguments here are twofold: firstly, the concept of natural kind is applicable to a heterogeneous set of practices of natural classification. The usage of the natural kind concept is so multifarious that it is misleading to practicing scientists if they use the natural kind concept in scientific classification. On these grounds, the concept of natural kind should be eliminated. Indeed Hacking (2007a, 229) does not mince his words: “Delete every mention of natural kinds”. The second, related, argument is on the grounds that there are so many different theories of natural kinds in the literature, of which some apply more readily to some scientific disciplines, while others seem to apply more readily in others. For example, the grounds for essentialism seem more warranted in chemistry, while Boyd’s HPC view seems more readily applicable in biology. Indeed, a homogeneous theory of natural kinds that would apply in all disciplines looks very unlikely. On these grounds, so the argument goes, the search for a unitary theory of natural kinds for all scientific classification is futile. Conix and Chi (2021) argue that these arguments for eliminativism do not provide a sufficient justification to eliminate the natural kind concept altogether. They argue that the notion of ‘natural kind’ plays another epistemic role in philosophical research, because it enables fruitful investigation into non-arbitrary classification.
2. Natural Kinds in the Special Sciences
Our interest in natural kinds is generated by the fact that the particular sciences make frequent use of what, on the face of it, seem to be natural kinds. So an important question is whether the kinds of the special sciences (e.g. psychology, economics, biology, chemistry and so on) do in fact satisfy the conditions laid out by metaphysicians for natural-kindhood (Fodor 1974; Dupré 1981, 1993; Millikan 1999; Ellis 2001). And to the extent that they do not, does that show that these kinds are not genuine natural kinds after all, but are something different? Or does it show that the metaphysicians need to revise their theories of natural kindhood? The metaphysical issues raised by the special sciences vary. For example, philosophers of biology ask whether species would be better understood as being individuals rather than natural kinds. The so-called species problem (Ghiselin 1974, 1987, 1997; Hull 1976, 1978; Kitts and Kitts 1979, LaPorte 1994) asks which are the appropriate criteria to use in order to decide which particular species an organism belongs to. This is particularly challenging because species evolve over time, which makes it difficult to determine when we should recognize a new species and distinguish it from a distinct, older ancestor species or from distinct sister species. Furthermore, the criteria advanced by most of the various species concepts on offer involve relational rather than intrinsic properties of organisms. So either species are not natural kinds or the view that kindhood is fixed by the intrinsic properties of things must be revised. In the philosophy of chemistry, a key question is whether chemical kinds provide as much support for microstructuralism as the stock examples discussed by metaphysicians suggest (Hendry 2006; LaPorte 2004; Needham, 2000, 2002; Van Brakel, 2000). Microstructuralism is the view that chemical kinds can be individuated solely in terms of their chemical microstructure. Chemical elements would appear to support microstructuralism since atomic number is sufficient to individuate any element. However, the extension of this view to more complex chemical structures (such as molecules) is much discussed in the literature. In the philosophy of mind, the ontological status of psychological kinds has been questioned in the light of modern advances in neuroscience (Churchland 1981; Fodor 1974). In particular, action is causally overdetermined by mental and neurophysiological kinds. If neuroscience can provide a sufficient account of action, then the role of our common-sense folk psychological concepts, such as belief and desire is called into question. Maybe there are no psychological natural kinds corresponding to those concepts. Natural kind realists reject the conventionalist view that in all cases the boundaries of ‘natural’ kinds are drawn by human interests. But is it plausible to draw a distinction between genuinely natural and conventional kinds when it comes to the social sciences? In particular, is it important that, via a feedback effect, human perceptions of what kinds there are can have an effect on the composition and even existence of those kinds (Hacking 1995)?
2.1 Natural Kinds and Biology
One central issue in the philosophy of biology concerns the nature of biological species, which have traditionally been held to be paradigmatic natural kinds. The traditional Linnean binomial system of classification groups organisms into species and genera in virtue of their overall physical similarities (their morphology). However, only the taxa species and genus were held to reflect ontological divisions in nature. The higher taxa (e.g., family, order, class, phylum, kingdom) are merely conventional divisions, which are of heuristic use in biology.
Biologists offer many different species concepts, which disagree on how species are individuated; indeed the different species concepts will disagree about the extensions of species and about the number of species. For example, according to the interbreeding species concept (e.g. Mayr 1969), species are groups of interbreeding natural populations, that are reproductively isolated from other groups. Alternatively, according to the phylogenetic approach to species (e.g. Cracraft 1983), species are classified according to common ancestral descent. These two approaches carve species differently. Some phylogenetic species fail to be interbreeding species. For example, organisms that reproduce asexually may nevertheless have a common descent. They will be grouped together as species by the phylogenetic approach, but not by the interbreeding approach (see Ereshefsky 1998 for discussion). Philosophers question whether the multiple divisions used by biologists reflect an ontological pluralism in the world or, alternatively, whether there is a privileged conception of species that captures ontological reality. Furthermore, some philosophers argue that species are not to be considered as natural kinds at all, insisting instead that species are individuals.
2.1.1 Species: Individuals or Kinds?
Despite its long history and intuitive appeal, the conception of species as natural kinds is difficult to sustain while also maintaining a traditional view of what a natural kind requires: a set of intrinsic natural properties that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for a particular to be a member of the kind.
The fact that lineages evolve more or less gradually over time and that this process leads to new species and other taxa, has two consequences: first, that species are spatio-temporally restricted in the sense that the species to which a particular organism belongs depends on its being related to a specific lineage; and secondly, that the characteristic properties of a species may change over time.
The first consequence of evolution implies that, contra the traditional view, intrinsically identical organisms may not be members of the same species: a cat-like organism independently evolved on a distant planet would not be a cat. (Cf. Dummett 1973: 144 ‘even if creatures exactly like men arose from dragons’ teeth, they would not be men, because not children of Adam’.)
The second consequence implies that intrinsic similarity is not necessary for membership of the same species. There exists a high degree of variation in intraspecific morphology and genetic makeup. While members of kinds need not be intrinsically identical (e.g., there may be isotopic variation between samples of a chemical element), there will nonetheless be certain distinctive intrinsic natural properties common to all members of the kind (e.g., nuclear charge in the case of atoms of the same element). That, it is claimed, is absent for species. Thus there is no genetic material or sequence of genes that all and only members of the species Drosophila melanogaster possess, and likewise for all other species. Nor can we turn to larger-scale phenotypic properties (which may nonetheless be hidden), since evolutionary change may eliminate such features without a new species arising (Sober 1980). Furthermore, gradual change, even through speciation, means that species will not be categorically distinct (Criterion 6), which for Ellis (2001) is an additional reason to conclude that species are not natural kinds.
These problems for the thesis that species are natural kinds may lead one to conclude that classification by species does not correspond to any real division of things in nature any more than the higher taxa do. Darwin himself expressed this kind of conventionalism, in taking species to differ only in degree from varieties on the one hand and genera and higher taxa on the other hand:
Varieties have the same general characters as species, for they cannot be distinguished from species,—except, firstly, by the discovery of intermediate linking forms…and except, secondly, by a certain amount of difference, for two forms, if differing very little, are generally ranked as varieties, notwithstanding that intermediate linking forms have not been discovered. (Darwin 1859, 57)
(Mishler 1999 contains a modern version of this view.) The rejection of species as natural kinds need not lead to the rejection of realism about species altogether. Indeed, one can commit to species realism in a specific way: Ghiselin (1974, 1987, 1995, 1997), Hull (1976, 1978, 1980, 1987), and many other philosophers and biologists accept the claim that species are individuals, not kinds. This claim would appear to explain why, it is said, there are no serious candidates for biological laws, at least concerning members of particular species (Beatty 1997). Individual organisms are parts of species, not members of the species-kind. Speciation creates a new individual (or possibly two new individuals and the cessation of the preceding species-individual) but not a new kind. Organisms that are parts of the same species may share common features, but that is not what makes them parts of that species. Rather the explanation is the reverse: because the organisms are parts of the same species they are parts of the same lineage and so they will probably (but not inevitably) share features in common.
