First published Mon Jan 20, 2003; substantive revision Tue Feb 19, 2019

Reference is a relation that obtains between certain sorts of representational tokens and objects. For instance, when I assert that “Barack Obama is a Democrat,” I use a particular sort of representational token—i.e. the name ‘Barack Obama’—which refers to a particular individual—i.e. Barack Obama. While names and other referential terms are hardly the only type of representational token capable of referring (consider, for instance, concepts, mental maps, and pictures), linguistic tokens like these have long stood at the center of philosophical inquiries into the nature of reference. Accordingly, this entry will focus primarily on linguistic reference.[1]

Assuming that at least some token linguistic expressions really do refer, a number of interesting questions arise. How, for example, does linguistic reference relate to the act of referring—something that we as speakers do with referential terms? How exactly do referential terms come to refer? That is, in virtue of what do they refer to what they do? Is there a single answer to this question, a single mechanism of reference, or different answers depending on the sort of term in question? And what exactly is the relationship between reference and meaning? Answers to these various questions will turn out to be closely related; the task of this entry will be to trace out some of the main clusters of answers.

1. Introduction

We use language to talk about the world. Much of what we say about the world appears to be meaningful; some of it, presumably, is even true. For instance, I seem to be saying something true when, in the appropriate sort of setting, I assertively utter:

  1. Barack Obama is a Democrat.

How do we manage to do such things? How, for instance, do I manage to talk about Barack Obama and thereby say meaningful and true things about him? In a word: how do I refer to Barack Obama by means of the name ‘Barack Obama’? Metaphorically, we seem to be capable of using language to talk about the world because some of our words are themselves capable of ‘hooking onto’ things in the world, things like Barack Obama. Proper names—that is, expressions like ‘Barack Obama’ and ‘David Cameron’—are widely regarded as paradigmatic referring expressions. Although it may seem implausible to suppose that all words refer, that all words somehow ‘hook onto’ bits of reality, certain types of words are arguably of the referring sort. These include: proper names, pronouns, indexicals, demonstratives, plurals, natural kind terms, and various other sorts of property terms. Definite descriptions are another, though highly controversial, candidate. Here, we’ll focus on just a subset of these—namely, what are often called ‘singular’ referential terms. These are terms that, supposing they refer, refer to particular objects and individuals as opposed to groups or properties. Since singular referential terms have been subjected to intensive philosophical scrutiny over the past hundred years, this will still leave us with plenty to discuss.

This article will focus on five central, related questions regarding reference: (i) How does the reference relation that obtains between token uses of terms and objects relate to the act of reference, the thing that speakers do with these terms? In other words, do terms refer to what they do in virtue of our using them to do so, or do we use them to refer in virtue of their already doing so? (ii) What are the meanings of referential terms? Are they just referents, or rather something more? (iii) What is the mechanism of reference? In other words, in virtue of what does a token referential term attach to a particular object/individual? (iv) Is there a single mechanism of reference common to all referring terms, or do different sorts of terms hook onto their referents in virtue of different sorts of things? And (v) to what extent, if at all, can reference depend on relatively private features of the speaker, such as her intentions or other mental states?

Our goal here will be to map out how answers to these various questions naturally cluster together into several distinct outlooks on reference, outlooks which drive a great deal of theorizing about particular referential terms and phrases. To get there, we’ll start in Section 2 by looking at two of the main approaches to proper names. Then, in Section 3, we’ll turn to indexicals and demonstratives, which put pressure on the thought that these two approaches represent an exhaustive set of options. Section 4 will focus on definite descriptions, which will serve to bring to the fore the question of how the reference relation itself relates to the act of reference—a question which serves to highlight some potential deficiencies in earlier models of linguistic reference. Section 5 will step back to outline the main clusters of positions we will have developed by that point. Finally, Section 6 wraps up by looking at the reasons that have been offered for doubting whether there is really any such thing as the reference relation at all.

For the sake of both clarity and brevity, this entry will refrain from venturing too deeply into the detailed debates regarding the meaning, syntactic form, or function of the various terms we’ll be looking at. Rather, we’ll focus instead on what, if anything, can be said about the nature of linguistic reference in general. For a more detailed look at the idiosyncrasies of these various terms, please see the entries on names, descriptions, and indexicals. See also the related entry on natural kinds,

2. Proper Names

Proper names have long taken center stage in debates about linguistic reference. For present purposes, we’ll treat these as roughly co-extensive with what ordinary (non-philosophically trained) speakers standardly call ‘names’. So expressions like ‘Barack Obama’, ‘Kyoto’, and ‘Mount Kilimanjaro’ will all count as proper names for our purposes. What do these expressions have in common? In virtue of what do they constitute a genuine class of linguistic expressions? At least at first glance, these would appear to be syntactically simple expressions that refer, or at least purport to refer, to particular objects or individuals. Thus, ‘Barack Obama’ refers to a particular man, ‘Kyoto’ refers to a particular city, and ‘Mount Kilimanjaro’ refers to a particular mountain. And, even though it is questionable whether expressions such as ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Sherlock Holmes’ actually refer to anything, there can be no doubt that they at least purport to refer: to Santa Claus and Sherlock Holmes, respectively. They are thus to be counted as proper names as well for present purposes.

With respect to proper names, there are two basic orientations that have long captured philosophers’ attention: one that views names on the model of tags, and another that views them on the model of descriptions. We’ll briefly survey these two views, along with some complications that arise for each. Then we’ll turn to a problem that arises for both sorts of view: explaining how reference works for names with more than one bearer.

2.1 Descriptivist Theories

According to descriptivist theories of proper names, a particular use of a proper name refers when the descriptive content somehow associated with that use suffices to pick out a specific object or individual. On one standard way of working out this sort of view, one associated with both Gottlob Frege (1892) and Bertrand Russell (1911), some particular descriptive content is associated with a given use of a name because the speaker associates this content, in her mind, with the name in question. For the use of the name to refer, this descriptive content must uniquely determine the name’s referent. So when a speaker uses the name ‘N’ and, in so doing, successfully refers to a particular object or individual x, this sort of descriptivist claims (i) that the speaker must be thinking of N as the (unique) F and (ii) that x must in fact be the (unique) F. In other words, this sort of ‘classical’ descriptivist posits that referential success hinges on speakers attaching to each name in their repertoire some descriptive content F which uniquely singles out a specific object in the world. Conversely, when speakers fail to associate a sufficiently precise description with a name, this sort of descriptivist predicts that reference fails.

Classical descriptivists, like Frege and Russell, were perfectly willing to acknowledge that the descriptive content in question might vary—sometimes quite markedly—from one speaker to the next. Indeed, according to Russell, such contents may vary across time for one and the same speaker. Thus, while I might associate the name ‘Obama’ with the descriptive content the previous U.S. president, Michelle Obama might associate the same name with the descriptive content my husband. If Trump were to assume dictatorial powers, my identifying content associated with Obama might well change—perhaps to something like the last legitimate president of the United States. If Barack and Michelle were to divorce, Michelle’s identifying descriptive content would no doubt change as well—perhaps to my ex-husband. In all of these cases, the individual referred to by means of the name is determined (or, as it is often put, is ‘picked out’ or ‘fixed’) by the particular descriptive content the speaker associates with that name. Because the descriptive content in question is typically characterized by means of a definite description (an expression of the form the F), such theories are often (even if somewhat misleadingly[2]) known as ‘descriptivist theories’ of proper names.

