Philosophy of Religion
Philosophy of religion is the philosophical examination of the themes and concepts involved in religious traditions as well as the broader philosophical task of reflecting on matters of religious significance including the nature of religion itself, alternative concepts of God or ultimate reality, and the religious significance of general features of the cosmos (e.g., the laws of nature, the emergence of consciousness) and of historical events (e.g., the 1755 Lisbon Earthquake, the Holocaust). Philosophy of religion also includes the investigation and assessment of worldviews (such as secular naturalism) that are alternatives to religious worldviews. Philosophy of religion involves all the main areas of philosophy: metaphysics, epistemology, value theory (including moral theory and applied ethics), philosophy of language, science, history, politics, art, and so on. Section 1 offers an overview of the field and its significance, with subsequent sections covering developments in the field since the mid-twentieth century. These sections address philosophy of religion as practiced primarily (but not exclusively) in departments of philosophy and religious studies that are in the broadly analytic tradition. The entry gives significant attention to theism, but it concludes with highlighting the increasing breadth of the field, as more traditions outside the Abrahamic faiths (Judaism, Christianity, and Islam) have become the focus of important philosophical work.
- 1. The Field and its Significance
- 2. The Meaning of Religious Beliefs
- 3. Religious Epistemology
- 4. Religion and Science
- 5. Philosophical Reflection on Theism and Its Alternatives
- 6. Religious Pluralism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Field and its Significance
Ideally, a guide to the nature and history of philosophy of religion would begin with an analysis or definition of religion. Unfortunately, there is no current consensus on a precise identification of the necessary and sufficient conditions of what counts as a religion. We therefore currently lack a decisive criterion that would enable clear rulings whether some movements should count as religions (e.g., Scientology or Cargo cults of the Pacific islands). But while consensus in precise details is elusive, the following general depiction of what counts as a religion may be helpful:
A religion involves a communal, transmittable body of teachings and prescribed practices about an ultimate, sacred reality or state of being that calls for reverence or awe, a body which guides its practitioners into what it describes as a saving, illuminating or emancipatory relationship to this reality through a personally transformative life of prayer, ritualized meditation, and/or moral practices like repentance and personal regeneration. [This is a slightly modified definition of the one for “Religion” in the Dictionary of Philosophy of Religion, Taliaferro & Marty 2010: 196–197; 2018, 240.]
This definition does not involve some obvious shortcomings such as only counting a tradition as religious if it involves belief in God or gods, as some recognized religions such as Buddhism (in its main forms) does not involve a belief in God or gods. Although controversial, the definition provides some reason for thinking Scientology and the Cargo cults are proto-religious insofar as these movements do not have a robust communal, transmittable body of teachings and meet the other conditions for being a religion. (So, while both examples are not decisively ruled out as religions, it is perhaps understandable that in Germany, Scientology is labeled a “sect”, whereas in France it is classified as “a cult”.) For a discussion of other definitions of religion, see Taliaferro 2009, chapter one, and for a recent, different analysis, see Graham Oppy 2018, chapter three. The topic of defining religion is re-engaged below in the section 4, “Religion and Science”. But rather than devoting more space to definitions at the outset, a pragmatic policy will be adopted: for the purpose of this entry, it will be assumed that those traditions that are widely recognized today as religions are, indeed, religions. It will be assumed, then, that religions include (at least) Hinduism, Buddhism, Daoism, Confucianism, Judaism, Christianity, Islam, and those traditions that are like them. This way of delimiting a domain is sometimes described as employing a definition by examples (an ostensive definition) or making an appeal to a family resemblance between things. It will also be assumed that Greco-Roman views of gods, rituals, the afterlife, the soul, are broadly “religious” or “religiously significant”. Given the pragmatic, open-ended use of the term “religion” the hope is to avoid beginning our inquiry with a procrustean bed.
Given the above, broad perspective of what counts as religion, the roots of what we call philosophy of religion stretch back to the earliest forms of philosophy. From the outset, philosophers in Asia, the Near and Middle East, North Africa, and Europe reflected on the gods or God, duties to the divine, the origin and nature of the cosmos, an afterlife, the nature of happiness and obligations, whether there are sacred duties to family or rulers, and so on. As with each of what would come to be considered sub-fields of philosophy today (like philosophy of science, philosophy of art), philosophers in the Ancient world addressed religiously significant themes (just as they took up reflections on what we call science and art) in the course of their overall practice of philosophy. While from time to time in the Medieval era, some Jewish, Christian, and Islamic philosophers sought to demarcate philosophy from theology or religion, the evident role of philosophy of religion as a distinct field of philosophy does not seem apparent until the mid-twentieth century. A case can be made, however, that there is some hint of the emergence of philosophy of religion in the seventeenth century philosophical movement Cambridge Platonism. Ralph Cudworth (1617–1688), Henry More (1614–1687), and other members of this movement were the first philosophers to practice philosophy in English; they introduced in English many of the terms that are frequently employed in philosophy of religion today, including the term “philosophy of religion”, as well as “theism”, “consciousness”,and “materialism”. The Cambridge Platonists provided the first English versions of the cosmological, ontological, and teleological arguments, reflections on the relationship of faith and reason, and the case for tolerating different religions. While the Cambridge Platonists might have been the first explicit philosophers of religion, for the most part, their contemporaries and successors addressed religion as part of their overall work. There is reason, therefore, to believe that philosophy of religion only gradually emerged as a distinct sub-field of philosophy in the mid-twentieth century. (For an earlier date, see James Collins’ stress on Hume, Kant and Hegel in The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion, 1967.)
Today, philosophy of religion is one of the most vibrant areas of philosophy. Articles in philosophy of religion appear in virtually all the main philosophical journals, while some journals (such as the International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, Religious Studies, Sophia, Faith and Philosophy, the European Journal for Philosophy of Religion, Open Theology, Analytical Theology and others) are dedicated especially to philosophy of religion. Philosophy of religion is in evidence at institutional meetings of philosophers (such as the meetings of the American Philosophical Association and of the Royal Society of Philosophy). There are societies dedicated to the field such as the Society for Philosophy of Religion (USA) and the British Society for Philosophy of Religion and the field is supported by multiple centers such as the Center for Philosophy of Religion at the University of Notre Dame, the Rutgers Center for Philosophy of Religion, the Centre for the Philosophy of Religion at Glasgow University, The John Hick Centre for Philosophy of Religion at the University of Birmingham, and other sites (such as the University of Roehampton and Nottingham University). Oxford University Press published in 2009 The History of Western Philosophy of Religion in five volumes involving over 100 contributors (Oppy & Trakakis 2009), and in 2021 Wiley Blackwell published the Encyclopedia of Philosophy of Religion in four volumes, with over 250 contributors from around the world. What accounts for this vibrancy? Consider four possible reasons.
First: The religious nature of the world population. Most social research on religion supports the view that the majority of the world’s population is either part of a religion or influenced by religion (see the Pew Research Center online). To engage in philosophy of religion is therefore to engage in a subject that affects actual people, rather than only tangentially touching on matters of present social concern. Perhaps one of the reasons why philosophy of religion is often the first topic in textbook introductions to philosophy is that this is one way to propose to readers that philosophical study can impact what large numbers of people actually think about life and value. The role of philosophy of religion in engaging real life beliefs (and doubts) about religion is perhaps also evidenced by the current popularity of books for and against theism in the UK and USA. Interest in the question “is religion dangerous?” (the title of a 2006 book by Keith Ward) calls for work in history, sociology, and psychology, as well was philosophy of religion.
One other aspect of religious populations that may motivate philosophy of religion is that philosophy is a tool that may be used when persons compare different religious traditions. Philosophy of religion can play an important role in helping persons understand and evaluate different religious traditions and their alternatives. See, for example, the philosophically oriented survey Religions: a Quick Immersion and Victoria Harrison’s Eastern Philosophy of Religion.
Second: Philosophy of religion as a field may be popular because of the overlapping interests found in both religious and philosophical traditions. Both religious and philosophical thinking raise many of the same, fascinating questions and possibilities about the nature of reality, the limits of reason, the meaning of life, and so on. Are there good reasons for believing in God? What is good and evil? What is the nature and scope of human knowledge? In Hinduism; A Contemporary Philosophical Investigation (2018), Shyam Ranganathan argues that in Asian thought philosophy and religion are almost inseparable such that interest in the one supports an interest in the other.
Third, studying the history of philosophy provides ample reasons to have some expertise in philosophy of religion. In the West, the majority of ancient, medieval, and modern philosophers philosophically reflected on matters of religious significance. Among these modern philosophers, it would be impossible to comprehensively engage their work without looking at their philosophical work on religious beliefs: René Descartes (1596–1650), Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), Anne Conway (1631–1679), Baruch Spinoza (1632–1677), Margaret Cavendish (1623–1673), Gottfried Leibniz (1646–1716), John Locke (1632–1704), George Berkeley (1685–1753), David Hume (1711–1776), Immanuel Kant (1724–1804), and G.W.F. Hegel (1770–1831) (the list is partial). And in the twentieth century, one should make note of the important philosophical work by Continental philosophers on matters of religious significance: Martin Heidegger (1889–1976), Jean-Paul Sartre (1905–1980), Simone de Beauvoir (1908–1986), Albert Camus (1913–1960), Gabriel Marcel (1889–1973), Franz Rosenzweig (1886–1929), Martin Buber (1878–1956), Emmanuel Levinas (1906–1995), Simone Weil (1909–1943) and, more recently Jacques Derrida (1930–2004), Michel Foucault (1926–1984), and Luce Irigaray (1930–). Evidence of philosophers taking religious matters seriously can also be found in cases of when thinkers who would not (normally) be classified as philosophers of religion have addressed religion, including A.N. Whitehead (1861–1947), Bertrand Russell (1872–1970), G.E. Moore (1873–1958), John Rawls (1921–2002), Bernard Williams (1929–2003), Hilary Putnam (1926–2016), Derek Parfit (1942–2017), Thomas Nagel (1937–), Jürgen Habermas (1929–), and others. Chris Firestone and Nathan Jacobs have done recent work highlighting the immense work on religions by modern philosophers that are sometimes ignored in secular histories of philosophy (see their The Persistence of the Sacred in Modern Thought).
In Chinese and Indian philosophy there is an even greater challenge than in the West to distinguish important philosophical and religious sources of philosophy of religion. It would be difficult to classify Nagarjuna (150–250 CE) or Adi Shankara (788–820 CE) as exclusively philosophical or religious thinkers. Their work seems as equally important philosophically as it is religiously (see Ranganathan 2018).
Fourth, a comprehensive study of theology or religious studies also provides good reasons to have expertise in philosophy of religion. As just observed, Asian philosophy and religious thought are intertwined and so the questions engaged in philosophy of religion seem relevant: what is space and time? Are there many things or one reality? Might our empirically observable world be an illusion? Could the world be governed by Karma? Is reincarnation possible? In terms of the West, there is reason to think that even the sacred texts of the Abrahamic faith involve strong philosophical elements: In Judaism, Job is perhaps the most explicitly philosophical text in the Hebrew Bible. The wisdom tradition of each Abrahamic faith may reflect broader philosophical ways of thinking; the Christian New Testament seems to include or address Platonic themes (the Logos, the soul and body relationship). Much of Islamic thought includes critical reflection on Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus, as well as independent philosophical work.
Let us now turn to the way philosophers have approached the meaning of religious beliefs.
2. The Meaning of Religious Beliefs
Prior to the twentieth century, a substantial amount of philosophical reflection on matters of religious significance (but not all) has been realist. That is, it has often been held that religious beliefs are true or false. Xenophanes and other pre-Socratic thinkers, Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, the Epicureans, the Stoics, Philo, Plotinus differed on their beliefs (or speculation) about the divine, and they and their contemporaries differed about skepticism, but they held (for example) that there either was a divine reality or not. Medieval and modern Jewish, Christian, and Islamic philosophers differed in terms of their assessment of faith and reason. They also faced important philosophical questions about the authority of revelation claims in the Hebrew Bible, the Christian Bible, and the Qur’an. In Asian philosophy of religion, some religions do not include revelation claims, as in Buddhism and Confucianism, but Hindu tradition confronted philosophers with assessing the Vedas and Upanishads. But for the most part, philosophers in the West and East thought there were truths about whether there is a God, the soul, an afterlife, that which is sacred (whether these are known or understood by any human being or not). Realism of some kind is so pervasive that the great historian of philosophy Richard Popkin (1923–2005) once defined philosophy as “the attempt the give an account of what is true and what is important” (Popkin 1999: 1). Important philosophers in the West such as Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) and Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900), among others, challenged classical realist views of truth and metaphysics (ontology or the theory of what is), but the twentieth century saw two, especially powerful movements that challenged realism: logical positivism and philosophy of religion inspired by Wittgenstein.
