Peter John Olivi

First published Tue Nov 2, 1999; substantive revision Fri Jun 4, 2021

Peter John Olivi was one of the most original and interesting philosophers and theologians of the thirteenth century. Although not as clear and systematic as Thomas Aquinas, and not as brilliantly analytical as John Duns Scotus, Olivi’s ideas are equally original and provocative, and their philosophical value is nowadays recognized among the specialists in medieval philosophy. He is probably best known for his psychological theories, especially his voluntarist conception of the freedom of the will, but his influence extends also to other areas of philosophy, from metaphysics to practical philosophy.

1. Life and Work

Olivi (ca. 1248–1298) was born in Sérignan, in the Languedoc region of southern France. He entered the Franciscan order at the age of twelve, studied in Paris from 1267 to about 1272 (during the final years of Bonaventure’s generalate) without becoming a master of theology, and spent the remainder of his life teaching at various Franciscan houses of study in southern France, with a stay in Florence from 1287–89. (For biographical details, see Burr 1976 and 1989, and especially Piron 1998, 1999, 2006a.) Olivi’s outspoken originality led him into conflict with religious authorities: his writings were condemned by the Franciscan authorities in 1283, and although he was later rehabilitated by the new minister general Matthew of Aquasparta, he remained a controversial figure. He spent the last part of his life as a lector at Montpellier and Narbonne. Soon after his death the Franciscan order renewed the prohibition on reading or retaining his works. Although his philosophical views were controversial, what proved to be fatal was his reputation within the so-called “Spiritual” reform movement of the Franciscan order. Olivi’s understanding of the Franciscan vow and poverty became influential among the spiritualists, and after his death he was venerated by fervent laymen in Languedoc. When Church officials took action against the spiritual movement, Olivi’s reputation suffered a blow, which limited the influence he would have on posterity. (See Burr 1989, 1993, 2001.)

Olivi produced a large and wide-ranging body of work, much of which has survived. By far the most important philosophical text is his Summa of questions on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, a massive work he began writing soon after leaving Paris and redacted to its final form in the mid-1290s. This masterpiece of medieval philosophy remains still largely untranslated, and edited only in part. Olivi’s views on metaphysics and human nature are mostly found in his questions on Bk. II (ed. Jansen, 1922–26). Material on the virtues is found in Bk. III (ed. Emmen and Stadter, 1981). Other philosophically relevant works include his Quodlibeta from 1289–95 (ed. Defraia, 2002), a set of questions on logic (ed. Brown, 1986), and the Questions on Evangelical Perfection. Many of his biblical commentaries, the historically significant Commentary on the Apocalypse, and various texts pertaining to his condemnation have survived and are available in modern editions. (For a recent list of editions, see König-Pralong et al. 2010; for the dating of works, see Piron 2020a.) In this article we provide a brief outline of the most significant philosophical views that Olivi defended, both in theoretical and practical philosophy.

2. Theoretical Philosophy

2.1 Metaphysics

2.1.1 Rejection of categories

According to traditional medieval interpretation, Aristotle’s ten categories (substance and nine accidental categories, such as quality, quantity, and relation) represent both ontological and conceptual divisions of the world. On the one hand, the world really is divided into ten ontologically distinct types of things; and on the other hand, our conceptual scheme employs the ten categories because there is an isomorphism between how things really are and how we understand them to be (see the entry on medieval theories of the categories).

This traditional interpretation was not universally agreed upon, and various interpretations and modifications were presented, especially towards the end of the thirteenth century. In particular, the realist idea that categories are populated by different kinds things (res) came under pressure. Olivi is among the first authors to explicitly reject the idea that Aristotelian categories can be considered as ontologically distinct kinds of things, and he also points out that Aristotle does not offer any good reason to believe that there are exactly ten categories (Summa II q. 28, pp. 490–91). According to Olivi, there are more ways of conceptually carving the world than the Aristotelian categorical scheme, and we cannot infer the ontological structure of the world from our conceptual divisions. Olivi argues that “the diversity of modes of predication does not necessarily entail a diversity of modes of being, because the mode of predication follows the mode of understanding rather than the mode of being […]” (ibid., pp. 485–86; see also q. 54, pp. 262–63). Things that really exist are substances and qualities; the remaining categories are different ways to conceptualize things that really exist (Pini 2008, pp. 160–62; Pini 2005, pp. 74–77; Pasnau 2011, pp. 235–38).

However, Olivi finds a simple division between really existing things (substances and qualities) and conceptualizations that the mind makes too coarse. Although he goes some way towards nominalism, he does not go all the way (Boureau 1999, 45). In many contexts, he upholds the realist intuition that our concepts are based on how things really are—they are ontologically committing. To achieve this aim, he uses the notoriously difficult concept of rationes reales, which can be translated, for instance, as “real aspects” (Pini 2008, pp. 160–61; Pasnau 2011, p. 236), or “modes of partial intelligibility” (Piron 2016, par. 8). The core idea is that the human mind can consider the reality from different perspectives, by focusing on some aspect of it and leaving other aspects aside. For instance, it is possible to think about Socrates from the point of view of his quantity. Ontologically speaking the object of thought is still the individual rational substance Socrates—the fact that we think about his quantity does not entail real existence of quantity as a distinct thing (res)—but we focus only on his height and weight and, as it were, abstract them from him. These properties are not mind-dependent but real in the sense that Socrates really is of a certain quantity, but the core of Olivi’s view is that these qualities are nevertheless not ontologically distinct from Socrates’ substance. The category of relation functions in a similar way:

it does not seem that a relation adds anything real to that on which it is immediately founded, but only means another ratio realis of the same thing, which is real to the extent that such a ratio of the relation really is in the thing, and not solely in the intellect. But it is not really another in the sense of being another ‘thing’ or essence; it is only another ratio that is included in the thing without any difference [between the ratio and the thing] (Summa II q. 54, p. 260).

Rationes reales are further distinguished from conceptualizations that are completely mind-dependent, the so-called verbal accounts (rationes secundum dici): I said ‘rationes reales’ because also some <other> rationes are attributed to things, and they do not name anything real or anything that is in the thing itself (a parte rei) but only in the intellect, or according to the intellect. (Summa II q. 54, p. 247; see Bettoni 1959, pp. 236–43; Piron 1999, ch. 2; Piron 2016, par. 7–9) The crucial difference between rationes reales and rationes secundum dici is that the former are conceptualizations that are based on the nature of things themselves (although they do not reflect any real ontological distinctions or elements in them), while the latter are completely mind-dependent modes of thinking:

[…] they said that there seem to be several rationes reales, not only in God, but also in created things. They call these rationes reales in distinction to rationes which consist only of modes of being understood—such are the ratio of universality which the intellect attributes to things that are considered without their individuality, and relations secundum dici which posit nothing <real> in neither of their extremes or at least in the other extreme—just like ‘to be praised or loved’ taken in passive sense posit nothing in the thing praised or loved. Therefore, in distinction to these, they call rationes reales those, the truth of which lies entirely in the thing, so that they are not attributed to things on the basis of various modes of understanding, but rather on the basis of the real nature and truth itself (Summa II q. 7, pp. 134–35).

The ontological status of rationes reales is unclear. Some scholars seem to interpret them in a reductionist manner (Pini 2005, pp. 74–75; Piron 2016, par. 7) but it has also been argued that they, or at least some of them, should be taken as modes, understood as an ontological category that is distinct from substances and accidents but equally real (Pasnau 2011, pp. 247–49). Either way, clearly they function as a theoretical tool which is unknown to Aristotelian metaphysics and which allows Olivi to develop rather nuanced positions in several metaphysical, epistemological and theological questions.

