Parenthood and Procreation

First published Thu Jan 26, 2012; substantive revision Wed Mar 31, 2021

The ethics of parenthood and procreation apply not only to daily acts of decision-making by parents and prospective procreators, but also to law, public policy, and medicine. Two recent social and technological shifts make this topic especially pressing. First, changing family demographics mean that children are increasingly reared in blended families, by single parents, or by same-sex partners, prompting questions of who should be considered a child’s parent and what good parenting requires. Second, the development and proliferation of “Assisted Reproductive Technology” (ART) raises questions concerning access to the technology, its permissibility, and its use to enhance future children or prevent the birth of children with certain conditions. Recent debate in ethics and political philosophy has focused on the following questions:

  • Are there any procreative rights? If so, what are they? What, if anything, limits them? When, if at all, is it morally permissible to procreate? What may procreators permissibly aim at in choosing characteristics of potential children? What are the moral constraints on the means of procreation?

  • What are the grounds of parenthood? In what respects is parenthood a biological or natural relationship, and in what respects a social or conventional one?

  • What are the scope and limits of parental rights and responsibilities? What must parents provide for their children? How should their parental responsibilities weigh against other obligations? What should parents be allowed to do, and when may, or must, public agencies intervene? What, if anything, does society owe parents? What do co-parents owe each other?

In the following entry, we divide these questions into three sequential stages: the ethics of procreation (creating a child), to which we devote two sections, and then becoming parents (acquiring parental rights and responsibilities) and being parents (holding and discharging parental rights and responsibilities).

1. Foundations

A parent is someone with weighty rights and responsibilities regarding a given child. Parents usually have decision-making rights over most areas of their child’s life and rights to exclude others from making such decisions. So long as parents fulfill requirements to nourish, educate, and provide healthcare for their children, they may make many decisions over how and what their child eats, dresses, plays, studies, and with whom he or she interacts. Section 5 surveys controversies regarding the content of these rights and responsibilities.

“Parenthood” has distinct senses: biological, social, legal, and moral. These categories present problems at the margins. While the idea of a biological parent seems self-evident, modern reproductive technology complicates it, as a child can have genetic parents (gamete providers, who supply the sperm or egg) and a third, gestational, parent. Each of these is a biological parent, by virtue of making a biological contribution to producing the child. The recent technology of mitochondrial replacement therapy, in which the nucleus of a fertilized egg is transferred to a second egg for medical reasons, introduces further complications, as additional genetic material—mitochondrial DNA—is supplied by the donor egg cell.

Biological parents are commonly distinguished from social parents, who rear the child and are socially perceived as responsible for it. Adoptive parents, or parents who rear children created with donated gametes and gestated by a third party, are social, but not biological, parents. (Biological parents need not be social parents, as biological parents give up children for adoption, donate gametes, or work as gestational parents.) The category of social parent presents borderline cases when a given community does not socially recognize those rearing a child as parents. This might occur with a mother’s unmarried partner, two friends rearing children together, other relatives like grandparents rearing the child, or when a community participates in child-rearing. Legal and moral criteria for the acquisition of parental rights and responsibilities should clearly designate whom society should recognize as having them.

Legal parenthood consists in possessing legal parental rights and responsibilities. Historically, in the US, a pregnant woman’s husband has been presumed to be her child’s legal father: marriage, not biology, underpins the legal relation. This has faced legal challenges from genetic fathers (Rosenman 1995; see Hubin 2003 on fatherhood). Law in different jurisdictions is also increasingly recognizing legal parental rights on the basis of same-sex marriage. The rise of ART has prompted many questions regarding assignment of legal parenthood when there are contending claims—as between a couple who commissioned a contract pregnancy and the contracting gestational parent. They have also stretched the understanding of parenthood, as when the Ontario Court of Appeal recognized three legal parents (A.A. v. B.B., 2007 ONCA 2)—a lesbian couple and sperm donor. The wider use of ART and gamete donation, along with broader recognition of same-sex marriage and changing social attitudes towards polyamory, have led some philosophers to argue for rethinking the family to include more than two social and legal parents, on grounds including child welfare, social justice, and environmental impact (see, e.g., Cutas 2011, Shrage 2018, Gheaus 2019, Grill 2020).

Legal, social, and biological parenthood can be conceptually distinguished; however, parenthood is arguably fundamentally a moral relationship, and its moral grounds and obligations should be considered in resolving the borderline cases. Moral parenthood is possession of moral parental rights and responsibilities. These may differ in content from legal rights and responsibilities—we might think parents morally ought to do more than they are legally required to do, for example. The moral grounds for assigning parental rights can also differ from their legal assignment. Of course, legal assignment of parenthood may trigger moral obligations, due to a general moral obligation to obey the law or because the legal parent is best-placed to rear the child. But moral theories of parenthood give independent grounds for parental rights, on the basis of which particular legal arrangements may be criticized.

The interrelation of legal, moral, social, and biological parenthood depends on the particular moral theory of how one becomes a parent. For example, on a genetic account, biology determines moral parental status, whereas on an intentional account, biology will be less morally salient. Section 4 reviews these theories.

2. Procreative Autonomy

20th-century international human rights documents explicitly codify the right “to marry and found a family” (United Nations 1948, Article 16), and thus some writers argue that liberal constitutions implicitly enshrine a right to procreate (Hill 1991). A right to procreate could be construed negatively or positively. As a negative right, it would be a right against coercive interference in decisions regarding procreation. As a positive right, it would be an entitlement to assistance in procreation.

This entry does not consider abortion. Although positions on procreative autonomy are not independent of positions on abortion, the extensive philosophical debate about abortion must be dealt with independently. The issue of contraception can be touched on briefly here. While some religious views oppose contraception, this position is not widely defended in philosophical ethics. However, philosophical debate has recently emerged over “conscientious objections” by pharmacists. In some jurisdictions, pharmacists opposing abortion have a legal right to refuse to dispense emergency contraception, on the (medically controversial) basis that it acts as an abortifacient. This right has been defended on the grounds that pharmacists’ freedom of conscience outweighs the inconvenience to women (if they can obtain the drug elsewhere). Others have argued that such refusals constitute serious harms to women, not mere inconveniences, and that similar objections would not be permitted in non-procreative cases, such as a vegetarian pharmacist who refused to dispense materials tested on animals (LaFollette and LaFollette 2007; Fenton and Lomasky 2005; McLeod 2010; Kelleher 2010; McLeod 2020).

2.1 Defenses of a right to procreate

A negative moral right to procreate—also discussed under the label of “reproductive liberty” or “procreative liberty”—may be grounded in autonomy rights to control one’s body and make certain important decisions for oneself (Dworkin 1993). Violations could involve direct physical coercion such as rape or forced abortion or sterilization, or coercive interference with decisions regarding sexual activity or contraception. Involuntary physical interventions such as forced contraception, sterilization, or abortion were practiced in twentieth-century eugenic movements. Their wrongness is now generally acknowledged, but critics see continuity between such racist policies and contemporary moderately coercive policies such as making contraceptive implants the condition of medical aid for impoverished women, particularly for women of color (see Roberts 1997).

A right to procreate may also be grounded in the strong interest people have in creating a child, giving birth, and parenting (Robertson 1994). Because this justification does not concern a right to use one’s body, but to realize the important interest in creating and rearing a child, it can be taken to imply a positive (as well as a negative) right to procreate. Such a positive right could also entail a claim to sufficient environmental resources to raise children justly (Gheaus 2016a; Roberts 2015) or to funding for ART (Robertson 1994). Given that a distinct right to parent could be met through adoption, some suggest that financial barriers to ART where children are available for adoption would be justified (De Wispelaere and Weinstock 2014). Others have criticized the way that focusing on a right to procreate perpetuates the “biogenetic bias” that favors genetic ties over social ones (Boucai 2016) or challenged the idea that the value of establishing a parenting relationship can ground a right to create someone with the special vulnerabilities of children to their parents (Hannan and Leland 2018).

Liberal theory has tended to support some sort of right to procreative autonomy. At its strongest, the “repro-libertarian” approach opposes regulations on reproductive decisions and ART unless they can be shown to threaten harm to others. Repro-libertarianism is grounded in the values of individual equality and autonomy (Feinberg 1986; Dworkin 1993). The basic thought is that interfering in procreation involves illiberal interference with the person and her choices. Further, some authors hold that ART ought to be universally available provided it does not harm others, because any restrictions would constitute unequal treatment of those who cannot conceive through sexual intercourse (whether due to infertility or because they do not form a “traditional” family) (Harris 1998).

Repro-libertarians have been concerned to show that assumptions about the inherent wrongness or harmfulness of ART are not justified. In particular, they have argued that conservative opposition to cloning, genetic selection, surrogacy, and harvesting fetal ovarian tissue is based in undefended traditionalism (Harris 1998; cf. Glover 1998; Buchanan et al. 2000, chap. 2).