As a preface to addressing these two movements, let us take note of some of the nuances in philosophical reflection on the realist treatment of religious language. Many theistic philosophers (and their critics) contend that language about God may be used univocally, analogically or equivocally. A term is used univocally about God and humans when it has the same sense. Arguably, the term “to know” is used univocally of God in the claims “God knows you” and “You know London”, even though how God knows you and how you know London differ radically. In terms of the later difference, philosophers sometimes distinguish between what is attributed to some thing and the mode in which some state (such as knowledge) is realized. Terms are used analogously when there is some similarity between what is being attributed, e.g., when it is said that “two human persons love each other” and “God loves the world”, the term “love” may be used analogically when there is some similarity between these loves). Terms are used equivocally when the meaning is different as in the statement “Adam knew Eve” (which in the King James’ Bible meant Adam and Eve had intercourse) and “God knows the world” (while some of the Homeric gods did have intercourse with humans, this was not part of theistic worldviews). Theological work that stresses our ability to form a positive concept of the divine has been called the via positiva or catophatic theology. On the other hand, those who stress the unknowability of God embrace what is called the via negativa or apophatic theology. Maimonides (1135–1204) was a great proponent of the via negativa, favoring the view that we know God principally through what God is not (God is not material, not evil, not ignorant, and so on).
While some (but not all) philosophers of religion in the Continental tradition have aligned themselves with apophatic theology such as Levinas (who was non-theistic) and Jean-Luc Marion (1946–), a substantial amount (but not all) of analytically oriented philosophy of religion have tended to adopt the via positiva One of the challenges of apophatic theology is that it seems to make the philosophy of God remote from religious practices such as prayer, worship, trust in God’s power and goodness, pilgrimages, and religious ethics. According to Karen Armstrong, some of the greatest theologians in the Abrahamic faiths held that God
was not good, divine, powerful, or intelligent in any way that we could understand. We could not even say that God “existed”, because our concept of existence is too limited. Some of the sages preferred to say that God was “Nothing” because God was not another being… To these theologians some of our modern ideas about God would have seemed idolatrous. (Armstrong 2009: x)
A prima facie challenge to this position is that it is hard to believe that religious practitioners could pray or worship or trust in a being which was altogether inscrutable or a being that we cannot in any way understand. For a realist, via positiva philosophy of God that seeks to appreciate the force of apophatic theology, see Mikael Stenmark’s “Competing conceptions of God: the personal God versus the God beyond being” (2015).
Let us now turn to two prominent philosophical movements that challenged a realist philosophy of God.
“Positivism” is a term introduced by Auguste Comte (1798–1857), a French philosopher who championed the natural and social sciences over against theology and the philosophical practice of metaphysics. The term “positivism” was used later (sometimes amplified to Logical Positivism by A.J. Ayer) by a group of philosophers who met in Austria called the Vienna Circle from 1922 to 1938. This group, which included Moritz Schlick and Max Planck, advanced an empirical account of meaning, according to which for a proposition to be meaningful it needed either to be a conceptual or formal statement in mathematics or about analytic definitions (“triangles have three angles”) or about matters that can be empirically verified or falsified. Ostensibly factual claims that do not make any difference in terms of our actual (or possible) empirical experience are void of meaning. A British philosopher, who visited the Vienna Circle, A.J. Ayer popularized this criterion of meaning in his 1936 book, Language, Truth, and Logic. In it, Ayer argued that religious claims as well as their denial were without cognitive content. By his lights, theism, and also atheism and agnosticism, were nonsense, because they were about the reality (or unreality or unknowability) of that which made no difference to our empirical experience. How might one empirically confirm or disconfirm that there is an incorporeal, invisible God or that Krishna is an avatar of Vishnu? Famously, Antony Flew employed this strategy in his likening the God of theism to a belief that there is an undetectable, invisible gardener who could not be heard or smelled or otherwise empirically discovered (Flew 1955). In addition to rejecting traditional religious beliefs as meaningless, Ayer and other logical positivists rejected the meaningfulness of moral statements. By their lights, moral or ethical statements were expressions of persons’ feelings, not about values that have a reality independent of persons’ feelings.
The logical positivist critique of religion is not dead. It can be seen at work in Herman Philipse’s God in the Age of Science; A Critique of Religious Reasons (2012). Still, the criterion of meaning advanced by logical positivism faced a series of objections (for details see Copleston 1960 and Taliaferro 2005b).
Consider five objections that were instrumental in the retreat of logical positivism from its position of dominance.
First, it was charged that logical positivism itself is self-refuting. Is the statement of its standard of meaning (propositions are meaningful if and only if they are about the relations of ideas or about matters that are subject to empirical verification or falsification) itself about the relations of ideas or about matters that are subject to empirical verification or falsification? Arguably not. At best, the positivist criterion of meaning is a recommendation about what to count as meaningful.
Second, it was argued that there are meaningful statements about the world that are not subject to direct or indirect empirical confirmation or disconfirmation. Plausible candidates include statements about the origin of the cosmos or, closer to home, the mental states of other persons or of nonhuman animals (for discussion, see Van Cleve 1999 and Taliaferro 1994).
Third, limiting human experience to what is narrowly understood to be empirical seemed to many philosophers to be arbitrary or capricious. C. D. Broad and others defended a wider understanding of experience to allow for the meaningfulness of moral experience: arguably, one can experience the wrongness of an act as when an innocent person feels herself to be violated.
Fourth, Ayer’s rejection of the meaningfulness of ethics seemed to cut against his epistemology or normative account of beliefs, for he construed empirical knowledge in terms of having the right to certain beliefs. If it is meaningful to refer to the right to beliefs, why is it not meaningful to refer to moral rights such as the right not to be tortured? And if we are countenancing a broader concept of what may be experienced, in the tradition of phenomenology (which involves the analysis of appearances) why rule out, as a matter of principle, the experience of the divine or the sacred?
Fifth, and probably most importantly in terms of the history of ideas, the seminal philosopher of science Carl Hempel (1905–1997) contended that the project of logical positivism was too limited (Hempel 1950). It was insensitive to the broader task of scientific inquiry which is properly conducted not on the tactical scale of scrutinizing particular claims about empirical experience but in terms of a coherent, overall theory or view of the world. According to Hempel, we should be concerned with empirical inquiry but see this as defined by an overall theoretical understanding of reality and the laws of nature. This was not ipso facto a position that favored the meaningfulness of religious belief, but Hempel’s criticism of positivism removed their barrier for overall metaphysical accounts of reality, be these accounts theistic, pantheistic (roughly, God is everything), naturalistic, and so on. Moreover, the positivist critique of what they called metaphysics was attacked as confused as some metaphysics was implied in their claims about empirical experience; see the aptly titled classic The Metaphysics of Logical Positivism (1954) by Gustav Bergmann (1906–1987).
Let us now turn to Wittgenstein (1889–1951) and the philosophy of religion his work inspired.
2.2 Wittgensteinian Philosophy of Religion
Wittgenstein’s early work was interpreted by some members of the Vienna Circle as friendly to their empiricism, but they were surprised when he visited the Circle and, rather than Wittgenstein discussing his Tractatus, he read them poetry by Rabindranath Tagore (1861–1941), a Bengal mystic (see Taliaferro 2005b: chapter eight). In any case, Wittgenstein’s later work, which was not friendly to their empiricism, was especially influential in post-World War II philosophy and theology and will be the focus here.
In the Philosophical Investigations (published posthumously in 1953) and in many other works (including the publication of notes taken by his students on his lectures), Wittgenstein opposed what he called the picture theory of meaning. On this view, statements are true or false depending upon whether reality matches the picture expressed by the statements. Wittgenstein came to see this view of meaning as deeply problematic. The meaning of language is, rather, to be found not in referential fidelity but in its use in what Wittgenstein referred to as forms of life. As this position was applied to religious matters, D.Z. Phillips (1966, 1976), B.R. Tilghman (1994), and, more recently, Howard Wettstein (2012), sought to displace traditional metaphysical debate and arguments over theism and its alternatives and to focus instead on the way language about God, the soul, prayer, resurrection, the afterlife, and so on, functions in the life of religious practitioners. For example, Phillips contended that the practice of prayer is best not viewed as humans seeking to influence an all powerful, invisible person, but to achieve solidarity with other persons in light of the fragility of life. Phillips thereby sees himself as following Wittgenstein’s lead by focusing, not on which picture of reality seems most faithful, but on the non-theoretical ways in which religion is practiced.
To ask whether God exists is not to ask a theoretical question. If it is to mean anything at all, it is to wonder about praising and praying; it is to wonder whether there is anything in all that. This is why philosophy cannot answer the question “Does God exist?” with either an affirmative or a negative reply … “There is a God”, though it appears to be in the indicative mood, is an expression of faith. (Phillips 1976: 181; see also Phillips 1970: 16–17)
At least two reasons bolstered this philosophy of religion inspired by Wittgenstein. First, it seemed as though this methodology was more faithful to the practice of philosophy of religion being truly about the actual practice of religious persons themselves. Second, while there has been a revival of philosophical arguments for and against theism and alternative concepts of God (as will be noted in section 5), significant numbers of philosophers from the mid-twentieth century onward have concluded that all the traditional arguments and counter-arguments about the metaphysical claims of religion are indecisive. If that is the case, the Wittgenstein-inspired new philosophy of religion had the advantage of shifting ground to what might be a more promising area of agreement.
While this non-realist approach to religion has its defenders today, especially in work by Howard Wettstein, many philosophers have contended that traditional and contemporary religious life rests on making claims about what is truly the case in a realist context. It is hard to imagine why persons would pray to God if they, literally, thought there is no God of any kind. (see Wynn 2020, chapter six)
Interestingly, perhaps inheriting the Wittgenstein stress on practice, some philosophers working on religion today place greater stress on the meaning of religion in life, rather than seeing religious belief as primarily a matter of assessing an hypothesis (see Cottingham 2014).
3. Religious Epistemology
According to the prestigious Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, religious epistemology is “a branch of philosophy that investigates the epistemic status of propositional attitudes about religious claims” (Audi 2015: 925). Virtually all the extant and current methodologies in epistemology have been employed in assessing religious claims. Some of these methods have been more rationalistic in the sense that they have involved reasoning from ostensibly self-evident truths (e.g., a principle of sufficient reason), while others have been more experiential (e.g., empiricism, phenomenology, the stress on passion and subjectivity, the stress on practice as found in pragmatism). Also, some have sought to be ahistorical (not dependent upon historical revelation claims), while others are profoundly historical (e.g., grounded on revelation either known by faith alone or justified evidentially by an appeal to miracles and/or religious experience.
Over the past twenty years, there has been a growing literature on the nature of religious faith. Among many philosophers in the analytical tradition, faith has often been treated as the propositional attitude belief, e.g., believing that there is or is not a God, and much work devoted to examining when such belief is backed up by evidence and, if so, how much and what kinds of evidence. There has been a famous debate over “the ethics of belief”, determining what kinds of belief should not be entertained or countenanced when the evidence is deemed insufficient, and when matters of religious faith may be justified on pragmatic grounds (e.g., as a wager or venture). Faith has also been philosophically treated as trust, a form of hope, an allegiance to an ideal, commitment, and faithful action with or without belief (for a survey see Abraham & Aquino 2017; for a recent defense of religious faith without belief, see Schellenberg 2017).
The following examines first what is known as evidentialism and reformed epistemology and then a form of what is called volitional epistemology of religion.
3.1 Evidentialism, Reformed Epistemology, and Volitional Epistemology
Evidentialism is the view that for a person to be justified in some belief, that person must have some awareness of the evidence for the belief. This is usually articulated as a person’s belief being justified given the total evidence available to the person. On this view, the belief in question must not be undermined (or defeated) by other, evident beliefs held by the person. Moreover, evidentialists often contend that the degree of confidence in a belief should be proportional to the evidence. Evidentialism has been defended by representatives of all the different viewpoints in philosophy of religion: theism, atheism, advocates of non-theistic models of God, agnostics. Evidentialists have differed in terms of their accounts of evidence (what weight might be given to phenomenology?) and the relationship between evident beliefs (must beliefs either be foundational or basic or entailed by such foundational beliefs?) Probably the most well known evidentialist in the field of philosophy of religion who advocates for theism is Richard Swinburne (1934–).