2.1.2 Universal hylomorphism and matter

Olivi accepts a doctrine that is known as “universal hylomorphism”, i.e. the view that every substance, except God, is composed of form and matter. The hylomorphic scheme as such is of course taken from Aristotle, but the idea that it must be applied also to spiritual entities, such as the human soul and angels, is an extension that was popularized by Dominicus Gundissalinus. The philosophical reason behind this view is related to the idea that forms are fully actual. Everything that can undergo a change from one state to another requires potentiality, and thus all created substances must have a material constituent (Summa II q. 16, p. 304). In particular, Olivi holds that although the human soul is a spiritual entity, it is not a pure form but a hylomorphic combination of form and what Olivi calls “spiritual matter” (for details and qualifications, see § 2.3 below). Thus, Olivi, following Bonaventure, divides matter into two radically different kinds: corporeal and spiritual. All physical things around us are composed of corporeal matter and a form that actualizes and organizes it. The metaphysical structure of spiritual substances (angels and intellectual souls) is similar but the matter that enters their metaphysical composition is of a different kind. (Ribordy 2010; Suarez-Nani 2009, 29–44)

Moreover, Olivi rejects the Aristotelian notion of matter as pure potentiality and attributes a certain level of actuality to it: “The essence of matter means some act or actuality, which is nevertheless sufficiently distinct from the act which is a form” (Summa II q. 16, pp. 305–6). A number of different views on the nature of matter were debated in the thirteenth century, and Olivi’s theory was an original contribution to the debate. According to him, ‘actuality’ can be taken as an analogous notion that applies both to forms that are actual in a “determining and indeterminable” way, and matter that is actual in an indeterminate way and needs to be perfected by a form to turn into an actual substance. Olivi is careful to explain that matter’s having both actuality and potentiality does not mean that it is composed of act and potency, as if from form and matter. Rather, the actuality of matter is indeterminate and in that sense it is the same thing as the potentiality of matter, and therefore these two aspects of matter should be understood as two rationes, which do not introduce any real distinction (ibid., pp. 309–10; see Rodolfi 2010; Suarez-Nani 2009, 29–44). However, Olivi rejects Bonaventure’s theory of seminal reasons (rationes seminales), i.e. the idea that matter was imbued in the creation with latent structures that are actualized over time and thus explain the emergence of new substantial forms from the potentiality of matter. He accepts the term itself, but proposes a deflationary interpretation of it as various forms of efficient causality (Summa II q. 31).

2.1.3 Causality

It has been argued that Olivi is one of the few medieval authors to argue that God is not a concurrent cause of actions of created beings (Frost 2014; the following is based on this article). Although not a completely novel idea, this position was almost obsolete in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries; the only author in addition to Olivi to defend it was Durandus of St. Pourçain (ca. 1275–1332). Medieval authors typically argued that God is the universal first cause and, as such, he must directly take part in every causal process that is brought about by created things. This position, known as “concurrentism,” was defended as an effort avoid occasionalism (defended mainly by Islamic philosophers) while preserving the theological idea that nothing in this world happens or exists without God.

It should be emphasised that Olivi accepts the idea that nothing can remain in existence without God (Summa II q. 116, p. 346: “That which arises indirectly from the first cause requires the first causes’s power and sustenance no less than does that which arises immediately. Hence at the cessation of God’s entire influence it would be deprived of its existence no less than would those things that arise immediately”). His claim has a more limited scope, as it pertains to the nature of causality in a world that remains in existence only with the help of God. Although natural agents need God to exist, they can cause their effects without God’s direct participation in the causal process: “[…] many natural powers are sufficiently applied to their acts from their creation or generation, so that they need only the presence of a suitable object” (Summa II q. 116, p. 340).

Olivi explicitly rejects two competing views that give God a more central role in causal processes. According to one view, defended mainly by Dominicans, God contributes to the causal process indirectly, by applying created causes to their actions. The other view, favored by Franciscan authors such as John Duns Scotus and William Ockham, God acts as a co-cause that brings about the effect together with the created cause (Schmutz 2001). Olivi claims that both of these have problematic consequences when they are applied to sinful actions of humans—in particular to the original sin, which is the explicit topic of question 116 of the second book of his Summa, where he develops his position. Unsurprisingly, he wants to keep God clear from all moral responsibility for our sins.

The position that God is not responsible for our sins was of course uncontroversial. None of the authors who defended the idea that God is a concurrent cause (in one way or the other) thought that God thereby becomes morally responsible for them. But what is philosophically important in Olivi’s view is that he refuses to accept any other way to safeguard the impeccability of God except the denial of his role as a concurrent cause in the free actions of our will. This view is closely related to his conception of the freedom of the will but he seems to extend the argument from the human will to created causes in general; at least he uses physical causation as an example that illuminates the mutual roles of created causes and God:

Likewise, the immediate effects of secondary causes are likenesses of their active powers, as a ray <of light> is a likeness of the light of the sun, and the first effect of heat is nothing else than a likeness of heat. If therefore the mentioned divine cooperation is of different species than the heat, how can the likeness of heat be from it? (Summa II q. 116, p. 339)

Olivi suggests here that God cannot bring about any effect in the created cause, which would help that cause to bring about its effect. The only way God can take part in the causal process is by acting directly as a co-cause, and this won’t do for reasons that Olivi laid down earlier. The upshot is that God cannot be a concurrent cause in any way. The main purpose of the examples involving heat and light is to make the philosophical (and theological) point clear: Olivi appeals to created causes in general to make his point about sinful actions of the will more plausible. But he does this in such a way that there seems to be little reason to doubt that he means to extend the rejection of concurrence to created causes generally.

2.1.4 Freedom of the will and personhood (personalitas)

Olivi devotes several extended questions of his Summa to the topic of human freedom, beginning with the question of whether human beings even have free will (liberum arbitrium). Olivi’s own argument for the affirmative begins by listing seven pairs of attitudes (affectus), each of which testifies to the existence of free will (Summa II q. 57, p. 317):

  1. Zeal and mercy
  2. Friendship and hostility
  3. Shame and glory
  4. Gratitude and ingratitude
  5. Subjugation and domination
  6. Hope and distrust
  7. Carefulness and heedlessness

Each of these attitudes, Olivi claims, is intelligible only given the existence of free will. More specifically, they are “its distinctive products, or its distinctive acts and habits” (Summa II q. 57, p. 317). As he runs through the list, explaining how each attitude entails free will, it becomes clear that many of these claims are familiar ones. Zeal, for instance, is an angry reaction to bad deeds, motivated “only against the bad that one judges to have been done voluntarily, and thus which could have been freely avoided” (ibid., p. 318). Without free will, this attitude is based on an assumption that is “thoroughly false and grounded on a thoroughly false object” (ibid., p. 317). As zeal goes, so do the related phenomena of accusations, excuses, blame, and guilt. Generally, “a human being could no more be accused of some vice than he could be accused of death, for he could avoid the one as little as the other” (ibid., p. 336). Carefulness and heedlessness, the last pair on the list, likewise become meaningless: “For it is foolish to be careful about things that will occur necessarily” (ibid., p. 323). It becomes pointless to be careful about deliberation, for instance, “because the deliberation itself will or will not happen necessarily, and even one’s carefulness will or will not occur necessarily” (ibid., p. 323).

For Olivi, these and other data stand as unshakeable evidence for the existence and nature of free will. He makes this clear from the beginning of his reply, when he introduces two premisses that “no one of sane mind ought to doubt” (Summa II q. 57, p. 317). First, it is impossible for all of the attitudes of one’s rational nature to be “thoroughly false and perverse and grounded on a thoroughly false and perverse object.” Since Olivi thinks that the attitudes that distinguish us as rational creatures are founded on free will, giving up on free will would be to abandon most of what makes us human. We would cease to be what we properly are, persons, and we would become only “intellectual beasts” (ibid., p. 338; see below). Second, it is impossible for attitudes to be entirely illusory when human beings improve and perfect themselves by assuming those attitudes (ibid., p. 317). If the practices of zeal, deliberation, friendship, love, political power, etc. were all founded on a false assumption, then surely these practices would not be so crucial to human well-being. Thus “no one of sane mind will believe that something could be the truth which so sharply puts an end to all good things and brings on so many bad things” (ibid., p. 338). In the face of these implications, we should reject whatever stands in the way of free will, whether that be the authority of Aristotle or some abstruse principle of metaphysics. “Even if there were no other argument establishing that [the denial of free will] is false, this alone ought to be sufficiently persuasive” (ibid., p. 338). Moreover, as he explicitly notes, we should be persuaded not just of our own free will, but of the free will of all human beings, since these arguments are based not on private experience, but on our relationships with others.