2.2 Conservative perspectives on procreative autonomy

Communitarian conservative approaches to procreative liberty tend to regard procreation as part of a dense web of practices that gain their meaning and value from being part of a comprehensive way of life. Efforts to increase procreative autonomy—particularly through biotechnology—risk meddling with such ways of life (Sandel 2007). Thus, communitarian conservatives view ART with suspicion. The 20th-century record of Nazi “eugenics” programs, forced abortion as a population-control mechanism, and widespread nonconsensual sterilization in many countries, including the United States, is adduced as support for pessimism about technological, policy-driven, or self-indulgent interventions in procreation (Meilaender 1987).

Communitarian conservatives typically oppose the use of ART. They also criticize talk of rights in discussion of procreation and parent-child relations. As Murray writes: “Procreative liberty’s problems began when it appropriated the abstract principle—the right to choose—and ripped it out of the rich context that provided its moral heft” (Murray 2002, 42).

Communitarian conservatives need not deny that persons have a strong interest in autonomy regarding procreative decisions. The point is that this interest is both generated and delimited by a particular communal context. They believe there is no right to reproductive autonomy, because reproductive choices gain their meaning and value from this context.

Some philosophers argue for limiting the moral right to procreate to married or long-term male-female couples on harm-based grounds (Almond 2006). Some claim that same-sex and single parenting harm children. While the empirical debate cannot be addressed here, there seems to be a lack of evidence that same-sex parenting harms children. For example, an American Sociological Association review finds a “clear consensus in the social science literature” that children of same-sex parents are no worse off than children of different-sex parents (see Manning et al., 2014). In any case, since evidence suggests that high-conflict families or divorce can harm children, such arguments risk inconsistency if not applied to male-female couples at risk of divorce or sub-par parenting.

2.3 Feminist perspectives on procreative autonomy

Feminist perspectives on procreative autonomy are diverse, but they share a commitment to opposing patriarchy and promoting people’s (particularly women’s) abilities to determine the shape of their own lives, where this includes sexual and reproductive autonomy. While some feminists also take communitarian, repro-libertarian, or more nuanced liberal perspectives, other feminists criticize those approaches. One general theme of feminist criticism is that mainstream procreative ethics often employs abstractions which obscure the impact of policies on women’s bodies, as well as the real-world context of socio-economic pressures (e.g., Overall 2012). Much feminist work, then, begins with women’s embodied experience in pregnancy, as caregivers, and as subject to distinct, gendered, social and economic pressures (e.g., Mullin 2005; Satz 2010; Gheaus 2016b).

The feminist concern to enable women to control their own lives and bodies suggests sympathy with the repro-libertarians’ focus on autonomy and equality. But many feminists are skeptical of the reproductive biotechnology establishment, which remains preponderantly white, upper-middle class, male, and corporate. Hence feminists have charged that repro-libertarianism would exacerbate existing power inequalities (Corea 1985; Sherwin 1987, 1992; Rothman 1989; Dodds and Jones 1989a; Baron 2019). While this establishment represents itself as empowering women, many feminists charge that it succeeds only in disempowering them: it conscripts poorer women into service for people who are usually wealthier; it creates new expectations that may subtly coerce women to pursue fertility treatments or other medical interventions; and it inevitably reflects the cultural, economic, sexist, and racist biases of the society at large (Brazier 1998; Roberts 1997).

Some feminists have also raised the concern that any putative right to procreate threatens to give men power over women. In addition to empowering the mostly male scientific establishment, a right to procreate could empower a man to prevent his erstwhile partner from aborting her pregnancy (Overall 1993). Thus the importance of a right not to procreate has led many feminists to place the various strands of procreative autonomy within a nexus of interests.

Critiques of the concept of procreative autonomy as misleading or empty rhetoric reflect a larger feminist project critical of autonomy construed as individual choice: within an inegalitarian social and economic system, some feminists argue, pressures on choice will ensure that supposedly free choices disadvantage women (e.g. Dodds and Jones, 1989a). This is particularly problematic when the medical establishment presents burdensome technologies as the expected norm. Choices are shaped by the salient alternatives, so that the widespread adoption of new medical technologies will affect women’s choices (as the normalization of testing for Downs’ syndrome shapes women’s choice to undergo such testing). The point is not that adopting new technology is always problematic, but that the repro-libertarian framework for evaluating it is naïve and misleading (Sherwin 1992; see also 3.5 below, State Policies). These concerns extend to the way in which reproductive policy and technologies shape, and are shaped by, race as well as gender (Roberts 1997; Russell 2018).

A further feminist concern is that the rhetoric surrounding reproductive biotechnology commodifies women’s bodies, devalues women’s role in reproduction, and treats women as mere means rather than ends in themselves. For instance, some reproductive services entail so-called “womb rental,” “egg harvesting,” or “surrogate motherhood” (Rothman 1989; Ber 2000; Anderson 1990; Baron 2019). Feminists such as Corea argue that the reproductive biotechnology establishment relies on a distorted and stereotyped picture of the nature, desires, and needs of women, as well as the success rate of the technologies it purveys, and that these technologies result in physical harms to women (Corea 1985; Brazier 1998).

By conceptualizing women and their fetuses or newborns as having conflicting interests, rather than as in symbiotic harmony (as they usually are), the medical establishment promotes an adversarial view which lends itself to overriding pregnant women’s treatment decisions. Such interventions, such as court-ordered C-sections, are especially problematic when similar interventions would not be imposed on parents to save a born child’s life (such as a court-ordered blood transfusion); this inconsistency suggests a bias against pregnant women’s decision-making capacity. Understandings of pregnancy and motherhood, feminists argue, need to be enriched by considering women’s experience of pregnancy and moving away from an antagonistic medical model, as well as appreciating how that model has been socially constructed (Purdy 1990; Kukla 2005; Mullin 2005).

Feminist care ethics, which early on took the mother-child relationship as the model of caring (e.g., Held 1987), has provided a rich conceptual resource for feminist procreative ethics. The influence of care ethics can be seen, for example, in arguments which foreground the value of intimate mother-fetus relationships in examining the moral basis of parenthood and the legitimacy of contract pregnancy (e.g., Gheaus 2016b). In light of the challenge to traditional understandings of parenthood posed by new ARTs, Mary Lyndon Shanley has argued for caregiving as the ground of moral parenthood (Shanley 2018).

Finally, much feminist scholarship has focused on the unequal division of labor between parents within the household and its effect on girls’ life chances, and hence on the state’s role in addressing this gendered division of parenting labor and defining the legal institution of the family (Okin 1989, Card 1996, Schouten 2019; see also 3.5 below). Feminist perspectives appear throughout the discussion below. (See also the entry on feminist perspectives on the family.)

2.4 Anti-natalism

A further set of objections to the unburdened exercise of procreative autonomy is anti-natalist. Anti-natalism is opposition to procreation. In its local form anti-natalism applies only to particular people in certain instances. In the case where a child would predictably experience a life so miserable as to be not worth living, it may be argued that procreation would be wrongful. Whether there are such lives—and if so, what characterizes them—is controversial, but it is not unreasonable to suppose that a life can be so irremediably miserable that it is of no benefit to the individual who endures it. Arguably, the lives of those born with Tay-Sachs disease fit this description, and many argue that it is immoral to knowingly bring such children into the world. Some authors go much further than this, arguing that procreating is wrong unless the parent has reason to think he or she can provide the child with a good chance of a normal life. The general claim is that certain types of individuals have an interest in not being brought into existence on account of the quality of life they would have were they created (McMahon 1998; Roberts 1998). ARTs allowing post-menopausal women to give birth have prompted objections to post-menopausal motherhood on grounds of child welfare; but such arguments seem to employ double standards (see Cutas 2007). Cassidy holds that prospective parents who believe they will not be sufficiently competent should not procreate (Cassidy 2006). Relatedly, Benatar argues that autonomy rights cannot permit risking severe harm to children; those who risk transmitting HIV, for instance, cannot assert a right to reproduce (Benatar 2010). Local anti-natalism is also supported by the judgment that wrongful birth, birth which wrongfully imposes undue risk and harm on a resulting child, is possible (Shiffrin 1999).

Global anti-natalism opposes procreation in general. One global anti-natalist position holds that in all cases procreation is a harm to those brought into being. Benatar argues that while existence brings pains as well as pleasures, non-existence is a lack of pains and pleasures. While pain is bad, absence of pain and pleasure is not bad, so it is always worse to be than not to be (Benatar 1997, 2006; see also discussion of Shiffrin 1999, below; for responses, see Overall 2012, Benatar and Wasserman 2015). Other global anti-natalist positions focus on harms or costs to others. An environmentalist anti-natalism argues that procreation is wrong for the same reasons overconsumption is (Young 2001, MacIver 2015). An opportunity-cost anti-natalism argues that the money spent on rearing a child would be better spent on ameliorating the lives of those already existing (Rachels 2014). And a misanthropic anti-natalism argues that humans cause so much harm – to other humans, non-human animals, and the environment – that there is a duty not to procreate (Benatar 2015). Others have argued that the availability of children needing homes creates strong moral reasons to adopt rather than to procreate (Friedrich 2013, Rulli 2014). There are also intermediate positions. For example, Sarah Conly argues that the interests that ground a right to procreate can be satisfied with only one child and so it may be permissible to restrict the number of children an individual creates when costs to third parties from overpopulation are substantial (Conly 2005, 2016; see also Statman 2005).