To get the intuitive appeal of descriptivism more clearly in view, consider a case where we know two individuals named ‘David Cameron’—one of whom is a mutual friend and has never held any elected office, the other of whom is the former Prime Minister of the United Kingdom. Suppose now that I assertively utter:

  1. David Cameron made a grave error.

If for some reason you are confused about who I am talking about, the natural thing for you to do is to ask me “Which David Cameron do you mean?” I might then respond “The former Prime Minister of the U.K.,” and this seems to be dispositive of the facts here. That is, supposing that this is the description I had in mind, then it would seem that my utterance of (2) is genuinely about David Cameron the former Prime Minister and not our mutual friend, the non-politician. Likewise, the truth or falsity of (2) would seem to hinge on how things are with the former Prime Minister and not on how things are with our mutual friend of the same name.

Some other appealing aspects of descriptivism become evident when we pair the thesis considered above, a thesis about what determines reference, with a natural companion thesis to the effect that the descriptive contents associated with uses of names also provide their token meanings. In other words, proper names may well refer, but they only do so via their meanings—which are more like definite descriptions. By adopting this thesis, the descriptivist now has ready explanations available for a range of philosophically interesting cases. So, consider:

  1. Hesperus is Phosphorus.
  2. Santa Claus lives at the North Pole.
  3. Fred believes that Cicero, but not Tully, was Roman.

(3) is true, but not knowable apriori. That said, if the meanings of these two names is just whatever they refer to, we lack any obvious explanation for why (3) isn’t knowable apriori. After all, it just turns out to be an instance of the law of self-identify—something which very plausibly is knowable apriori. The meaning descriptivist, however, can say that what (3) asserts is that two distinct descriptions are satisfied by the same object. Given what the relevant descriptions are likely to be here, this won’t be something that can plausibly be known apriori. (4) presents a different sort of challenge: if the name ‘Santa Claus’ fails to refer, then how can an utterance of this sentence count as meaningful? What, in other words, is such an utterance about? Again, the meaning descriptivist has an easy answer here. What (4) means is something like there is some unique bearded, jolly elf who lives at the North Pole. Finally, one might worry that if ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’ just refer, and refer to the same thing, then it becomes rather difficult to see how Fred could believe something about the one but not about the other. But if Fred associates each name with a different description, and if those descriptions are crucial to the meaning of (5), then the problem simply dissolves.

The central challenge to the descriptivist theory is that there is reason to suspect that proper names are not semantically equivalent to definite descriptions. Saul Kripke (1972) argues, for example, that names pick out the same object even when embedded under modal terms like ‘might’, whereas definite descriptions typically don’t do this. Returning to our earlier example of ‘David Cameron’ and supposing that the description I associate with Cameron is the British Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit, it seems that I can still truly assert:

  1. David Cameron might not have called for a referendum on Brexit.

If descriptivism is right about both meaning and reference, however, then (6) should be equivalent to:

  1. It might have been the case that: the British Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit did not call for a referendum on Brexit.

Granted, (7) is not really a claim of ordinary English. Still, holding fixed that we are talking about metaphysical rather than epistemic possibility here, it should be clear enough that (7) is false: if there is someone who satisfies the description ‘the British Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit’ in whatever possible situation we are considering, then that individual called for a Brexit referendum in that possible situation.

Now, in more ordinary English, there is a way of hearing something along the lines of (7) as true: assuming that we are talking about the Prime Minister who actually called for a referendum, of course he might not have. But that is not how definite descriptions are typically assumed to function; rather, they are typically understood to be flexible, or non-rigid across the space of possibility, picking out whatever happens to satisfy them in whatever possible situation we are considering. So, if the descriptivist is to avail herself of this sort of defensive maneuver, as some have been tempted to, then she will have to motivate the claim that names are semantically equivalent not to definite descriptions per se, but rather to ‘actualized’ or ‘rigidified’ versions thereof.[3]

This challenge can be avoided by a descriptivist who is willing to give up on the claim that what a proper name means, on a given occasion, is equivalent to a definite description. In that case, an associated description will fix reference relative to the actual world, and then that referent is what relevant to determining the truth of modal statements. This response, however, entails giving up on the nice explanations of (3)–(5) that the more committal meaning descriptivist was able to provide. What’s more, even this more minimal version of descriptivism will run into another problem raised by Kripke, what is often called the ‘semantic’ problem.

This problem runs as follows: often, we don’t associate enough information with a name to pick out any particular individual. Nonetheless, we seem to be capable of using that name to refer to a specific individual. Kripke offers as an example the name ‘Feynman’. Most people, Kripke claims, will at best know that Feynman was a physicist; they will not know anything, aside from the name, that would serve to differentiate Feynman from any other physicist they have heard of. The problem is that an indefinite description like a physicist will not suffice to pick out any particular individual in the world. Even a physicist named ‘Feynman’ won’t do, at least in a world where two physicists bear this name. At best, this sort of description will pick out an arbitrary member of a class of individuals, not a particular one. And yet, as Kripke points out, it seems perfectly coherent for someone who knows nothing about Feynman, who has only overheard someone using the name, to say to herself “I wonder who Feynman is,” or to ask her friend “Who is Feynman?” In each of these cases, the natural thing to say is that the speaker is using the name ‘Feynman’ to wonder or ask about Feynman. How she can manage to do so, however, looks to be something that is going to be very difficult for the descriptivist to explain—assuming (i) that she wants to maintain the link between associated descriptions and the information available to an individual speaker, and (ii) that she is unwilling to rely on descriptions like whoever the person I overheard this name from was using it to talk about.

Before moving on to the Millian alternative, it is worth noting that some descriptivists have indeed been tempted to defend the theory by giving up on the link mentioned in (i). P.F. Strawson (1959), for instance, suggests that speakers may rely on others to provide the relevant descriptive content, the content that serves to hook a given use of a name onto an object or individual in the world. In fact, Strawson allows that groups can effectively use names to refer so long as there is a at least one expert among them for whom for whom the following holds: when we pool expert opinion, a plurality of the the descriptions they associate with the relevant name are true of a single object. This will effectively deal with Kripke’s Feynman case, but at an intuitive cost. For now the descriptivist has not only forfeited her ability to explain (3)–(5), she has also risked making it the case that speakers will have no special access to who they are talking about when using a name. If speakers regularly lack sufficient information to identify the referent of their use of a proper name, then it is highly unclear why we would be justified in relying on them to answer questions like “Which N were you talking about?” Some may be tempted to pay this price. Others may be tempted to try to integrate bits and pieces of descriptivism even into theories which are otherwise anti-descriptivist. In fact, this latter option has proven a popular one, and much of what follows can be viewed as a study in how this strategy has played out with respect to different sorts of referential terms.

2.2 Millian Heirs

The primary alternative to the descriptivist theory of names has typically gone by the name of ‘Millianism’. According to this view, which dates back to John Stuart Mill (1867), a name’s meaning is simply its referent. In its modern form, the view was introduced by Ruth Barcan Marcus (1961), who proposed that we ought to conceive of proper names as ‘tags’. To say that proper names are tags is, for Marcus, to say that they have no linguistic meaning beyond their reference. Proper names do not, on this sort of view, refer by way of the descriptions they allegedly stand for. Rather, they refer directly, as it is sometimes put, to their bearers. Important consequences of this theory include, as Marcus notes, the necessity of identity statements between co-referring proper names—something which, though highly intuitive, is not guaranteed by many descriptivist theories of proper names.[4] Other important consequences include the dissolution of puzzles involving substitutivity in modal contexts (Marcus 1993).

Of course, saying that names function as tags—or that they are ‘directly referential’—is not to provide a full theory of names. That will require, at the very least, an explanation of what makes a name the particular tag that it is. In other words, we need to specify what it is, if not an associated description, that fixes what a name refers to in context. Put slightly differently, the claim that names function as tags effectively furnishes us with a semantics for names. What remains, is to provide a metasemantics for names, a theory that tells us which semantic value should be associated with each name, and why.