Swinburne was (and is) the leading advocate of theistic natural theology since the early 1970s. Swinburne has applied his considerable analytical skills in arguing for the coherence and cogency of theism, and the analysis and defense of specific Christian teachings about the trinity, incarnation, the resurrection of Christ, revelation, and more. Swinburne’s projects in the evidentialist tradition in philosophy of religion are in the great tradition of British philosophy of religion from the Cambridge Platonists in the seventeenth century through Joseph Butler (1692–1752) and William Paley (1743–1805) to twentieth century British philosophers such as A.E. Taylor (1869–1945), F. R. Tennant (1866–1957), William Temple (1881–1944), H.D. Lewis (1910–1992), and A.C. Ewing (1899–1973). The positive philosophical case for theism has been met by work by many powerful philosophers, most recently Ronald Hepburn (1927–2008), J.L. Mackie (1917–1981), Antony Flew (1923–2010), Richard Gale (1932–2015), William Rowe (1931–2015), Michael Martin (1932–2015), Graham Oppy (1960–), J.L. Schellenberg (1959–), and Paul Draper (1957–). (See The Routledge Companion to Theism [Taliaferro, Harrison, & Goetz 2012] for an overview of such work.)
There have been at least two interesting, recent developments in the philosophy of religion in the framework of evidentialism. One has been advanced by John Schellenberg who argues that if the God of Christianity exists, God’s reality would be far more evident than it is. Arguably, in the Christian understanding of values, an evident relationship with God is part of the highest human good, and if God were loving, God would bring about such a good. Because there is evidence that God does not make Godself available to earnest seekers of such a relationship, this is evidence that such a God does not exist. According to this line of reasoning, the absence of evidence of the God of Christianity is evidence of absence (see Schellenberg 2007 and Howard-Snyder & Moser 2001). The argument applies beyond Christian values and theism, and to any concept of God in which God is powerful and good and such that a relationship with such a good God would be fulfilling and good for creatures. It would not work with a concept of God (as we find, for example, in the work of Aristotle) in which God is not lovingly and providentially engaged in the world. This line of reasoning is often referred to in terms of the hiddenness of God.
Another interesting development has been advanced by Sandra Menssen and Thomas Sullivan. In philosophical reflection about God the tendency has been to give priority to what may be called bare theism (assessing the plausibility of there being the God of theism) rather than a more specific concept of God. This priority makes sense insofar as the plausibility of a general thesis (there are mammals on the savanna) will be greater than a more specific thesis (there are 12,796 giraffes on the savanna). But Menssen and Sullivan argue that practicing philosophy of religion from a more particular, especially Christian, context, provides a richer “data base” for reflection.
The all–too–common insistence among philosophers that proper procedure requires establishing the likelihood of God’s existence prior to testing revelatory claims cuts off a huge part of the data base relevant to arguing for theism… For it is difficult to establish God’s existence as likely unless some account can be given of the evils of the world, and the account Christianity has to offer is unimaginably richer than any non-religious account. The Christian account, accessed through scripture, is a story of love: of God’s love for us and of what God has prepared for those who love him… It is a story of the salvific value of suffering: our sufferings are caught up with Christ’s, and are included in the sufferings adequate for the world’s redemption, sufferings Christ has willed to make his own. (Menssen & Sullivan 2017: 37–38)
In terms of the order of inquiry, it may be helpful at times, to consider more specific philosophical positions—for example, it may seem at first glance that materialism is hopeless until one engages the resources of some specific materialist account that involves functionalism—but, arguably, this does not alone offset the logical primacy of the more general thesis (whether this is bare theism or bare materialism). Perhaps the import of the Menssen-Sullivan proposal is that philosophers of religion need to enhance their critical assessment of general positions along with taking seriously more specific accounts about the data on hand (e.g., when it comes to theism, assessing the problem of evil in terms of possible theological positions on redemption as presented in ostensible revelations).
Evidentialism has been challenged on many grounds. Some argue that it is too stringent; we have many evident beliefs that we would be at a loss to successfully justify. Instead of evidentialism, some philosophers adopt a form of reliabilism, according to which a person may be justified in a belief so long as the belief is produced by a reliable means, whether or not the person is aware of evidence that justifies the belief. Two movements in philosophy of religion develop positions that are not in line with the traditional evidential tradition: reformed epistemology and volitional epistemology.
Reformed epistemology has been championed by Alvin Plantinga (1932–) and Nicholas Wolterstorff (1932–), among others. Reformed epistemology is “Reformed” insofar as it draws on the Reformer John Calvin (1509–1564) who claimed that persons are created with a sense of God (sensus divinitatis). While this sense of God may not be apparent due to sin, it can reliably prompt persons to believe in God and support a life of Christian faith. While this prompting may play an evidential role in terms of the experience or ostensible perception of God, it can also warrant Christian belief in the absence of evidence or argument (see K. Clark & VanArragon 2011; M. Bergmann 2017; and Plantinga & Bergmann 2016). In the language Plantinga introduced, belief in God may be as properly basic as our ordinary beliefs about other persons and the world. The framework of Reformed epistemology is conditional as it advances the thesis that if there is a God and if God has indeed created us with a sensus divinitatis that reliably leads us to believe (truly) that God exists, then such belief is warranted. There is a sense in which Reformed epistemology is more of a defensive strategy (offering grounds for thinking that religious belief, if true, is warranted) rather than providing a positive reason why persons who do not have (or believe they have) a sensus divinitatis should embrace Christian faith. Plantinga has argued that at least one alternative to Christian faith, secular naturalism, is deeply problematic, if not self-refuting, but this position (if cogent) has been advanced more as a reason not to be a naturalist than as a reason for being a theist. (For a stronger version of the argument that theism better accounts for the normativity of reason than alternatives, see Angus Menuge’s Agents Under Fire, 2004.)
Reformed epistemology is not ipso facto fideism. Fideism explicitly endorses the legitimacy of faith without the support, not just of (propositional) evidence, but also of reason (MacSwain 2013). By contrast, Reformed epistemology offers a metaphysical and epistemological account of warrant according to which belief in God can be warranted even if it is not supported by evidence and it offers an account of properly basic belief according to which basic belief in God is on an epistemic par with our ordinary basic beliefs about the world and other minds which seem to be paradigmatically rational. Nonetheless, while Reformed epistemology is not necessarily fideistic, it shares with fideism the idea that a person may have a justified religious belief in the absence of evidence.
Consider now what is called volitional epistemology in the philosophy of religion. Paul Moser has systematically argued for a profoundly different framework in which he contends that if the God of Christianity exists, this God would not be evident to inquirers who (for example) are curious about whether God exists. By Moser’s lights, the God of Christianity would only become evident in a process that would involve the moral and spiritual transformation of persons (Moser 2017). This process might involve persons receiving (accepting) the revelation of Jesus Christ as redeemer and sanctifier who calls persons to a radical life of loving compassion, even the loving of our enemies. By willfully subjecting oneself to the commanding love of God, a person in this filial relationship with God through Christ may experience a change of character (from self-centeredness to serving others) in which the person’s character (or very being) may come to serve as evidence of the truths of faith.
3.2 The Epistemology of Disagreement
The terrain covered so far in this entry indicates considerable disagreement over epistemic justification and religious belief. If the experts disagree about such matters, what should non-experts think and do? Or, putting the question to the so-called experts, if you (as a trained inquirer) disagree about the above matters with those whom you regard as equally intelligent and sensitive to evidence, should that fact alone bring you to modify or even abandon the confidence you hold concerning your own beliefs?
Some philosophers propose that in the case of disagreements among epistemic peers, one should seek some kind of account of the disagreement. For example, is there any reason to think that the evidence available to you and your peers differs or is conceived of differently. Perhaps there are ways of explaining, for example, why Buddhists may claim not to observe themselves as substantial selves existing over time whereas a non-Buddhist might claim that self-observation provides grounds for believing that persons are substantial, enduring agents (David Lund 2005). The non-Buddhist might need another reason to prefer her framework over the Buddhist one, but she would at least (perhaps) have found a way of accounting for why equally reasonable persons would come to different conclusions in the face of ostensibly identical evidence.
Assessing the significance of disagreement over religious belief is very different from assessing the significance of disagreement in domains where there are clearer, shared understandings of methodology and evidence. For example, if two equally proficient detectives examine the same evidence that Smith murdered Jones, their disagreement should (other things being equal) lead us to modify confidence that Smith is guilty, for the detectives may be presumed to use the same evidence and methods of investigation. But in assessing the disagreements among philosophers over (for example) the coherence and plausibility of theism, philosophers today often rely on different methodologies (phenomenology, empiricism, conceptual or linguistic analysis, structural theory, post-structuralism, psychoanalysis, and so on). But what if a person accepts a given religion as reasonable and yet acknowledges that equally reasonable, mature, responsible inquirers adopt a different religion incompatible with her own and they all share a similar philosophical methodology? This situation is not an abstract thought experiment. In Christian-Muslim dialogue, philosophers often share a common philosophical inheritance from Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus, and a broad range of shared views about the perfection of God/Allah.
One option would be to adopt an epistemological pluralism, according to which persons can be equally well justified in affirming incompatible beliefs. This option would seem to provide some grounds for epistemic humility (Audi 2011; Ward 2002, 2014, 2017). In an appropriately titled essay, “Why religious pluralism is not evil and is in some respects quite good”, (2018) Robert McKim presents reasons why, from a philosophical point of view, it may be good to encourage (and not merely acknowledge) ostensibly equally reasonable worldviews. For an overview of the current state of play in philosophy of religion on the topic of religious disagreement, see “Disagreement and the Epistemology of Theology” (King & Kelly 2017).
At the end of this section, two observations are also worth noting about epistemic disagreements. First, our beliefs and our confidence in the truth of our beliefs may not be under our voluntary control. Perhaps you form a belief of the truth of Buddhism based on what you take to be compelling evidence. Even if you are convinced that equally intelligent persons do not reach a similar conclusion, that alone may not empower you to deny what seems to you to be compelling. Second, if the disagreement between experts gives you reason to abandon a position, then the very principle you are relying on (one should abandon a belief that X if experts disagree about X) would be undermined, for experts disagree about what one should do when experts disagree. For overviews and explorations of relevant philosophical work in a pluralistic setting, see New Models of Religious Understanding (2018) edited by Fiona Ellis and Renewing Philosophy of Religion (2017) edited by Paul Draper and J.L. Schellenberg. Two other resources are also highly recommended: In God, Knowledge, and the Good, Linda Zagzebski commends the epistemic importance of practicing philosophy in a communal setting and in On Evidence in Philosophy William Lycan offers a seasoned view of how to assess the epistemic credibility of arguments by philosophers.
4. Religion and Science
The relationship between religion and science has been an important topic in twentieth century philosophy of religion and it seems highly important today.
This section begins by considering the National Academy of Sciences and Institute of Medicine (now the National Academy of Medicine) statement on the relationship between science and religion:
Science and religion are based on different aspects of human experience. In science, explanations must be based on evidence drawn from examining the natural world. Scientifically based observations or experiments that conflict with an explanation eventually must lead to modification or even abandonment of that explanation. Religious faith, in contrast, does not depend only on empirical evidence, is not necessarily modified in the face of conflicting evidence, and typically involves supernatural forces or entities. Because they are not a part of nature, supernatural entities cannot be investigated by science. In this sense, science and religion are separate and address aspects of human understanding in different ways. Attempts to pit science and religion against each other create controversy where none needs to exist. (NASIM 2008: 12)
This view of science and religion seems promising on many fronts. If the above statement on science and religion is accepted, then it seems to insure there is minimal conflict between two dynamic domains of what the Academies refer to as “human experience”. The National Academies do seem to be correct in implying that the key elements of many religions do not admit of direct scientific investigations nor rest “only on empirical evidence”. Neither God nor Allah nor Brahman (the divine as conceived of in Judaism, Christianity, Islam, and Hinduism) is a physical or material object or process. It seems, then, that the divine or the sacred and many other elements in world religions (meditation, prayer, sin and forgiveness, deliverance from craving) can only be indirectly investigated scientifically. So, a neurologist can produce detailed studies of the brains of monks and nuns when they pray and meditate, and there can be comparative studies of the health of those who practice a religion and those who do not, but it is very hard to conceive of how to scientifically measure God or Allah or Brahman or the Dao, heaven, and so on. Despite the initial plausibility of the Academies stance, however, it may be problematic.
First, a minor (and controversial) critical point in response to the Academies: The statement makes use of the terms “supernatural forces or entities” that “are not part of nature”. The term “supernatural” is not the standard term used to refer only to God or the divine, probably (in part) because in English the term “supernatural” refers not just to God or the divine, but also to poltergeists, ghosts, devils, witches, mediums, oracles, and so on. The later are a panoply of what is commonly thought of as preposterous superstition. (The similarity of the terms supernatural and superstitious may not be an accident.) The standard philosophical term to reference God in the English language, from the seventeenth century onward, is theism (from the Greek theos for god/God). So, rather than the statement refer to “supernatural forces or entities”, a more charitable phrase might refer to how many world religions are theistic or involve some sacred reality that is not directly, empirically measurable.