Note that anti-natalists do not always defend legal restrictions, because interfering with procreation may involve intolerably illiberal coercion of the person. Even those who do think that there are circumstances in which interference with procreation can be justified accept that there are important countervailing values. For example, Benatar notes that the moral costs of forced abortion or sterilization are “immense,” but thinks that the moral costs of moderate coercion or directive counseling should be weighed against the moral costs of harm to future children (Benatar 2010; see also the discussion of parental licensing in Section 5.2 below).

One response to anti-natalist views is to provide a justification for the decision to procreate. Some authors, agreeing that procreation requires a justification and that many common reasons for procreating carry no moral weight, locate a possible justification in the unique nature of the parent-child relationship, the desire for pregnancy, or the desire to pass on valuable family traits (Overall 2012, Rulli 2016, Brake 2015, Ferracioli 2018; on whether one can make a rational decision to have a child, see Paul 2015 and Krishnamurthy 2015).

3. The Morality of Procreation

For the most part, secular debates about the morality of procreation focus on whether and when procreation is impermissible, rather than whether it might be obligatory (though see Smilansky 1995 and Gheaus 2015 on whether there could be a duty to procreate). The debates concerning the impermissibility of procreation raise deep issues in metaphysics and value theory (Belshaw 2003; Holtug 2001; Kavka 1982; Rachels 1998). We restrict our discussion to moral issues rather than legal ones, and assume throughout that reproduction is fully voluntary and informed—that is, neither coerced nor accidental.

3.1 The Non-Identity Problem and Impersonal Considerations

It might be hoped that we could give a full account of permissible procreation by appealing only to the interests of the individuals affected by procreative decisions. Unfortunately, there is reason to think that this may not be possible. Consider the following sort of case, introduced into the literature by Parfit (1984), and known as the non-identity problem (Hanser 1990; Harman 2004; Woodward 1986; entry on the nonidentity problem):

Marie is taking a drug that she knows will cause a birth defect—say, a withered arm—in any child that she conceives (call this child “Amy”). In 3 months this drug will have passed from her body, and she will be able to conceive a child free from this defect (call this child “Sophie”). Intuitively, Marie does something wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie.

Non-identity cases of this kind are called “same-number” cases because they involve comparing situations that contain the same number of individuals. Other versions of the non-identity problem involve different-number (or non-comparative) choices:

Sri has a genetic condition that she knows will cause any child she conceives to be born with a serious cognitive disability. Despite knowing this fact, Sri deliberately conceives and gives birth to a seriously cognitively disabled child, Aarav.

Assume, plausibly, that Amy and Aarav have lives that are worth living. Does Marie do something wrong in conceiving and giving birth to Amy? Does Sri do something wrong conceiving and giving birth to Aarav? Many are inclined to think that they do, but it is unclear how we can capture this wrongness by appeal only to the interests of the individuals involved. This is because wronging someone seems to presuppose that things could have gone otherwise for that individual, but things could not have gone otherwise for either Amy or Aarav. Sri’s putative wrong consists in creating Aarav, and doing otherwise would have entailed creating no one. Her action has no victim and therefore sets back no one’s interests. Amy isn’t made worse off by Marie’s actions, for had Marie waited another three months before conceiving she would have given birth to a different child (Sophie) instead of Amy. It is therefore difficult to see how Marie might have harmed or wronged Amy.

It is also prima facie implausible that the interests of other parties explain why these actions would be wrong: they are wanted and their births don’t harm their community.
The non-identity problem is not solely a problem for the morality of procreation. Anyone who affects the welfare of future people in identity-affecting ways may face it. Readers interested in general approaches to the non-identity problem should consult the relevant entry. Here we discuss just those aspects bearing on the ethics of becoming parents (see also Hanser 1990; Vehmas 2002).

Feinberg (1992) compares situations like the Marie and Sri cases with cases in which someone is harmed in the course of being saved from a greater harm (e.g., his leg is broken while his life is being saved). In both cases an evil or harm is justified in virtue of the fact that it is a necessary condition of a greater good—in the one case saving a person’s life, in the other case bringing a life into existence. Shiffrin (1999), however, holds that harming someone to save them from a greater harm is morally distinct from harming them to impose a “pure benefit” on them. Shiffrin claims that we have serious qualms about harming someone without their consent to secure a pure benefit for them, even when we can be sure that they would regard the pure benefit as far outweighing the harm (see also Steinbock and McClamrock 1994). She concludes that procreation is routinely more morally problematic than is generally recognized.

Shiffrin’s attempt to drive a wedge into Feinberg’s analogy raises questions of its own. First, one might challenge the assumption that life is a pure benefit. Even if we assume that Amy’s life would be worth living, creating her would be a benefit only on a rather peculiar conception of what a “benefit” entails. Amy is not better off than she otherwise would have been, for there is no way that she otherwise would have been. Furthermore, the argument may prove too much. If one is never justified in harming someone (without their consent) to impose a pure benefit on them, and if existence always involves some form of harm, then it must always be wrong to bring someone into existence. A global form of anti-natalism (see Section 2.4) thereby seems to be the price of this solution to the non-identity problem.

A number of authors, including Parfit, argue that we need to appeal to impersonal considerations to solve the non-identity problem. Several of these solutions appeal to the role morality of parents. According to Freeman, “The principle of parental responsibility requires that individuals should desist from having children unless certain minimum conditions can be satisfied. Responsible parents want their children to have good and fulfilling lives” (1997, 180). Freeman goes on to claim that the principle of parental responsibility entails that the very young and very old should not become parents. Similarly, Purdy claims that one shouldn’t reproduce unless one can ensure that one’s children will have a decent life, with clean water, nutritious food, shelter, education, and medical care counting as basic prerequisites (Purdy 1995). Purdy’s position seems to imply that many—even most—of the world’s children have been wrongly brought into existence. More recently, Wasserman has argued that whether it is permissible to bring a child into existence with certain characteristics (such as impairments), depends on the reasons the prospective parents have for creating such a child. These should be reasons that concern the good of the child, which can still support creating a child whose life will predictably go worse than that of another child who could be created instead (Wasserman 2005). Others have taken similar reasoning to show that prospective parents can be morally criticized for their attitudes to future children, such that the desire to have a child with a harmful condition is wrongful (Kahane 2009).

Not all of those who have written on the non-identity problem accept that Marie does wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie, or that Sri does wrong in reproducing. Indeed, some find the suggestion that it is wrong to (knowingly) bring disabled children into the world abhorrent due to the implications of such views for individuals with disabilities. Asch holds that a woman has a right to an abortion, but also that it would be wrong to have an abortion to prevent the birth of a disabled child. Abortion on such grounds is immoral, she argues, because it communicates that “disability is so terrible it warrants not being alive” (Asch 1999, 387). The argument could easily be extended to decisions about whether to conceive a certain type of child. Does prenatal diagnosis and selective abortion, or preimplantation genetic diagnosis, communicate that disability is so terrible it warrants not being alive? On its face this claim is contestable; the associated decisions are highly specific to each case. And even if such acts did communicate something, it is unclear that it would be a thesis about relative qualities of life (see also Buchanan et al. 2000, chap. 7). For more discussion of the ethics of creating people with disabilities see encyclopedia article on disability: health, well-being, and personal relationships.

3.2 Assisted Reproductive Technologies

Suppose that competent adults have the liberty to procreate. Are there limits on the means that they may take in order to do so? In this and the following section we focus on three methods of ART that have generated controversy: gamete donation, in vitro fertilization (IVF), and commercial surrogacy. (Here we focus on technologies already widely used; for a discussion of reproductive human cloning, see the entry on cloning.)

Most discussion has centered on whether it is permissible for prospective parents to avail themselves of these novel technologies for procreation. There has also been some debate over whether people have a claim to access these technologies through public health care systems or private health insurance. Most rich countries with universal health care provide some treatment for infertility. For example, the United Kingdom’s National Health Service funds a limited number of cycles of IVF for couples who meet eligibility criteria. Given limited resources, providing ART takes away from money that could be spent on other health care interventions (Roberts 1997). In this context it is particularly important whether infertility is properly considered a disease or disability in need of treatment (Neumann 1997; McLeod 2017). Another broad social concern raised by all these technologies is their role in the reproduction of race; when such technologies are used to produce racially similar children, they may perpetuate the idea of race as natural, as opposed to a social construction (Russell 2018).