Does individualism about species imply that species are not natural kinds? One might suspect as much, but perhaps the two views are compatible. LaPorte (2004), for example, believes that one can consistently hold both views. Where one theorist will see a species-as-kind and an organism-as-member of that kind, another theorist will see a species-as-individual and an organism-as-part of that kind. And so even allowing that individualism is correct, we can construct a kind: if S is a species-individual and x is an organism, then x is a member of the species-kind S* iff x is a part of S. For example, an individual organism (a radish plant) is a part of the species-individual Raphanus Sativus if and only if it is a member of the species-kind Raphanus Sativus (LaPorte 2004, 16). LaPorte’s view does entail giving up on certain features that natural kinds are often thought to have; one cannot still hold that kind membership is necessarily intrinsic, since ‘being a part of y’ is not an intrinsic property and parts of the same entity do not necessarily have any intrinsic properties in common. For that reason, it is also less plausible that kinds must play a role in laws of nature.
If one retains the view that species are natural kinds one must confront the fact that a plethora of species concepts are available and as seen earlier, these species concepts do not always delineate the same species. For example, Mayr’s (1969) biological species concept (BSC) regards a species as a group of “interbreeding natural populations that are reproductively isolated from other such populations” (1969, 26). The phylogenetic species concept (PSC) holds that a species is “the smallest diagnosable cluster of individual organisms within which there is a parental pattern of ancestry and descent” (Cracraft 1983, 170). These definitions are not perfectly coextensive. (For a detailed discussion of species concepts see the entry on species.)
This diversity may be thought to support conventionalism about natural kinds (Section 1.1.2). But supporters of naturalism about our classifications (Section 1.1.1) will deny that the dispute in systematics reflects an indeterminacy in the natural world. A monist will hold that one of the existing systems is a superior account of the natural world. A commitment to one of the different systems over another will result in a different ontological account of species. The most prevalent system of classification in contemporary systematics is cladistics, which classifies organisms phylogenetically, in virtue of shared derived features or an organism’s place in the genealogical tree.
An alternative view to monism, motivated by the variety of species concepts, is pluralism, which holds that the different accounts of species in systematics reflect equally legitimate ways of carving up nature subject to our pragmatic and theoretical interests. However, these systems do carve nature in genuinely natural ways. The species and higher taxa that they delineate reflect real features of the world from the point of view of different theoretical interests. Pluralism (Kitcher 1984; Dupré 1993; Ereshefsky 1992) is the weakest form of realism about kinds in the philosophy of biology.
2.1.2 Biological Essentialism
Kripke (1971, 1972) and Putnam (1975a) use animal kinds as examples of natural kinds for which a posteriori essences can be found. There is some implication that these essences are microstructural, intrinsic properties, which will be, of necessity, individually necessary and jointly sufficient for an entity to be a member of a kind. However, if species are individuals, then it is not true that species may be individuated on the basis of the intrinsic properties of their members. The various species concepts tend to offer relational criteria of species membership (see above). According to the BSC, for example, membership of a species depends on relational properties, such as membership of a certain population and interbreeding. Alternatively, the PSC refers to shared descent.
However, Kripke (1980) himself argues that a person’s parentage is essential to them. If that is so, then if individual S is descended from N, then S is necessarily descended from N. McGinn (1976) suggests that this extends to species also. LaPorte (2004) argues that essentialism holds with respect to facts relating individuals, species, and other taxa to the higher taxa (genus and above) within which they are nested. These taxa are clades, that is to say kinds defined by shared descent from a common ancestral group: an individual or group that is a member or part of clade is necessarily a member or part of that clade. Thus biological kinds (species, genera, etc.) do have essential properties, and these are historical rather than intrinsic properties.
So one option for biological essentialism is to drop the traditional view that the natural properties that are essential for membership of a natural kind are intrinsic: natural, extrinsic (relational) properties can play this role (Okasha 2002). The categorical distinctness criterion must be dropped also.
2.2 Natural Kinds and Chemistry
On account of the problems for natural kinds in biology as well as the development of modern chemistry, chemical kinds have replaced biological kinds as the paradigms of natural kinds. The chemical elements and chemical compounds appear to be bona fide natural kinds. We refer to chemical kinds in laws, explanations, and inductions: that a certain item is iron explains its behaviour and that behaviour is predictable; that iron objects are magnetizable is a law of nature (criteria 2 and 3 above). Moreover, we can induce that all iron is magnetizable, from the observation of particular instances of iron objects that are magnetic. And chemical kinds appear to obey the categorical distinctness requirement: iron is clearly distinct from its neighbours in the periodic table (manganese and cobalt); no elements are intermediate kinds (criterion 6 above). Furthermore, microstructural essentialism seems to be a prima facie plausible option for chemical kinds: it is essential to iron that something made of pure iron is constituted by atoms that have precisely 26 protons in their nuclei.
Microstructuralism in the philosophy of chemistry is the thesis that chemical kinds can be individuated solely in terms of their microstructural properties (Hendry 2006). As exemplified above by the case of iron, the chemical elements provide paradigmatic kinds that may be individuated microstructurally, since the atomic number—the number of protons in the nucleus—suffices to identify the element. It is true that macro-level chemical and physical properties can also serve to individuate chemical elements, and in the nineteenth century chemists were able to individuate elements without knowing what we do about nuclear structure. However, it is held that atomic number has explanatory priority: the number of protons in the nucleus, and hence the nuclear charge, explains the structure of electrons surrounding the nucleus, which, in turn, explains the chemical behaviour of the element.
The microstructuralist can extend this approach from elements to compounds. Compounds are identified principally by their constituent elements. Thus carbon dioxide is that compound of carbon and oxygen with the molar proportion 1:2. In more detail, molecules of carbon dioxide consist of two oxygen atoms and a single carbon atom. The practice of identifying a chemical compound only by its composing elements was the norm in chemistry, until the discovery of isomerism by Friedrich Woehler in 1827. Isomers are distinct compounds that nonetheless share the same constituent elements in the same proportion. Thus fulminic acid and cyanic acid may both be expressed in terms of constituents in the empirical formula CHNO, but their distinct chemical and physical properties identify them as different substances. The explanation of isomerism (and many other facts in organic chemistry), provided first by August Kekulé and Archibald Scott Couper, is the fact that certain compounds exist in molecular form and these molecules have internal structure. Thus molecules of isomers have the same atoms in different spatial arrangements, e.g., CHNO may be arranged as H–O–C≡N (cyanic acid) or as H–C=N–O (fulminic acid). Isomerism means that specifying the chemical composition alone is not sufficient for classification. The microstructure of a compound concerns not just the elemental atoms in its molecules, but also their spatial arrangement.
Needham (2000) and van Brakel (2000) have argued that compounds such as water are dynamic structures whose natures cannot be given in static accounts of their composing elements. Molecules of H2O are polar, with the consequence that the electropositive hydrogen atoms in one H2O molecule will bond with the electronegative oxygen atoms in another H2O molecule, such bonds being hydrogen bonds with the result that in liquid water H2O molecules will form polymer-like chains known as oligomers. The hydrogen bonds and the consequent chains are responsible for the fact that water is liquid at room temperature (whereas compounds with similarly sized molecules, such as hydrogen sulphide, methane, and carbon dioxide, are all gaseous at room temperature). These oligomers are constantly forming, breaking, and reforming. The rate of such changes and the mean length of such oligomers are dependent on the thermodynamic context (in the extreme case, an ice crystal may be considered as a single such oligomer, the crystal structure being dependent on the fixed, strong hydrogen bonds). Thus, say Needham and van Brakel, we cannot consider water to be just a compound composed of a collection of H2O molecules. Furthermore, anything that is to be water must be a macroscopic entity, since only macroscopic bodies can bear thermodynamic properties, such as melting point, which we use to identify water. Hence, a single H2O molecule is not water.