Having proved that human beings have free will, Olivi sets out to explain what he means by freedom. His conception obviously belongs within the libertarian camp in the free will debate, and its central feature is that in order to be free, the will must be active and capable of reflexively moving itself to action. True, the will’s choices are not necessitated by reason or anything other than by the will itself, but Olivi does not merely conclude that the will is not necessitated; the further conclusion he reaches is that the will, until it makes a choice, is entirely undetermined one way or another, and that it determines itself in the direction it chooses. This is something “every human being senses with complete certainty within himself” (Summa II q. 57, p. 327). In arguing that the will determines itself, he means that it is a first mover, in need of no efficient cause other than itself. “Its free power is the cause of its motion, when it is moved, and the cause of its rest, when it rests” (ibid. ad 5, pp. 341–42; Yrjönsuuri 2002). If the will did not have this capacity for self-movement, then it would have to be determined by something else, and so it would not be making its own choices. But this violates the unshakeable assumptions from which Olivi begins, because it would then turn out that the will is not autonomous and hence not a suitable object of one’s zeal or friendship, among other things.

Olivi is well aware that the lack of autonomy does not entirely preclude a sort of pseudo-zeal or pseudo-friendship. One might be angry with someone, for instance, not out of the conviction that the bad action was that person’s fault, but simply in an effort to change that person’s ways. But this line of thought does violence to our conceptions of ourselves and our fellow human beings. We want people to do the right thing not because they have been effectively manipulated, but “solely and purely because of the love of justice” (Summa II q. 57, ad 22, p. 368). Further, when we urge a person to do the right thing, “we do not intend simply to move someone toward what is good, but rather to make it that he voluntarily moves himself toward the good” (ibid., p. 369).

Another distinctive feature of Olivi’s theory of the freedom of the will is that he criticizes Anselm of Canterbury’s asymmetric notion of freedom, according to which the will is free only when it conforms to the normative standard of justice. Olivi argues that the ability to sin is a part of freedom and that the ability to choose between alternatives—including vices—is part of the definition of freedom (Summa II q. 41, pp. 696–702, q. 57, 359; Kent 2017; Bobillier 2020, pp. 178–79). Moreover, Olivi argues fervently against the view that the will is a power for opposites only with respect to a future instant. In order to be truly free, the will must, in the same instant it wills ‘A’, be capable of willing ‘not-A’. Olivi’s conception seems to have been the source of John Duns Scotus’ revolutionary theory of synchronic contingency (Dumont 1995), and although Scotus is better known as an early proponent of libertarian freedom, his view is heavily indebted to Olivi. Indeed, it is arguable that Olivi deserves credit as the founder of this conception of freedom of the will.

Finally, one of the original moves that Olivi makes with his theory of the freedom of the will is that he proposes a novel interpretation of the notion of ‘personhood,’ i.e. the property of being a person (see Perler 2020; Piron 2007; Bobillier 2020, pp. 102–37). This notion is put to several uses in different contexts, but philosophically the most pertinent idea is that which he develops in relation to self-consciousness and the freedom of the will: “personhood is the same as per se existence, governing, free, and reflexively turned (or turnable) to itself in a possessive way—that is, possessing itself by a certain free reflextion” (Summa II q. 52, p. 200). To be a person, one must have two highly sophisticated abilities, namely a mind that provides self-awareness by turning reflexively towards itself (see below) and freedom of the will understood in terms of activity and self-movement. Some elements of Olivi’s innovative notion are more well-known from authors of much later periods, such as Descartes, Locke and Kant; but it was Olivi who first formulated this notion of personhood and used it in his metaphysical, epistemological and moral theories (Bobillier 2020, pp. 133–34).

2.2 Epistemology

2.2.1 Rejection of divine illumination

The idea that certain knowledge requires divine illumination enjoyed steady popularity from antiquity to late thirteenth century. The philosophical appeal of the view is familiar from Plato’s epistemology, and Augustine’s remarks popularized it among early medieval theologians. These remarks do not constitute a detailed theory of how illumination takes place, but in the mid-thirteenth century prominent authors such as Bonaventure and Matthew of Aquasparta developed a systematic defence of it. At the influence of Aristotelian epistemological theory, the theory of divine illumination came under pressure and it was both attacked and defended from many perspectives, e.g. by explaining illumination by separating the agent intellect from individual human beings and identifying it with God. Olivi was the first Franciscan author to launch a heavy critique of the Augustinian idea that universal cognition requires divine illumination. He presents (in Summa I, q. 2) a thorough criticism of the reasons that were used to defend it, and although he ends up accepting the position, he emphasizes that the theory must be carefully formulated so that it takes into account the shortcomings he has pointed in it—all of which can be taken to qualify it to the brink of rejection (see the entry on divine illumination). After all, one of the conditions that he sets for the true theory is that “it does not take away the possibility of true and certain judgement and understanding” (Summa I, q. 2, p. 510) from the human mind, and in another context he argues that the acts of understanding originate in the human intellect (Summa II q. 74; Caldera 2010, pp. 235–36).

Another issue that leads Olivi to questions the idea of divine illumination is related to Henry of Ghent’s realistic view (realistic of the Platonist breed), that knowledge of universal propositions provides a proof for the existence of God. In Olivi’s eyes, the problem here is that if such knowledge is based on grasping the eternal reasons in God (which God used in creation), there is no way to preserve the theological doctrine that we cannot see God in this life. While Henry’s argument is based on the realist idea that necessary truths would exists even in the absence of thinking subjects, Olivi holds that necessary propositions are necessary only because they cannot be formed by a mind without their being true. Having thus undermined the fundamental basis of the theory of divine illumination, Olivi goes on to propose a theory of knowledge that is closer to Aquinas’ view in its appeal to empiricism, but that is more radical and preserves certain aspects of Augustine’s neoplatonist theory—especially as it emphasizes the active nature of the mind in cognitive processes (Piron 2020b, par. 2–3).

2.2.2 Direct realism

Olivi’s direct realism is central to his thinking about cognition. If he were willing to say that the object of our spiritual attention is not the external object but an internal species of the object, then he could reformulate his theory of cognitive attention in a more plausible way, as a matter of grasping an internal impression from the object. But Olivi works very hard to avoid falling into any kind of position that might be called representationalist—that is, a view on which the immediate objects of cognition are internal. This epistemological commitment to direct realism is one of the most important philosophical reasons for Olivi to reject the standard scholastic account of sensible and intelligible species. On that standard account, species serve as forms that provide the intentional content of sensation and thought. Although these forms were standardly described as merely the means by which we grasp external things, Olivi argued that in fact the proponent of species was committed to representationalism.

Olivi argues against the species theory by advancing through a series of ever-more-serious charges. First, the theory is committed to taking species as the objects of cognition:

A species will never actually represent an object to the cognitive power unless the power attends to the species in such a way that it turns and fixes its attention on the species. But that to which the power’s attention is turned has the character of an object, and that to which it is first turned has the character of a first object. Therefore these species will have the character of an object more than the character of an intermediate or representative source (Summa II q. 58 ad 14, p. 469; cf. Summa II q. 74, p. 123).

His argument for this conclusion turns on the first sentence of the passage, in which he claims that a species cannot represent an object to a cognizer unless the cognizer attends to the species. For Olivi, such attention to some thing is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for that thing’s being cognized. So if we do have to focus our attention in this way on species, he infers that those species will be the object of cognition, not merely causal intermediaries.

Next, Olivi argues that species would have to be the first object of cognition. To turn toward a species in the way that we must if that species is to represent the external world “is the same as to attend to it as a first object” (Summa II q. 74, p. 123). Elsewhere, “we would always cognize the species before the thing itself that is the object” (Summa II q. 58 ad 14, p. 469). The point Olivi wants to make is one more often made by denying that the world is seen directly or immediately. If we see the external world at all, we see it only at second hand, indirectly.

The argument goes one final step. Someone who wants to claim that our internal sensations are themselves perceived has to choose whether or not to claim that the external world is also perceived. Olivi holds that, on the species account, we would not perceive the external world at all, only images of it:

The attention will tend toward the species either in such a way that it would not pass beyond so as to attend to the object, or in such a way that it would pass beyond. If in the first way, then the thing will not be seen in itself, but only its image will be seen as if it were the thing itself (Summa II q. 74, p. 123; cf. q. 58 ad 14, pp. 469–70, 487–88).