Gamete donation involves the provision of gametes by a man or woman who is not intended to be the resulting child’s social parent. Insemination by another man is not a new technology per se, but the modern phenomena of sperm banking and anonymous providers have led some to question the morality of artificial insemination by donor (AID). Some objections clearly have a religious basis; we therefore do not discuss them here. But some conservatives about procreative liberty have also developed secular objections to gamete donation. The most interesting of these focuses on the practice of paying gamete providers. For example, Thomas Murray criticizes “insemination by vendor” on the grounds that it inserts the values of the marketplace into family life and thereby threatens to undermine it (Murray 1996, 34). The process of harvesting ova also involves serious risks to the woman providing them, which are discussed in the description of the IVF process below.

A different set of concerns centers on the moral responsibilities of gamete providers. Since in most jurisdictions gamete providers must waive all parental claims over their genetic offspring, it has been widely assumed that they do not have moral parental responsibilities. Several philosophers have, however, argued that gamete donation is morally dubious, precisely because providers take their parental responsibilities too lightly (Benatar 1999; Nelson 1991; Moschella 2014). The argument can be challenged in at least two ways. First, we might challenge the claim that gamete providers typically treat their parental responsibilities too lightly by transferring or alienating them (Bayne 2003, Page 1985), especially in the case when gamete donation occurs in a context in which assisted reproduction is regulated and would-be gamete recipients are screened. Second, one could argue that in the broad nexus of persons responsible for creating a child through assisted reproduction, the contribution of gamete providers is not especially morally significant (Fuscaldo 2006). (See the entry on gamete donation and sale.) However, recent critics have argued that gamete donors morally cannot transfer or alienate their parental responsibilities because these involve maintaining particular relationships which cannot be transferred (Weinberg 2016; see also Brandt 2017).

A distinct debate concerns the permissibility of procreating using anonymous gamete donors. Velleman argues that this practice is wrong because it frustrates children’s interest in knowing their genetic forebears (Velleman 2005). In response, Haslanger argues that not only does this view make certain forms of adoption morally suspect, it presupposes implausible connections between genetics, identity, and human flourishing (Haslanger 2009). Policy debates over anonymous gamete donation have expanded to the question of whether donor-conceived individuals—as adults—have the right to know who their genetic parents are (Melo‐Martín 2014; Groll 2020). Anonymous donation is now illegal in a number of jurisdictions.

IVF involves fertilizing ova outside the womb and transferring resulting embryos into the uterus. The woman whose ova are used is given a hormone treatment that induces producing multiple ova, which are harvested by a needle inserted through the vaginal wall. Fertilization may involve incubating the ovum in sperm or injecting a single sperm into the ovum in intracytoplasmic sperm injection (ICSI). Several embryos are transferred into the uterus after three to five days. Since the birth of the first “test-tube baby” in 1978, IVF has become a fairly common procedure for addressing certain forms of infertility.

Objections to IVF have focused on negative consequences for the women or their offspring and on wider societal implications. Stimulation of the ovaries may lead to ovarian hyperstimulation syndrome, a potentially serious condition. Like any surgical procedure there are risks involved in retrieval of ova. Transferring multiple embryos increases risk of multiple pregnancy, which can be risky for both mother and fetuses. Fetuses born as a result of IVF may be at an increased risk of birth defects, lower birth weights, and premature birth (Bower and Hansen 2005; Reefhuis et al. 2009). The absolute risk of these problems remains relatively low, however, and so they do not seem to justify a blanket prohibition on IVF.
Similar objections to those raised against gamete donation have also been raised against IVF, including that it commodifies children and female reproduction. Feminists have developed a more subtle critique. Sherwin (1987) argues that the powerful desires that many people, especially women, have for their own biological children are the product of problematic social arrangements and cultural values. While reproductive technologies like IVF may help some (privileged) women get what they want, they also further entrench the oppressive societal values that create these powerful desires in the first place.

IVF typically results in creating more embryos than are used in the fertility treatment. The remaining embryos may be given to other women for implantation, donated for research, destroyed, or cryogenically stored. There are likely over a million cryogenically stored embryos in the United States alone (Christianson et al. 2020). Depending on one’s view of the moral importance of human embryos this may be considered an especially worrying consequence of IVF. People who believe that such embryos have the same moral status as humans will judge that destroying them is wrong and creating them without a plan for implantation is comparably bad. The use of surplus embryos as a source of totipotent stem cells for medical research has generated objections from religious groups and conservatives opposed to abortion. Consistency would seem to require that anyone who objects to using these embryos in research ought also to object to their creation in the first place, since it almost inevitably results in surplus embryos that will eventually be destroyed.

3.3 “Surrogacy” and Contractually Assisted Reproduction

Perhaps the most controversial form of assisted reproduction is so-called “surrogate” motherhood or contract pregnancy. Such arrangements can take many forms, but the most widely discussed involves two parties, a contracting couple and a “surrogate” or gestational mother. The gestational mother carries a child derived from the gametes of one or both members of the contracting couple and agrees to give the child over to the couple after birth. Surrogacy is now regulated in most countries. Commercial surrogacy is widely, although not universally, illegal, driving an increase in international surrogacy. Many more jurisdictions permit so-called “altruistic” surrogacy, which does not involve paying the surrogate mother over and above compensating her for direct costs.

Many of the disputes surrounding contract pregnancy focus on the question of who should be given parental rights and responsibilities if the arrangement breaks down. (In some cases, neither party to the arrangement wants to keep the baby; in other cases both parties want to keep it.) Indeed, much of the impetus for recent accounts of the grounds of parenthood has derived from attempts to adjudicate such disputes (Shanley 2018, and see section 4).

Repro-libertarians insist that a right to procreative autonomy entails protecting most methods of “collaborative reproduction,” so long as they are safe and consensual (Robertson 1994, chap. 6). For them, the right to procreate is a special case of the right to make binding contracts (see Straehle, 2019). But it is not settled whether such contracts ought to be legal and, if so, enforceable.

One central point of contention is whether gestational surrogacy involves commodification—for example, by entailing that the gestational mother is selling her baby—or whether it is no different in kind from other forms of paid childcare (Anderson 1990; Radin 1996; Glover et al. 1989; Shanley 1993; but see also Arneson 1992). It is also disputed whether a parental right acquired through gestation can be contractually transferred: on a gestationalist view which grounds the right to parent in the intimate relationship between gestator and fetus, the justification of the right entails that it is not subject to transfer (Gheaus 2016b, and see 4.2).

A distinct concern has to do with whether anyone who undertakes a contractual obligation to surrender custody of future children can do so autonomously. Some writers argue that such decisions cannot be autonomous, and hence that surrogacy contracts should not only be unenforceable but also illegal (Dodds and Jones 1989b; see Purdy 1989 and Oakley 1992 for a response).

Contract pregnancy is also criticized on grounds of harm to women. One such harm is that, in practice, it treats women as, and reinforces the perception of them as, mere fetal “containers” (Purdy 1990, Satz 2010, Baron 2019). The fact that it gives medical staff and intending parents extensive control over women’s sexuality and their bodies is particularly troubling in the context of gender inequality (Satz 2010). But others reject bans on surrogacy contracts as paternalistic, unduly limiting women’s freedom. Nevertheless, even those who defend contract pregnancy urge that safeguards, such as mandated post-natal waiting periods during which the gestational mother is permitted to change her mind or age-based restrictions on who may enter into such contracts, should be in place to protect the interests of the child and of the gestator (Steinbock 1988; Straehle 2016; see also Botterell and McLeod 2016).

More recently, the discussion has moved to ethical analyses of international surrogacy arrangements. These have typically involved commissioning parents from high-income countries and surrogate mothers from poorer populations in less wealthy countries, including India and Thailand. The vast power differentials between the parties, expanded roles for surrogacy agencies brokering the arrangements, and loose regulatory regimes have made for heightened concern about exploitation and other potential wrongs (Panitch 2013, and see discussion in Purdy 1989, Wilkinson 2016).

3.4 Enhancement

Some couples who undergo IVF also opt for preimplantation genetic diagnosis (PGD) whereby the genomes of their embryos are analyzed and particular embryos then selected for implantation. This is more common among couples at risk for transmitting a genetic disease or who are trying to create a child compatible with an existing ill child so that she can be used as a source of donated stem cells. However, it can be used for selecting for or against other traits, such as sex, or disability—for example, some deaf parents want to raise children who inherit their deafness. Such uses of PGD are controversial (on sex selection see Heyd 2003; Robertson 2003; Purdy 2007; ESHRE Task Force 2013; on selecting deafness see Karpin 2007; Fahmy 2011; Schroeder 2018).

Current technology is mostly limited to selecting among existing embryos. However, the recent development of CRISPR-Cas9 genome editing techniques has finally made it possible to genetically alter gametes and embryos in vivo. This has made questions about the permissibility of genetic enhancement pressing.