Moving beyond this minor point about terminology, religious beliefs have traditionally and today been thought of as subject to evidence. Evidence for religious beliefs have included appeal to the contingency of the cosmos and principles of explanation, the ostensibly purposive nature of the cosmos, the emergence of consciousness, and so on. Evidence against religious belief have included appeal to the evident, quantity of evil in the cosmos, the success of the natural sciences, and so on.
One reason, however, for supporting the Academies notion that religion and science do not overlap is the fact that in modern science there has been a bracketing of reference to minds and the mental. That is, the sciences have been concerned with a mind-independent physical world, whereas in religion this is chiefly a domain concerned with mind (feelings, emotions, thoughts, ideas, and so on), created minds and (in the case of some religions) the mind of God. The science of Kepler, Copernicus, Galileo, and Newton was carried out with an explicit study of the world without appeal to anything involving what today would be referred to as the psychological, the mind or the mental. So, Newton’s laws of motion about the attraction and repulsion of material objects make no mention of how love or desire or emotional need might be required to explain the motion of two material bodies to embrace romantically. The bracketing of mind from the physical sciences was not a sign of early scientists having any doubts about the existence, power and importance of minds. That is, from Kepler through Newton and on to the early twentieth century, scientists themselves did not doubt the causal significance of minds; they simply did not include minds (their own or the minds of others) among the data of what they were studying. But interestingly, each of the early modern scientists believed that what they were studying was in some fashion made possible by the whole of the natural world (terrestrial and celestial) being created and sustained in existence by a Divine Mind, an all good, necessarily existing Creator. They had an overall or comprehensive worldview according to which science itself was reasonable and made sense. Scientists have to have a kind of faith or trust in their methods and that the cosmos is so ordered that their methods are effective and reliable. The earliest modern scientists thought such faith (in what Einstein refers to as “the rationality and intelligibility of the world” (Cain 2015: 42, quoting a 1929 statement in Einstein 1954 [1973: 262]) was reasonable because of their belief in the existence of God (Cain 2015).
Whether there is sufficient evidence for or against some religious conception of the cosmos will be addressed in section 4. Let us contrast briefly, however, two very different views on whether contemporary science has undermined religious belief.
According to Steven Pinker, science has shown the beliefs of many religions to be false.
To begin with, the findings of science entail that the belief systems of all the world’s traditional religions and cultures—their theories of the origins of life, humans, and societies—are factually mistaken. We know, but our ancestors did not, that humans belong to a single species of African primate that developed agriculture, government, and writing late in its history. We know that our species is a tiny twig of a genealogical tree that embraces all living things and that emerged from prebiotic chemicals almost four billion years ago.… We know that the laws governing the physical world (including accidents, disease, and other misfortunes) have no goals that pertain to human well-being. There is no such thing as fate, providence, karma, spells, curses, augury, divine retribution, or answered prayer—though the discrepancy between the laws of probability and the workings of cognition may explain why people think there is. (Pinker 2013)
Following up on Pinker, it should be noted that it would not be scientifically acceptable today to appeal to miracles or to direct acts of God. Any supposed miracle would (to many, if not all scientists) be a kind of defeat and to welcome an unacceptable mystery. This is why some philosophers of science propose that the sciences are methodologically atheistic. That is, while science itself does not pass judgment on whether God exists (even though some philosophers of science do), appealing to God’s existence forms no part of their scientific theories and investigations.
There is some reason to think that Pinker’s case may be overstated, however, and that it would be more fair to characterize the sciences as methodologically agnostic (simply not taking a view on the matter of whether or not God exists) rather than atheistic (taking a position on the matter). First, Pinker’s examples of what science has shown to be wrong, seem unsubstantial. As Michael Ruse points out:
The arguments that are given for suggesting that science necessitates atheism are not convincing. There is no question that many of the claims of religion are no longer tenable in light of modern science. Adam and Eve, Noah’s Flood, the sun stopping for Joshua, Jonah and the whale, and much more. But more sophisticated Christians know that already. The thing is that these things are not all there is to religions, and many would say that they are far from the central claims of religion—God existing and being creator and having a special place for humans and so forth. (Ruse 2014: 74–75)
Ruse goes on to note that religions address important concerns that go beyond what is approachable only from the standpoint of the natural sciences.
Why is there something rather than nothing? What is the purpose of it all? And (somewhat more controversially) what are the basic foundations of morality and what is sentience? Science takes the world as given Science sees no ultimate purpose to reality… I would say that as science does not speak to these issues, I see no reason why the religious person should not offer answers. They cannot be scientific answers. They must be religious answers—answers that will involve a God or gods. There is something rather than nothing because a good God created them from love out of nothing. The purpose of it all is to find eternal bliss with the Creator. Morality is a function of God’s will; it is doing what He wants us to do. Sentience is that by which we realize that we are made in God’s image. We humans are not just any old kind of organism. This does not mean that the religious answers are beyond criticism, but they must be answered on philosophical or theological grounds and not simply because they are not scientific. (2014: 76)
The debate over religion and science is ongoing (for promising work, see Stenmark 2001, 2004).
5. Philosophical Reflection on Theism and Its Alternatives
For much of the history of philosophy of religion, there has been stress on the assessment of theism. Non-theistic concepts of the divine have increasingly become part of philosophy of religion (see, for example, Buckareff & Nagasawa 2016; Diller & Kasher 2013; and Harrison 2006, 2012, 2015). Section 6 makes special note of this broadening of horizons. As noted at the outset of this entry, theism still has some claim for special attention given the large world population that is aligned with theistic traditions (the Abrahamic faiths and theistic Hinduism) and the enormity of attention given to the defense and critique of theism in philosophy of religion historically and today.
5.1 Philosophical Reflection on Divine Attributes
Speculation about divine attributes in theistic tradition has often been carried out in accord with what is currently referred to as perfect being theology, according to which God is understood to be maximally excellent or unsurpassable in greatness. This tradition was (famously) developed by Anselm of Canterbury (1033/4–1109). For a contemporary work offering an historic overview of Anselmian theism, see Yujin Nagasawa’s Maximal God; A New Defense of Perfect Being Theism (2017). Divine attributes in this tradition have been identified by philosophers as those attributes that are the greatest compossible set of great-making properties; properties are compossible when they can be instantiated by the same being. Traditionally, the divine attributes have been identified as omnipotence, omniscience, perfect goodness, worthiness of worship, necessary of non-contingent existence, and eternality (existing outside of time or atemporally). Each of these attributes has been subject to nuanced different analysis, as noted below. God has also been traditionally conceived to be incorporeal or immaterial, immutable, impassable, omnipresent. And unlike Judaism and Islam, Christian theists conceive of God as triune (the Godhead is not homogenous but consists of three Persons, Father, Son, and Holy Spirit) and incarnate as Jesus of Nazareth (fully God and fully human).
One of the tools philosophers use in their investigation into divine attributes involve thought experiments. In thought experiments, hypothetical cases are described—cases that may or may not represent the way things are. In these descriptions, terms normally used in one context are employed in expanded settings. Thus, in thinking of God as omniscient, one might begin with a non-controversial case of a person knowing that a proposition is true, taking note of what it means for someone to possess that knowledge and of the ways in which the knowledge is secured. A theistic thought experiment would seek to extend our understanding of knowledge as we think of it in our own case, working toward the conception of a maximum or supreme intellectual excellence befitting the religious believers’ understanding of God. Various degrees of refinement would then be in order, as one speculates not only about the extent of a maximum set of propositions known but also about how these might be known. That is, in attributing omniscience to God, would one thereby claim God knows all truths in a way that is analogous to the way we come to know truths about the world? Too close an analogy would produce a peculiar picture of God relying upon, for example, induction, sensory evidence, or the testimony of others. One move in the philosophy of God has been to assert that the claim “God knows something” employs the word “knows” univocally when read as picking out the thesis that God knows something, while it uses the term in only a remotely analogical sense if read as identifying how God knows (Swinburne 1977).
Using thought experiments often employs an appearance principle. One version of an appearance principle is that a person has a reason for believing that some state of affairs (SOA) is possible if she can conceive, describe or imagine the SOA obtaining and she knows of no independent reasons for believing the SOA is impossible. As stated the principle is advanced as simply offering a reason for believing the SOA to be possible, and it thus may be seen a advancing a prima facie reason. But it might be seen as a secundum facie reason insofar as the person carefully scrutinizes the SOA and its possible defeaters (see Taliaferro & Knuths 2017). Some philosophers are skeptical of appealing to thought experiments (see Van Inwagen 1998; for a defense see Taliaferro 2002, Kwan 2013, and Swinburne 1979; for general treatments see Sorensen 1992 and Gendler & Hawthorne 2002).
Imagine there is a God who knows the future free action of human beings. If God does know you will freely do some act X, then it is true that you will indeed do X. But if you are free, would you not be free to avoid doing X? Given that it is foreknown you will do X, it appears you would not be free to refrain from the act.
Initially this paradox seems easy to dispel. If God knows about your free action, then God knows that you will freely do something and that you could have refrained from it. God’s foreknowing the act does not make it necessary. Does not the paradox only arise because the proposition, “Necessarily, if God knows X, then X” is confused with “If God knows X, then necessarily X?” After all, it is necessarily the case that if someone knows you are reading this entry right now, then it is true that you are reading this entry, but your reading this entry may still be seen as a contingent, not necessary state of affairs. But the problem is not so easily diffused, however, because God’s knowledge, unlike human knowledge, is infallible, and if God infallibly knows that some state of affairs obtains then it cannot be that the state of affairs does not obtain. Think of what is sometimes called the necessity of the past. Once a state of affairs has obtained, it is unalterably or necessarily the case that it did occur. If the future is known precisely and comprehensively, isn’t the future like the past, necessarily or unalterably the case? If the problem is put in first-person terms and one imagines God foreknows you will freely turn to a different entry in this Encyclopedia (moreover, God knows with unsurpassable precision when you will do so, which entry you will select and what you will think about it), then an easy resolution of the paradox seems elusive. To highlight the nature of this problem, imagine God tells you what you will freely do in the next hour. Under such conditions, is it still intelligible to believe you have the ability to do otherwise if it is known by God as well as yourself what you will indeed elect to do? Self-foreknowledge, then, produces an additional related problem because the psychology of choice seems to require prior ignorance about what will be choose.
Various replies to the freedom-foreknowledge debate have been given. Some adopt compatibilism, affirming the compatibility of free will and determinism, and conclude that foreknowledge is no more threatening to freedom than determinism. While some prominent philosophical theists in the past have taken this route (most dramatically Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758)), this seems to be the minority position in philosophy of religion today (exceptions include Paul Helm, John Fischer, and Lynne Baker). A second position adheres to the libertarian outlook, which insists that freedom involves a radical, indeterminist exercise of power, and concludes that God cannot know future free action. What prevents such philosophers from denying that God is omniscient is that they contend there are no truths about future free actions, or that while there are truths about the future, God either cannot know those truths (Swinburne) or freely decides not to know them in order to preserve free choice (John Lucas). On the first view, prior to someone’s doing a free action, there is no fact of the matter that he or she will do a given act. This is in keeping with a traditional, but controversial, interpretation of Aristotle’s philosophy of time and truth. Aristotle may have thought it was neither true nor false prior to a given sea battle whether a given side would win it. Some theists, such as Richard Swinburne, adopt this line today, holding that the future cannot be known. If it cannot be known for metaphysical reasons, then omniscience can be analyzed as knowing all that it is possible to know. That God cannot know future free action is no more of a mark against God’s being omniscient than God’s inability to make square circles is a mark against God’s being omnipotent. Other philosophers deny the original paradox. They insist that God’s foreknowledge is compatible with libertarian freedom and seek to resolve the quandary by claiming that God is not bound in time (God does not so much foreknow the future as God knows what for us is the future from an eternal viewpoint) and by arguing that the unique vantage point of an omniscient God prevents any impingement on freedom. God can simply know the future without this having to be grounded on an established, determinate future. But this only works if there is no necessity of eternity analogous to the necessity of the past. Why think that we have any more control over God’s timeless belief than over God’s past belief? If not, then there is an exactly parallel dilemma of timeless knowledge. For outstanding current analysis of freedom and foreknowledge, see the work of Linda Zagzebski.