The most popular option has been to pair a Millian semantics with a metasemantic picture adumbrated at roughly the same time by Peter Geach (1969), Keith Donnellan (1970), and the aforementioned Kripke (1972). Typically called the ‘causal theory of reference’, the central idea developed in these works is that (the use of) a name refers to whatever is linked to it in the appropriate way—a way that does not require speakers to associate any identifying descriptive content whatsoever with the name. The causal theory is generally presented as having two components: one dealing with reference fixing, the other dealing with reference borrowing. Reference, on this sort of view, is initially fixed via a dubbing. In other words, a language user gives a name to an object, by saying something like “You’re to be called ‘N’.” The standard case is supposed to be one where the dubber is occurrently perceiving the target object when she utters this. Then, after this initial act of reference-fixing, the name is passed on from speaker to speaker through communicative exchanges. Speakers succeed in referring to something by means of its name, on this sort of view, because underlying their uses of the name are links in a causal chain stretching back to the initial dubbing of the object with that name. Subsequent speakers thus effectively ‘borrow’ their reference from speakers earlier in the chain, though borrowers needn’t be able to identify any of the lenders they are in fact relying on. All that is required is that borrowers are appropriately linked to their lenders through chains of communication, chains of passing on the name.

As Kripke points out, complications arise due to the fact that we can apparently re-use names. So, I may have come across the name ‘Napoleon’ via a chain of use leading back to the most famous of French generals. Having heard the name, I may now decide to call my cat, who likes to imperiously survey the domain of my apartment, ‘Napoleon’. When I use the name in this way, my intentions make it the case, Kripke claims, that I have introduced a new name, or at least a new use of the name. This is in spite of the fact that there is a very real sense in which I inherited the name from a historical tradition that traces back to 18th century France. The take-home is this: not every sort of causal connection to previous use is equal, according to the causal theorist. Some will help to fix reference, whereas others are irrelevant. And while it would certainly be nice to have a complete theory of which of these is which, a detailed account of all this has proven remarkably difficult to offer.[5]

2.3 Names with Multiple Bearers

So far, we’ve generally proceeded as though names were univocal—that is, as if only one person or thing can bear a given name. But that hardly seems right. As we already saw, a name like ‘David Cameron’ would seem to apply equally well to the former British Prime Minister and to anyone else who’s parents decided to call them this, regardless of their politics; likewise, once I’ve named my cat ‘Napoleon’, it would seem that the name ‘Napoleon’ can be used equally well to talk about either the greatest of French generals or, alternatively, my cat. Classical descriptivists have no real trouble accounting for this, since each time a name is used, its reference is essentially fixed anew by whatever description the speaker happens to have in mind. In other words, according to the descriptivist, it is really only a matter of happenstance that uses of names ever co-refer. That might seem a rather large bullet to bite. On the other hand, once we move away from classical descriptivism, explaining how names can refer to different individuals in different circumstances becomes far more challenging.

Consider a descriptivist in the Strawsonian mold, one for whom an utterance of the name ‘N’ refers in accord with the plurality of the beliefs of the relevant experts. What are we to do with a name like ‘David Cameron’ then, which sometimes refers to the former British Prime Minister and sometimes to our mutual friend? We cannot simply aggregate all the relevant beliefs associated with this name, considered as an orthographic or phonological form, and then see who or what the plurality of those beliefs picks out. For that would leave us only ever able to use the name to refer to one or the other of these David Camerons, and that hardly seems like the right thing to say. It seems, therefore, that a descriptivist of this sort will have to think about names in some more fine-grained manner. Yet this will not prove easy. She cannot simply go back to appealing to the information the speaker happens to have to do the job—for we can easily imagine someone who has names for both David Camerons in her vocabulary, and yet lacks sufficient information to distinguish the one from the other.

Similar issues arise for the Millian. Here, however, some concrete proposals have been floated. For instance, David Kaplan (1990) has argued that, against all appearances, names really do only have one referent apiece. In fact, Kaplan suggests that we should think of names as individuated, in part, by their referents. In other words, on Kaplan’s view, one cannot simply ‘read off’ which name has been used from its overt phonological or orthographic form. Rather, Kaplan posits that there are any number of names all written and pronounced ‘David Cameron’. While each of these names is written and pronounced identically, each refers to a different person. The question now becomes: what determines which name a speaker has used in a given context? Kaplan suggests that the answer to this question has to do with the speaker’s mental states, and in particular with the speaker’s intention to talk about one or another individual. In effect, Kaplan takes it that hearing a name leaves us with a mental trace, a mental analogue of a linguistic name, that directly refers to some particular individual. By looking to see who or what that trace refers to, we come to know the referential properties of the utterance or inscription being used to express this mental trace. In a word, on Kaplan’s theory, names are first and foremost a mental phenomenon. We do, of course, use certain marks and sounds to externalize the mental traces, or mental names, that we acquire from each other in the course of things; linguistic names, in the sense of something that will bear referential features, are types of uses of a particular phonological or orthographic form to externalize the use of a mental name to refer in thought.

Kaplan’s theory has some rather odd consequences, however. For instance, it turns out that no two people actually ever share a name—for a name comes complete with its referential features. Kaplan suggests that what people share are not names but rather some common aspects of how their names tend to be externalized. In other words, for Kaplan, what it is to share a name with someone else is for both of your names to belong to the same class of phonological and orthographic forms. Kaplan calls these ‘generic names’, as opposed to the ‘common currency names’ which, for him, are the bearers of semantic properties like reference.

Finding themselves dissatisfied with Kaplan’s proposal here, other direct reference theorists have opted for different responses to the problem of names with multiple bearers. For instance, both Francois Recanati (1997) and Michael Pelczar and Joe Rainsbury (1998) have suggested that names ought to be treated on the model of indexicals, a sort of term that we will consider in more detail shortly. Briefly though, the suggestion runs: there is one and only one name ‘David Cameron’, but context makes clear to which individual a particular utterance of this name refers. In effect, the proposal preserves something of the causal theory—by allowing that baptisms and passings-on of names are the right sort of thing to determine the set of possible referents associated with a name at any given time—while appealing to some further feature of the context to do the work of selecting an individual from this set. One lingering problem is that, in contrast to the pure indexicals like ‘I’ or ‘here’, it is less than clear what aspect of the context might serve to make this selection. Things get worse still once we consider contexts in which multiple people bearing the same name are all present and being talked about in the course of a single utterance (e.g. “David was Prime Minister, now retired in disgrace, whereas David is a plumber in good standing.”).[6] One possibility would be to posit that proper names function more like the demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ than they do any of the pure indexicals. Alternatively, one might posit that proper names themselves denote only the property of bearing the relevant name, but that singular reference emerges when proper names are supplemented with a determiner like ‘that’ or ‘the’ to form a determiner phrase like ‘that David’ or ‘the Michelle’ (see Burge (1973) and Graff Fara (2015), respectively; see also the entry on names for more on such ‘predicativist’ views). In languages like English, of course, these determiners would turn out to be mostly silent. Still, one might take it that positing silent determiners is a price worth paying for coherent story about the reference of names (or definite noun phrases containing names, as the case may be) that is compatible with the claim that two individuals can genuinely share a name.

As should be clear, to better understand these last few proposals we’ll first need to get clearer on how reference is supposed to work for each of the various terms and phrases just appealed to: pure indexicals, impure indexicals, complex demonstratives, and definite descriptions. Over the next few sections, we’ll work to fill in these gaps.

3. Indexicals

We’ve now seen two basic models of how words refer to things. On the descriptivist model, words refer by being associated, somehow, with a description that serves to isolate a particular object as the referent. Different versions of this model derive from different ways of associating the relevant descriptions with particular uses of words. On the causal model, in contrast, words are associated with chains of use that lead back to some original act of dubbing. That act itself then serves to bridge the gap between word and world. While both these models were developed with names in mind, we should ask ourselves “Can either serve to explain linguistic reference in general? That is, can either model plausibly extend to other sorts of referential terms, beyond just names?”