Several critics of genetic enhancement argue that permitting enhancement is liable to undermine important human values. Sandel argues that the control that enhancement technology would allow parents is liable to undermine their humility in the face of the gift of their children, impose responsibilities that we are not prepared to deal with, and threaten social solidarity (Sandel 2007). Habermas argues that parents who genetically enhance their children will, through the control they exert, prevent their children from entering relationships of moral equality and undermine their ability to be autonomous (Habermas 2003). Both have been criticized for exaggerating the likely effects of permitting enhancement technologies (Fenton 2006; Lev 2011).

A second argument against permitting parents to genetically enhance their offspring is that it is liable to exacerbate unfairness. Enhancements will probably be available only to richer parents. As a result, their offspring, who are already advantaged over their peers, would be even better able to compete against them (Etieyibo 2012).This is commonly raised as a particular objection to genetic (or other biomedical) enhancements, but it is not clear why there is something distinctive about genetic enhancement that renders it more troubling than other ways in which parents attempt to enhance their children, such as private schooling.

The fairness objection also assumes that the advantages of genetic enhancement are competitive advantages, so that an enhancement would make the recipient better able to compete with others for goods such as careers and social status. This assumption underlies concerns both that the availability of enhancements would exacerbate existing inequalities and that if universally available they would be collectively self-defeating (as, for example, if everyone were to add 6 inches to their height) (Glannon 2001). However, this assumption might be false; for example, literacy is a non-genetic enhancement which is beneficial both to the literate person and others (Buchanan 2008).

While most discussions of the ethics of genetic enhancement have focused on whether the practice is ever permissible, some ethicists argue that it is not only permissible for parents to enhance their children, but a positive duty. Savulescu (2001) argues for what he calls the Principle of Procreative Beneficence: couples should use pre-genetic diagnosis and selective abortion to choose the child, of the children they could have, who will have the best life. This naturally extends to using genetic enhancement. Savulescu’s justification for the principle of Procreative Beneficence is that it seems irrational not to select the best child when no other reasons are relevant to one’s choice. But this seems like a very weak principle: it seems likely that at least some other reason will frequently apply. For example, prospective parents might just prefer to leave their child’s genetic makeup up to chance. If this is not an irrational preference, then it plausibly gives some reason for them not to select any particular embryo to implant. Savulescu’s view is extended in further papers which claim that the principle of Procreative Beneficence has greater moral weight than simply being a tiebreaker when no other reasons apply (Savulescu and Kahane 2009, 281; for criticism see Parker 2010, Carter and Gordon 2013, Bennett 2014). These and related issues are discussed at length in the entries on enhancement and eugenics.

Finally, controversy is not limited to genetic interventions: there are live debates about whether parents may choose (male) circumcision, clitoridectomy, marrow donation, sex assignment of inter-sexed children, and other surgical interventions (see, e.g., Benatar and Benatar 2003 on circumcision; Parens 2006, on surgically shaping children).

3.5 State Policies

Many bioethicists move beyond a focus on individual rights to consider broader effects of reproductive policy. As discussed in 2.2, these include communitarian conservatives who are concerned with the effects of reproductive policy, particularly regarding ARTs, on social attitudes towards the value of life and the meaning of family (Sandel 2007). They also include liberals who share values of autonomy and equality with repro-libertarians, and as a result treat market exchanges and consensual services as “innocent until proven guilty.” But rather than focusing just on the effects of particular procreative choices, these liberals also attend to the impact of institutionalizing practices such as genetic selection or IVF within a society that aims to maintain liberal background institutions (Glover et al. 1989; Buchanan et al. 2000; Brock 2005). Institutionalization foregrounds concerns that liberals focused on individual choices downplay, such as the effects of large numbers, the incentives that policies create, and opportunity costs. Thus for policy liberals it will be impossible to determine the scope of procreative rights without considering institutional structure and social context, given reasonable assumptions about human motivations.

For instance, when many people make similar reproductive choices, the resulting “baby boom” may reshape the social, economic, political, and environmental landscape. Such concerns apply to the use of ARTs, such as for sex selection: sex ratios might become grossly skewed in countries with a strong preference for male children (Xue 2010). Such societal consequences are also predicted by disability theorists who argue that normalizing genetic testing and embryo selection or abortion to prevent certain impairments could lead to increased stigma against and decreased resources for people with such impairments (see also the entry on disability). Such concerns might provide grounds for restricting ARTs or incentivizing their use.

Much recent debate has focused on the effects of the legal institution of the family on procreative choices and child welfare. Arguments for incentivizing procreation within marriage assume that children reared within marriages will benefit as contrasted with those reared outside marriages (Galston 1991, chap. 10; but see Young 1995). Others have argued that legally separating marriage and parenting will allow the state to support both children and their caregivers more directly (Shrage 2018) or that recognizing more than two parents will benefit children as well as serving broader social goals such as resource conservation (Gheaus 2019, Grill 2020). Such revisionist arguments extend to legal institutionalization of non-parental care for children: for example, Gheaus has argued for the institutional provision of non-parental care on child welfare grounds (Gheaus 2011, 2018b), and Brake for the legal recognition of paid childcare workers as family (Brake 2018). Liberal feminists have argued for state family policy—such as parental leave and incentives for egalitarian co-parenting—to promote gender equality (e.g., Schouten 2019). Adoption policy has also been the focus of recent discussion, with debates over open adoption and attention to the difficulties of LGBT adoption (Haslanger and Witt 2006; Baylis and McLeod 2014, Part IV). Family policy also has effects on racial equality, as Dorothy Roberts points out in her criticism of state policies on terminating parental rights which disporpotionately affect black families (Roberts 2006).

Liberal accounts of procreative autonomy may face problems in a context of social inequality and over-population. Some affirm procreative autonomy, but regard it as compatible with apparently coercive population policies such as limitations on the number of children particular persons may have. This may be because they regard procreative autonomy as a merely prima facie right, less weighty than other rights, such as the right to a minimally decent quality of life (Bayles 1979). Or they may conceive of procreative autonomy more narrowly than is commonly done (O’Neill 1979; Hill 1991). O’Neill, for example, construes procreative autonomy as requiring an intention to rear the resulting child so that it has a life at least normal for its society. Without such intentions, parents are not exercising a right to procreate, and thus policies to curtail their behavior do not constitute coercive infringements of procreative autonomy. Recent work in this area has examined the extent to which the state is justified in restricting procreation in light of its environmental costs (e.g., Conly 2016). In sum, on such views, procreative autonomy is one among many important forms of autonomy, which may conflict among themselves, and with the state’s legitimate (or compulsory) ends such as the provision of public goods and compliance with national constitutions. Talk of rights, from such a standpoint, is appropriate only within a nexus of liberties, claims, powers, and ends. From such a perspective, the implications of a right to procreative autonomy are much less straightforward than from the individually focused repro-libertarian perspective.

One further problem for liberals is posed by divergent societal views on the nature of the good for children. Respecting such divergent views seems to be required by equal respect, but this is in tension with the need to define standards for child welfare and parental authority. For example, balancing child welfare and parent autonomy may be difficult in culturally diverse societies, in which state standards of child welfare may be criticized as discriminatory against child-rearing practices of cultural minorities (e.g., Dwyer 2018; for discussion of child welfare and state neutrality, see Fowler 2010 and 2014).

3.6 A Right Not to Procreate?

While we have set aside the question of abortion, we will briefly address two other cases in which avoiding procreation and parenthood has been taken as protected by procreative autonomy. First is the case of legal paternity assignment for the purposes of child support, particularly in the case of “involuntary fathers.” Second is the case of the disposition of frozen embryos created from the gametes of two people who now disagree on their use. We can usefully distinguish rights not to become a gestational parent, not to become a legal parent, and not to become a genetic parent (Cohen 2007, 1140). The cases we are concerned with in this section relate to the two latter (alleged) rights: not to become a legal or a genetic parent.

While avoiding unwanted paternity has become a topic for the “men’s rights” movement, arguments for a “father’s right to choose” can begin from feminist defenses of procreative autonomy. What is at issue here is not whether an unwilling father has the right to compel a pregnant woman to have an abortion – this would be an intolerable invasion of her procreative autonomy – but whether he should be assigned the legal status, and legal support obligations, of fatherhood. If women have the right to avoid the status and burdens of motherhood, by parity of reasoning – the argument goes – men should have the right to avoid the status and burdens of fatherhood. Of course, the physical burdens of pregnancy provide a clear disanalogy between the cases (for related legal arguments against arguing from abortion cases to genetic parenthood cases, see Cohen 2007). But dismissing the comparison too quickly risks inattention to the costs of “forced fatherhood” on worse-off men (and their disproportionate enforcement on men of color in the US) (Brake 2005). Some would argue that even if men have the right to avoid involuntary fatherhood (especially in cases such as a “purloined sperm” case, in which they can deny moral responsibility), the claims of children outweigh a right not to become a parent (Overall 2012).