Could there be a being that is outside time? In the great monotheistic traditions, God is thought of as without any kind of beginning or end. God will never, indeed, can never, cease to be. Some philosophical theists hold that God’s temporality is very much like ours in the sense that there is a before, during, and an after for God, or a past, present, and future for God. This view is sometimes referred to as the thesis that God is everlasting. Those adopting a more radical stance claim that God is independent of temporality, arguing either that God is not in time at all, or that God is “simultaneously” at or in all times. This is sometimes called the view that God is eternal as opposed to everlasting.
Why adopt the more radical stance? One reason, already noted, is that if God is not temporally bound, there may be a resolution to the earlier problem of reconciling freedom and foreknowledge. As St. Augustine of Hippo put it:
so that of those things which emerge in time, the future, indeed, are not yet, and the present are now, and the past no longer are; but all of these are by Him comprehended in His stable and eternal presence. (The City of God, XI.21)
If God is outside time, there may also be a secure foundation explaining God’s immutability (changelessness), incorruptibility, and immortality. Furthermore, there may be an opportunity to use God’s standing outside of time to launch an argument that God is the creator of time.
Those affirming God to be unbounded by temporal sequences face several puzzles which I note without trying to settle. If God is somehow at or in all times, is God simultaneously at or in each? If so, there is the following problem. If God is simultaneous with the event of Rome burning in 410 CE, and also simultaneous with your reading this entry, then it seems that Rome must be burning at the same time you are reading this entry. (This problem was advanced by Nelson Pike (1970); Stump and Kretzmann 1981 have replied that the simultaneity involved in God’s eternal knowledge is not transitive). A different problem arises with respect to eternity and omniscience. If God is outside of time, can God know what time it is now? Arguably, there is a fact of the matter that it is now, say, midnight on 1 July 2018. A God outside of time might know that at midnight on 1 July 2018 certain things occur, but could God know when it is now that time? The problem is that the more emphasis one places on the claim that God’s supreme existence is independent of time, the more one seems to jeopardize taking seriously time as it is known. Finally, while the great monotheistic traditions provide a portrait of the Divine as supremely different from the creation, there is also an insistence on God’s proximity or immanence. For some theists, describing God as a person or person-like (God loves, acts, knows) is not to equivocate. But it is not clear that an eternal God could be personal. For recent work on God’s relation to time, see work by Katherine Rogers (2007, 2008).
5.1.3 The goodness of God
All known world religions address the nature of good and evil and commend ways of achieving human well-being, whether this be thought of in terms of salvation, liberation, deliverance, enlightenment, tranquility, or an egoless state of Nirvana. Notwithstanding important differences, there is a substantial overlap between many of these conceptions of the good as witnessed by the commending of the Golden Rule (“Do unto others as you would have them do unto you”) in many religions. Some religions construe the Divine as in some respect beyond our human notions of good and evil. In some forms of Hinduism, for example, Brahman has been extolled as possessing a sort of moral transcendence, and some Christian theologians and philosophers have likewise insisted that God is only a moral agent in a highly qualified sense, if at all (Davies 1993). To call God good is, for them, very different from calling a human being good.
Here are only some of the ways in which philosophers have articulated what it means to call God good. In treating the matter, there has been a tendency either to explain God’s goodness in terms of standards that are not God’s creation and thus, in some measure, independent of God’s will, or in terms of God’s will and the standards God has created. The latter view has been termed theistic voluntarism. A common version of theistic voluntarism is the claim that for something to be good or right simply means that God approves of permits it and for something to be bad or wrong means that God disapproves or forbids it.
Theistic voluntarists face several difficulties: moral language seems intelligible without having to be explained in terms of the Divine will. Indeed, many people make what they take to be objective moral judgments without making any reference to God. If they are using moral language intelligibly, how could it be that the very meaning of such moral language should be analyzed in terms of Divine volitions? New work in the philosophy of language may be of use to theistic voluntarists. According to a causal theory of reference, “water” necessarily designates H2O. It is not a contingent fact that water is H2O notwithstanding the fact that many people can use the term “water” without knowing its composition. Similarly, could it not be the case that “good” may refer to that which is willed by God even though many people are not aware of (or even deny) the existence of God? Another difficulty for voluntarism lies in accounting for the apparent meaningful content of claims like “God is good”. It appears that in calling God or in particular God’s will “good” the religious believer is saying more than “God wills what God wills”. If so, must not the very notion of goodness have some meaning independent of God’s will? Also at issue is the worry that if voluntarism is accepted, the theist has threatened the normative objectivity of moral judgments. Could God make it the case that moral judgments were turned upside down? For example, could God make cruelty good? Arguably, the moral universe is not so malleable. In reply, some voluntarists have sought to understand the stability of the moral laws in light of God’s immutably fixed, necessary nature.
By understanding God’s goodness in terms of God’s being (as opposed to God’s will alone), one comes close to the non-voluntarist stand. Aquinas and others hold that God is essentially good in virtue of God’s very being. All such positions are non-voluntarist in so far as they do not claim that what it means for something to be good is that God wills it to be so. The goodness of God may be articulated in various ways, either by arguing that God’s perfection requires God being good as an agent or by arguing that God’s goodness can be articulated in terms of other Divine attributes such as those outlined above. For example, because knowledge is in itself good, omniscience is a supreme good. God has also been considered good in so far as God has created and conserves in existence a good cosmos. Debates over the problem of evil (if God is indeed omnipotent and perfectly good, why is there evil?) have poignancy precisely because one side challenges this chief judgment about God’s goodness. (The debate over the problem of evil is taken up in section 5.2.4.)
The choice between voluntarism and seeing God’s very being as good is rarely strict. Some theists who oppose a full-scale voluntarism allow for partial voluntarist elements. According to one such moderate stance, while God cannot make cruelty good, God can make some actions morally required or morally forbidden which otherwise would be morally neutral. Arguments for this have been based on the thesis that the cosmos and all its contents are God’s creation. According to some theories of property, an agent making something good gains entitlements over the property. The crucial moves in arguments that the cosmos and its contents belong to their Creator have been to guard against the idea that human parents would then “own” their children (they do not, because parents are not radical creators like God), and the idea that Divine ownership would permit anything, thus construing human duties owed to God as the duties of a slave to a master (a view to which not all theists have objected). Theories spelling out why and how the cosmos belongs to God have been prominent in all three monotheistic traditions. Plato defended the notion, as did Aquinas and Locke (see Brody 1974 for a defense).
A new development in theorizing about God’s goodness has been advanced in Zagzebski 2004. Zagzebski contends that being an exemplary virtuous person consists in having good motives. Motives have an internal, affective or emotive structure. An emotion is “an affective perception of the world” (2004: xvi) that “initiates and directs action” (2004: 1). The ultimate grounding of what makes human motives good is that they are in accord with the motives of God. Zagzebski’s theory is perhaps the most ambitious virtue theory in print, offering an account of human virtues in light of theism. Not all theists resonate with her bold claim that God is a person who has emotions, but many allow that (at least in some analogical sense) God may be see as personal and having affective states.
One other effort worth noting to link judgments of good and evil with judgments about God relies upon the ideal observer theory of ethics. According to this theory, moral judgments can be analyzed in terms of how an ideal observer would judge matters. To say an act is right entails a commitment to holding that if there were an ideal observer, it would approve of the act; to claim an act is wrong entails the thesis that if there were an ideal observer, it would disapprove of it. The theory can be found in works by Hume, Adam Smith, R.M. Hare, and R. Firth (see Firth 1952 ). The ideal observer is variously described, but typically is thought of as an impartial omniscient regarding non-moral facts (facts that can be grasped without already knowing the moral status or implications of the fact—for instance, “He did something bad” is a moral fact; “He hit Smith” is not), and as omnipercipient (Firth’s term for adopting a position of universal affective appreciation of the points of view of all involved parties). The theory receives some support from the fact that most moral disputes can be analyzed in terms of different parties challenging each other to be impartial, to get their empirical facts straight, and to be more sensitive—for example, by realizing what it feels like to be disadvantaged. The theory has formidable critics and defenders. If true, it does not follow that there is an ideal observer, but if it is true and moral judgments are coherent, then the idea of an ideal observer is coherent. Given certain conceptions of God in the three great monotheistic traditions, God fits the ideal observer description (and more besides, of course). This need not be unwelcome to atheists. Should an ideal observer theory be cogent, a theist would have some reason for claiming that atheists committed to normative, ethical judgments are also committed to the idea of a God or a God-like being. (For a defense of a theistic form of the ideal observer theory, see Taliaferro 2005a; for criticism see Anderson 2005. For further work on God, goodness, and morality, see Evans 2013 and Hare 2015. For interesting work on the notion of religious authority, see Zagzebski 2012.)
It should be noted that in addition to attention to the classical divine attributes discussed in this section, there has also been philosophical work on divine simplicity, immutability, impassibility, omnipresence, God’s freedom, divine necessity, sovereignty, God’s relationship with abstract objects, Christian teachings about the Trinity, the incarnation, atonement, the sacraments, and more.
5.2 God’s Existence
In some introductory philosophy textbooks and anthologies, the arguments for God’s existence are presented as ostensible proofs which are then shown to be fallible. For example, an argument from the apparent order and purposive nature of the cosmos will be criticized on the grounds that, at best, the argument would establish there is a purposive, designing intelligence at work in the cosmos. This falls far short of establishing that there is a God who is omnipotent, omniscient, benevolent, and so on. But two comments need to be made: First, that “meager” conclusion alone would be enough to disturb a scientific naturalist who wishes to rule out all such transcendent intelligence. Second, few philosophers today advance a single argument as a proof. Customarily, a design argument might be advanced alongside an argument from religious experience, and the other arguments to be considered below. True to Hempel’s advice (cited earlier) about comprehensive inquiry, it is increasingly common to see philosophies—scientific naturalism or theism—advanced with cumulative arguments, a whole range of considerations, and not with a supposed knock-down, single proof.
This section surveys some of the main theistic arguments.
5.2.1 Ontological arguments
There is a host of arguments under this title; version of the argument works, then it can be deployed using only the concept of God as maximally excellent and some modal principles of inference, that is, principles concerning possibility and necessity. The argument need not resist all empirical support, however, as shall be indicated. The focus of the argument is the thesis that, if there is a God, then God’s existence is necessary. In other words, God’s existence is not contingent—God is not the sort of being that just happens to exist or not exist. That necessary existence is built into the concept of God can be supported by appealing to the way God is conceived in Jewish, Christian, and Islamic traditions. This would involve some a posteriori, empirical research into the way God is thought of in these traditions. Alternatively, a defender of the ontological argument might hope to convince others that the concept of God is the concept of a being that exists necessarily by beginning with the idea of a maximally perfect being. If there were a maximally perfect being, what would it be like? It has been argued that among its array of great-making qualities (omniscience and omnipotence) would be necessary existence. Once fully articulated, it can be argued that a maximally perfect being which existed necessarily could be called “God”. For an interesting, recent treatment of the relationship between the concept of there being a necessarily existing being and there being a God, see Necessary Existence by Alexander Pruss and Joshua Rasmussen (2018: chapters one to three).
The ontological argument goes back to St. Anselm (1033/34–1109), but this section shall explore a current version relying heavily on the principle that if something is possibly necessarily the case, then it is necessarily the case (or, to put it redundantly, it is necessarily necessary). The principle can be illustrated in the case of propositions. That six is the smallest perfect number (that number which is equal to the sum of its divisors including one but not including itself) does not seem to be the sort of thing that might just happen to be true. Rather, either it is necessarily true or necessarily false. If the latter, it is not possible, if the former, it is possible. If one knows that it is possible that six is the smallest perfect number, then one has good reason to believe that. Does one have reason to think it is possible that God exists necessarily? Defenders of the argument answer in the affirmative and infer that God exists. There have been hundreds of objections and replies to this argument. Perhaps the most ambitious objection is that the same sort of reasoning can be used to argue that God cannot exist; for if it is possible that God not exist and necessary existence is part of the meaning of “God”, then it follows that God cannot exist.
Classical, alternative versions of the ontological argument are propounded by Anselm, Spinoza, and Descartes, with current versions by Alvin Plantinga, Charles Hartshorne, Norman Malcolm, and C. Dore; classical critics include Gaunilo and Kant, and current critics are many, including William Rowe, J. Barnes, G. Oppy, and J. L. Mackie. The latest book-length treatments of the ontological argument are two defenses: Rethinking the Ontological Argument by Daniel Dombrowski (2006) and Yujin Nagasawa’s Maximal God; A New Defence of Perfect Being Theism (2017). Not every advocate of perfect being theology embraces the ontological argument. Famously Thomas Aquinas did not accept the ontological argument. Alvin Plantinga, who is one of the philosophers responsible for the revival of interest in the ontological argument, contends that while he, personally, takes the argument to be sound (because he believes that the conclusion that God exists necessarily is true, which entails that the premise, that it is possible that God exists necessarily is true) he does not think the argument has sufficient force to convince an atheist. (Plantinga 1974: 216–217) For a recent new contribution to the ontological argument, see Brian Leftow’s Anselm’s Argument; Divine Necessity .