To answer this question, and ultimately to introduce a third distinct model of linguistic reference, we turn now to the indexicals. That is, we turn to terms like ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘this’, and ‘that’. As we’ll soon see, it is hardly clear that all indexicals refer in the same way. In particular, a distinction has often been drawn between what are called ‘pure’ and ‘impure’ indexicals, with rather different theories of reference being offered for each. The challenges that arise in trying to offer accounts of the impure indexicals will bring us full circle to one of the questions with which we began: namely, do words refer because we use them to do so, or rather do we use them to do so because they already refer?

3.1 Pure Indexicals

What are pure indexicals? Roughly, they are expressions the reference of which appears to co-vary with certain very regular aspects of the contexts in which they are used. Here, ‘context’ should be understood as incorporating, inter alia, a speaker, hearer, time, and place. In contrast, the reference of ‘impure’ indexicals is supposed to be more difficult to characterize in terms of picking out some distinct, repeatable feature of a context. While both the existence and the significance of this distinction are controversial (see the entry on indexicals for further discussion; see also Radulescu (2018)), examples of each sort of term—should the distinction prove both real and significant—typically are not. Standard examples of pure indexicals include ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and arguably ‘you’. The list of impure indexicals, on the other hand, is generally agreed to include ‘this’, ‘that’, ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’.

The traditional approach to indexicals, dating back once more to Frege and Russell, has it that the reference of such expressions is fixed by some sort of descriptive content associated by the speaker with the expression. This reference-fixing description is the meaning of a given utterance of the expression. The motivation for such a view is largely intuitive. Indexicals certainly do appear to mean something, and their meanings presumably have something to do with how these expressions refer. For instance, the meaning of ‘I’ is arguably the speaker of this utterance and refers to that individual; the meaning of ‘now’ is arguably the time of this utterance and refers to that time. And so on.

One obvious objection to this view is that what the term ‘I’ refers to does not appear to be sensitive to whatever sort of descriptive content a speaker might happen to associate with that term. For instance, the fact that I might happen to associate the description the previous U.S. president with the term ‘I’ does not mean that I can somehow succeed in using the term ‘I’ to refer to Barack Obama. Another problem with this view, discussed extensively in Kaplan (1989b), is that taking these reference-determining descriptions to be part of what we assert when we use indexicals can lead to our making some rather odd predictions. Consider an assertive utterance of:

  1. I am hungry.

Suppose, first, that I am the speaker. I utter (8). Now, suppose that you are the speaker. You utter (8). While there may be a sense in which we ‘said the same thing’—that is, the sense in which we uttered the same sentence-type—there is another sense in which we clearly did not. We could also put this as: we asserted very different things. And yet, according to the classical descriptivist, we’ve both asserted the very same thing. Namely, we’ve both asserted that the speaker is hungry. All that differs is the context in which we asserted this.

Now, to be clear, there are ways of tinkering with the view to avoid both these objections. Some, like Hans Reichenbach (1947) or more recently Manuel Garcia-Carpintero (1998) and John Perry (2001), have argued that indexicals are ‘token reflexives’, meaning that the descriptions that should be associated with them will need to involve explicit reference to the utterance of that very token use of the term. So, for instance, the description for ‘I’ might be: the speaker of this very token of ‘I’. Since different tokens will be involved when each of us utters (8), we’ll no longer be asserting the very same thing. If we add that, for token indexicals at least, the relevant descriptions aren’t under the speaker’s control, but are rather associated with particular terms via the rules of language, then we can avoid the former objection as well.

A different sort of approach was developed by Reichenbach’s student, David Kaplan. Kaplan (1989b) took many of the same elements that Reichenbach was working with, but put them into a direct reference framework where the meaning of an indexical in context—its contribution to what is said or asserted—is just an object. According to Kaplan, we need to distinguish between two types of meaning, which he called ‘character’ and ‘content’. Content is basically what we have been calling meaning to this point; it is what the utterance of an individual term contributes to what is said or asserted by the utterance of a complete sentence of which it is a part. On direct reference theories, this is an object, thereby making the truth or falsity of what is said or asserted object-dependent. Character, on the other hand, is more akin to a rule of use; a character tells us, for any given context, what the content of a given expression is. Names, on Kaplan’s way of thinking about them, have constant characters: in any two arbitrary contexts, uses of the same name will be mapped to the same referent (recall that Kaplan thinks of names in a fine-grained way, such that they are never shared). The rule for any name ‘N’ thus turns out to be: in any context whatsoever, return N as the referent. Not so for terms like ‘I’ or ‘here’, which Kaplan takes to be associated with rules like return the speaker and return the location of the utterance. So in a context where I am speaking in Foyle’s, utterances of these indexicals will refer to me and to Foyle’s, respectively. When you are speaking at the American Bar, they will refer to you and to the American Bar.

Importantly, the characters of the pure indexicals are supposed to be insensitive to speakers’ mental states. That rules out any possibility of my using the term ‘I’ to refer to Barack Obama. Nor are your and my utterances of (8) predicted to assert the same thing. What’s more, as Kaplan points out, the view allows us to productively distinguish between ‘metaphysical’ necessity and what Kaplan calls ‘logical’ necessity. The sentence “I am here now,” Kaplan claims, represents a logical necessity: in virtue of what the indexicals ‘I’, ‘here’, and ‘now’ all mean, this sentence cannot be uttered falsely. Yet clearly it is not necessary in any sort of metaphysical sense that a particular speaker must be wherever she happens to be at the time of utterance; she could just as easily have been somewhere else.[7]

Now we have three basic models of reference, of the metasemantics of referential terms, on the table: the descriptivist model, the causal chain model, and the character model. With the last of these in view, we can clarify an important aspect of the indexical theory of names that was discussed at the end of the last section. Essentially, that theory proposed to hybridize our second and third models. Instead of names having constant characters, as Kaplan would have it, the proposal is to assign them more interesting ones. For instance, we might try stipulating that the context, in addition to containing a speaker, place, time, etc., must also include a most salient individual bearing a given name. Names, the idea runs, always refer to their most salient bearer at a context. Since names no longer have constant characters, they are more like indexicals than we might initially have thought. On the other hand, we can preserve a good amount of the causal theory by re-characterizing it as a theory about who counts as a name-bearer in a given context.[8]

This way of developing the indexical theory is not without its downsides, however. For instance, it hardly seems to be true that we always use names to refer to the most salient bearer of that name in a context, particularly once we consider utterances of names prefixed with phrases like ‘the other’ (e.g. “The other David is not here yet, though I can hear him down the hall.”). What’s more, there is reason to worry that embracing this sort of indexical theory entails giving up on one of the purported advantages of the causal theory: its ability to explain how it is that we can pass on the capacity to think about objects merely by passing on names for those objects. Since names are causally anchored to the objects they name, according to the causal theory, acquiring a new name should suffice to put us in causal contact with the object named. On the indexical theory of names, on the other hand, we do not pass on names for things; rather, we use names to refer to the most salient bearer of that name in a given context. Perhaps this suffices to pass on a use of a name—loaded, as it were, with a referent—where the listener doesn’t already have that use in her repertoire. But if the listener fails to have this use in her repertoire, then it becomes hard to see how the referent of that use could count as the most salient bearer of the relevant name in the context.

3.2 Impure Indexicals

In contrast to the pure indexicals, the reference of impure indexicals like ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’ or the ‘true demonstratives’ like ‘this’ and ‘that’ looks to be far less amenable to an analysis in terms of character. After all, what regular feature of a speech context might any of these terms serve to pick out? One option would be to say that tokens of each of these simply refer to the demonstratum of the context. But not only does that threaten to force us to say that all of these terms effectively mean the same thing—something which seems rather counterintuitive—now we also need to know what exactly serves to make something the demonstratum in a context. And what are we to do when multiple such terms, or multiple instances of the same term, are used within the span of a single utterance? Are we really to believe that contexts involve not just a demonstratum role, but also a first demonstratum role, a second demonstratum role, etc.?