The argument is based on a dilemma. Granting that cognizers must attend to species, there either will or will not be a separate and further attention to the object itself. It would of course be quite odd to say that there is such a further attention. This would entail, as Olivi goes on to say, that one “considers the object in two ways—first through a species, second in itself” (Summa II q. 74, p. 123). This seems too much at odds with the phenomenal feel of perception to be a serious possibility. The obvious way out of the dilemma, then, is to say that there will not be any further attention: one apprehends the external world, if one does at all, in virtue of attending to the species themselves. This is what the representationalist will likely say. But if this were the case, Olivi argues, then we would be seeing only the images of objects, not the things in themselves. Memorably, he remarks that a species “would veil the thing and impede its being attended to in itself as if present, rather than aid in its being attended to” (Summa II q. 58 ad 14, p. 469; Pasnau 1997).

In place of the species theory, Olivi offers an interesting alternative. Rather than treat mental representations as something separate from an act of cognition, Olivi proposes identifying the two. On his view, an act of cognition in itself represents the object that is perceived. There is no need to postulate any further representation beyond the act itself: that inevitably results in the mediation that Olivi wants to avoid. This act theory would prove influential on later scholastics, most notably William Ockham. And in our own era it has been reinvented and renamed, as the adverbial theory of thought and perception.

2.3 Philosophy of Mind

2.3.1 Soul and body

With the rediscovery of Aristotle’s metaphysical and ethical works, thirteenth-century theologians devoted an increasing portion of their time to interpreting and developing Aristotelian accounts of human nature. Olivi was very far from a slavish admirer of Aristotle’s, and his theory of the nature of the soul and its relation to the body differs radically from those medieval interpretations which endeavor to be faithful to the Philosopher. Nonetheless, he employs the Aristotelian theoretical framework, and although he often seems to be rather hostile to Aristotle’s pervasive influence, once remarking that “without reason he is believed, as the god of this age” (Summa II q. 58 ad 14, p. 482; see Burr 1971), the main thrust of his criticism is directed at contemporary Averroist interpretations of Aristotle rather than at Aristotle himself (Piron 2006b). The critical, even harsh passages must be understood in this light.

Nonetheless, he rejects many principles that are crucial for Aristotle’s account of the soul-body relationship. He argues that it is “not only contrary to reason but also dangerous to the faith” to hold that “the [soul’s] intellective and free part is the form of the body per se and considered as such” (Summa II q. 51, p. 104). Others had questioned the extent to which soul and body could be analyzed in terms of form and matter, but Olivi goes further because he explicitly denies that one part of the soul, the rational part, can be understood as the form of the body. This denial is ultimately based on his view that the intellectual part of the soul must be spiritual and incorporeal because otherwise it cannot be immortal, intellectual, and free. Yet he does not want to jeopardize the substantial unity of the soul and the body, and he works towards a theory which incorporates both of these doctrines.

Olivi’s denial that the soul’s intellectual part is the form of the body matches fairly closely with a doctrine that was condemned by the Council of Vienne in 1312, when Pope Clement V declared in the bull Fidei catholicae fundamento that it is a heresy to hold that “the rational or intellective soul is not per se and essentially the form of the human body” (Denzinger 1965, n. 902). However, it is easy to misunderstand what Olivi is saying, and a closer analysis shows that his position is far more nuanced than the wording of the condemnation suggests. First, he is not denying that the rational part of the soul is a form, or even that it is the form of a human being. To begin with, he follows Bonaventure and makes the distinction discussed above between two kinds of matter. The human body and all material objects are made of corporeal matter, but spiritual entities (angels and human souls) also have a material substratum, the so-called spiritual matter. Olivi argues that the rational part of the soul, intellect and will, is a form of this spiritual matter. It is acceptable to speak of intellect as the form of a human being since the spiritual matter belongs to the human being. But because the spiritual matter of the soul is distinct from the corporeal matter of the body, Olivi can maintain that the rational part is not the form of the body (see e.g. Summa II q. 51 appendix, p. 138).

Second, Olivi is not denying that the soul is the form of the body. What he denies is that the rational part of the soul (“the intellective and free part”) is the form of the body. He resorts to a doctrine of the plurality of substantial forms, according to which complex substances, such as human beings, have several more or less distinct forms that together make the complete human being. The intellectual part of the soul is distinct from another part, the sensory part, and only the latter is the form of the body. Because the two parts of the soul are united in the spiritual matter, it is acceptable to say that the whole soul is the form of the body:

It is said that the whole rational soul, rather than the sensory part, is the form of the body, even though it is informed by the whole only insofar as it is informed by the soul’s sensory and nutritive part. (Summa II q. 51 app., p. 146)

We should say that the whole soul is the form of the body, in much the same way that we say that a person talks, not a tongue (ibid., p. 144). But if we direct our attention to the various parts of the soul, then it is wrong to say that the rational part, “per se and considered as such,” is the form of the body. The soul is the form of the body only with respect to its sensory and nutritive part. Given Olivi’s argumentation against the formal union between the intellectual part of the soul and the body, it may seem that the unity of the human being is compromised. Olivi argues, however, that the relation between these two parts is substantial even though it is mediated by the sensory part and the spiritual matter of the soul. He writes:

If the human body is united and inclined to the sensory form, which is inclined and united to the intellectual form; and the intellectual form is essentially united to the sensory form, which is inclined to the body; then by the same token the intellectual form and the body are necessarily substantially united to each other. Still, this does not mean that they would be united as form and matter. (Summa II q. 51, p. 134)

The substantial union between the intellectual and sensory parts is due to their being the forms of the same spiritual matter of the soul. In this way, all the metaphysical components constitute a single substance. A human being is an essentially unified entity even though the intellectual part of the soul is not the actuality of the body or any of its parts.

2.3.2 Cognitive activity and attention

One of the most interesting and original aspects of Olivi’s philosophy is his critique of the standard Aristotelian model of cognition. The starting point of this critique is the Augustinian conception of the ontological superiority of the soul with respect to the body, which leads Olivi to insist that perception and intellectual understanding cannot be passive reception of external stimuli but must be understood as active processes. On the conventional medieval view, a cognitive power simply receives impressions from the world, in the form of sensible or intelligible species. Olivi argues that such an account leaves out a crucial element, the focusing of the cognitive power’s attention on the object to be cognized:

However much the cognitive power is informed through a disposition and a species differing from the cognitive action, it cannot advance to a cognitive action unless before this it actually tends toward the object, so that the attention of its intention should be actually turned and directed to the object. (Summa II q. 72, p. 9)

Olivi gives the kinds of examples that one would expect. The ears of someone sleeping, for instance, receive the same impressions as the ears of someone awake, but the sleeper does not sense these impressions. Even when we are awake, we sometimes do not perceive objects right in front of us when we are intently focused on something else (Summa II q. 73, pp. 89–90).

Olivi argues that this kind of cognitive attention requires a “virtual extension” toward the object. Though he accepts the traditional theory of species in medio, sensible qualities that fill the air between the senses and their objects (for details, see Demange and Kedar 2020), he denies that these species are the efficient cause of cognition. One striking consequence of this claim is that the object itself need not exert any causal influence, not on the cognitive powers nor even on the physical sense organs. The external object need only be close enough to be apprehended by the cognizer’s spiritual attention. In the cases of both perception and understanding, the efficient agent is the cognitive power. The external object is merely a kind of final cause or, more precisely, a “terminative cause” (Summa II q. 72, p. 36; Epistola, n. 12). It is merely by being the object of the cognitive power’s attention that the external object plays a role in cognition.

Olivi treats virtual attention—or directedness—not as a sui generis activity of the mind, but as a general kind of causal relationship that can be applied to physical agents just as much as to mental ones. For him, every natural physical agent has a virtual attention of this sort that extends as far as its causal force does (Summa II q. 23, pp. 424–25). One authority comments that Olivi’s virtual attention is “in fact equivalent to action at a distance” (Jansen 1921, p. 118), a characterization that seems apt in the case of physical effects such as the light of the sun that illuminates distant objects.