These considerations need not undermine the microstructuralist claim. Many chemical kinds may exist in any of the solid, liquid, and gaseous states while remaining the same substance, including water. But, water vapour will not possess the oligomers present in liquid water and ice. So their presence, however characteristic of water in the liquid and solid phases, cannot be a necessary feature of all bodies of water. Above we saw that atomic number is regarded as the essential feature of an element because it explains the other characteristics an element has. Likewise, the structure of the H2O molecule explains why it is a strongly polar molecule, which in turn explains why it tends to form oligomers. As regards thermodynamic properties, Hendry (2006) points out that we say that water is contained in a person’s body, without thinking that this water has any thermodynamic properties. More generally, thermodynamic properties can be ascribed only to entities in equilibrium, but not all bodies of water are in thermodynamic equilibrium or even nearly so. We may very well use such thermodynamic properties in identifying something as water, but that does not mean that it is in virtue of such properties that something is water.
Hendry (2006) points to a potentially more difficult problem, which is that any liquid sample of water, however pure, contains not only H2O molecules but also H3O+ and OH− ions. These ions cannot be regarded as impurities, since they are also an inevitable consequence of the polar structure of the H2O molecule. Hendry’s solution is to regard H2O molecules as the constituents of water in rather the same sense that eggs and flour are the constituents of a cake—they go into making the cake but need not retain exactly the form they started with. Water is made from bodies of H2O molecules, but not all those retain precisely that structure.
The taxa in the classical Linnean system of biological classification are nested in a hierarchy, as required by Criterion 5 in Section 1.1.1. But, in certain respects, chemical classification fails to meet this requirement. The phenomenon of allotropy is exhibited when an element exists in two or more distinct forms. The element carbon has several, including the allotropes diamond and graphite. Tin has two allotropes at room tempreature, white tin (which is metallic) and grey tin (which is non-metallic). Some instances of tin will fall into one category and other instances will fall into the other category. Consequently, classification by element and classification by metal or non-metal cannot be combined hierarchically.
Such cross-cutting classifications are frequently found in organic chemistry, where compounds can be classified according to their so-called functional groups. Functional groups are specific combinations of atoms within a molecule that will cause the molecule to engage in certain reactions and to have other physical and chemical properties that are characteristic of that group. For example, alcohols are organic compounds containing a hydroxyl group −OH bound to a carbon atom of an alkyl group or derivative of an alkyl group. Alcohols undergo characteristic reactions such as esterification. Since other hydrogen atoms in an alcohol molecule may be substituted by another functional group, the resulting molecule will have properties characteristic of both functional groups and may be classified accordingly. Benzyl alcohol, C6H5CH2OH (or BnOH), is obtained from methane, CH4, by replacing one hydrogen atom by an alcohol-forming hydroxyl group, −OH, and another by the phenyl group −C6H5 (Ph) (the phenyl group plus the CH2 from the methane is the benzyl group, i.e. Bn is PhCH2). Thus benzyl alcohol may be classified either as an alcohol, or as an aromatic benzene derivative, since it participates in the characteristic reactions of the latter, such as electrophilic aromatic substitution or hydrogenation of the benzene ring. If the hierarchy requirement on a system of natural kinds is correct, then not all these cross-cutting classifications pick out natural kinds. The claim that the hierarchy requirement is too stringent for scientific kinds has been defended by Khalidi (1998) and Tobin (2010b).
One may have to deny that metals form a natural kind, and that classification by functional group is a classification into natural kinds. (Not all classifications need to be into kinds in order for them to be useful.) Note that in both cases, there is room for vagueness. Some elements, such as germanium and antimony, are classed as metalloids, with characteristics between metals and non-metals. The impact of a functional group diminishes with the size of the molecules of which it is a part and in the presence of competing functional groups, and so in certain cases, classification according to functional group will be vague. Such vagueness falls foul of the categorical distinctness requirement (Criterion 6 above).
Philosophers have also discussed classification at the interface of biology and chemistry. Goodwin (2011) has argued that structure is fundamental and sufficient for classification of biomolecules, such as proteins. Tobin (2010a) and Slater (2009) appeal to developments in the relationship between protein structure and function in a number of cases such as moonlighting proteins, intrinsically unstructured proteins, and enzymes with multiple structural variants. They claim that the path from structure to function in not straightforward and so undermines the fundamental individuating role of structure in protein classification. Slater (2009) takes these developments in the practice to constitute an argument in favour of macromolecular pluralism. Goodwin (2011) claims that these developments do not undermine the fundamental role of structure in protein classification, but instead suggest a more nuanced understanding of this role. (Goodwin, 2011: p. 534) In a similar vein, Tahko (2020) argues that biochemical kinds pose a challenge for ontological reductionism and for microstructuralism, which have led some to motivate a dual theory of chemical and biological kinds and others to argue for pluralism about natural kinds. Tahko argues that the main challenge is multiple realization, which he nevertheless, thinks can be addressed. The upshot is that there are reasonable prospects for ontological reductionism about biochemical kinds, which in his view corroborates natural kind monism. Thus, even if there are indispensable classificatory practices at the higher level, this need not entail pluralism about biochemical kinds.
2.3 Natural Kinds and Psychology
Do the different sorts of mental state form natural kinds? We certainly think that our minds make a difference to what happens in the physical world and we think that we act because we have certain beliefs, desires, hopes, fears etc. The distinctive explanatory roles performed by these different states in folk psychology certainly suggest that these beliefs, desires, hopes and fears constitute distinct mental natural kinds. Note that in considering natural kinds in chemistry, biology, and physics we have thought of kinds principally as kinds of thing (kinds of stuff, organism, particle, etc.) whereas we are now considering the possibility of certain kinds of state. (Ellis (2001, 2002) is clear that he does not limit natural kinds to kinds of thing, but includes kinds of state and process also.) A Cartesian dualist holds that mental states are distinct from any physical state of the subject, as they are states of an immaterial thinking substance. The problem for dualism however is in finding the ground of the difference between fearing, believing, hoping etc. i.e. what difference is there to the immaterial substance when a subject is in different mental states? In principle this problem could be avoided by the dualist if mental kinds are regarded as immaterial substances (Shoemaker 2003).
There are many ways to understand mental natural kinds, and theories have been proposed by eliminativists, identity theorists, functionalists and many others. We will treat each of these in turn. Physicalists hold that the differences in mental kinds relate somehow to differences in states of the subject’s brain, or, more generally, the subject’s body. At one extreme, the (type) identity theory of mind holds that types of mental state are identical with types of brain state. If so, we may expect the kinds of psychology to be identical with the kinds of neuroscience.
The identity theory faces the problem of multiple realizability—the idea that it is possible for physically diverse creatures to be in the same kind of mental state. It is possible, for example, that Martian neurophysiology might be entirely different from that of humans while Martians nonetheless have the same kinds of mental state as humans have; if a Martian’s body is injured, it writhes, groans, and avoids the causes of such injuries—the Martian is in pain (Lewis 1980). Indeed it is possible that cognitive scientists might design a machine that is capable of higher-level thought (implemented on, for example, a silicon architecture). It is even possible that the same mental kinds be realized by distinct neurophysiological systems in one and the same organism over time. Consequently, it is at least an open empirical possibility that mental kinds may correspond to a widely disjunctive and heterogeneous set of neurophysiological kinds, and hence that there is no one-to-one correlation between them.