Several possible responses arise at this point. First, we might try to take advantage of the fact that many uses of these terms are accompanied by ostensive gestures. So perhaps, as Kaplan (1978) and McGinn (1981) both suggest, it is such gestures that serve to make objects the demonstrata of contexts—one per use of an impure indexical. This suggestion also gives us a rather natural way of understanding what makes something the first demonstratum as opposed to the second, and so on. On the other hand, this approach faces a rather obvious objection: many perfectly good uses of impure indexicals and demonstratives simply aren’t accompanied by any sort of ostensive gesture. That observation leads to a second possible response, one which is in many ways a generalization of this first: perhaps it is not the ostensive gesture itself that makes an object the demonstratum, but rather what that gesture does. Gestures, we might take it, serve to make objects salient in a context. So perhaps what matters is just that an object be particularly salient in a context; perhaps this is what serves to make it the demonstratum, whether or not that salience is the direct result of an ostensive gesture.

Howard Wettstein (1984) develops a view along these lines, and this same sort of view has more recently been fleshed-out and defended by Allyson Mount (2008). The basic idea is that a term like ‘she’ refers to whoever counts as the most salient female in the context. Similar rules will apply to the other impure indexicals. Problems start to arise, however, once we consider bare uses of ‘this’ and ‘that’—which don’t seem to contain any substantial information about the relevant sortal. While it might seem plausible enough that some object will count as the maximally salient female in a context, it seems far less plausible that contexts will contain maximally salient objects simpliciter, or without further qualification. What might serve to make an object maximally salient simpliciter? The natural suggestion would seem to be: our interests. If anything is going to make an object maximally salient simpliciter, it’s presumably going to be that we, as agents, have brought a certain set of interests to the conversational exchange.

Dialectically though, this suggestion is problematic. For one thing, the interests of the speaker and listener can easily diverge. So we need to know whose interests, if either, trumps when those interests fail to align. Otherwise, all that we can say is that a certain object is maximally salient relative to both a context and a particular agent—but not relative to a context itself, without further qualification. Mount specifies that what we are interested in is mutual maximal salience. But this threatens to make a great many uses of the impure indexicals fail to refer when the speaker and listener’s interests diverge. What’s more, as Mount herself notes, the view entails that reference fails in almost any instance where the listener happens not to be paying attention to the speaker’s utterance. Other ways of precisifying the view face analogous worries, seemingly handing too much control to either the speaker or the listener.

This brings us to a third possibility for how the impure indexicals refer: perhaps, as Kaplan (1989a) suggests, token uses of the impure indexicals, like demonstratives and deictic uses of pronouns, refer to whoever or whatever the speaker intends for them to refer to. Kaplan sees some continuity here with his earlier pointing-based approach, since he takes it that such intentions (what he calls ‘directing intentions’) might well be thought of as the internal analogue of an externalized pointing. Still, the suggestion is more durable than this earlier one; no explicit gesture is necessary for reference to succeed. Indeed, not only can we now account for uses of impure indexicals with no accompanying ostensive gesture, this sort of intentionalist theory can also allow for uses of impure indexicals to refer to objects that aren’t physically present in the context—as there is no block to speakers having intentions directed at such objects. Since we do indeed use impure indexicals to refer to physically and temporally distant objects, this looks like a significant advantage for Kaplan’s ‘intentionalist’ theory of reference.

None of this is to say that Kaplan’s view has been universally embraced. On the contrary, the view has often been thought to face a rather serious problem. We noted above that terms like the bare demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ look to be rather flexible in their application. Yet even these terms are not infinitely flexible. Presumably, you cannot point directly and deliberately at a picture of David Cameron, utter (9), and succeed in referring to the picture of David Kaplan that you have tucked away in your desk drawer for just such occasions:

  1. That is a picture of one of the most Hawaiian shirt-loving philosophers of the twentieth century.

This is an instance of what has sometimes been called the ‘Humpty Dumpty Problem’.[9] Basically, any time we might be tempted to suggest that what token uses of some particular term mean or refer to depends on the speaker’s intentions, the following sort of problem inevitably arises: unless we impose some constraints on what those intentions can look like, then we’ll end up with seemingly absurd results, results like that the token use of ‘that’ in (9) really does refer to the picture of Kaplan you have tucked away in your desk.

A slightly more complicated case, confusingly from an earlier time-slice of Kaplan (i.e. Kaplan 1978) and used to help motivate the pointing theory, can be used to make much the same point. Kaplan asks us to imagine a scenario where the speaker is sitting at her desk and her prized picture of Rudolf Carnap, which typically hangs on the wall behind her, has been switched for a picture of Spiro Agnew. Failing to notice the switch, and intending to use the term ‘that’ to refer to her picture of Carnap, the speaker points behind herself, directly at the picture of Agnew, and utters (10):

  1. That is a picture of one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century.

On Kaplan’s telling of things, (10) is false not in virtue of reference failing here. Rather, it is false in virtue of the speaker’s having asserted something false of the actual picture hanging behind her, the picture of Agnew. Most philosophers have been inclined to agree about this (see King (2013) for an exception, however). Importantly, this case is slightly different from our (9) in that it doesn’t seem altogether implausible that the speaker here might also intend for her use of ‘that’ to refer to whatever picture is hanging behind her. After all, she is somehow confused about what picture that is. This confusion might, therefore, give the intentionalist some additional room to maneuver.

One possibility would be for the intentionalist to dispute the above judgments and embrace the claim that the token uses of ‘that’ in (9) and (10) do in fact refer to the pictures of Kaplan and Carnap, respectively (see Radulescu (forthcoming) for a response along these lines). Most intentionalists have not gone down this route, however. Instead, they have either tried to restrict the range of intentions that count as properly ‘referential’, or else they have tried to impose certain limitations on when speakers’ intentions in fact determine reference. This first strategy has generally proceeded by appealing to certain considerations drawn from Paul Grice’s (1957) theory of meaning. The second, in contrast, has tended to try to derive the relevant constraints from the standing meanings of, or rules of use for, the impure indexicals and demonstratives. More recently, some philosophers have also tried combining these two approaches.

The Gricean approach to reference was first clearly articulated by Gail Stine (1978)—though it had been alluded to by both Grice himself and Keith Donnellan (1968).[10] The basic idea is that the relevant sorts of intentions for fixing the reference of impure indexicals are, properly speaking, intentions aimed at getting the listener to identify a particular object as the referent. In keeping with Grice’s broader theory of meaning, these intentions are posited to be even more complicated than just this: not only are they aimed at getting the listener to identify some object as the referent, they are also meant to be fulfilled in part on the basis of the listener’s recognizing that this is how she is intended to act.