However, the case of cognitive acts is different. Olivi carefully avoids committing to real extramission of vision, and he argues that perceptual acts take place in the powers of the soul, not in the perceived object (Summa II q. 58, p. 482; Silva & Toivanen 2010). The virtual extension of the soul’s attention is not real, not even in some special nonphysical sense. When Olivi explains that the extension is ‘virtual’, he means to contrast it with ‘real’. He explicitly denies, for instance, that this virtual extension involves “any real emission of its essence” (Summa II q. 73, p. 61). Elsewhere, considering the claim that “our mind is where it fixes its intention,” he says that “these words are metaphorical, for we are not there really or substantially, but only virtually or intentionally” (Summa II q. 37 ad 13, p. 672). On this basis it is fair to say that the soul does not actually perform any action at a distance, although its attention can be directed to distant objects. Accordingly, Olivi’s view is best described as an intentional theory of cognition (Perler 2002; Toivanen 2013a).

Olivi allows that the object itself, through species in medio, can indirectly act on our spiritual faculties, through what he calls the via colligantiae (way of connection). A flash of lightning will make a physical impression on our eyes, and this physical impression can, through the via colligantiae, affect the spiritual sensory powers. But, crucially, this connection is not what brings about sensation. We see this flash, as opposed to receiving merely a physical impression from it, when we direct our spiritual attention toward it (Quodlibet I.4). This via colligantiae plays an important role across Olivi’s philosophical psychology, being his general method of explaining the vexed connection between mind and body (see Summa II q. 59, pp. 546–54; ibid. q. 72, pp. 30–35; Jansen 1921, pp. 76–90).

2.3.3 Words and concepts

Olivi extends his critique of species to the mental word (verbum), which was standardly postulated as the product of intellectual thought. His treatment of the verbum raises different issues from those associated with species. Here the issue is not direct realism, precisely, but rather the nature of concept formation. Near the start of his commentary on the Gospel of John, Olivi describes the standard view as follows: “Our mental word is something following an act of thought […] and formed by that thought. […] After it has been formed […] the [extra-mental] object is clearly understood or viewed in that word as if in a mirror” (Tractatus de verbo 6.1). This word, moreover, “is that which is first cognized by intellect and is its first object;” the extra-mental object is cognized secondarily. This description closely matches a characterization Olivi gives in his later Sentences commentary:

Some maintain that a kind of concept, or word, is formed through an abstractive, investigative, or inventive consideration, in which real objects are intellectively cognized as in a mirror. For they call this the first thing understood, and the immediate object; it is a kind of intention, concept, and defining notion of things. (Summa II q. 74, pp. 120–21)

This view has two characteristic features. First, it postulates a mental representation—a concept or word—that is the product of intellectual activity. Second, it supposes that we understand the world through these representations, in such a way that we get at the world indirectly, or secondarily, “as if in a mirror.” Call this an object theory of the verbum.

Olivi’s own view is that the verbum should be identified with a particular act of thought: “our mental word is our actual thought” (Tractatus de verbo 6.2.1). When we engage in abstract intellectual cognition, Olivi says, “nothing serving as an object is really abstracted or formed that differs from the act of consideration already mentioned” (ibid., 6.2.3). His Summa offers a concise characterization:

This [sort of intervening concept] ought not to be called a verbum, nor can [such a concept] be anything other than the act of consideration itself or a memory species formed through that act. (Summa II q. 74, p. 121)

There are, then, acts of intellect, but there are no separate inner concepts that are the objects of those acts. Call this an act theory of the verbum.

Why is this act theory superior to an object theory? One line of argument holds that the object theory “contains in itself obvious absurdities and thus contradicts sound reason” (Tractatus de verbo 6.2.2). This claim is argued in different ways, with the following dilemma often playing a crucial role: On one hand the verbum is said to be the product of intellectual cognition. But on the other hand the verbum is said to be required for cognition as the “first thing understood.” How can it be both? Olivi thinks his opponents will have to maintain that in some way the verbum is the product of one act of intellect and the object of a second. This leads him to argue that his opponents are treating the verbum as merely a memory. But Olivi is happy to countenance representations of this sort. Thus the object theory collapses into the act theory.

The second line of attack holds that the theory lacks support because “there is no necessity or utility in postulating such a verbum” (Tractatus de verbo 6.2.3). Here Olivi considers two parallel lines of argument that a proponent of the mental word might make against this charge of superfluity.

First, […] we experience in ourselves that we form in our mind new concepts of many propositions and conclusions. These concepts remain in us later and we return to them when we want to remember such propositions. […] Second, […] from individuals seen or imagined by us we abstract and form defining characterizations of their universal features […] and we come back to these when we wish to view such universal features. (Tractatus de verbo 6.2.3)

Each argument appeals to our experience of forming within ourselves abstract ideas: in the first case propositional ideas, in the second universals. Intellect in each case is said to form a verbum. Olivi replies that no such inner word is necessary. In each case we have an act of conceptual thought, but no object is formed in intellect over and above the act of thinking itself. Indeed, if anything, such an object “would be an impediment” (ibid.)—alluding to the epistemological difficulties discussed in the previous section.

By eliminating the representations that might intervene between intellect and external reality, Olivi gives us what we might be tempted to think of as a direct realist theory of intellectual cognition. Yet direct realism faces a serious problem at the intellectual level, a problem that Olivi’s discussion fails to acknowledge. Direct realism is attractive as a theory of sensation because it seems clear what the objects of sensation are. But what are we directly in touch with when our intellect thinks abstractly or propositionally? One answer to this question is Platonism: universals and/or propositions have some kind of abstract mode of existence, independently of the human mind. Like almost all the scholastics, Olivi firmly rejects this kind of account (Summa II q. 13). Another kind of answer, sometimes called conceptualism, treats universals and/or propositions as mental constructs. Defenders of the object theory can take this approach. They can hold that although there are no universals or propositions in external things (in re), there are universals and propositions in the mind (in mente). The verbum, serving as universal or as proposition, will (in some cautiously described sense) be the object of thought.

Olivi’s act theory would seem to rule out this kind of conceptualism. But what then will Olivi put in its place? He speaks of intellect’s “attending to and considering the real character of a common or specific nature” (Tractatus de verbo 6.2.3; Pasnau 1999, 271–276), as if he has an unproblematic account of intellect’s relationship to the external world. Yet he says nothing to clarify the status of this relationship. He simply does not seem to have recognized the problem of abstract knowledge as a fundamental metaphysical motivation for the object theory. In this respect his overall account, although conceptually innovative, remains fundamentally incomplete.

2.3.4 Self-Awareness and reflexivity

Olivi extensively discusses various types of self-reflexivity in his writings. He adopts the traditional idea that the intellect is capable of turning reflexively toward itself, but he also attributes certain types of reflexivity to the sensory powers of the soul and argues that the will is a reflexive power.

The most rudimentary type of self-reflexivity takes place in the sense of touch. Aristotle argues in De anima II.11 that the organ of the sense of touch is the heart and that the flesh of the body is nothing but the medium that transmits the sensations from an external object to the heart. Olivi rejects the Aristotelian theory. He thinks that the whole body functions as the organ of the sense of touch. Moreover, he argues that the body is the primary object of the sense of touch, while external objects are perceived secondarily by perceiving the harmful and beneficial changes that they cause in the body. This position leads to the obvious problem that the sense of touch seems to be a reflexive power, as it is capable of sensing the state of its own organ. Olivi recognizes this problem and gives two possible solutions: either the sense of touch which is in one place of the body senses the state of the adjacent part of the body, or the sense of touch really is capable of a certain type of reflexivity. In the latter case, Olivi argues, the sense of touch would be capable of sensing the state of its own organ but not its own act or itself as a psychological power. He does not make up his mind between these two explanations, but he clearly thinks that the sense of touch enables a certain kind of bodily self-perception. Inasmuch as every animal has the sense of touch, it follows that even the simplest animals are capable of perceiving their bodies (Summa II q. 61, pp. 575–85; Yrjönsuuri 2008a; Toivanen 2013a).