Cases of dispute over frozen embroyos, such as Evans v. the United Kingdom, foreground issues of privacy and control over one’s genetic material – especially, whether there is a right not to become a genetic parent (again, here we set aside the question of the moral status of the embryo). In the Evans case, a couple produced embryos through IVF, intending to procreate together, but separated before the embryos could be implanted. Subsequently, the man involved asked that the embryos be destroyed; the law required that both parties consent for the procedure to continue. The woman brought a legal challenge, hoping to proceed with implantation.

Considerations of procreative autonomy, control of one’s genetic material, could be brought to bear on either side here. Is there a right not to become a genetic parent, and if so, does it override any other rights or moral considerations pertinent to such disagreements? A right not to become a genetic parent could be grounded in privacy or property right in one’s genetic material (including informational). But once the embryo is intentionally created with the consent of the gamete donor, it may be argued that any prior property claims are ceded; the genetic contribution cannot be retrieved from this “miscible joint property” (Chan and Quigley 2007; see also Cohen 2007). On one feminist perspective, the woman who has undergone IVF ought to control the embryos, because of the additional burdens of the procedure and any future treatments on her (Overall 1995).

The resolution to these questions depends, at least in part, on the underlying moral grounds of parenthood. For example, if one acquires parental moral obligations by causing a child to exist, that will have very different implications than if one only acquires such obligations through a voluntary undertaking. The next section will examine such accounts of the moral grounds of parenthood.

4. Becoming Parents

In virtue of what does one become a moral parent, i.e., a primary bearer of parental rights and/or parental responsibilities with respect to a particular child? We can distinguish four general answers: genetic, labor-based, intentional (or voluntarist), and causal accounts. On monistic versions, only one of these properties generates parental relationships. On pluralistic accounts, more than one of these relations can ground parenthood.

Some contemporary discussions assume that moral parental rights and responsibilities or obligations are inseparable (Bayne and Kolers 2003). But Archard has argued that this “parental package” view is untenable (Archard and Benatar 2010, 22–25; Archard 2010; see also Austin 2007, chap. 3). To take Archard’s example, an estranged, abusive parent may have moral and legal support obligations but no parental rights; obligations to ensure a child is provided for do not entail parental rights. It is more plausible, as Archard notes, that parental rights and responsibilities—which, as contrasted with obligations, concern the hands-on, day-to-day rearing of the child—come together. Even these, in some circumstances, might come apart—as when an estranged parent retains some decision-making rights but holds no responsibilities. Moreover, the grounds for parental rights and parental responsibilities may be distinct, even if parents typically have both. For example, Millum argues for a labor-based account of parental rights but a voluntarist account of parental responsibilities (Millum 2017).

4.1 Genetic accounts

Genetic theories ground parenthood in the relation of direct genetic derivation. Geneticism thus places parenthood in the nexus of other familial relations, such as being a sibling, cousin, and so on, which appear to have a genetic basis and which appear (at least to some) to come along with certain moral rights and responsibilities.

Hall (1999) defends geneticism by appeal to the Lockean notion of self-ownership. Since genetic parents own the genetic material from which the child is constituted, they have a prima facie parental claim to the child. There are a number of problems with this line of argument (Kolers & Bayne 2001) and it is an argument that Locke himself rejected (Franklin-Hall 2012). First, it subsumes parental relations under property relations, by attempting to derive a claim about parenthood from premises involving claims about ownership. The plausibility of this derivation is based on emphasizing parental rights associated with exclusivity and authority, and downplaying parental responsibilities. Those responsibilities—to both child and community—pull sharply against a property-based analysis of parenthood. Second, taking self-ownership seriously entails that children own themselves, and this surely defeats any proprietary claim that their parents might have in them (Archard 1990). Third, genetic parents do not provide the material from which the child is constituted in utero; that derives from the gestational mother, not the genetic parents (Silver 2001). Of course, the child’s genetic make-up structures that matter, but to argue for the priority of the genetic over the gestational contribution is to argue for the priority of form over matter, and it is not obvious that this can be done.

Other arguments for geneticism derive from considering paternity, in that direct genetic derivation appears to provide the most plausible account of the basis of fatherhood. Several recent legal cases have overturned adoptions on the grounds that the estranged father, unidentified at the time of birth, has returned to claim the child (Rosenman 1995, Shanley 1995). Supporters of these decisions endorse the view that unalienated genetic claims to children can override months or even years of rearing by the adoptive parents, as well as the earlier failure of the father to claim the child. Similarly, in “surrogacy” cases, many writers have argued—or simply assumed—that a genetic father may have his own child by contracting with a surrogate mother. This seems to presuppose a genetic account of paternity; and it is a small step from a genetic account of paternity to a genetic account of parenthood. One need appeal only to the principle of “parity,” according to which the sort of relationship that makes one person a parent suffices to make anyone else a parent (Bayne & Kolers 2003; Austin 2004).

4.2 Labor-based accounts

An alternative account views parents’ work, rather than their genetic relationships, as essential to the parental relation. According to these labor-based accounts, people who play or have played a parental role in a child’s life have thereby become the parents. In this spirit, a number of authors have argued that the primary ground of parenthood is the gestational relation (Rothman 1989; Feldman 1992). In reproductive contexts in which a child’s gestational mother differs from its genetic mother—as in egg (or embryo) donation and gestational surrogacy—it is therefore the gestational mother who has the primary claim to parental rights and responsibilities. This line of argument can be expanded to include people besides the gestational mother who have taken a parental role in rearing a child (Millum 2010; 2017).

Three main considerations are presented in favor of labor-based accounts. One focuses on the interests of the child. Where a child has been looked after by a person or people for some time, it is thought to be very damaging for her to be taken away from them (Archard 2004). In the case of gestation, since the gestational mother is guaranteed to be identifiable at birth, it may be thought in the best interests of the child that she be regarded as the mother (Annas 1984). Moreover, the child and gestator are already involved in an intimate relationship at birth, which it is arguably prima facie wrong to sever (Gheaus 2018a). However, while recognizing the gestational mother or caregivers as parents will sometimes serve the best interests of the child, it is implausible that this will always be the case. This argument might, at best, ground laws presuming that the gestational mother and rearing parents have a claim to be the legal parents. Since there will likely be cases in which being reared by someone else would be better for the child, it will be difficult to justify the assignment of parenthood on the grounds of labor in every case.

A second line of argument appeals to what parents deserve for the work they do. Gestational mothers typically invest a substantial amount of effort into the child. In Narayan’s words, a gestational mother typically undergoes “considerable discomfort, effort, and risk in the course of pregnancy and childbirth” (Narayan 1999, 81; also Gheaus 2012). While this account appears to give a special role to gestational mothers, it can include parenting partners who help bear the costs or contribute to establishing a relationship (for example, by viewing an ultrasound image together). Similarly, the people who care for a child invest a great deal of work. It might therefore be thought that they deserve to be the parents (Millum 2010; 2017).

Labor-based accounts have the advantage over genetic accounts that they can explain why the individuals they pick out as the parents ought to have parental rights. They also incorporate adoptive and other non-biological parental relationships into a single account of parenthood, whereas genetic accounts seem forced to view non-biological parenthood as a distinct type of normative relationship. Objections to gestationalist accounts of parenthood may start from the problem of paternity: if gestation is necessary for parenthood, how can men become fathers (Bayne & Kolers 2003)? Broader labor-based accounts that count the work of other caregivers can explain fatherhood, but they still seem to give the gestational mother veto power over other potential parents. As Barbara Katz Rothman puts it: “if men want to have children, they will either have to develop the technology that enables them to become pregnant … or have children through their relationships with women” (Rothman 1989, 257). Some will find this implausible.

4.3 Intentional and voluntarist accounts

A third approach to parenthood, popular with legal theorists, appeals to intentions as the ground of parenthood (Hill 1991; Parker 1982; Shultz 1990; Stumpf 1986). Intentionalists motivate their position by appeal to cases like the following. The Khans wish to have a child “of their own.” They screen egg and sperm providers and find providers who satisfy their requirements. They then select a gestational mother, who carries the fetus to term and then hands the infant over to the Khans. Intentionalists argue that because they “carefully and intentionally orchestrated the procreational act, bringing together all the necessary components with the intention of creating a unique individual whom they intend to raise as their own” (Hill 1991, 359), the Khans should be regarded as the child’s sole parents.

Another argument for intentionalism appeals to the “case of the misplaced sperm”:

Bruce is about to undergo some risky medical treatment, and has placed some of his sperm in a sperm-bank in case he needs it at a later date. Through a bureaucratic mishap, Bruce’s sperm is swapped with that of a sperm-donor and is used by Bessie to produce a child. Does Bruce acquire parental rights and responsibilities over Bessie’s child?