Having followed the Gricean line this far, now we need to ask: can the Gricean thesis regarding the complexity of referential intentions somehow cut off the threat of a collapse into Humpty Dumpty-ism? The answer, according to the Gricean, is “Yes.” More precisely, the Gricean will claim that the speaker lacks a genuinely referential intention in a case like (9), since she should have no expectation that her listener will be in a position to recover her intended referent. In a case like (10), however, she does look to have an intention for her listener to recover the picture of Carnap as the referent. So how is the Gricean in any position to help here? As Bach (1992) helpfully clarifies, the Gricean line really ought to run as follows: while genuinely referential, the speaker’s intention to refer to the picture of Carnap runs via an intention to refer to whatever picture happens to be behind her. That latter intention is meant to be recognized directly, whereas the former can only be recognized indirectly, via the recognition of both this latter intention and (in the good case) the fact that the picture behind the speaker actually is the picture of Carnap. So a better way of formulating the Gricean thesis when it comes to reference is in terms of a primary/secondary distinction that reflects this sort of asymmetry: when there is a conflict between a primary and secondary referential intention, and both are genuinely referential, it is the primary one that serves to fix reference.[11]

So far, so good for the Gricean. But just how general is her solution to the Humpty Dumpty Problem? Can she, for instance, account for a speaker who appears to be fully competent in a language like English, but who mistakenly believes that everyone else can simply read off her referential intentions, directly? In other words, consider a speaker who believes that her listener can read her mind regarding her referential intentions, though nothing else, and only when she actually utters a demonstrative. Unless we rule out such a speaker as broadly incompetent in speaking English, it would seem that she can now succeed, according to the Gricean, in making a token of ‘this’ or ‘that’ refer to whatever she likes, on any occasion whatsoever. For this speaker can coherently intend for her listener to recover that object as the referent of her use of the demonstrative, partly in virtue of recognizing this very intention, and regardless of what that object is. In other words, given some strange enough background beliefs, the Gricean predicts that a speaker really can make a use of ‘that’ in an utterance like (9) refer to her picture of David Kaplan—regardless of whether anyone short of a real clairvoyant would ever be capable of recovering this referent. So the Gricean strategy to block intentionalism’s collapse into Humpty Dumpty-ism won’t fully generalize.

Partly in response to worries like these, we might think that the right sort of response to the Humpty Dumpty Problem is not to up the complexity of referential intentions themselves, but rather to impose limits on how particular sorts of terms—even the true demonstratives—can be used to refer. Marga Reimer (1991, 1992) offers a suggestion along just these lines: when uses of the demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ are accompanied by ostensive gestures, then the referent itself must lie in the general direction indicated by that gesture.[12] When there is no gesture, then there is no such constraint. In other words, Reimer re-emphasizes the apparently special connection between demonstratives and gestures that earlier theorists tried to leverage into a full theory of demonstrative-reference. This time, however, Reimer suggests that we use this connection not to generate a complete theory of demonstrative reference, but rather to impose some constraints on the intentionalist theory. Those constraints, in turn, are what allows Reimer to make the intuitively correct predictions regarding (9) and (10): with respect to (9), she will say that one cannot succeed at pointing to one picture and referring to another picture, unless perhaps the first is a photograph of the second; with (10), she will say that the speaker intends both to refer to the picture behind herself and to that of Carnap, but only one of these satisfies the constraint associated with the gesture. Thus, only one of these intentions is in a position to determine reference.

To be clear, Reimer’s position is by no means incompatible with the Gricean theory of referential intentions. One might, in fact, accept both that there are substantive constraints on reference that derive from the meanings of the impure indexicals themselves, and also that referential intentions are as the Gricean describes them to be. Bach (2017) has recently embraced such a view, for instance. That said, one should demand an independent reason for adopting the Gricean thesis. For it would seem that one can prevent a collapse into Humpty Dumpty-ism simply by accepting that there are constraints on reference conventionally associated with particular impure indexicals; one thus no longer needs the Gricean thesis to rein in the scope of referential intentions. Still, it is perfectly reasonable to think that there are going to be plenty of more general theoretical reasons to prefer the combination of these theories to a pure constraint-type approach like Reimer’s.

4. Definite Descriptions

In contrast to the sorts of terms we have considered so far, the primary question regarding definite descriptions—complex expressions like ‘the biscuit’ or ‘the off-license’—is not how they refer, but whether they refer at all.

Both Meinong (1904) and Frege (1892) thought that they did. That left them with a problem, however, since the overt descriptive material found in definite descriptions is typically insufficient to identify a single object as the referent. For Frege, at least, there was a fairly obvious solution: treat that overt descriptive material as just a part of the sense of the definite description, allowing more material to be added by whatever fuller description the speaker happens to have in mind. Faced with this same set of issues, Russell (1905) took the opposite tack: he posited that descriptions simply do not refer. Rather, what he offered was a translation procedure for sentences of the form ‘The A is B’, which he posited to mean: there is one and only one A, and that A is also B.[13]

This dispute becomes even more interesting when one considers that both Russell and Frege agreed that names were to be understood as, in some sense, akin to definite descriptions. Now we are in a better position to see the deep differences between them, in spite of this superficial agreement. For Frege, that claim in no way prevented names from being genuine devices of reference. For Russell, it did. For Frege, a name’s contribution to the truth or falsity of a sentence was (intensional contexts to the side) its referent. For Russell, it was the associated description.

Why suppose that definite descriptions fail to refer? After all, we certainly seem to use them to talk about particular objects; when I say “I want the sloop to the right of that one,” I seem to be expressing a desire to possess a particular sloop, not just a desire to be relieved from slooplessness in some complicated fashion. What’s more, we can substitute definite descriptions for names and indexicals in most linguistic contexts. Naively then, it might seem reasonable to posit that, if names and indexicals refer, then so too do token definite descriptions. Russell, however, did not lack for motivation in his claim that definite descriptions fail to refer. Consider assertive utterances of the following sentences:

  1. The King of France is bald.
  2. The author of Middlemarch is the third child of Robert and Christiana Evans.

(11) is meaningful, and certainly not true. Russell takes it to be plainly false, though that is controversial (see Strawson (1950) and, more recently, Von Fintel (2004)). Regardless, if one thinks that definite descriptions are devices of reference, then it’s unclear how one will be justified in claiming that sentences like (11) are meaningful. After all, the description clearly doesn’t refer. With (12), the problem facing the referentialist is different: since both these descriptions should refer to the same individual, Mary Ann Evans (or ‘George Eliot’), it becomes highly unclear why (12) shouldn’t be knowable apriori. As with identity statements involving co-referring names, this looks to be merely an instance of the law of self-identity.

Note that Russell’s theory, in contrast, has no difficulty explaining any of this. (11) just makes a claim about there being a unique king of France, a claim which is both perfectly meaningful and straightforwardly false. (12), on the other hand, makes a claim about the unique satisfier of one set of properties also uniquely satisfying another set of properties. That should hardly ever count as knowable apriori.

Still, there are also reasons to question Russell’s claim that definite descriptions fail to refer. For instance, as Strawson (1950) pointed out, many assertive utterances involving definite descriptions will seem true even when the relevant description fails to have a unique satisfier. So, consider:

  1. The table is covered with books.

Assertively uttered in a context where there is a single table stacked high with books, (13) would seem to be true. Yet Russell predicts the opposite, so long as there is at least one additional table somewhere or other in the universe. Strawson’s alternative was to claim that there are genuinely referential uses of definite descriptions. Used in this way, definite descriptions will, like names and indexicals, contribute an object or individual to the content asserted by the utterance—so long, that is, as that object satisfies the relevant descriptive material. Otherwise, such tokens will still count as meaningful in virtue of being associated with coherent rules of use, but they will fail to refer. That, Strawson claims, means that the assertive utterances of which they are a part will fail to be either true or false. The contrasting category here is of a attributive use of a definite description, which is supposed to function more or less as Russell suggested.

Keith Donnellan (1966) went even further than Strawson, claiming that definite descriptions can be used to refer even when the putative referent fails to satisfy the descriptive material explicit in the description itself. In what is probably his most famous example, Donnellan asks us to consider an utterance of the following:

  1. Who is the man drinking the martini?

Suppose that we are both looking at a man who appears to be drinking a martini, but is in fact drinking water, when you utter (14). On Donnellan’s telling, this is irrelevant; the token description ‘the man drinking the martini’ can refer to this man in our visual field regardless of whether he is in fact drinking a martini. What matters, according to Donnellan, is just that you have this man ‘in mind’ when using the relevant description, that you use the description with this man as your intended target.