The sense of touch is not the only sensory power that is capable of reflexivity. Another such power is the so-called common sense—the highest cognitive power of the animal soul and the only internal sense Olivi acknowledges. Although he does not provide a systematic discussion of the reflexivity of the common sense, he suggests in several places that it is capable of apprehending its own activity by turning toward itself incompletely (semiplene) (Summa II q. 62, p. 595). This ability is related to the Aristotelian conception of perception of perception, but Olivi suggests something more than the traditional Aristotelian picture. Following Augustine, he argues that animals are aware of their own bodies and the purpose and value of their organs and body parts, since otherwise they would not be able to use their bodies effectively and preserve their lives:

When a dog or a snake sacrifices one of its members in order to save its head or sacrifices some part in order to save the whole, then it prefers the whole over the part and the head over the other member. Therefore, these animals must have some common power which shows both extremes simultaneously, their mutual comparison, and the preference of one over the other—although it does not do this with the same fullness and degree of reflexive judgement as does the intellect. (Summa II q. 62, p. 588)

The common sense enables animals to perceive their own bodies, the parts and their functions, and the relative value of the parts for the well-being of the animal as a whole, thus making animals capable of self-preservation that goes beyond the ability to avoid pain (see Toivanen 2013b).

The difference between intellectual self-reflexivity and the reflexivity of the common sense is based on the spiritual nature of the intellectual soul. Unlike the common sense, the intellectual mind is spiritual and immaterial and therefore capable of being directly and immediately aware of itself. Certain authors (most notably Aquinas) had argued that this kind of direct awareness is not possible because considered in itself the intellect is fully potential. It must be actualized by thinking something else before it can be cognized. By contrast, Olivi argues that the soul is directly aware of itself.

The soul knows or is able to know itself in two ways. The first of them is an experiential and as if tactile sensation by which the soul undoubtedly senses that it is, lives, cognizes, wills, sees, hears, moves the body, and likewise for its other acts, whose principle and subject it knows and senses itself to be. And this [happens] to such an extent that it cannot actually know or consider any object or any act without always knowing and sensing itself to be the subject (suppositum) of the act by which it knows and considers that [object or act] … The other way of knowing itself is by reasoning. In this way the soul investigates the genera and differences that it does not know in the first way. (Summa II q. 76, pp. 146–47)

By separating these two types of knowledge that the soul or mind has of itself, Olivi is in a position to explain why we do not have certain knowledge of the nature of the soul. The direct awareness tells us only that the soul lives and acts, but in order to know the essence of the soul, we must compare this immediate awareness to our knowledge of the species and genera of the things in the world, and this process is not infallible (Putallaz 1991; Brower-Toland 2013).

The highest level of reflexivity, however, is found in the will, because only the will is capable of moving itself to action. In order to be free, the will has to be able to move itself in such a way that it can also refrain from moving itself. It has this ability because it is related to itself as a mover to a moved thing: “Insofar as the will is free, it has another kind of reflexivity upon itself which the intellect lacks: for, the will is turned toward itself not only as to an object, but also as a mover to a moved thing” (Summa II q. 51, p. 115). In fact, the reflexivity of the intellect is based on the will’s ability to direct other powers of the soul. (Summa II q. 57, pp. 364–66; ibid., q. 58, pp. 421–23.) Usually human beings are able to control themselves by their will, and this ability is what makes them persons. Reflexivity of the will plays a crucial role in the process, as we can see from a passage in which Olivi explains how sleep affects the psychological processes of the soul:

Sometimes the attention of the superior part of the soul is in such a state that it is able to invent and form various things with respect to the cognitive powers and, similarly, to refuse and approve with respect to appetitive powers; then it is said to deliberate and combine, to consent and choose. And nevertheless it does not move to these acts freely, as it does when awake, because it moves itself to these acts in such a way that it does not have a power to move itself otherwise. (Summa II q. 59, p. 564)

Experience shows that the will can act also when a person is asleep, as we often make choices in our dreams. But because the reflexivity of the will is hindered, it does not make these choices freely. In this way, the ability to move the will to its acts is the crucial factor that makes us free, and our personhood is dependent on the highest type of reflexivity, which ensures that our choices and actions originate in us.

3. Practical Philosophy

3.1 Ethics

3.1.1 Virtue ethics

Like most medieval authors, Olivi can be understood as a virtue ethicist. As with many of them, however, he does not defend virtue ethics in its strict Aristotelian guise. To begin with, he criticizes the Thomistic position, according to which some moral virtues are in the sensory part of the soul, but he is also critical of Bonaventure, who held that virtues belong to the free choice (liberum arbitrium) and thus include both the will and the intellect. Instead, Olivi places all virtues, including prudence, firmly in the will. Other powers of the soul may participate in these virtues due to their connection to the will, but apart from this connection they have no real virtues (Kent 1995, 233–36; Summa III q. 4, pp. 224–25, 231). Virtues, on Olivi’s account, are stable dispositions (or habits, habitus) of the will, which are generated by repeated actions, and they make good choices easier for the agent (Summa II q. 58, p. 432).

Moreover, Olivi is careful to secure the freedom and autonomy of the will even against its own dispositions: virtues and vices do not determine our choices. A virtuous person is more likely to make good choices than a vicious one, but ultimately every choice is always up to the will (Bobiller 2020, 155–56), and the agent can always act against her virtuous or vicious dispositions. Olivi emphasizes that this kind of freedom is a necessary condition for being morally responsible of one’s actions: “Where the freedom of the will is missing, there is absolutely no ground for merit and demerit” (Summa II q. 57, 337). Another important aspect of Olivi’s virtue ethics is that he plays down the role of external action and focuses instead on the will of the agent: the moral value of our actions stems from the internal intention and the free decision to perform those actions (see, e.g. Summa II q. 113, p. 307; ibid., q. 118, p. 443; Normore 2004, p. 144).

Due to the emphasis on the freedom of the will and the internal intention, the individual moral agent is at the center of Olivi’s ethics. In particular, his notions of person and personhood are ethically significant, as they comprise two properties that make human beings moral agents: awareness of oneself as the subject and origin of one’s actions and choices, and freedom of the will. The moral agent, for Olivi, is first and foremost a free person, an autonomous individual, who is aware of her own actions as something that originates in her and who must judge the moral worth of her choices by herself (Bobillier 2020, 27–137). In order to make this judgement, the agent must be able to reflect her own (past, present, future) choices against the objective normative order that is the natural law/will of God, which they know via innate conscience and “experiential taste” that explains the affective aspect of moral knowledge (Bobillier 2020, 144–67; Summa II qq. 81–82).

Olivi’s radical voluntarism leads him also to treat Aristotelian akrasia in a special way: literally as weakness of the will that explains why the agent chooses agains his better knowledge. Genuine cases of akrasia (in which the person is not making an intellectual error, e.g., due to the influence of emotions) exist and they reveal the fundamental nature of the will, namely, that its freedom is not bound by intellectual judgments or emotional outbursts (Kent 1984, 184–205; Bobillier 2020, 239, 252–60). Olivi argues explicitly against the view he takes to be Aristotle’s, namely that the conclusion of the practical syllogism is action or necessarily turns into action. He emphasizes that since the will is absolutely free, the conclusion of the practical syllogism must be accepted by the will before it turns into action, and the will can always reject the conclusion, thus leading the agent to reconsider the situation at hand. Moreover, he thinks that when an akratic person chooses to perform a morally wrong action, he may be fully aware that it is against the moral law. In Olivi’s view, human beings are able to consider one and the same action from many angles at the same time; they can think simultaneously several universal premises and combine them freely with the particular premise, thus reaching contrary conclusions: this act of fornication is both morally blameworthy and pleasant, and I am free to choose whether I go for it or not (Summa II qq. 85–86, 186–91; ibid., q. 57, pp. 309–10; see Toivanen 2012).

Thus, an akratic person knows actually that what he is about to do is a sin, but his knowledge is theoretical and lacks the experiential affective aspect. By contrast, he finds the sinful action pleasant because his thought concerning it has this aspect to it (Bobillier 2020, 257–58; Summa II q. 86, p. 193). To be sure, even this experiential mode of thinking does not determine the will, and thus an akratic can always decide to do otherwise, and he is fully responsible for his choice. Olivi criticizes the Aristotelian theory for taking away the responsibility due to a momentary lack of understanding, caused by emotion (see e.g. Bobillier 2020, pp. 254–56). In the end, there is no other explanation for bad choices except that the person wills to make them.