Intuitions vary here, but there is at least some pull towards denying that Bruce’s genetic relation to Bessie’s child gives him any parental claim over it. The reason Bruce lacks a parental relation to Bessie’s child seems to be that he didn’t intentionally bring the child into existence.

Intentionalism construes parenthood as relying on facts about agency rather than biology; for the intentionalist, parenthood is fundamentally a moral relationship rather than a biological one (see Fuscaldo 2006, for discussion). Some philosophical defenses of intentionalism appeal to a voluntaristic account of responsibilities in general (Van Zyl 2002). If special obligations to particular others are generally acquired voluntarily, then it is plausible that parental obligations are also voluntarily incurred (O’Neill 1979; Brake 2005, 2010; for criticism see Prusak 2011a, b). Furthermore, parental obligations are role obligations. While it is a matter of debate whether any role obligations can be acquired involuntarily, it is at least plausible that roles assumed as adults (as opposed to roles one is born into) require voluntary acceptance. Finally, parental role obligations are conventional: their scope and content varies by jurisdiction and society. This suggests an unfairness if such extensive obligations are incurred involuntarily (Brake 2010). On the other hand, once it is recognized that parental obligations are conventional, the content of parental obligations and the voluntary actions required to acquire them can be explained with reference to social conventions of parenthood (Millum 2008; 2017). Another defense of intentionalism appeals to parental autonomy, as opposed to the way in which obligations are incurred: Richards argues for a variant of the intentional view according to which parental rights derive from “a right to continue [projects] we have underway” (Richards 2010, 23).

One objection to intentionalism concerns the content of the intentions that are supposed to ground parenthood. Consider a case in which a couple conceives by accident and then form intentions to give up the baby for adoption rather than rear it. This intention endures until 15 minutes after birth, at which point they change their minds and decide to rear the child. It is highly implausible that for the first 15 minutes of the child’s life they are no more its parents than anyone else.

Perhaps the most widespread objection to the voluntarist account is that it seems to absolve unintending procreators from parental obligation. However, many share the view that procreators, intending or not, who voluntarily engaged in sex have a moral responsibility to a resulting child due to their role in causing it to exist (Austin 2007; Fuscaldo 2006; Millum 2008).

Whatever the prospects of a voluntarist account of parenthood, a voluntarist account of familial relations in general is implausible. The duties that siblings have to each other, or that children have to their parents, are not easily understood as voluntary undertakings. This is a problem for voluntarist accounts of parenthood to the extent that duties between parents and children should fit within a wider framework of familial duties (Rachels 1989; Mills 2003; see Mullin 2010, for discussion; and the entry on special obligations).

4.4 Causal accounts

Finally, parenthood may be grounded in causation (Nelson 1991; Bigelow et al. 1988; Blustein 1997; Archard 2010). A causal account differs from intentionalism in that one can cause something without intending to do so. Indeed, one can cause a certain state of affairs even when one is unaware that one’s actions could do so. One needn’t have grasped the connection between sexual intercourse and pregnancy in order to be the cause of a child’s existence.

One of the attractions of causalism is its promise to account for the plausibility of genetic, labor-based, and intentional accounts of parenthood. Genetic, gestational, and caregiving relationships contribute to the child’s existence or development, and, in the cases that some intentionalists appeal to, the commissioning couple are a cause of the child’s existence. Causalism offers to explain its competitors.

But causal accounts face problems: first, what is meant by “causation” in this context? ‘But-for’ causation is too weak to ground parenthood, because its scope is so wide: for example, procreation might not have occurred ‘but-for’ the urgings of would-be grandparents or the actions of the match-making friend who introduced the parents. This is the “too many parents” problem (Hanna 2019). But it is unclear what notion of causation the causal theorist should adopt instead of ‘but-for’ causation (Blustein 1997). Second, what implications does the causal account have? Even with a satisfactory account of causation it may be unclear whom the account ascribes parenthood to in any particular case—or if it is clear enough, there is a risk of an ad hoc account of causation tailor-made for this purpose. Concern with the arbitrariness of the causal chain by means of which a child may be created leads writers such as Fuscaldo (2006) to emphasize that what is wanted is not a theory of causation but of agency (see also Austin 2004, 2007). This leads causal theorists back in the direction of intentionalism.

A related problem is that causal accounts often leave it unclear how causal responsibility generates moral responsibility. Sometimes it appears that the thought is that procreators, by causing a child to exist, have placed it in a needy position and so owe it, as compensation, “procreative costs.” But these costs are arguably not equivalent to the weighty responsibilities of parenthood (Brake 2010). The question is whether, as a result of causal responsibility for their existence, parents merely owe children repair of their needy condition, by fostering survival to adulthood, or whether such “procreative costs” include a richer set of parental responsibilities, such as a duty to love and to make the child “content with his condition” (Prusak 2011b, 67).

One final alternative, as noted above, is a ‘pluralist’ account which allows that more than one of these relations (such as causation or intention) may be sufficient, but not necessary, for parenthood (Bayne and Kolers 2003). Pluralist accounts have not yet been developed in depth.

Having outlined the main theories of the grounds of parenthood, we turn now to questions concerning the morality of being a parent.

5. Being Parents

5.1 Parental Rights

Parents have moral and legal rights regarding their children. They have the liberty to make decisions on behalf of their children regarding matters such as diet, schooling, association with others, and—more controversially—religious observance, and the right to exclude others from such decision-making. Such rights decrease in strength and scope as children gain decision-making capacity, yet until the child reaches moral or legal competence, issues of substituted judgment and surrogate decision-making remain (Ross 2002).

Parental rights’ content, extent, and relation to parental obligations is determined by the underlying theory of why parents possess such rights. On the child-centered or fiduciary model, parental rights piggyback on parental responsibilities to children, which are morally fundamental. One such theory is Blustein’s “priority thesis.” According to the priority thesis, parents acquire rights in order to carry out their responsibilities; thus responsibilities are morally prior to rights (Blustein 1982, 104–114). As Archard writes, “A parent can choose for his child, and exclude others from the making of these choices, only in the service of and thus constrained by a duty to care for the child. It is in the first instance because a dependent child must have decisions made for it that a designated parent is entitled to make those decisions.” (Archard 2010, 108; see also Brennan and Noggle 1997; Austin 2007).

Other theories of parental rights focus on parents’ interests. Historically, parenthood has often been regarded as a possessory (or proprietary) relationship. Some genetic accounts of parenthood imply the proprietarian view that parents own their children (see 4.1; Hall 1999; Narveson 2002). However, property rights seem inappropriate here for several reasons: children cannot be sold and they cannot be used however the parent wishes. While it might be responded that parental property rights are limited, prohibiting sale and certain uses, this does not address the more fundamental objection that persons cannot be property.

Other theories provide more plausible support for parent-centered, as opposed to child-centered, accounts of parental rights in terms of parents’ interests. Brighouse and Swift argue for parental rights on the basis of the irreplaceable good offered by parenting. Because parenting is a project with goods which cannot be obtained through other activities, such as the responsibility of caring for a child and the receipt of children’s spontaneous trust, affection, and intimacy, the interest in parenting should be protected. On this account, parental rights, not parental obligations, are fundamental, because the parents’ interests are the basis for the right (Brighouse and Swift 2006, 2014; see also Shoeman 1980). One line of objection is to ask whether the interest in parenting is likely to be undermined by state intervention in parental decision-making. Here we can usefully distinguish at least three different kinds of parental interests which could ground parental rights to control aspects of their children’s lives: interests in being a fiduciary, interests in intimacy, and interests in “nurturing, counseling, and education.” Intimacy and being a fiduciary, which Brighouse and Swift appeal to, arguably need not be undermined by intervention – whereas an interest in authentically nurturing children into adults might (Altman 2018).

The parental-interest account of parents’ rights addresses problems raised within political philosophy for the family. Brighouse and Swift generate their account partly in response to the challenge of redistribution of children: if the state should promote child welfare, why should children not be redistributed at birth to the best prospective parents, to maximize children’s welfare? But as Gheaus points out, while Brighouse and Swift provide an account of fundamental parental rights, they do not explain why biological parents have rights to rear their biological children, rather than such children being redistributed to better prospective parents, who could thereby undertake their own parenting projects (Gheaus 2012). One response to this concern is to separate the question of how someone obtains parental rights (the topic of the previous section) from the question of whose interests—parent, child, or both—those rights ultimately protect (Millum 2017). Brighouse and Swift also aim to address the family’s notorious effect on equal opportunity – different parenting practices, such as reading bedtime stories, can greatly affect children’s life chances. On their account, certain inequality-producing institutions such as private schools and inheritances are not protected under parents’ rights – but practices essential to parents’ interest in intimacy, such as bedtime stories, are. (For a reply, see Engster 2019.) Finally, a dual-interest view, grounding rights in interests of both parents and children, is also possible (Macleod 2015).