One might worry, as did Alfred MacKay (1968), that this means that Donnellan is open to the charge of offering a Humpty Dumpty view of definite descriptions—one on which there are no substantive constraints on what token descriptions can be used to refer to. Interestingly, Donnellan (1968)’s response was to appeal to the Gricean theory of meaning, thus raising the possibility that what he meant by ‘having in mind’ is something akin to the Gricean’s notion of having a referential intention. As we saw above, however, there is reason to think that even this sort of move won’t suffice to head off the collapse of intentionalism into Humpty Dumpty-ism in a fully general sense. So there is still reason to be concerned that Donnellan’s willingness to jettison the explicit descriptive material as a constraint on referential success is perhaps a bridge too far.

But what of the intuitions behind Donnellan’s example? For, even if we reject his claim that a description like ‘the F’ can be used to refer to something that isn’t an F, it still seems as though communication is possible in a case like (14). That is, I should be able to tell who you’re asking about regardless of whether I know that this man is drinking a water rather than a martini. Kripke (1977) suggested that the way to deal with cases like these is to view the sort of reference involved as merely pragmatic, as having to do with communicative efficacy rather than with the sort of strict aboutness relevant to determining truth or falsity in a context. According to Kripke, there is no need to posit that definite descriptions ever refer; instead, we can explain away their apparent referential properties by noting that, even if they do not refer, speakers will typically have targets in mind for them to latch onto nonetheless. So long as we are reasonably good at recovering those targets, we can use them to direct each other’s thought to particular objects without needing to posit that token instances of these expressions themselves ever manage to lock onto those objects and individuals. In other words, we are free to accept the Russellian theory of descriptions, supplemented with this claim that descriptions are very often used to direct listeners’ attention to the ‘speaker’s referent’, as Kripke called what he took to be the referential analogue of Gricean ‘speaker’s meaning’ (or, roughly, whatever the speaker is trying to get across to the listener, literally or otherwise).

Kripke seems to have in mind that genuine linguistic reference—or what he calls ‘semantic reference’—needs to run purely via convention. His paradigm example is names, which he takes to be associated with a convention to the effect that their reference is fixed via an appeal to causal chains. Alternatively, he might have pointed to Kaplan’s character-based approach to the pure indexicals, a view which is equally reliant on conventions to establish reference. As we saw above, however, there are plausibly limits to this sort of approach: a conventionalist approach to the reference of impure indexicals, like demonstratives and pronouns, has not been forthcoming. Likewise, once we take seriously the problem of names with multiple bearers, it becomes far less clear that the reference of token uses of names can be fixed by anything so simple as a linguistic convention. Rather, in both cases, it looks like it is going to be rather tempting to appeal to facts about the speaker in order to fix linguistic reference. But if that is acceptable there, the case for ruling out definite descriptions as non-referring starts to look much weaker.

If, unlike Kripke, we start with the idea that linguistic reference is, at root, the result of an act, of something that we do rather than something that words themselves do, then definite descriptions start to look more like the normal case and indexicals like the outlier. This is, in fact, an old idea, one that dates back to Susan Stebbing (1943) and the later work of Ludwig Wittgenstein (1958), and which we already saw running through the ideas of Grice, Strawson, and Donnellan.[14] The enduring worry, of course, is that without some restrictions on how we can use terms to successfully refer, we will divorce the theory of reference from both our intuitions on cases and from any role in an overall theory of communication. But if we embrace certain limits on referential success—to be imposed by either Gricean reflexivity, conventionalized constraints, or both—these worries can plausibly be avoided. And, indeed, with respect to definite descriptions the case for there being a conventionalized constraint on referential success, as Strawson took there to be, can look particularly appealing.

More recently, a different sort of challenge has emerged for those claiming that token definite descriptions sometimes refer: namely, the difference in meaning which is standardly assumed to mark definite descriptions off from their indefinite cousins (that is, descriptions like ‘a philosopher’ as opposed to ‘the philosopher’) has itself been called into question. Two main reasons have been offered for rejecting a difference in meaning between these sorts of phrases. First, pinning down exactly what this distinction is supposed to amount to has proven remarkably difficult; every aspect of Russell’s original analysis, for instance, has subsequently been cast into doubt. Second, a great many languages turn out to lack anything like the definite/indefinite distinction. This raises the possibility that this distinction is a far less significant, and less well-defined, feature of meaning, even in a language like English, than it is usually taken to be (see Ludlow and Segal (2004); see also Abbott (2008) for counterarguments and the entry on descriptions for extensive discussion along with further references).

How would rejecting the definite/indefinite distinction affect debates on whether token definite descriptions sometimes refer? Well, if it were clear that indefinite descriptions could not be used to refer, and if these were indeed semantically equivalent to definite descriptions, then we would have additional reason to think that definite descriptions cannot be used to refer either. On the other hand, some have argued that indefinite descriptions can refer, though these arguments are highly controversial (see Chastain (1975) and Fodor and Sag (1982); again, see the entry on descriptions for further discussion and references). Even if we were to reject such a view, advocates of the unitary theory still typically grant that there is a pragmatic difference marked by the use of ‘the’ as opposed to ‘a’. So it would be open to the stalwart defender of the view that token definite descriptions sometimes refer to try to argue that such pragmatic markers can play a significant role in regulating the use of descriptions to refer—despite these markers being nowhere reflected in meaning at the level of what is said or asserted. Obviously, none of this will be settled here.

5. Four Models of Linguistic Reference

By looking at how philosophers have attempted to account for the referential features of various sorts of linguistic terms, we have effectively introduced four distinct ways of conceiving of how referential terms might come to refer to particular objects and individuals in the world. In other words, we have introduced four distinct models for the metasemantics of referential terms:

1. On the descriptivist model, words refer in virtue of being associated with a specific descriptive content that serves to identify a particular object or individual as the referent.

2. On the causal model, words refer in virtue of being associated with chains of use leading back to an initiating use or ‘baptism’ of the referent.

3. On the character model, words refer in virtue of being associated with regular rules of reference. Paradigm rules of this sort will themselves allude to repeatable elements of the context, identifying which of these elements is the referent for which sort of term.

4. On the intentionalist model, words refer in virtue of being used, intentionally, to refer to particular objects. In other words, words refer in virtue of their being uttered as part of complex intentional acts which somehow target particular objects or individuals.

As should be clear by now, these four models aren’t strictly exclusive of each other. One might, for instance, think of the classical descriptivism—which appeals to the speaker’s mental state in order to associate a particular description with a particular token referential term—as a particular version of intentionalism. Presumably, speakers will only manifest the right sort of mental state when they are intentionally using a referential term to refer. Likewise, one might view the causal theory as a special case of the character theory: in the case of terms like names, the invariant rule of use associated with a particular name is itself to be explained in terms of a chain of uses leading back to a specific object or individual. In fact, if one is willing to allow the characters of certain sorts of terms, like the demonstratives, to allude to the speaker’s referential intentions, then character theorists can countenance a certain sort of intentionalism within the scope of their theory as well. In doing so, however, it is unclear what remains of the original character model, with its reliance on publicly-identifiable aspects of the context as the primary driver of the rules of reference.

It’s worth noting some clear divisions among these options. First, there is a divide between views according to which referential terms themselves refer, and that we thus use them to refer because they already do so, and views according to which it is us who do the referring, with token linguistic reference following only derivatively. The causal theory and certain non-classical versions of descriptivism are paradigm instances of the former sort of view, whereas the intentionalist model is a paradigm instance of the latter—along with the classical descriptivism of Frege and Russell. Due to its inherent flexibility, the character model is harder to place along this spectrum. Kaplan’s rules for the true indexicals seem to straddle this divide: indexical tokens acquire their reference because they are uttered in a particular context, presumably intentionally. But they acquire their reference independently of anything having to do with the speaker’s mental state. If we extend the character theory to include both intention-dependent characters for demonstratives and constant, context-invariant characters for names, then things become more complicated still. In that case, the character theory starts to look pluralistic with respect to this division; some referential terms acquire their reference in virtue of our using them to refer, whereas we use other such terms to refer in virtue of their antecedently referring.