One central difference between Olivi’s and Aristotle’s approaches to virtue ethics is that while the latter thinks that a person’s moral character determines how he acts after the practical reasoning is done, Olivi argues that there always remains a choice. Although one’s moral character may statistically guide him to choose a certain type of action, Olivi’s focus is more on the actual choice, which is in all cases completely free. Moral education and habituation may improve one’s ability to make morally good choices, but ultimately moral improvement is a matter of simply starting to do the right thing instead of wrong one. Thus, Olivi is a virtue ethicist but his virtue ethics is of a different breed than Aristotle’s.

3.1.2 Unity of virtues

One question that late thirteenth-century authors discussed was related to the unity of the virtues. It was prompted by Augustine’s critique of the Stoic position as well as by Cicero’s De officiis (Kent 1984, pp. 523–25), and it received a new impetus with Aristotle’s argument that a virtuous person necessarily has all virtues of character because prudence is necessary for each genuine virtue, and prudence in turn entails all other virtues (EN 6.12–13). The idea is roughly that a prudent person can grasp what is the best course of action all things considered, and this requires finding a correct balance that meets the requirements of all virtues: one who acts bravely must also act justly because unjust bravery is not a real virtue.

Many medieval philosophers accepted this view, but not all, and towards the end of the thirteenth century critical voices were raised; Olivi seems to be one of the first to reject it completely. He thinks that it is possible to have one virtue while lacking others, and his strategy to ward off the Aristotelian theory is to argue that prudence itself is not one monolithic whole. Even if prudence turns out to be necessary for every moral virtue, it is possible to possess only the part of prudence that is proper to one particular virtue:

[…] as moral virtue contains many virtues that differ from each other by their genera and species, so prudence contains many prudences or many partial dispositions. (Summa III q. 6, p. 277)

It is possible to, e.g., exercise moderation with respect to food and drink and yet be covetous and amass money without limits, and the prudence that aids the agent to exercise moderation does not necessarily convince him of the viciousness of covetousness. Virtues are essentially independent of each other. However, Olivi acknowledges the unity of virtues in the sense that in order to become a fully virtuous person, one must acquire all specific virtues. A virtuous agent functions as the unifying factor (Wood 1997, pp. 51–53).

Moreover, Olivi thinks that virtues may support each other in practical life. In particular, he argues that voluntary poverty is not only one of the virtues but actually the highest virtue (QPE q. 8, p. 85). It is not suitable for everyone but only for those who are able to follow Franciscan ideals. However, for the latter it proves to be essential as it leads to a host of other virtues such as chastity, fortitude, generosity, magnanimity—and to humility, which Olivi considers as abandonment of oneself and submission to the will of God (Bobillier 2020, 193–222). In contrast to humility, wrongly directed self-love and pride are the sources of all vices (Bobillier 2020, pp. 217–21, pp. 236–52).

3.2 Political Philosophy

3.2.1 Poverty

Although Olivi did not leave behind systematic treatises on political philosophy, his works touched upon several politically loaded theological and philosophical ideas. In particular, he played a central role in the controversy over how rigorously to understand the Franciscan vow of poverty, which would have a lasting effect on medieval political reality (Burr 1989, 2001). Although the controversy centered on Franciscan poverty and was thus strongly motivated by theological worries and Church politics, it is not difficult to see that it has several philosophical dimensions to it. For instance, it has been argued that the modern conception of subjective rights was first developed in the debate between the Franciscan order and the pope over the correct interpretation of poverty and the vow (see, e.g., van Duffel 2010).

Franciscans held that the vow of poverty requires renouncing ownership (dominium), but that using products owned by someone else (e.g., the Church) does not violate the vow. However, the question that divided them in the latter half of the thirteenth century was whether the vow requires that, even when merely using the goods of another, one adheres to strict standards of austerity, the so-called “poor use” (usus pauper). Olivi insisted on these strict standards but claimed that they are part of the vow only indeterminately. This means first that not every violation is a mortal sin, provided that one’s general tendency is to strive for spiritual humility by living poorly. It also means that what exactly counts as poor use depends on the circumstances and situation, since it is impossible to find a precise and fixed line between poor and lax use of commodities. In other words, Olivi admitted a certain latitude and flexibility in this notion (Burr 2001, pp. 51–53).

Another central idea for Olivi was that one should not obey one’s superiors if obeying their commands entails sinful action or the violation of the Franciscan vow, thus endangering one’s salvation. Given Olivi’s flexible view of the scope of the poor use, this last restriction makes the limit between the duties of obedience and disobedience vague. Each individual friar must judge in his own conscience whether he should obey or disobey (and ultimately protest) the commands of their superiors. It is not surprising that Olivi’s theoretical model of the vow, in conjunction with the potential for disobedience, fueled the political controversy within the Franciscan order and the Church (Burr 2001, pp. 64–65).

From a philosophical perspective, one of the most important aspects of Olivi’s view is the connection between the freedom of the will and the evangelical vow’s renunciation of ownership understood as dominion (dominium). The idea that ownership is a form of dominion stems from a more general theory according to which freedom of the will can be understood as a dominion that one has over one’s will. This dominion is extended to one’s body and external actions, and ultimately to external goods. Olivi thinks that the Franciscan vow means not only giving up the dominion over external goods but also over one’s own actions (obedience) and ultimately one’s own freedom, as it means subjection to the will of God. Yet, when someone voluntarily subjects his will to God, he paradoxically proclaims his ultimate freedom: the vow must be continuously renewed. The choice to give up the freedom of the will is a voluntary choice that is freely given every moment as long as one keeps to the vow (QPE, q. 8, p. 169; QPE, q. 14, p. 135; Piron 1996; Toivanen 2016a).

3.2.2 The nature of political power

One of the most important texts where Olivi deals with political philosophy is his Quid ponat ius (= Summa IV q. 1). His aim in this text is to provide a theoretical foundation for his discussion on the sacraments, and he considers it useful to start with a detailed analysis of the ontology of political power and property rights. Although it has been pointed out that Olivi seems to prefer a mixed form of government (Blythe 1992, pp. 151–52), this particular text does not aim at offering a political theory; it is a philosophical exercise in social ontology, which centers on a question concerning the ontological foundation of relational terms such as ‘right’ (ius), ‘authority’ (auctoritas), ‘power’ (potestas), ‘obligation’ (obligatio), and ‘property right’ (proprietas). (For discussion, see Piron 1996, 2016; Rode 2014, 2016; Toivanen 2016a.)

Olivi develops his view in relation to two opposing views. According to the first view, there must be something real in the end-terms of these relations because otherwise they would not be real: “a relation that posits nothing in the related things is only a relation according to what is said (relatio secundum dici) […] but it is clear that the power of a king, or any real jurisdiction, or obligation, or subordination of some people are really actual even when none of us thinks or talks about them” (Summa IV q. 1, par. 7). The second view holds that relational properties such as dominium are radically different from natural properties, and that no ontological change takes place when, for instance, someone is crowned a king. Olivi seeks for a position between these two views, and he finds one when he argues that relations of this kind are based on rationes reales (see § 2.1). They are real relations in the sense that they do not depend on someone actually thinking of them but they do not entail any real (Aristotelian) ontological addition to the relata.

The relation that a ruler has to the subjects is a form of dominion, and it it principally related to the will of the ruler:

Therefore, since this kind of power does not add anything intrinsic to the person of the king, it can relate to the whole person of the king in such a way that it will not determinately relate to any of his powers, unless it perhaps relates to the free will (liberum arbitrium) and the powers that are bound to it, insofar as they are such. (Summa IV q. 1, par. 53)

Coronation extends the dominion of the king over his subjects, and this is due to the human ability to change the normative reality by establishing new relations between human beings, between human beings and property, and so forth (Rode 2014, pp. 377–78). Although the normative reality ultimately depends on the will of God and natural law (Rode 2016, pp. 117–19), the human will plays an important role in the detailed explanation of how it works.

3.2.3 Economic theory

In addition to his philosophical and theological ambitions, Olivi took part in a theoretical discussion concerning economic justice. He composed a short treatise Tractatus de contractibus (ed. Piron 2012) while he was working at the Franciscan studium generale of Narbonne in mid-1290s. The work is a theoretical treatise that is related to the moral dimension of economic activities and it was probably occasioned by pastoral duties that Franciscan friars had in an urban context. Although Olivi’s views can be traced back to earlier discussions on Roman and Canon law, as well as other works dealing with just price, scholars have also argued that his overall approach profoundly changed medieval economic theory (Kaye 1998, 2014; Langholm 1992, 1998; Piron 2012; Todeschini 2009; a more critical evaluation is Kirshner and Lo Prete 1984).