One question concerning parental rights is their strength. Parental rights entitle parents to exclude others, including the state, from child-rearing decisions. For critics, the absolute exclusivity typical of contemporary western nuclear families gives parents too much power over the vulnerable children in their care (Card 1996, Gheaus 2011; see also Gheaus 2018b).

An important set of questions about the content of parental rights concerns their scope. While it is widely agreed that parents have rights to make many day-to-day decisions on behalf of their children, a number of purported rights have been questioned.

One controversial right is the right to infuse children with parents’ religious beliefs. On the one hand, handing down such beliefs to children is, to many, a key aspect of the parental project (Brighouse and Swift 2006, 2014; Galston 2011). On the other hand, Clayton argues that raising one’s child in a religion violates a requirement of liberal neutrality, which applies to parents just as it applies to states (Clayton 2006; also Coleman 2003). From a feminist perspective, Okin argued that religious infusion could affect girls’ developing self-respect and equal opportunity (Okin 1994; cf. Chambers 2017, Chapter 6; Schouten 2017). Even if such arguments theoretically justify state intervention, their proponents must explain how, in practice, the state could intervene in the intimate parent-child relationship without psychologically harming children.

Another set of questions concerns parental authority over medical interventions. Critics have argued that circumcision of male children violates their bodily integrity; but children’s rights to bodily integrity must be weighed against other morally weighty interests, including the child’s own interest in community membership (Benatar and Benatar 2003, Mazor 2019). Likewise, there is controversy over whether parents should have the right to prevent transgender adolescents from receiving puberty-blocking treatment; here, harm to transgender children must be weighed (Priest 2019). In such conflicts, there are tensions between parental control rights and children’s rights, but also between different understandings of what the child’s best interests require (particularly when the child lacks decision-making capacity). (See entry on children’s rights.)

A related debate concerns the authority of parents to control their child’s education. Most discussion of this issue has focused on religion-based objections to the duration or content of public schooling. This was the context in which Feinberg originally discussed the child’s “right to an open future,” which he regards as a constraint on parental discretion regarding their child’s schooling (1980, see below for further discussion). A key challenge is how to justify these objections. One strategy is to cite the parents’ right to freedom of religion, but then some argument must be given for why the apparent interests of a child in being educated should be sacrificed to their religious freedom. A separate question regarding parental rights and education is whether parents are ethically permitted to confer advantages on their children through private schooling, particularly when doing so is expected to reduce the quality of education available to other children (Swift 2003).

Other questions concerning parental rights concern exclusivity and the number of possible parents. As step-parenting, procreation involving multiple biological, gestational, and social parents, and other diverse family forms become more prevalent, why should the number of parents be limited to two? As noted in Section 1 above, a Canadian court recognized a child as having three parents. Relatives in addition to the parents are frequently involved in raising children, even in cultures in which the nuclear family is considered the norm. In the United States, nearly 3 million grandparents have primary responsibility for children living in their homes and it has been argued that grandparental rights should be legally recognized (Henderson 2005). Further, some philosophers have argued for legal recognition or support for non-parental care, as in, for example, African-American practices of “othermothering” or “revolutionary parenting.” This would permit more adults to contribute to children’s development, thereby arguably benefiting children (Card 1996; Gheaus 2011 and 2019; hooks 1984; Collins 1991; Mullin 2005; see also 3.5 above).

So far, we have considered parental rights as parents’ moral and legal claims to make, and exclude others from, decisions regarding their child. But some philosophers have argued for other rights held by parents—namely, positive rights to social support for child-rearing. These proposals are discussed in 5.2, as they aim at helping parents discharge their responsibilities.

5.2 Parental Responsibilities

Parenthood inhabits the intersection of two distinct relationships: a custodial relationship between parent and child, and a trustee relationship between the parents and the larger society or other collective. Both may generate responsibilities.

The custodial relationship involves a set of duties aimed at, and justified by, the welfare of the child. As custodian, the parent is under a limited obligation to work for and organize his or her life around the welfare and development of the child, for the child’s sake. Analysis of the content of parental responsibilities has therefore mostly focused on the rights of the child. Feinberg’s right to an “open future” can be read as a limit on parental discretion (see 5.1). It can also be interpreted as giving children positive claims to certain goods, such as an education that leaves them with a wide range of valuable life plans to choose from. Whether there is such a positive right and in what it consists are matters of dispute (Liao 2015; Mills 2003; Lotz 2006 and 2014; Millum 2014; essays in Archard and Macleod 2002; entry on children’s rights). Another question is whether parental responsibilities end when the child reaches adulthood, or whether they are lifelong (Weinberg 2018).

Societies, families, and cultural groups also have interests in the welfare of children. For instance, the state has an interest in the reproduction of its workforce and its citizens; hence parental decisions that threaten the child’s chances of becoming a fully participating citizen may come under special state scrutiny. Distinct groups, such as the state and cultural groups, may make conflicting claims on the parents as trustees. For instance, in order to promote culturally prescribed norms, parents might seek to remove their child from school, or have their daughter undergo clitoridectomy; yet the state may claim that such a decision violates the parents’ trustee relationship on grounds that the state has a compelling interest in securing the full citizenship capacities and rights of its citizens (Galston 1995; Okin 1989; Chambers 2017, Chapter 6). Moreover, discharging parental responsibilities must be balanced with discharging obligations of distributive and global justice (Archard and Macleod 2002, Part III; Macleod 2010).

Indeed, some philosophers argue that parental responsibilities include duties towards social or environmental justice. For example, parents arguably have a duty of egalitarian justice to guide their children away from “expensive consumption habits” (Zwarthoed 2017). They may, as parents, have duties to address climate change, on behalf of their children’s, or children’s children’s, interests (Cripps 2017; see also Gheaus 2016a, 2019). This may also apply to special duties of adoptive parents, especially in inter-racial adoptions (Haslanger and Witt 2006, see also Baylis and McLeod 2014).

All parents fail to meet their responsibilities at some point. We would not expect someone to raise a child without making mistakes along the way. However, at some point, excusable parental failings shade into neglect and abuse. Exactly what counts as child abuse is a matter for debate. However, if abuse marks a threshold above which it is permissible for others—particularly the state—to intervene, then a clear definition is needed (Archard 2004, chap. 14).

By the time neglect or abuse has reached the point that the state intervenes, irreparable damage has often been caused, and the actions that can be taken to improve a child’s situation are likely to be limited. Some philosophers argue that prospective parents should be screened ahead of time for their ability to parent and those who are deemed unlikely to be able to fulfill their parental responsibilities should not be granted parental licenses. The argument in favor of licensing parents may appeal primarily to the harms to children that occur if unfit people are allowed to parent (LaFollette 1980, 2010) or to the wider impact on society from rearing children who are unlikely to become good citizens (McFall 2009). Either way proposals for parental licensing schemes must show that it is possible prospectively to identify individuals who are likely to be neglectful or abusive parents with sufficient accuracy, show that the schemes do not violate the rights of prospective parents (on this see Liao 2015), and explain how they are to be enforced. The latter is perhaps the hardest challenge: without resorting to compulsory sterilization how can people be prevented from having children without licenses? (McFall 2009, 122) Of course, there could be penalties for unlicensed parents, or their children could be subject to confiscation, but such policies risk inadvertently penalizing the children they were intended to assist. Moreover, enforcement would disproportionately burden women. As gestators, women might be subjected to de facto forced abortions; women are also more likely to be primary caregivers, and thus subjected to greater interference and monitoring (Engster 2010). A further question is whether onerous licensing policies for adoptive parents can be justified in the absence of more general parental licensing schemes (McLeod and Botterell 2014).

Finally, children need a great deal of care if they are to grow up into autonomous, healthy adults and good citizens. Parents clearly have the responsibility to provide some of this care, and the state has the obligation to step in when parents are failing to do as they should. However, there is an open question about what the state should provide in cases that do not involve abuse or neglect. As Alstott has argued, parenting imposes opportunity costs on parents, for example, in earning potential. Moreover, child-care labor remains gender-structured, with women performing by far the greater share. On these grounds Alstott argues for caregiver accounts to ensure equal opportunity, for example, allocating educational funds to parents (Alstott 2004). One pertinent question is whether parenting should be considered a private good, like an expensive taste which it would be unjust for society to subsidize (Taylor 2009). Some have responded that it is a matter of justice due to its effects on equal opportunity for women and full participation of women as equal citizens (Okin 1989; Kittay 1999; Schouten 2019). Others have argued for collective social responsibility for children on grounds such as children’s welfare and their status as a public good, providing positive externalities by reproducing society and producing workers who will support the current generation in old age (George 1987; Archard 2004; Engster 2010; Olsaretti 2013; Millum 2017).


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We would like to thank Tim Bayne and Avery Kolers, the authors of the previous version of this entry, for allowing the use of several passages from their original entry—mainly in section 4.

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