Eliminativism argues that the prima facie failure to straightforwardly reduce mental kinds to neurophysiological kinds ought to lead to the elimination of mental kinds altogether (Churchland 1981, 1988). This is to claim that there are no mental natural kinds. On this view, the mental kinds in folk psychology are comparable to the kinds delineated by discredited folk theories from the past e.g., the humours in medieval medicine. The underlying principle of medieval medicine was the balancing of so-called four humours. According to the theory, illness was caused by an imbalance of these four humours. From the point of view of modern medicine this theory is radically false and so the only option is to eliminate the humours as putative natural kinds. Analogously, mental kinds ought to be eliminated in favour of those kinds uncovered by recent research in neuroscience. Eliminativists agree that human beings have invented a very successful methodology for describing their mental lives. This methodology is folk psychology, a common sense theory of how mental states are causally related to human action. However, folk psychology, they argue, is merely a heuristic device invented by human beings in order to make the explanation of behaviour easier. The posits of the theory are not real natural kinds. Once a better explanation of human behaviour in terms of neurophysiological kinds is available, then mental kinds will be eliminated.
Functionalists argue that the irreducibilty of mental kinds is nevertheless compatible with a token-token identity theory (Fodor 1974, 1997). Mental kinds are not type-identical with neurophysiological kinds (i.e. there is not one type of neurophysiological correlate for each type of mental state, so we cannot make general identity statements such as “pain = C-fibres firing”). A Martian and I, both in a state of fear at a time t, may be in different physiological states. Nevertheless, my token instance of the kind fear at time t will be identical with the token physical state in my brain at that time. Likewise, the token instance of the Martian’s fear at time t1 is identical with his token physical state.
It has been argued by Kim (1992, 1993) that multiply realized mental kinds of the latter kind can in principle be locally reduced to their realizing states. Mental kinds are analogous to mineral kinds such as jade, which can be locally reduced to nephrite or jadeite depending on the sample. Importantly, a sample that does not consist of either nephrite or jadeite is simply not jade. Nevertheless, there is an important disanalogy between mental kinds and locally reduced kinds like jade. If you want a sample of jade, then it must be composed of either jadeite or nephrite. In other words, if J (jade) is realized by the disjunction P (Jadeite) or Q (Nephrite), then it is metaphysically necessary that the properties a thing has qua J are either properties it has qua P or properties it has qua Q. So, something with all the other qualitative properties of jade in another possible world, but which lacked the essential properties (i.e. of jadeite or nephrite) would simply not be an instance of jade.
In contrast, for the functionalist (Fodor 1997) mental kinds are defined by their functional roles, rather than by the essential properties of the neurophysiological kinds that realize them. It does not matter which physical kind does the realizing, be it silicon chips, neurons, C-fibres or whatever. Rather, what matters is that the psychological state (e.g., pain) plays a certain functional role. The whole point of multiple realizability is that it is easy to imagine some possible world where a token mental kind is realized by silicon chips, C-fibres firing, or whatever. So, a mental kind is not essentially realized by a certain neurophysiological kind; rather it plays the same functional role independently of what underlying kind is realizing it. This appears to violate Criterion 1 for natural kinds (in Section 1.1.1), that members of a natural kind should have some natural properties in common.
The functional role of mental kinds is explained by some functionalists in terms of the modularity of the mind (Fodor 1983). This is the claim that the mind has different innate modules which play a certain functional role. These modules are domain-specific, operating only on certain kinds of inputs. So, for example, there will be distinct modules for mental tasks like mind-reading, speaker recognition and facial recognition. The functional role associated with mental kinds might for example be given an evolutionary account in terms of adapted modules (Cosmides and Tooby 1992). On this view, mental kinds in folk psychology are successful for the purposes of the explanation of human behaviour because they refer to the functional modules of the mind. Such views may motivate emergentism. One interpretation of the emergentist account of mind is that there are emergent mental kinds that have no straightforward correlation with the kinds identified by neuroscience. Nor are mental kinds and neurophysiological kinds either identical to or subkinds of one another; consequently emergentism is in conflict with the (contested) taxonomic hierarchy criterion (Criterion 5). (See the entry on emergent properties.)
The type-identity theory, if true, might seem to motivate essentialism about psychological kinds, by analogy with other theoretical identities (see Section 1.3.1 and Section 4.3). Kripke (1980), however, denies that his arguments concerning other theoretical identities apply here. Let us say that (slow) pain for us humans is correlated with the firing of C-fibres. If this were a genuine theoretical identity, then in all possible worlds, when someone undergoes C-fibre firing, then they are in a state of pain. But it seems plausible that there could be worlds where C-fibre stimulation is not accompanied by any painful sensation. If there are such worlds, then the theoretical identity implies that such a world is one where people can be in pain without having any painful sensation; indeed the pain might yield a pleasant sensation. Kripke regards this as counterintuitive. The concept of pain is necessarily tied to the phenomenal nature of the pain sensation, whereas the concept of gold is not tied to the colour yellow. Consequently, there is no identity between pain and C-fibre firing (nor any other physical state); likewise there is no physical essence to pain. A posteriori natural kind essentialism fails in this case.
Recently, there has been some discussion of whether mental concepts are themselves natural kinds. The claim that concepts form a natural kind has been accepted by philosophers of psychology and cognitive psychologists alike (Margolis, 1994, 1995; Fodor, 1998, 2008). Recent literature has argued against that assumption (Griffiths 1997; Machery 2005, 2009; Piccinini and Scott 2006). Griffiths 1997 has argued that individual and familiar concepts such as emotion do not correspond to genuine natural kinds, and should therefore be eliminated from scientific vocabulary. Machery’s (2009, Ch. 3) heterogeneity hypothesis claims furthermore that the class of concepts do not delineate a homogeneous class; the kind ‘concept’. Rather, they divide into several distinct kinds that actually have little in common. Thus, it is a mistake to assume that there are many general properties of concepts, and that a theory of concepts should attempt to describe these. In general, then the notion of concept is not part of an adequate taxonomy of our mental representation.
2.4 Natural Kinds and Social Science
The question as to whether there are social kinds has a long history. In the sociology of science, functionalists such as Durkheim (1897) have argued that there is empirical support for the autonomy of social facts. For example, statistical analysis shows that suicide rates differed radically depending on social factors, (e.g. religious background, gender, marital status etc.) This analysis led to the possibility of social science being taken in a quantitative direction. Even if every individual commits suicide as a result of psychological factors, the statistical facts about the “reasons” for suicide and how they change with place and over time are distinctly social. One question then is whether one should be naturalist about such social facts. If so, how could naturalism be reconciled with the claim that social facts are dynamic and changing in so far as they concern human beings in social interactions?
Because social kinds are distinctly anthropocentric, some theorists claim that the only plausible view we can hold is some form of constructivism about them. Hacking (1995, 1999) argues that in social contexts the object of classification itself changes in being classified. The fact that the people being classified are conscious makes for dynamic interactions between the classification and the classified. The latter may resist or embrace certain classifications (‘child abuser’, ‘hip’) and modify their behaviour accordingly. This leads to an change in the extensions of the relevant kind concepts. Furthermore, as the extensions change, the criteria for membership may change also. Many of our classifications in social science are evaluative. A social situation looks deviant from the norm and people make an evaluative judgment about this. Sometimes this means that people passively accept what experts say about them, and see themselves in that light. But feedback can direct itself in many ways. Alternatively, some people seek to reclassify themselves. Thus, classification in social science is interactive. Hacking argues that this is in marked contrast to the indifferent kinds that are found in natural science. An electron is indifferent to being classified as an electron.
Pace Hacking, Khalidi (2010) argues that in fact the contrast between natural and social kinds is not so stark: even many chemical kinds would not have been instantiated in the world were it not for the fact that a scientist conceived of them and acted on that conception. So in both cases the existence of a classification scheme can cause changes to the extension of the kinds in question. The difference between natural kinds and social kinds is a difference of the degree of control we have over the object of classification. In the chemical domain, for example, the nature of the phenomena themselves imposes greater restrictions on the kinds that we can create. (See also Cooper 2004.)