5.2.2 Cosmological arguments
Arguments in this vein are more firmly planted in empirical, a posteriori reflection than the ontological argument, but some versions employ a priori reasons as well. There are various versions. Some argue that the cosmos had an initial cause outside it, a First Cause in time. Others argue that the cosmos has a necessary, sustaining cause from instant to instant, whether or not the cosmos had a temporal origin. The two versions are not mutually exclusive, for it is possible both that the cosmos had a First Cause and that it has a continuous, sustaining cause.
The cosmological argument relies on the intelligibility of the notion of there being at least one powerful being which is self-existing or whose origin and continued being does not depend on any other being. This could be either the all-out necessity of supreme pre-eminence across all possible worlds used in versions of the ontological argument, or a more local, limited notion of a being that is uncaused in the actual world. If successful, the argument would provide reason for thinking there is at least one such being of extraordinary power responsible for the existence of the cosmos. At best, it may not justify a full picture of the God of religion (a First Cause would be powerful, but not necessarily omnipotent), but it would nonetheless challenge naturalistic alternatives and provide some reason theism. (The later point is analogous to the idea that evidence that there was some life on another planet would not establish that such life is intelligent, but it increases—perhaps only slightly—the hypothesis that there is intelligent life on another planet.)
Both versions of the argument ask us to consider the cosmos in its present state. Is the world as we know it something that necessarily exists? At least with respect to ourselves, the planet, the solar system and the galaxy, it appears not. With respect to these items in the cosmos, it makes sense to ask why they exist rather than not. In relation to scientific accounts of the natural world, such enquiries into causes make abundant sense and are perhaps even essential presuppositions of the natural sciences. Some proponents of the argument contend that we know a priori that if something exists there is a reason for its existence. So, why does the cosmos exist? Arguably, if explanations of the contingent existence of the cosmos (or states of the cosmos) are only in terms of other contingent things (earlier states of the cosmos, say), then a full cosmic explanation will never be attained. However, if there is at least one necessarily (non-contingent) being causally responsible for the cosmos, the cosmos does have an explanation. At this point the two versions of the argument divide.
Arguments to a First Cause in time contend that a continuous temporal regress from one contingent existence to another would never account for the existence of the cosmos, and they conclude that it is more reasonable to accept there was a First Cause than to accept either a regress or the claim that the cosmos just came into being from nothing. Arguments to a sustaining cause of the cosmos claim that explanations of why something exists now cannot be adequate without assuming a present, contemporaneous sustaining cause. The arguments have been based on the denial of all actual infinities or on the acceptance of some infinities (for instance, the coherence of supposing there to be infinitely many stars) combined with the rejection of an infinite regress of explanations solely involving contingent states of affairs. The latter has been described as a vicious regress as opposed to one that is benign. There are plausible examples of vicious infinite regresses that do not generate explanations: for instance, imagine that Tom explains his possession of a book by reporting that he got it from A who got it from B, and so on to infinity. This would not explain how Tom got the book. Alternatively, imagine a mirror with light reflected in it. Would the presence of light be successfully explained if one claimed that the light was a reflection of light from another mirror, and the light in that mirror came from yet another mirror, and so on to infinity? Consider a final case. You come across a word you do not understand; let it be “ongggt”. You ask its meaning and are given another word which is unintelligible to you, and so on, forming an infinite regress. Would you ever know the meaning of the first term? The force of these cases is to show how similar they are to the regress of contingent explanations.
Versions of the argument that reject all actual infinities face the embarrassment of explaining what is to be made of the First Cause, especially since it might have some features that are actually infinite. In reply, Craig and others have contended that they have no objection to potential infinities (although the First Cause will never cease to be, it will never become an actual infinity). They further accept that prior to the creation, the First Cause was not in time, a position relying on the theory that time is relational rather than absolute. The current scientific popularity of the relational view may offer support to defenders of the argument.
It has been objected that both versions of the cosmological argument set out an inflated picture of what explanations are reasonable. Why should the cosmos as a whole need an explanation? If everything in the cosmos can be explained, albeit through infinite, regressive accounts, what is left to explain? One may reply either by denying that infinite regresses actually do satisfactorily explain, or by charging that the failure to seek an explanation for the whole is arbitrary. The question, “Why is there a cosmos?” seems a perfectly intelligible one. If there are accounts for things in the cosmos, why not for the whole? The argument is not built on the fallacy of treating every whole as having all the properties of its parts. But if everything in the cosmos is contingent, it seems just as reasonable to believe that the whole cosmos is contingent as it is to believe that if everything in the cosmos were invisible, the cosmos as a whole would be invisible.
Another objection is that rather than explaining the contingent cosmos, the cosmological argument introduces a mysterious entity of which we can make very little philosophical or scientific sense. How can positing at least one First Cause provide a better account of the cosmos than simply concluding that the cosmos lacks an ultimate account? In the end, the theist seems bound to admit that why the First Cause created at all was a contingent matter. If, on the contrary, the theist has to claim that the First Cause had to do what it did, would not the cosmos be necessary rather than contingent?
Some theists come close to concluding that it was indeed essential that God created the cosmos. If God is supremely good, there had to be some overflowing of goodness in the form of a cosmos (see Stump & Kretzmann 1981, on the ideas of Dionysius the Areopagite; see Rowe 2004 for arguments that God is not free). But theists typically reserve some role for the freedom of God and thus seek to retain the idea that the cosmos is contingent. Defenders of the cosmological argument still contend that its account of the cosmos has a comprehensive simplicity lacking in alternative views. God’s choices may be contingent, but not God’s existence and the Divine choice of creating the cosmos can be understood to be profoundly simple in its supreme, overriding endeavor, namely to create something good. Swinburne has argued that accounting for natural laws in terms of God’s will provides for a simple, overarching framework within which to comprehend the order and purposive character of the cosmos (see also Foster 2004).
Defenders of the cosmological argument include Swinburne, Richard Taylor, Hugo Meynell, Timothy O’Connor, Bruce Reichenbach, Robert Koons, Alexander Pruss, and William Rowe; prominent opponents include Antony Flew, Michael Martin, Howard Sobel, Graham Oppy, Nicholas Everitt, and J. L Mackie. While Rowe had defended the cosmological argument, his reservations about the principle of sufficient reason prevents his accepting the argument as fully satisfying.
5.2.3 Teleological arguments
These arguments focus on characteristics of the cosmos that seem to reflect the design or intentionality of God or, more modestly, of one or more powerful, intelligent God-like, purposive forces. Part of the argument may be formulated as providing evidence that the cosmos is the sort of reality that would be produced by an intelligent being, and then arguing that positing this source is more reasonable than agnosticism or denying it. As in the case of the cosmological argument, the defender of the teleological argument may want to claim it only provides some reason for thinking there is a God. It may be that some kind of cumulative case for theism would require construing various arguments as mutually reinforcing. If successful in arguing for an intelligent, trans-cosmos cause, the teleological argument may provide some reason for thinking that the First Cause of the cosmological argument (if it is successful) is purposive, while the ontological argument (if it has some probative force) may provides some reason for thinking that it makes sense to posit a being that has Divine attributes and necessarily exists. Behind all of them an argument from religious experience (to be addressed below) may provide some reasons to seek further support for a religious conception of the cosmos and to question the adequacy of naturalism.
One version of the teleological argument will depend on the intelligibility of purposive explanation. In our own human case it appears that intentional, purposive explanations are legitimate and can truly account for the nature and occurrence of events. In thinking about an explanation for the ultimate character of the cosmos, is it more likely for the cosmos to be accounted for in terms of a powerful, intelligent agent or in terms of a naturalistic scheme of final laws with no intelligence behind them? Theists employing the teleological argument draw attention to the order and stability of the cosmos, the emergence of vegetative and animal life, the existence of consciousness, morality, rational agents and the like, in an effort to identify what might plausibly be seen as purposive explicable features of the cosmos. Naturalistic explanations, whether in biology or physics, are then cast as being comparatively local in application when held up against the broader schema of a theistic metaphysics. Darwinian accounts of biological evolution will not necessarily assist us in thinking through why there are either any such laws or any organisms to begin with. Arguments supporting and opposing the teleological argument will then resemble arguments about the cosmological argument, with the negative side contending that there is no need to move beyond a naturalistic account, and the positive side aiming to establish that failing to go beyond naturalism is unreasonable.
In assessing the teleological argument, consider the objection from uniqueness. The cosmos is utterly unique. There is no access to multiple universes, some of which are known to be designed and some are known not to be. Without being able o compare the cosmos to alternative sets of cosmic worlds, the argument fails. Replies to this objection have contended that were we to insist that inferences in unique cases are out of order, then this would rule out otherwise respectable scientific accounts of the origin of the cosmos. Besides, while it is not possible to compare the layout of different cosmic histories, it is in principle possible to envisage worlds that seem chaotic, random, or based on laws that cripple the emergence of life. Now we can envisage an intelligent being creating such worlds, but, through considering their features, we can articulate some marks of purposive design to help judge whether the cosmos is more reasonably believed to be designed rather than not designed. Some critics appeal to the possibility that the cosmos has an infinite history to bolster and re-introduce the uniqueness objection. Given infinite time and chance, it seems likely that something like our world will come into existence, with all its appearance of design. If so, why should we take it to be so shocking that our world has its apparent design, and why should explaining the world require positing one or more intelligent designers? Replies repeat the earlier move of insisting that if the objection were to be decisive, then many seemingly respectable accounts would also have to fall by the wayside. It is often conceded that the teleological argument does not demonstrate that one or more designers are required; it seeks rather to establish that positing such purposive intelligence is reasonable and preferable to naturalism. Recent defenders of the argument include George Schlesinger, Robin Collins, and Richard Swinburne. It is rejected by J. L. Mackie, Michael Martin, Nicholas Everitt, and many others.
One feature of the teleological argument currently receiving increased attention focuses on epistemology. It has been argued by Richard Taylor (1963), Alvin Plantinga (2011 and in Beilby 2002), and others that if we reasonably rely on our cognitive faculties, it is reasonable to believe that these are not brought about by naturalistic forces—forces that are entirely driven by chance or are the outcome of processes not formed by an overriding intelligence. An illustration may help to understand the argument. Imagine Tom coming across what appears to be a sign reporting some information about his current altitude (some rocks in a configuration giving him his current location and precise height above sea-level in meters). If he had reason to believe that this “sign” was totally the result of chance configurations, would he be reasonable to trust it? Some theists argue that it would not be reasonable, and that trusting our cognitive faculties requires us to accept that they were formed by an overarching, good, creative agent. This rekindles Descartes’ point about relying on the goodness of God to ensure that our cognitive faculties are in good working order. Objections to this argument center on naturalistic explanations, especially those friendly to evolution. In evolutionary epistemology, one tries to account for the reliability of cognitive faculties in terms of trial and error leading to survival. A rejoinder by theists is that survival alone is not necessarily linked to true beliefs. It could, in principle, be false beliefs that enhance survival. In fact, some atheists think that believing in God has been crucial to people’s survival, though the belief is radically false. Evolutionary epistemologists reply that the lack of a necessary link between beliefs that promote survival and truth and the fact that some false beliefs or unreliable belief producing mechanisms promote survival nor falls far short of undermining evolutionary epistemology. See Martin (1990), Mackie (1983), and Tooley (see Tooley’s chapters 2, 4, and 6 in Plantinga & Tooley 2008), among others, object to the epistemic teleological argument.
Another recent development in teleological argumentation has involved an argument from fine-tuning.
Fine tuning arguments contend that life would not exist were it not for the fact that multiple physical parameters (e.g., the cosmological constant and the ratio of the mass of the neutron to the mass of the proton) have numerical values that fall within a range of values known to be life-permitting that is very narrow compared to the range of values that are compatible with current physical theory and are known to be life-prohibiting. For example, even minor changes to the nuclear weak force would not have allowed for stars, nor would stars have endured if the ratio of electromagnetism to gravity had been much different. John Leslie observes:
Alterations by less than one part in a billion to the expansion speed early in the Big Bang would have led to runaway expansion, everything quickly becoming so dilute that no stars could have formed, or else to gravitational collapse inside under a second. (Leslie 2007: 76)
Robin Collins and others have argued that theism better accounts for the fine tuning than naturalism (see Collins 2009; for criticism of the argument, see Craig & Smith 1993). For a collection of articles covering both sides of the debate and both biological and cosmological design arguments, see Manson 2003.