A second important divide has to do with the extent to which reference is allowed to depend on potentially idiosyncratic and relatively inaccessible aspects of the speaker’s mental state. As we saw above, both classical descriptivists and intentionalists allow for a strong dependence on the speaker’s mental states, and this can lead to some odd predictions regarding reference. Griceans and constraint-type theorists like Reimer have offered ways of trying to minimize these results, but one might also worry that allowing reference to depend on the speaker’s mental state at all undercuts our ability to explain how we use referential terms to coordinate our object-directed thoughts with each other—in other words, to communicate. On the causal model, for instance, we literally give each other ways of thinking about the same object by passing on a name. That makes explaining communication rather straightforward, supposing, that is, that we are consistently able to recognize which name has been uttered on a given occasion. The problem of names with multiple bearers means that this might turn out to be non-trivial; but at least the payoff looks significant. Alternatively, on the Kaplanian theory of true indexicals, we can explain our ability to coordinate our thought on particular places, times, and individuals in virtue of the fact that the place, time, and speaker of the utterance are things that are typically public knowledge, equally available to every member of the conversation. The question is whether such an analysis is available for terms like the impure indexicals.

Third, and finally, there is an important divide between models of reference which are expansive as opposed to narrow. In their broadest forms, both intentionalism and descriptivism are expansive; they purport to apply equally well to any sort of referential term whatsoever. The causal model is a narrow model of reference; it has only ever been purported to apply to the reference of names. Once more, the character model proves difficult to place; just how broad or narrow it proves will depend on just how far we are willing to stray in our theorizing from the paradigm case of the true indexicals. Expansive theories hold out the promise of offering a substantive account of the reference relation. That is, expansive theorists can claim that the reason that token uses of referential terms play a certain sort of role in explaining the the truth or falsity of an utterance is that a certain sort of substantive relation obtains between that token use and some object in the world. Narrow theorists, in contrast, will have to allow that there are different sorts of relations that serve to fix reference for different sorts of referential terms, and even perhaps different uses of the same term. Thus, they will have to say that what unifies referential terms is not that, when they succeed in referring, a particular sort of relation obtains between that token use and some object or individual, but rather that they play some particular functional role in determining the truth-conditions or assertive content of an utterance. In other words, standing behind debates over which of these models we should adopt is a much larger, and as yet unresolved, question: just what are our explanatory ambitions in offering a theory of reference in the first place?

6. Negative Views of Reference

So far, this article has been concerned with what might be called ‘positive’ views of reference. Reference, construed as a relation between bits of language and bits of reality, is assumed to be a genuine, substantive relation worthy of philosophical scrutiny—or perhaps a family of such relations. Accounts are then offered of what constitutes this link. Some philosophers have even tried to work up from this link to more substantive conclusions about the nature of knowledge and reality (see, in particular, Putnam (1981); see also the entry on skepticism and content externalism). But not all philosophers are so sanguine about the theoretical significance of reference, or even the thesis that there is either one or a family of substantive relations to be explained. In closing, we will briefly discuss several ‘negative’ views of reference.

W.V.O. Quine is probably the most famous reference skeptic. In his (1960), he argued that reference is inherently indeterminate or ‘inscrutable’. By this, Quine means that there is no fact of the matter about what our words refer to. This is not to say that our words refer to something but we are unable to determine what that is. Rather, there is simply no such thing as that to which our words refer. Nevertheless, Quine does not go so far as to say that our words fail to refer in any sense. His view is rather that it makes sense to speak of what our words refer to only relative to some purpose we might have in assigning referents to those words. Quine’s argument for the inscrutability thesis involves an application of the thesis that empirical theories are underdetermined by their supporting evidence. For any body of empirical evidence we might have about speakers of a given language, there will be a number of competing theories regarding what their words refer to. Such theories will be empirically equivalent, equally consistent with the empirical data. One theory might say that, in the language in question, ‘gavagai’ refers to rabbits; another might say that it refers to undetached rabbit parts; a third might say that it refers to time-slices of rabbits. Quine’s views on underdetermination can be applied to one’s own language as well. The result is that the available evidence no more forces the speaker to the conclusion that by ‘rabbit’ she means rabbits than it forces her to conclude that by ‘rabbit’ she means undetached rabbit parts or time-slices of rabbits. If a speaker observes herself using the word ‘rabbit,’ the evidence she amasses will give equal support to all three theories, as well as to many others. So, according to Quine, for any given body of empirical evidence, there will be numerous competing theories as to what the words one uses refer to. And there will be no principled way of adjudicating between these theories.[15]

A related and much-discussed problem, the problem of the many, was raised by Peter Unger (1980) and Geach (1980). Basically, the idea is that with many, probably even most, physical objects, there are any number of equally compelling candidates for their borders, and hence their physical constitution. In the terms we’ve been dealing with here, there are any number of equally compelling candidates for being the referent of a singular referential term, like ‘that’, when that term is being used to target a physical object. Without some way of selecting one of these as somehow privileged, we might wonder whether we should really think of such terms as referring—unless, that is, we are happy to accept that apparently-singular referential terms in fact refer to sets of objects, vague objects, or the like.[16]

Donald Davidson’s instrumentalist views on reference are in some sense more radical still. Davidson (1984) claims that reference is a theoretically vacuous notion: it is of absolutely no use in a semantic theory, or a theory of strict and literal meaning. His basis for endorsing this position is his conviction that no substantive explanation of reference is possible. The problem is that any such explanation would have to be given in non-linguistic terms, but no such explanation can be given, Davidson claims. As Davidson puts it: if the name ‘Kilimanjaro’ refers to Kilimanjaro, then no doubt there is some relation between English (or Swahili) speakers, the word, and the mountain. But it is inconceivable that one should be able to explain this relation without first explaining the role of the words in the sentences; and if this is so, there is no chance of explaining reference directly in non-linguistic terms. However, this does not mean that there is no hope for semantics. On the contrary, on Davidson’s view, a theory of truth for a language is at the same time a theory of meaning for that language. The point here is that a Davidsonian theory of meaning has no place for the notion of reference per se; instead, it assimilates what we might be tempted to call ‘reference’ into the theory of linguistic truth. That might, however, prove compatible with the sorts of pluralist approaches to reference we canvassed above.

Similar in spirit to Davidson’s view are deflationist theories of reference—not to be confused with deflationism about truth, though often motivated by a desire to endorse that latter theory. Deflationists about truth typically claim that to assert that a statement is true is just to assert the statement itself. Deflationists about reference, on the other hand, claim that there is nothing more to the notion of reference than what is captured by instances of a schema like: ‘a’ refers to a. Such a schema generates claims like ‘Frege’ refers to Frege, claims which can seem perfectly plausible until we consider the problem of names with multiple bearers or indexicals, both pure and impure. In such cases, the deflationist might then reach for a slightly more complex schema incorporating the notion of a use of a term. But then we need to ask what is meant by a ‘use’ in these circumstances, and once we start to answer this question it becomes increasingly unclear whether a truly deflationist approach to reference can in fact be preserved.[17]

In spite of the myriad concerns which motivate these ‘negative’ views of reference, concerns which might well make us rethink the idea that there is any one relation which deserves to be called ‘reference’, the nature of the relation between language and reality continues to be one of the most talked about and vigorously debated issues in the philosophy of language. What remains to be seen is whether and to what extent this work might prove useful for understanding a broader notion of reference, or a broader notion of the relationship between representational tokens and the world around us, which is equally at home in aesthetics, ethics, and the philosophy of mind as it is in the philosophy of language.


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Marga Reimer

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