3. The Epistemology of Natural Kinds
Many of these considerations from the practice of classification in the special sciences have led to an emerging naturalist approach to the topic of natural kinds. It is clear from the examination of classification in the special sciences, that it is difficult to find a concept of natural kind that fits all of the different practices of classification. This has sometimes been used as a core argument in favour of pluralism about natural kinds (Dupré 2001) or to eliminate the need for natural kinds altogether (Hacking 2007a). Additionally, this first argument has been used to support the homeostatic property cluster view of kinds, because this takes a more liberal approach to classification. Indeed one of the motivations for Boyd’s original HPC view was to outline an account of natural kinds that was liberal enough to accommodate a diversity of natural kinds, also including the kinds in the biological and social sciences.
Many of the claims made in support of pluralism stem from concerns about natural kind classification in the context of scientific practice. This approach tends to examine specific scientific case studies and derive philosophical implications about classification from the examination of these classificatory practices (Kendig 2015). It is important to point out that many of the discussions are epistemic in nature; that is to say the claim that there are different ways to classify in scientific practice, which are all equally legitimate ways of generating knowledge for practising scientists depending on their theoretical interests and research questions.
In recent literature, some have argued for a move away from the metaphysics of natural kinds to an epistemology-first approach to classification. Slater (2015), Ereshefsky and Reydon (2015) argue that the epistemic value of natural kinds can be considered independently from the metaphysics of natural kinds. They claim that it is more fruitful to be led by classification in scientific practice first and foremost. A philosophical account of our classificatory practices should describe how kinds are made in the context of scientific practice, we might refer these as acts of “kinding”. Slater claims that what matters for classification is the role that our classes play in inductive inferences within the context of scientific practice. Slater argues that this requires a minimal metaphysical commitment “that these properties be sufficiently stably co-instantiated to accommodate the inferential and explanatory uses to which particular sciences are put” Slater (2015), p. 396). Similarly, Magnus (2012) argues that a natural kind in a domain allows enquiry in the domain to achieve inductive and explanatory success, a success which would be impossible without a pre-existing commitment to a natural kind classification.
Additionally, those that take an epistemology first approach are critical of metaphysical accounts of natural kinds which are overly prescriptive and homogeneous about what counts as a natural kind. The consequence of taking a metaphysics first approach is that many of the important and heterogeneous practices of kinding that are used in the context of scientific practice do not count as natural kind classifications in the metaphysical sense. The implication here is that an epistemology first approach is more consistent with a descriptive and naturalistic account of classification. Epistemological accounts of natural kinds must come first and our metaphysical accounts must be informed by these epistemological considerations.
Ereshefsky and Reydon (2015) have argued that this has led to a fundamental mismatch between scientific kinds and natural kinds. In the homeostatic property cluster view of kinds, the overarching principles of similarity and homeostatic mechanisms lead to many examples of scientific kinds which do not then count as natural kinds. For example, according to Ereshefsky and Reydon (2015), non-causal, functional and heterostatic kinds would not count as natural kinds despite the fact that many successful scientific kinds are non-causal, functional or heterostatic.
In contrast, Lemeire (2018) argues that a purely epistemic approach to natural kinds is misguided. The epistemic approach rests on the assumption that for kind categories to be epistemically fruitful, they have to get something right about the world. However, epistemic success is constrained by deference to the world not only in cases of natural kind classification, but also in cases of conventional and pragmatic classification, where the product of kinding is not considered to be a natural kind. For this reason, Lemiere argues that a purely epistemic approach fails to give us a principled way of distinguishing between the natural kinds and their conventional counterparts. A metaphysical account of which features individuals require to be considered as natural kinds is required to lead our categorization practices. An epistemic approach alone cannot provide a principled way of doing this.
Kendig and Grey (2021) are also critical of purely epistemic approaches to natural kinds. They accept that there is value to epistemology first accounts of natural kinds in so far as they highlight the epistemic value of natural kind classifications to scientists. Nevertheless, they argue that doing this successfully requires accurate metaphysical presuppositions. Their argument focuses on Slater’s HPC view of natural kinds to expose why metaphysical presuppositions are necessary for our categorisation practices. They claim that it is not possible to evaluate the stability of a cluster of properties without taking stock of the metaphysical picture used to account for that stability
Reydon (2016) has argued for a model which attempts to reconcile and integrate the metaphysics and the epistemology in the act of classification. On his co-creation model of natural kinds, both nature and the classifier are constitutive of the creation of kinds’ (p. 70); kinds are ‘co-determined by aspects of the state of affairs in nature as well as by background assumptions and decisions by investigators’ (p. 59).
4. The Semantics of Natural Kind Terms
Much recent interest in natural kinds has been stimulated by debates concerning the semantics of natural kind terms, originating especially with the work of Saul Kripke (1972) and Hilary Putnam (1973, 1975a). Typical natural kind expressions fall into one of two categories: predicates (is water, is gold, is a tiger, and is an oak) and singular terms (water, gold, the tiger, and the oak). In this section we survey some of the debates concerning the meaning of such terms, what—if anything—they refer to, and how they do so. Many discussions focus on the predicate kind terms, often considering them alongside other general terms, taking the principal issue to be the relationship between a natural kind term and its extension. Such an approach will appeal to conventionalists, but it may appeal also to those naturalists who are nominalists about natural kinds or otherwise hostile or indifferent to (strong) realism about natural kinds. However, we shall see that there may be reason to take the singular kind terms as primary. (One difference between Putnam and Kripke is that while Putnam tends to focus on the natural kind predicates, Kripke’s arguments are centered primarily on the singular natural kind terms.) Kripke and Putnam attacked a pair of related views about natural kind terms: descriptivist semantics (the meaning of such a term is a description satisfied by all and only members of the kind) and internalism (the meaning of such a term, the relevant description, is fully grasped by competent users of the term so that what fixes the extension of the term supervenes on what is internal to the user). Putnam’s rejection of descriptivism is a component of his argument that ‘meanings ain’t in the head’ whereas for Kripke the goal is to show that natural kind terms are much like proper names, for which, he argues, a descriptivist semantics fails. Members of the extension of a natural kind share properties in common. If descriptivism were true, then one would reasonably believe that those properties would be the properties mentioned in the description with the possible addition of further properties nomically correlated with those. But if descriptivism is false, it would appear that the characteristic properties of a kind will not typically be knowable a priori, but must be uncovered by scientific investigation. If so, then those properties, being necessary conditions of kind membership but discoverable only a posteriori, look very much like real essences. At first sight it seems then that the semantic arguments of Kripke and Putnam have metaphysical consequences. This is highly controversial (Salmon 1979, 1982). Do the arguments of Putnam and Kripke really support an essentialist metaphysics? Or do they illegitimately assume it? Or do they, more innocently, show that we as users of natural kind terms implicitly assume such a metaphysics?
4.1 Descriptivism and Internalism
The modern tradition of natural kinds begins with J. S. Mill (1884) who talked of ‘Kinds’ (the term ‘natural kind’ is traced by Hacking (1991a) back to Mill’s contemporary, the logician John Venn (1866)). According to Mill, typical singular (individual) names such as ‘Scott’ denote their referents but lack any connotation, that is to say the names do not imply any attribute. Some singular names do have connotation as well as denotation, for example ‘the author of Waverley’. A general name, such as ‘white’, denotes all the things they hold of (its extension) while also connoting the attribute they all share in common. Natural kind terms are a special case of general terms in this respect
The idea that something such as a connotation determines the extension of a term is elaborated in Frege’s notion of sense and, later, that of intension. Frege and later philosophers have applied this view to singular proper names, and views of this sort fall under the general heading of ‘descriptivism’. Russell is also often referred to in this regard, but it should be remembered that Russell’s view is that grammatically proper names are abbreviations of quantified expressions and so do not have any referring role at all (and so a fortiori they do not have a referring role that is meditated by a connotation/sense/intension). Some neo-Fregeans nevertheless deny that Fregean senses should be cashed out as descriptions (e.g., McDowell 1977; Evans 1982).