A more sustained objection against virtually all versions of the teleological argument takes issue with the assumption that the cosmos is good or that it is the sort of thing that would be brought about by an intelligent, completely benevolent being. This leads us directly to the next central concern of the philosophy of God.
5.2.4 Problems of evil
If there is a God who is omnipotent, omniscient, and completely good, why is there evil? The problem of evil is the most widely considered objection to theism in both Western and Eastern philosophy. There are two general versions of the problem: the deductive or logical version, which asserts that the existence of any evil at all (regardless of its role in producing good) is incompatible with God’s existence; and the probabilistic version, which asserts that given the quantity and severity of evil that actually exists, it is unlikely that God exists. The deductive problem is currently less commonly debated because many (but not all) philosophers acknowledge that a thoroughly good being might allow or inflict some harm under certain morally compelling conditions (such as causing a child pain when removing a splinter). More intense debate concerns the likelihood (or even possibility) that there is a completely good God given the vast amount of evil in the cosmos. Such evidential arguments from evil may be deductive or inductive arguments but they include some attempt to show that some known fact about evil bears a negative evidence relation to theism (e.g., it lowers its probability or renders it improbable) whether or not it is logically incompatible with theism. Consider human and animal suffering caused by death, predation, birth defects, ravaging diseases, virtually unchecked human wickedness, torture, rape, oppression, and “natural disasters”. Consider how often those who suffer are innocent. Why should there be so much gratuitous, apparently pointless evil?
In the face of the problem of evil, some philosophers and theologians deny that God is all-powerful and all-knowing. John Stuart Mill took this line, and panentheist theologians today also question the traditional treatments of Divine power. According to panentheism, God is immanent in the world, suffering with the oppressed and working to bring good out of evil, although in spite of God’s efforts, evil will invariably mar the created order. Another response is to think of God as being very different from a moral agent. Brian Davies and others have contended that what it means for God to be good is different from what it means for an agent to be morally good (Davies 2006). See also Mark Murphy’s 2017 book God’s Own Ethics; Norms of Divine Agency and the Argument from Evil. A different, more substantial strategy is to deny the existence of evil, but it is difficult to reconcile traditional monotheism with moral skepticism. Also, insofar as we believe there to be a God worthy of worship and a fitting object of human love, the appeal to moral skepticism will carry little weight. The idea that evil is a privation or twisting of the good may have some currency in thinking through the problem of evil, but it is difficult to see how it alone could go very far to vindicate belief in God’s goodness. Searing pain and endless suffering seem altogether real even if they are analyzed as being philosophically parasitic on something valuable. The three great monotheistic, Abrahamic traditions, with their ample insistence on the reality of evil, offer little reason to try to defuse the problem of evil by this route. Indeed, classical Judaism, Christianity, and Islam are so committed to the existence of evil that a reason to reject evil would be a reason to reject these religious traditions. What would be the point of the Judaic teaching about the Exodus (God liberating the people of Israel from slavery), or the Christian teaching about the incarnation (Christ revealing God as love and releasing a Divine power that will, in the end, conquer death), or the Islamic teaching of Mohammed (the holy prophet of Allah, whom is all-just and all-merciful) if slavery, hate, death, and injustice did not exist?
In part, the magnitude of the difficulty one takes the problem of evil to pose for theism will depend upon one’s commitments in other areas of philosophy, especially ethics, epistemology, and metaphysics. If in ethics you hold that there should be no preventable suffering for any reason, regardless of the cause or consequence, then the problem of evil will conflict with your acceptance of traditional theism. Moreover, if you hold that any solution to the problem of evil should be evident to all persons, then again traditional theism is in jeopardy, for clearly the “solution” is not evident to all. Debate has largely centered on the legitimacy of adopting some middle position: a theory of values that would preserve a clear assessment of the profound evil in the cosmos as well as some understanding of how this might be compatible with the existence of an all powerful, completely good Creator. Could there be reasons why God would permit cosmic ills? If we do not know what those reasons might be, are we in a position to conclude that there are none or that there could not be any? Exploring different possibilities will be shaped by one’s metaphysics. For example, if you do not believe there is free will, then you will not be moved by any appeal to the positive value of free will and its role in bringing about good as offsetting its role in bringing about evil.
Theistic responses to the problem of evil distinguish between a defense and a theodicy. A defense seeks to establish that rational belief that God exists is still possible (when the defense is employed against the logical version of the problem of evil) and that the existence of evil does not make it improbable that God exists (when used against the probabilistic version). Some have adopted the defense strategy while arguing that we are in a position to have rational belief in the existence of evil and in a completely good God who hates this evil, even though we may be unable to see how these two beliefs are compatible. A theodicy is more ambitious and is typically part of a broader project, arguing that it is reasonable to believe that God exists on the basis of the good as well as the evident evil of the cosmos. In a theodicy, the project is not to account for each and every evil, but to provide an overarching framework within which to understand at least roughly how the evil that occurs is part of some overall good—for instance, the overcoming of evil is itself a great good. In practice, a defense and a theodicy often appeal to similar factors, the first and foremost being what many call the Greater Good Defense.
5.2.5 Evil and the greater good
In the Greater Good Defense, it is contended that evil can be understood as either a necessary accompaniment to bringing about greater goods or an integral part of these goods. Thus, in a version often called the Free Will Defense, it is proposed that free creatures who are able to care for each other and whose welfare depends on each other’s freely chosen action constitute a good. For this good to be realized, it is argued, there must be the bona fide possibility of persons harming each other. The free will defense is sometimes used narrowly only to cover evil that occurs as a result, direct or indirect, of human action. But it has been speculatively extended by those proposing a defense rather than a theodicy to cover other evils which might be brought about by supernatural agents other than God. According to the Greater Good case, evil provides an opportunity to realize great values, such as the virtues of courage and the pursuit of justice. Reichenbach (1982), Tennant (1930), Swinburne (1979), and van Inwagen (2006) have also underscored the good of a stable world of natural laws in which animals and humans learn about the cosmos and develop autonomously, independent of the certainty that God exists. Some atheists accord value to the good of living in a world without God, and these views have been used by theists to back up the claim that God might have had reason to create a cosmos in which Divine existence is not overwhelmingly obvious to us. If God’s existence were overwhelmingly obvious, then motivations to virtue might be clouded by self-interest and by the bare fear of offending an omnipotent being. Further, there may even be some good to acting virtuously even if circumstances guarantee a tragic outcome. John Hick (1966 ) so argued and has developed what he construes to be an Irenaean approach to the problem of evil (named after St. Irenaeus of the second century). On this approach, it is deemed good that humanity develops the life of virtue gradually, evolving to a life of grace, maturity, and love. This contrasts with a theodicy associated with St. Augustine, according to which God made us perfect and then allowed us to fall into perdition, only to be redeemed later by Christ. Hick thinks the Augustinian model fails whereas the Irenaean one is credible.
Some have based an argument from the problem of evil on the charge that this is not the best possible world. If there were a supreme, maximally excellent God, surely God would bring about the best possible creation. Because this is not the best possible creation, there is no supreme, maximally excellent God. Following Adams (1987), many now reply that the whole notion of a best possible world, like the highest possible number, is incoherent. For any world that can be imagined with such and such happiness, goodness, virtue and so on, a higher one can be imagined. If the notion of a best possible world is incoherent, would this count against belief that there could be a supreme, maximally excellent being? It has been argued on the contrary that Divine excellences admit of upper limits or maxima that are not quantifiable in a serial fashion (for example, Divine omnipotence involves being able to do anything logically or metaphysically possible, but does not require actually doing the greatest number of acts or a series of acts of which there can be no more).
Those concerned with the problem of evil clash over the question of how one assesses the likelihood of Divine existence. Someone who reports seeing no point to the existence of evil or no justification for God to allow it seems to imply that if there were a point they would see it. Note the difference between seeing no point and not seeing a point. In the cosmic case, is it clear that if there were a reason justifying the existence of evil, we would see it? William Rowe thinks some plausible understanding of God’s justificatory reason for allowing the evil should be detectable, but that there are cases of evil that are altogether gratuitous. Defenders like William Hasker (1989) and Stephen Wykstra (1984) reply that these cases are not decisive counter-examples to the claim that there is a good God. These philosophers hold that we can recognize evil and grasp our duty to do all in our power to prevent or alleviate it. But we should not take our failure to see what reason God might have for allowing evil to count as grounds for thinking that there is no reason. This later move has led to a position commonly called skeptical theism. Michael Bergmann, Michael Rea, William Alston and others have argued that we have good reason to be skeptical about whether we can assess whether ostensibly gratuitous evils may or may not be permitted by an all-good God (Bergmann 2012a and 2012b, 2001; Bergmann & Rea 2005; for criticism see Almeida & Oppy 2003; Draper 2014, 2013, 1996). Overall, it needs to be noted that from the alleged fact that we would be unlikely to see a reason for God to allow some evil if there were one, it only follows that our failure to see such a reason is not strong evidence against theism.
For an interesting practical application of the traditional problem of evil to the topic of the ethics of procreation, see Marsh 2015. It has been argued that if one does believe that the world is not good, then that can provide a prima facie reason against procreation. Why should one bring children into a world that is not good? Another interesting, recent development in the philosophy of religion literature has been the engagement of philosophers with ostensible evils that God commands in the Bible (see Bergmann, Murray, & Rea 2010). For a fascinating engagement with the problem of evil that employs Biblical narratives, see Eleonore Stumps’ Wandering in Darkness (2010). The treatment of the problem of evil has also extended to important reflection on the suffering of non-human animals (see S. Clark 1987, 1995, 2017; Murray 2008; Meister 2018). Problems raised by evil and suffering are multifarious and are being addressed by contemporary philosophers across the religious and non-religious spectrums. See, for example, The History of Evil edited by Meister and Taliaferro, in six volumes with over 130 contributors from virtually all religious and secular points of view, and the recent The Cambridge Companion to the Problem of Evil edited by Meister and Moser (2017).
Some portraits of an afterlife seem to have little bearing on our response to the magnitude of evil here and now. Does it help to understand why God allows evil if all victims will receive happiness later? But it is difficult to treat the possibility of an afterlife as entirely irrelevant. Is death the annihilation of persons or an event involving a transfiguration to a higher state? If you do not think that it matters whether persons continue to exist after death, then such speculation is of little consequence. But suppose that the afterlife is understood as being morally intertwined with this life, with opportunity for moral and spiritual reformation, transfiguration of the wicked, rejuvenation and occasions for new life, perhaps even reconciliation and communion between oppressors seeking forgiveness and their victims. Then these considerations might help to defend against arguments based on the existence of evil. Insofar as one cannot rule out the possibility of an afterlife morally tied to our life, one cannot rule out the possibility that God brings some good out of cosmic ills. For two recent arguments against a positive theistic appeal to an afterlife, see Sterba 2019 141–156, and Ekstrom 2021;131–155 — compare with Mawson 2016.
The most recent work on the afterlife in philosophy of religion has focused on the compatibility of an individual afterlife with some forms of physicalism. Arguably, a dualist treatment of human persons is more promising. If you are not metaphysically identical with your body, then perhaps the annihilation of your body is not the annihilation of you. Today, a range of philosophers have argued that even if physicalism is true, an afterlife is still possible (Peter van Inwagen, Lynne Baker, Trenton Merricks, Kevin Corcoran). The import of this work for the problem of evil is that the possible redemptive value of an afterlife should not be ruled out (without argument) if one assumes physicalism to be true. (For an extraordinary, rich resource on the relevant literature, see The Oxford Handbook of Eschatology, edited by J. Walls, 2007.)
5.2.6 Religious experience
Perhaps the justification most widely offered for religious belief concerns the occurrence of religious experience or the cumulative weight of testimony of those claiming to have had religious experiences. Putting the latter case in theistic terms, the argument appeals to the fact that many people have testified that they have felt God’s presence. Does such testimony provide evidence that God exists? That it is evidence has been argued by Jerome Gellman, Keith Yandell, William Alston, Caroline Davis, Gary Gutting, Kai-Man Kwan, Richard Swinburne, Charles Taliaferro, and others. That it is not (or that its evidential force is trivial) is argued by Michael Martin, J. L. Mackie, Kai Nielson, Matthew Bagger, John Schellenberg, William Rowe, Graham Oppy, and others. In an effort to stimulate further investigation, consider the following sketch of some of the moves and countermoves in the debate.