In De contractibus Olivi discusses several topics related to the morality of economic activity, such as contracts, commerce, usury, value, and capital. The first question of the treatise serves as an illustrative example of his general approach to economics. It focuses on the notion of just price, which Olivi analyzes with the intention of setting normative limits that regulate but do not completely prevent economic activity. As in Quid ponat ius, he proposes a theory that reconciles two sets of opposing arguments. According to the first set of arguments, a voluntary contract between a buyer and a seller suffices to establish a just price. The price the parties freely agree upon is just, because any other way of setting the just price would make commercial activities liable to immorality. Without full knowledge of the just price, the buyer and the seller might accidentally deviate from it and thus sin. By contrast, the second set of arguments aims to prove that there must be objectively determinable limits for the just price. Otherwise there might be a situation in which someone charges an extremely high price for a glass of water, and one who is dying of thirst pays it voluntarily, thereby making the price just. Thus, all deviations from the objectively just price are against the principles of justice.

Olivi treats just price in a similar way as usus pauper: it cannot be a pre-fixed and universally applicable single point but there must be some amount of latitude and flexibility to it. He adopts the Aristotelian idea of virtuous action as a middle-point between two opposing vices: just as virtue is not a fixed middle that can be known a priori but depends on the context and situation, so just price has limits but is open to variation due to various contextual factors. (Piron 2012, p. 45.) There are normative limits for the just price—for instance, vital needs may force the buyer to agree on a price that is unjust, but the seller should refrain from asking more than a fair price. Yet, the flexibility of the limits of just price leave room for economic activity and allow merchants to profit, and within these limits the participants agree on the price freely. Olivi also submits that if neither party deceives the other and both enter the transaction freely (no compelling circumstances obtain), one may even give away one’s commodities for free.

Olivi provides more detailed set of criteria for determining the limits of just price in various situations in scholastic literature (Kaye 2014, p. 114). Among these criteria are the obvious quality of the commodity, the materials and the amount of work needed to produce it, and rarity, but also individual desires and personal values (De contractibus 1.1, pp. 98–102; Toivanen 2016b). Further, he argues that the just price is affected by social factors such as common estimation and common needs, and that ultimately economic activity exists for the sake of the common good of the community (Tractatus de contractibus 1.2, pp. 108–10). In this way, Olivi’s analysis reflects the fact that medieval economic discourse was fundamentally normative and related to moral theology—unlike contemporary economics, which is more descriptive and lacks the normative dimension (Piron 2012).


Primary Sources

A comprehensive list of critical editions of Olivi’s works has been published in König-Pralong, Ribordy, and Suarez-Nani (eds.), 2010, 463–71. The list below contains works cited in the present entry, as well as a selection of his philosophically most important works.

  • “De perlegendis philosophorum libris,” ed. F. Delorme, Antonianum 16 (1941): 37–44.
  • “Epistola ad fratrem R.,” ed. S. Piron et al., Archivum Franciscanum Historicum 91 (1998): 33–64. [Correspondence related to the 1283 condemnation.]
  • “Impugnatio quorundam articulorum Arnaldi Galliardi, art. 19,” ed. S. Piron, in Pierre de Jean Olivi—Philosophe et théologien (Berlin: De Gruyter, 2010), 453–62.
  • Lectura super Apocalypsim, ed. W. Lewis (St. Bonaventure: Franciscan Institute, 2016).
  • Lectura super Proverbia et Lectura super Ecclesiasten, ed. J. Schlageter (Grottaferrata: Editiones Collegii S. Bonaventurae, 2003).
  • Peter of John Olivi on Genesis, ed. D. Flood (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 2007). [Latin edition.]
  • Peter of John Olivi on the Acts of the Apostles, ed. D. Flood (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 2001). [Latin edition.]
  • Peter of John Olivi on the Bible, ed. D. Flood & G. Gál (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 1997). [Latin edition.]
  • “Petri Iohannis Olivi Tractatus de verbo,” ed. R. Pasnau, Franciscan Studies (Essays in Honor of Fr. Gedeon Gál) 53 (1993) 121–53. [Excerpt from the Commentary on the Gospel of John. Published in 1997.]
  • Quaestio de usu paupere and Tractatus de usu paupere, ed. D. Burr (Florence: Olschki, 1992). [Olivi’s strict and therefore controversial views on how to understand the Franciscan vow of poverty.]
  • Quaestiones de incarnatione et redemptione. Quaestiones de virtutibus, ed. A. Emmen and E. Stadter (Grottaferrata: Editiones Collegii S. Bonaventurae, 1981). [Latin edition of Summa Bk. III.]
  • Quaestiones de novissimis ex Summa super IV sententiarum, ed. P. Maranesi (Grottaferrata: Editiones Collegii S. Bonaventurae, 2004). [Latin edition of some questions from Summa Bk. IV.]
  • Quaestiones de perfectione evangelica q. 8: “An status altissimae paupertatis sit simpliciter melior omni statu divitiarum,” ed. J. Schlageter, Das Heil der Armen und das Verderben der Reichen: Petrus Johannis Olivi OFM: Die Frage nach der höchsten Armut, 73–210 (Werl: Dietrich-Coelde, 1989). [= QPE]
  • Quaestiones in primum librum Sententiarum, in Quaestiones in secundum librum Sententiarum (Volume 3, Appendix), ed. B. Jansen (Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1926). [= Summa I]
  • Quaestiones in secundum librum Sententiarum (Bibliotheca Franciscana Scholastica 4–6), ed. B. Jansen (Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1922–26). [= Summa II] [Latin edition of Summa Bk. II. Includes selected questions from Bk. I.]
  • Quaestiones logicales, ed. S. Brown, Traditio 42 (1986) 335–88.
  • Quid ponat ius vel dominium, ed. F. Delorme and S. Piron, Oliviana 5 (2016), available online [= Summa IV q. 1]
  • Quodlibeta quinque, ed. S. Defraia (Grottaferrata: Editiones Collegii S. Bonaventurae ad Claras Aquas, 2002).
  • Tractatus de contractibus, in Pierre de Jean Olivi, Traité des contrats, ed. & trans. S. Piron. Bibliothèque scolastique 5 (Paris, Les Belles-Lettres, 2012).
  • “Tria scripta apologetica,” ed. D. Laberge, Archivum Franciscanum Historicum 28 (1935) 115–55, 374–407. [Edits Olivi’s responses to the charges brought against him in 1283.]


  • Commentary on the Gospel of Mark, trans. R.J. Karris (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 2011).
  • “De perlegendis philosophorum libris,” trans. C. König-Pralong, O. Ribordy & T. Suarez-Nani, in Pierre de Jean Olivi—Philosophe et théologien (Berlin: De Gruyter, 2010), 409–50.
  • La matière, trans. T. Suarez-Nani et al. (Paris: Vrin, 2009). [French translation of Summa II, qq. 16–21.]
  • Quelle réalite construit le droit ou le pouvoir? Trans. S. Piron, Oliviana 2016. [French translation of Quid ponat ius.]
  • Questions sur la foi: Traduction des questions VIII et IX de virtutibus, trans. N. Faucher (Paris: Vrin, 2021). [French translation of selected questions from Summa III.]
  • “The Mental Word” (= Tractatus de verbo), in R. Pasnau (tr.) Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts. Volume 3: Mind and Knowledge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002) 136–51.
  • “The Sum of Questions on The Sentences [of Peter Lombard],” trans. D. Flood & O. Bychkov, Franciscan Studies, 66 (2008), pp. 83–99. [English translation of Summa I q. 1.]
  • Treatise on Contracts, trans. R. Thornton & M. Cusato (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute Publications, 2016). [English translation of Tractatus de contractibus.]
  • “Why the Human Soul Cannot Be the Form of the Body” (= Summa II q. 51), in Basic Issues in Medieval Philosophy, ed. R. N. Bosley & M. M. Tweedale (Peterborough: Broadview Press, 2006).

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