Mill’s descriptivism implies that for each natural kind term there is an associated set of properties such that for some item to be a member of that natural kind, it should possess those properties—these are properties that describe objects belonging to the kind in question. Implicit in Mill and explicit in Frege is the claim that these descriptions are constitutive of the meaning of the term in the following way: someone who understands the term adequately will be in a position to grasp a priori that something falls under the kind term if and only if it satisfies that description. For this reason the relevant properties will normally be readily observable properties of things; they will not be properties associated with the kind only by a posteriori investigation. For example, as mentioned above, Kant held the view that it is a priori that something falls under the kind term gold only if it is a yellow metal. Because the extension-fixing meaning of a term is thus graspable a priori this view is internalist about extension fixing. The extensions of kind terms of any two subjects with the same internal mental states will have (in the same context) the same extensions.
4.2 Arguments Against Descriptivism
Putnam (1973, 1975a) and Kripke (1972) reject the descriptivist view of natural kind terms. Putnam’s principal aim is to undermine internalism about reference and extension (“meanings just ain’t in the head”). Kripke’s aim is first to restate a Millian view of proper names (they denote without connoting) and then to extend that view to natural kind terms. (‘Millian’ will be used to characterize any account of the semantics of a term that claims that it denotes without connoting, even when applied, pace Mill, to kind terms.) According to Kripke, Mill was right about proper names but wrong about kinds; Millianism—Mill’s denotation-without-connotation view—is right for both sorts of term. Salmon (1982) categorizes Kripke’s arguments against descriptivism for singular terms under the headings ‘the modal arguments’, ‘the epistemological arguments’, and ‘the semantic arguments’—this categorization is useful also for the corresponding arguments against descriptivism for general terms.
4.2.1 The Modal Arguments Against Descriptivism
The modal arguments against descriptivism take the following form. Let C be some natural kind and D be some complex set of readily observable properties that would, on a descriptivist view, be most naturally regarded as providing the content of the description that constitutes the meaning of ‘C’. Now consider:
(K) ∀x(x is an instance of the kind C ↔ Dx).
Since D is constitutive of the meaning of ‘C’, (K) should be analytic and so necessary. The descriptive view would thus be refuted either by (i) metaphysically possible instances of the kind C that do not possess the property complex D or by (ii) metaphysically possible items that do possess the property complex D without being instances of C.
Some proposed cases of (i) require the laws of nature to be contingent. Although the laws of nature are widely held to be contingent, some philosophers hold that the laws are necessary, on the basis of essentialist arguments that are much of a piece with Kripke’s essentialist arguments, even if strictly independent of them. The anti-descriptivist arguments regard the observable properties of instances of a kind C as nomic consequences of the essence of C. If the laws of nature are metaphysically necessary then D will be a necessary property of instances of C also. Thus, instances of (i) will not be available. If the laws are necessary, then the melting point of gold will be necessary just as the atomic number of gold is. However, not all observable properties are consequences of the laws alone. Some are consequences of the laws plus contingent environmental factors. Thus the perceived colour of an object may change with environmental differences. Thus if looking yellow is a component of D, then a possible world in which gold does not look yellow (because of unusual atmospheric effects)—surely a genuine possibility—would be a counterinstance of type (i). On the other hand, it might be argued, that the proper component of D would be being yellow, in which case we will have the makings of an epistemological argument against descriptivism (see below).
Other cases of (i) might be thought to be generated, irrespective of the necessity of the laws, by noting that a kind might be manifested in two or more superficially distinct species. Thus allotropes are distinct types of a single chemical kind that may differ considerably in superficial properties (for example, graphite and diamond, both types of the element carbon). Similarly, a caterpillar and a butterfly can be members of the same species. For known cases, D would have to be disjunctive. While that may not itself be problematic, it raises the epistemic possibility that the same phenomenon may be (nomically and metaphysically) possible for many kinds that we think exist in only one form.
Cases of (ii) may be more readily available, since the necessity of laws may rule out a particular kind having different possible sets of manifest properties, but does not rule out two distinct possible kinds having the same manifest properties. Indeed, the case of jadeite and nephrite is often referred to as an example of the latter. Along the same lines, we may imagine that something like fool’s gold, iron pyrites, is just like gold in observable properties, differing only in chemical constitution. We may imagine that there were creatures to all appearances like cats, but which are internally robots; or just like tigers but had reptilian innards. These are all metaphysically possible, so the arguments go; hence, possession of the relevant properties cannot suffice for membership of the corresponding kind.
The modal argument does not refute descriptivism applied to every description—after all, Kripke and Putnam do both think that the description “is constituted by H2O” holds necessarily of anything that is water. Rather, the modal argument is intended to exclude as possible descriptions those that could be constitutive of a sense or connotation that is grasped by any competent user of the term. Such a sense, if it exists, would employ descriptions that refer to the observable features of the members of a kind, not those features uncovered by science.
4.2.2 The Epistemological Arguments
The epistemological arguments against descriptivism have a similar structure to the modal arguments. Consider again the proposition (K). Someone who uses the term ‘C’ competently should be thereby able to come to know that (K) is true, in virtue of grasping the meaning of ‘C’. Thus (K) should be a priori. So counterexamples to descriptivism would be cases (i) where although one knows that some thing is of the kind C one cannot thereby come to know that it possesses the property complex D, or (ii) where although one knows that some thing possesses the property complex D, one cannot thereby come to know that it is of the kind C.
To generate epistemological type (i) cases, Kripke asks us to imagine that gold might be blue but only appears yellow thanks to an optical illusion, or that tigers do not normally have four legs, but only appear that way, again thanks to an illusion. However, if the descriptions associated with ‘gold’ were to include ‘is yellow’ and the descriptions associated with ‘tiger’ include ‘is four-legged’ then we would know a priori that these possibilities do not obtain. But that seems to be a mistake. Although we may reasonably be confident that gold really is yellow and not blue, and not just appearing that way, this confidence is not a priori but is instead a consequence of a posteriori experience of the conditions under which we have observed samples of gold. It is a matter of discovery whether we are subject to this kind of illusion, or whether something that is in fact white or grey could be gold; for example it is only a posteriori that we know that gold does not have white and grey allotropes, as tin does. (What is called ‘white gold’ is in fact an alloy of gold; but given a description of its appearance, it is not a priori that it is not gold. This is a contrapositive version of an epistemological type (i) case.) Likewise, turning to epistemological type (ii) cases, if descriptivism were correct, we could rule out a priori the possibility that something has all the superficial properties of gold, but is not gold. But again we do not have such a priori knowledge (again we note that jadeite is superficially similar to nephrite but not the same kind).
Putnam’s Division of Linguistic Labor may be thought of as furnishing an epistemological argument. Putnam’s idea is that the referent of a term used by some individual may be fixed not by their own knowledge or beliefs, but rather by the knowledge of certain experts to whom that individual defers. Since aluminium and molybdenum are different kinds, then according to descriptivism there should be some a priori knowable features that will distinguish between them for anyone who is capable of using ‘aluminium’ to refer to the one kind and ‘molybdenum’ to the other kind. Likewise there should be some mental difference between a speaker in the actual world who uses ‘aluminium’ to refer to aluminium and a speaker in another world, where the instances of aluminium and molybdenum are swapped (pans and cans are made of molybdenum there), who uses ‘aluminium’ to refer to molybdenum. But, says, Putnam, no such difference need exist: ordinary speakers have these differentiated referring capacities without any difference in knowledge of the referents. That is because those referential capacities are parasitic on those of the experts who do have the required discriminating knowledge (Putnam, 1975b, 228). Their knowledge fixes the referents of their use of ‘aluminium’ and ‘molybdenum’. Our deference to them as those people who could tell us which things are aluminium and which are molybdenum, means that our referents of ‘aluminium’ and ‘molybdenum’ are the same as theirs.
4.2.3 The Semantic Arguments
The modal and epistemological arguments concern the modal and epistemic properties of propositions of the form of (K). If descriptivism were correct then there should be for each kind, C, a proposition of that form employing a manifest property complex D, such that the proposition is analytic and hence both necessary and a priori. The modal and epistemological arguments deny this.
Note that the modal and epistemological arguments are most naturally presented in the material mode, concerning the objects themselves and their relations. (K) is in the material mode and we ask about its modal status, by talking about certain stuff and asking whether it is or would be gold if it had such-and-such properties, and so forth. Likewise, mutatis mutandis, for the epistemological arguments. The semantic arguments differ in that they are presented in the formal mode, concerning the linguistic expressions in question. This is because we are asking what a term’s reference or extension would be in certain counterfactual circumstances. To use an example concerning a proper (singular) name, we start by imagining that it turns out that Johannes Kepler had not been the first to postulate the laws of planetary motion, whereas it was an unknown student of Kepler’s who did this first. Many people have no beliefs about Kepler other that that he was the first person to postulate those laws. If our story were true, would the name ‘Kepler’, as used by such people, refer to the student or to the teacher? Our intuition, so anti-descriptivists maintain, is that the name would still refer to the teacher, the man we (falsely) believed to be responsible for the discovery of the laws of planetary motion. Yet, if the descriptivist account were correct for proper names, then with respect to the people under consideration, their use of ‘Kepler’ would either refer to the student, or would fail to refer at all.
Both Putnam and Kripke take arguments of this sort to generalize to natural kind terms. The best known of the semantic arguments as applied to natural kind terms is Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment (see Section 1.3.1). Putnam asks us to imagine that elsewhere in the universe there is a planet exactly like Earth in virtually all respects, which we may call ‘Twin Earth’. However, where on Earth we find H2O, on Twin Earth we find XYZ, a substance with a fundamentally different chemical structure from H2O, but which shares all its manifest properties (boiling and freezing points, taste, odour, ability to support life, being the predominant constituent of precipitation, seas, lakes etc.) with H2O. Every inhabitant of Earth has a twin equivalent on Twin Earth. Twin Earthlings (at least those in the parts bearing a geographical similarity to Earth’s United States, Australia, Jamaica, Pitcairn etc.) speak a language rather like English and use the term ‘water’ in circumstances precisely analogous to our uses of ‘water’ on Earth, e.g., they say that their lakes and reservoirs are full of ‘water’.
The semantic Twin Earth argument now proceeds by asking what the extension of ‘water’ is, as used by some Earthling, and likewise what the extension of ‘water’ is, as used by some Twin Earthling. Putnam’s appeal to our linguistic intuitions is supposed to yield the verdict that the extension of the Earthling’s use of ‘water’ includes all and only H2O whereas the Twin Earthling’s use of ‘water’ includes all and only XYZ. In support of this we may consider that this is the judgment we must come to if we Earthlings are not to deny what Earth chemists tell us, viz. that water is H2O, nor, symmetrically, deny the Twin Earth chemists’ assertion, ‘water is XYZ’. Nor will it do to gainsay our chemists’ judgment that water is H2O, given the assumption of the existence of XYZ. For that is tantamount to the suggestion that (actual) Berzelius (the discoverer of the correct chemical formula for water) was not entitled to assert that water is H2O until he had ruled out the possibility of some substance other than H2O sharing water’s manifest qualities.
The thought experiment is now almost in a position to claim the foregoing as a counterexample to descriptivism, for XYZ will satisfy any set of manifest properties that could be constitutive of the meaning of ‘water’ as used on Earth. Yet the extension of that term excludes XYZ. However, the reference to chemists’ knowledge made above reminds us that there is a difference between not only the physical constitution of Earth and Twin Earth, but also a difference between the psychological states of their inhabitants. For (some of) those on Earth believe ‘water is H2O’ whereas their Twin Earth counterparts believe ‘water is XYZ’. Perhaps, at least for those speakers, those beliefs are also constitutive of the meanings of the two terms ‘water’ (Earth) and ‘water’ (Twin Earth). In order to exclude this response, Putnam asks us to consider the same comparison made in 1750, before any beliefs of this form were held. We now assume that there has been no major change in the (cross-temporal) extension of ‘water’ (Earth) since 1750. (That is to say, when David Hume asked for a glass of what he called ‘water’, he was requesting the same stuff as we are when we make a request using the same term.) Since, as argued above, the extensions of ‘water’ (Earth) and ‘water’ (Twin Earth) differ today, their extensions differed in 1750. But in 1750 the descriptions associated with the word ‘water’ cannot differ between Earth and Twin Earth. This is because the molecular structure of water was unknown in 1750, prior to the chemical revolution (when phlogiston theory was replaced by Lavoisier’s new oxygen theory). Given that the molecular structure was unknown even to the experts, the descriptive resources available to Earthians and their Twin Earthian counterparts were identical. Nonetheless, their references using ‘water’ differed. Hence, descriptions do not suffice to fix reference.
4.3 Direct Reference and Externalism
The conclusions of the arguments given above include not only the falsity of descriptivism as a thesis about the reference of natural kind terms, but also the more general truth of semantic externalism. The Earthling in 1750 and their Twin Earth counterpart are supposed to be intrinsic physical duplicates. (There is a problem in that one would expect the twin to have XYZ in its blood stream, etc., not H2O, so the two are not perfect duplicates; but we can take it that this physical difference should not affect the argument.) Although they are duplicates, the terms they use have different extensions; likewise their thoughts have different truth conditions. Consequently, the reference, extension, and truth conditions of a person’s utterances do not supervene on their physical state. These things are fixed, at least in part, by external considerations. We might retain a conception of the psychological such that the psychological still supervenes on the physical; but then one would have to deny that ‘thinking about water’ characterizes a psychological state. Or, we must deny that the psychological state of a subject supervenes upon the physical state of the subject.
If descriptions do not fix extensions, and some external factor fixes extensions, then by what process are extensions fixed? Kripke does not intend to propose a new theory of reference fixing, although the outlines of such a theory are fairly clearly implied by what he says. His principal aim is to make the case for the Millian denotation-without-connotation view of singular proper names, and then extend this (contrary to Mill’s own opinion) to certain general terms also, including natural kind terms.
The Millian view may be called direct reference (Kaplan 1977), since the reference of singular proper name is not mediated by a connotation/sense/intension. The semantic value of such a name just is the individual to which it refers. Such terms are thus rigid designators—they denote the same object with respect to all possible worlds (Kripke 1980, 48). How does this view extend to natural kind terms? The answer is that the view does not transfer if we take the analogue of the denotation of a singular term to be the extension of a kind term. This is because presumably the extension of a kind term differs from world to world, since the individual members of a kind, such as individual tigers and lumps of gold, are generally contingent entities.
The obvious route to an analogy between kind terms and singular direct reference is to focus not on natural kind predicates but on singular natural kind terms (see first paragraph of Section 4 above). We should regard terms such as ‘water’, ‘gold’, ‘Rattus rattus’, etc. as denoting abstract individuals and objects (or some other kinds of entity that may be the constant recipient of reference across worlds). Thus the direct reference view applied to such terms says that the semantic value of those terms just is those abstract individuals, and the claim that the terms are rigid designators is the claim that they denote the same abstract individual, the same natural kind, with respect to all possible worlds. Rigid designation is a consequence of direct reference (but not vice versa). (See Martí 2003 for a discussion of the relationship between Millianism, direct reference, and rigid designation. See also Sullivan 2005.)
Treating kinds as abstract individuals permits an analogue for natural kind terms to the natural story concerning the reference of singular proper names that emerges from Kripke’s discussion. In the simplest case, an individual receives a name in a naming ceremony, and the use of that name is transferred from speaker to speaker, preserving its reference through each transfer. Thus the reference of a later use is determined by tracing back the route of transmission to the original naming ceremony. In the natural kind case, which is rather more of an idealization than the case of a concrete particular, the original naming ceremony picks out a natural kind via an ostension of one of its samples. This is the so-called ‘causal’ theory of reference. Note that ‘causal’ refers to the causal transmission of the use of the name. (Although an ostensive reference fixing will be causal, the link between the kind (or its sample) and the first use of the kind term could be secured by a reference-fixing description. In such as case the reference-fixing description does merely that; it does not supply a meaning (sense or intension).
Thus far Kripke’s account of the semantics of natural kind terms treats them very much on a par with proper names, suggesting that kinds are much like abstract individuals, being potential recipients of singular reference—Millianism has been extended from proper names of individuals to natural kind terms. (Mill’s own view of ‘general terms’ was not Millian in this sense, but closer to a Fregean view.) Putnam gives a more elaborate account of the reference of natural kind terms, which apparently does not depend on treating kinds as abstract individuals. According to Putnam, the extension of a natural kind term is fixed by ostending or otherwise identifying a sample of the kind and appealing, explicitly or implicitly, to a ‘same kind relation’. Thus the extension of ‘water’ includes all and only those things that bear the same kind relation to some sample, which may be specified loosely, for instance as ‘the watery stuff around here’ (where ‘watery’ is defined in terms of the manifest characteristics of water, not in terms of ‘water’). (Note that Putnam says ‘same liquid relation’, but that would not provide the extension of a natural kind term, since it would exclude the gaseous and solid phases of water.) Putnam (1975a) thereby extends the notion of rigid designation to general terms, since (a) the same kind relation is a cross-world relation, and (b) it is anchored to a specific, actual world sample. Consequently all samples of water in all possible worlds will bear the same kind relation to one another. That this excludes XYZ depends upon its being the case that a sample that does not share the ‘important physical properties’ of our sample cannot be of the same kind.
The view that natural kind terms are rigid designators has consequences for identity statements involving natural kind terms (e.g., “brontosaurus is apatosaurus”). The reason is that any identity statement relating two rigid designators is necessarily true. Hence identity statements involving natural kind terms express necessary truths, even if knowable only a posteriori. Kripke regards theoretical identities such as ‘water = H2O’, where one of the terms is a description, as instances of such a posteriori necessary identities. Such a claim requires an argument to show that ‘H2O’ is a rigid designator, since it is not a directly referring expression. We may take ‘H’ and ‘O’ to designate hydrogen and oxygen rigidly. However, if the formula ‘H2O’ just means ‘hydrogen and oxygen compounded in the ratio 2:1’ one might wonder whether, if the laws of nature are contingent, there might be worlds where hydrogen and oxygen are compounded in that ratio in such a way that the resulting compound does not belong to the same kind as H2O, and is not water. If that is possible, then ‘H2O’ is not a rigid designator, and ‘water = H2O’ is not necessary. (As noted above, Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment does not establish the identity of water and H2O—all it establishes is that being constituted of H2O is a necessary condition of being water. In which case it is consistent with some instances (actual and possible) of H2O not being water.) Most discussions accept that to count H2O as a substance it must be compounded of hydrogen and oxygen in the way that they are actually compounded. The rigid designation of simple, directly referring names and kind terms is often explained in terms of their having an indexical character. In ideal cases where the name is introduced via an ostension of its intended referent, the designation is literal. In other cases indexicality is less apparent, as we see in the case of ‘water’ where there is something like an implicit ostension of ‘watery stuff around here’ (though ‘water’ could not mean ‘watery stuff around here’, since then the referent of ‘water’ would then be different in an XYZ environment). A similar implicit indexicality is found in the theoretical specification of kind terms, which explains their rigid character also.
The Millian view applied to simple natural kind terms faces various problems. One of these problems concerns empty terms. ‘Phlogiston’, ‘caloric’, ‘ether’, ‘humour’, are all natural kind terms that fail to refer to anything. Millianism implies that there is no semantic difference between these terms at all. Surely ‘phlogiston does not exist’ and ‘caloric does not exist’ mean different things; Lavoisier asserted the first and denied the second with apparent consistency. The most common response to this problem is a retreat from pure Millianism for such terms. Some descriptive element is included in their semantics.
This need not be a full retreat to a Fregean view for two reasons. The descriptive element may not suffice to pick out the kind (in the non-empty cases)—the implicit historical ostension of a sample may be necessary to fix reference. And the description itself may have non-Fregean features—it may have an indexical component, for example, a reference to the actual world, that a Fregean would deny. The retreat from pure Millianism (and a partial vindication of Mill’s own view of general terms, which Kripke rejected) need not undermine the claim that kind terms are rigid designators. Rigid designation does not require direct reference; complex theoretical expressions, such as ‘H2O’, may, as we saw, also be rigid designators.
Several philosophers have argued that rigid designation for kind and other general terms faces a serious objection: rigid designation for kind terms is trivial (Soames 2002; Schwartz 2002; Martí 2004). Rigid designation requires that the object designated by a rigid designator be the same in all worlds. That requirement rules out the extension of a kind term as its designation, since the same kind may have different extensions in different worlds. On the other hand, regarding the extension as an abstract individual also faces difficulties. One might take ‘Mary’s favourite colour’ to designate different colours in different worlds, and thus understood it is not a rigid designator. But we could take ‘Mary’s favourite colour’ to designate (rigidly) an unusual abstract individual Mary’s-favourite-colour, which has violet things as its extension in the actual world, but turquoise things in another possible world and so on. This thought experiment suggests that it is always possible to regard a general term as a rigid designator. One option for resisting this move is to deny that in every case there is some entity for the term to refer to. There is no thing abstract or concrete that is Mary’s-favourite-colour. Property terms may denote a natural property, in Lewis’s (1986) terms a sparse property or they do not denote at all. Similarly, natural kind terms denote genuinely natural entities that are likewise sparse or they fail to denote.
4.4 From Reference to Essence?
Above we saw that an identity statement conjoining two rigid designators expresses a necessary truth, one that may be knowable only a posteriori. That follows simply from the definition of ‘rigid designator’. We have also seen that natural kind terms are rigid designators. That seems simply to be a fact about the semantics of natural kind terms. Consequently it looks as if a non-trivial metaphysical fact—that there are necessary truths knowable only a posteriori—is a consequence of Kripke’s semantics for natural kind terms. Furthermore, when we consider theoretical identities, such as ‘water is H2O’ and ‘gold is the element with atomic number 79’ etc., it appears that we are being given a special kind of necessary truth, a truth that it necessary because it specifies the essence of a kind.
The conclusion that we can derive metaphysical facts from semantic ones has been regarded as highly questionable by many commentators. How could facts about our use of terms lead to conclusions about the essences of things and kinds? Furthermore, the anti-descriptivist semantics involved is closely related to semantic externalism, but the latter need not imply essentialism, as Tyler Burge’s social externalism shows (Burge 1979, 1986). Nathan Salmon (1982) argues that no non-trivial essentialist consequences can be inferred from a theory of reference.
One might take the view that the apparent derivation of a metaphysical conclusion from semantic premises is a sleight of hand, with hidden essentialist premises being smuggled into the argument. If one were to assume that ‘H2O’ is a rigid designator, one might be accused of tacitly assuming metaphysical essentialism. However, one might alternatively take the view that semantics and metaphysics are more intimately related (Bird 2020). For example, one might hold that the semantics itself makes certain metaphysical assumptions, in which case the metaphysics would follow from the semantics, but innocently and for fairly trivial reasons. Note that a thoroughgoing Fregean descriptivism also has metaphysical consequences, since it rules out essentialism. According to the view that the correct semantics implies an essentialist metaphysics, the semantic claim that ‘water’ is a rigid designator is itself metaphysically loaded. But this is not to say that Putnam, Kripke, and other philosophers are smuggling in metaphysical assumptions. Rather, it is to say that competent users of the term tacitly make those assumptions. Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiments make those assumptions explicit. Note that, as the above discussion has shown, while the thought experiments are normally expressed in the formal mode—we ask whether XYZ would fall within the extension of the term ‘water’ (Earth)—the essentialist conclusion can be reached directly by phrasing the same question in the material mode: we ask whether XYZ would be water.
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