Objection: Religious experience cannot be experience of God for perceptual experience is only sensory and if God is non-physical, God cannot be sensed.
Reply: The thesis that perceptual experience is only sensory can be challenged. Yandell marks out some experiences (as when one has “a feeling” someone is present but without having any accompanying sensations) that might provide grounds for questioning a narrow sensory notion of perceptual experience.
Objection: Testimony to have experienced God is only testimony that one thinks one has experienced God; it is only testimony of a conviction, not evidence.
Reply: The literature on religious experience testifies to the existence of experience of some Divine being on the basis of which the subject comes to think the experience is of God. If read charitably, the testimony is not testimony to a conviction, but to experiences that form the grounds for the conviction. (See Bagger 1999 for a vigorous articulation of this objection, and note the reply by Kai-man Kwam 2003).
Objection: Because religious experience is unique, how could one ever determine whether it is reliable? We simply lack the ability to examine the object of religious experience in order to test whether the reported experiences are indeed reliable.
Reply: As we learned from Descartes, all our experiences of external objects face a problem of uniqueness. It is possible in principle that all our senses are mistaken and we do not have the public, embodied life we think we lead. We cannot step out of our own subjectivity to vindicate our ordinary perceptual beliefs any more than in the religious case. (See the debate between William Alston  and Evan Fales ).
Objection: Reports of religious experience differ radically and the testimony of one religious party neutralizes the testimony of others. The testimony of Hindus cancels out the testimony of Christians. The testimony of atheists to experience God’s absence cancels out the testimony of “believers”.
Reply: Several replies might be offered here. Testimony to experience the absence of God might be better understood as testimony not to experience God. Failing to experience God might be justification for believing that there is no God only to the extent that we have reason to believe that if God exists God would be experienced by all. Theists might even appeal to the claim by many atheists that it can be virtuous to live ethically with atheist beliefs. Perhaps if there is a God, God does not think this is altogether bad, and actually desires religious belief to be fashioned under conditions of trust and faith rather than knowledge. The diversity of religious experiences has caused some defenders of the argument from religious experience to mute their conclusion. Thus, Gutting (1982) contends that the argument is not strong enough to fully vindicate a specific religious tradition, but that it is strong enough to overturn an anti-religious naturalism. Other defenders use their specific tradition to deal with ostensibly competing claims based on different sorts of religious experiences. Theists have proposed that more impersonal experiences of the Divine represent only one aspect of God. God is a person or is person-like, but God can also be experienced, for example, as sheer luminous unity. Hindus have claimed the experience of God as personal is only one stage in the overall journey of the soul to truth, the highest truth being that Brahman transcends personhood. (For a discussion of these objections and replies and references, see Taliaferro 1998.)
How one settles the argument will depend on one’s overall convictions in many areas of philosophy. The holistic, interwoven nature of both theistic and atheistic arguments can be readily illustrated. If you diminish the implications of religious experience and have a high standard regarding the burden of proof for any sort of religious outlook, then it is highly likely that the classical arguments for God’s existence will not be persuasive. Moreover, if one thinks that theism can be shown to be intellectually confused from the start, then theistic arguments from religious experience will carry little weight. Testimony to have experienced God will have no more weight than testimony to have experienced a round square, and non-religious explanations of religious experience—like those of Freud (a result of wish-fulfillment), Marx (a reflection of the economic base), or Durkheim (a product of social forces)—will increase their appeal. If, on the other hand, you think the theistic picture is coherent and that the testimony of religious experience provides some evidence for theism, then your assessment of the classical theistic arguments might be more favorable, for they would serve to corroborate and further support what you already have some reason to believe. From such a vantage point, appeal to wish-fulfillment, economics, and social forces might have a role, but the role is to explain why some parties do not have experiences of God and to counter the charge that failure to have such experiences provides evidence that there is no religious reality. (For an excellent collection of recent work on explaining the emergence and continuation of religious experience, see Schloss & Murray (eds.) 2009.)
There is not space to cover the many other arguments for and against the existence of God, but several additional arguments are briefly noted. The argument from miracles starts from specific extraordinary events, arguing that they provide reasons for believing there to be a supernatural agent or, more modestly, reasons for skepticism about the sufficiency of a naturalistic world view. The argument has attracted much philosophical attention, especially since David Hume’s rejection of miracles. The debate has turned mainly on how one defines a miracle, understands the laws of nature, and specifies the principles of evidence that govern the explanation of highly unusual historical occurrences. There is considerable debate over whether Hume’s case against miracles simply begs the question against “believers”. Detailed exposition is impossible in this short entry. Taliaferro has argued elsewhere that Hume’s case against the rationality of belief in miracles is best seen as part of his overall case for a form of naturalism (Taliaferro 2005b).
There are various arguments that are advanced to motivate religious belief. One of the most interesting and popular is a wager argument often associated with Pascal (1623–1662). It is designed to offer practical reasons to cultivate a belief in God. Imagine that you are unsure whether there is or is not a God. You have it within your power to live on either assumption and perhaps, through various practices, to get yourself to believe one or the other. There would be good consequences of believing in God even if your belief were false, and if the belief were true you would receive even greater good. There would also be good consequences of believing that there is no God, but in this case the consequences would not alter if you were correct. If, however, you believe that there is no God and you are wrong, then you would risk losing the many goods which follow from the belief that God exists and from actual Divine existence. On this basis, it may seem reasonable to believe there is a God.
In different forms the argument may be given a rough edge (for example, imagine that if you do not believe in God and there is a God, hell is waiting). It may be put as an appeal to individual self-interest (you will be better off) or more generally (believers whose lives are bound together can realize some of the goods comprising a mature religious life). Objectors worry about whether one ever is able to bring choices down to just such a narrow selection—for example, to choose either theism or naturalism. Some think the argument is too thoroughly egotistic and thus offensive to religion. Many of these objections have generated some plausible replies (Rescher 1985). (For a thoroughgoing exploration of the relevant arguments, see the collection of essays edited by Jeffrey Jordan (1994).)
Recent work on Pascalian wagering has a bearing on work on the nature of faith (is it voluntary or involuntary?), its value (when, if ever, is it a virtue?), and relation to evidence (insofar as faith involves belief, is it possible to have faith without evidence?). For an overview and promising analysis, see Chappell (1996), Swinburne (1979), Schellenberg (2005), and Rota (2016). A promising feature of such new work is that it is often accompanied by a rich understanding of revelation that is not limited to a sacred scripture, but sees a revelatory role in scripture plus the history of its interpretation, the use of creeds, icons, and so on (see the work of William Abraham ).
A burgeoning question in recent years is whether the cognitive science of religion (CSR) has significance for the truth or rationality of religious commitment. According to CSR, belief in supernatural agents appears to be cognitively natural (Barrett 2004, Kelemen 2004, Dennett 2006, De Cruz, H., & De Smedt, J. 2010) and easy to spread (Boyer 2001). The naturalness of religion thesis has led some, including Alvin Plantinga it seems (2011: 60), to imply that we have scientific evidence for Calvin’s sensus divinitatis. But others have argued that CSR can intensify the problem of divine hiddenness, since diverse religious concepts are cognitively natural and early humans seem to have lacked anything like a theistic concept (Marsh 2013). There are many other questions being investigated about CSR, such as whether it provides a debunking challenge to religion (Murray & Schloss 2009), whether it poses a cultural challenge for religious outlooks like Schellenberg’s Ultimism (Marsh 2014), and whether it challenges human dignity (Audi 2013). Needless to say, at the present time, there is nothing like a clear consensus on whether CSR should be seen as worrisome, welcome, or neither, by religious believers.
For some further work on the framework of assessing the evidence for and against theism (and other religious and secular worldviews) see C. S. Evans 2010, Chandler and Harrison 2012. In the last twenty years there has been increasing attention given to the aesthetic dimension of arguments for and against religiously significant conceptions of ultimate reality and of the meaning of life (see Brown 2004; Wynn 2013; Hedley 2016; Mawson 2016; Taliaferro & Evans 2010, 2013, 2021).For its breadth and nuanced use of philosophy and aesthetics, see Anthony O’Hear’s 2020 work Transcendence, Creation and Incarnation.
6. Religious Pluralism
In the midst of the new work on religious traditions, there has been a steady, growing representation of non-monotheistic traditions. An early proponent of this expanded format was Ninian Smart (1927–2001), who, through many publications, scholarly as well as popular, secured philosophies of Hinduism and Buddhism as components in the standard canon of English-speaking philosophy of religion.
Smart championed the thesis that there are genuine differences between religious traditions. He therefore resisted seeing some core experience as capturing the essential identity of being religious. Under Smart’s tutelage, there has been considerable growth in cross-cultural philosophy of religion. Wilfred Cantwell Smith (1916–2000) also did a great deal to improve the representation of non-Western religions and reflection. See, for example, the Routledge series Investigating Philosophy of Religion with Routledge with volumes already published or forthcoming on Buddhism (Burton 2017), Hinduism (Ranganathan 2018), Daoism, and Confucianism. The five volume Encyclopedia of Philosophy of Religion (mentioned earlier) to be published by Wiley Blackwell (projected for 2021) will have ample contributions on the widest spectrum of philosophical treatments of diverse religions to date.
The explanation of philosophy of religion has involved fresh translations of philosophical and religious texts from India, China, Southeast Asia, and Africa. Exceptional figures from non-Western traditions have an increased role in cross-cultural philosophy of religion and religious dialogue. The late Bimal Krishna Matilal (1935–1991) made salient contributions to enrich Western exposure to Indian philosophy of religion (see Matilal 1882). Among the mid-twentieth-century Asian philosophers, two who stand out for special note are T.R.V. Murti (1955) and S.N. Dasgupta (1922–1955). Both brought high philosophical standards along with the essential philology to educate Western thinkers. As evidence of non-Western productivity in the Anglophone world, see Arvind Sharma 1990 and 1995. There are now extensive treatments of pantheism and student-friendly guides to diverse religious conceptions of the cosmos.
The expanded interest in religious pluralism has led to extensive reflection on the compatibility and possible synthesis of religions. John Hick is the preeminent synthesizer of religious traditions. Hick (1973 a and b)) advanced a complex picture of the afterlife involving components from diverse traditions. Over many publications and many years, Hick has moved from a broadly based theistic view of God to what Hick calls “the Real”, a noumenal sacred reality. Hick claims that different religions provide us with a glimpse or partial access to the Real. In an influential article, “The New Map of the Universe of Faiths” (1973a), Hick raised the possibility that many of the great world religions are revelatory of the Real.
Seen in [an] historical context these movements of faith—the Judaic-Christian, the Buddhist, the Hindu, the Muslim—are not essentially rivals. They began at different times and in different places, and each expanded outwards into the surrounding world of primitive natural religion until most of the world was drawn up into one or the other of the great revealed faiths. And once this global pattern had become established it has ever since remained fairly stable… Then in Persia the great prophet Zoroaster appeared; China produced Lao-tzu and then the Buddha lived, the Mahavira, the founder of the Jain religion and, probably about the end of this period, the writing of the Bhagavad Gita; and Greece produced Pythagoras and then, ending this golden age, Socrates and Plato. Then after the gap of some three hundred years came Jesus of Nazareth and the emergence of Christianity; and after another gap the prophet Mohammed and the rise of Islam. The suggestion that we must consider is that these were all movements of the divine revelation. (Hick 1989: 136; emphasis added)
Hick sees these traditions, and others as well, as different meeting points in which a person might be in relation to the same reality or the Real:
The great world faiths embody different perceptions and conceptions of, and correspondingly different responses to, the Real from within the major variant ways of being human; and that within each of them the transformation of human existence from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness is taking place. (1989: 240)
Hick uses Kant to develop his central thesis.
Kant distinguishes between noumenon and phenomenon, or between a Ding an sich [the thing itself] and the thing as it appears to human consciousness…. In this strand of Kant’s thought—not the only strand, but the one which I am seeking to press into service in the epistemology of religion—the noumenal world exists independently of our perception of it and the phenomenal world is that same world as it appears to our human consciousness…. I want to say that the noumenal Real is experienced and thought by different human mentalities, forming and formed by different religious traditions, as the range of gods and absolutes which the phenomenology of religion reports. (1989: 241–242)
One advantage of Hick’s position is that it undermines a rationale for religious conflict. If successful, this approach would offer a way to accommodate diverse communities and undermine what has been a source of grave conflict in the past.
Hick’s work since the early 1980s provided an impetus for not taking what appears to be religious conflict as outright contradictions. He advanced a philosophy of religion that paid careful attention to the historical and social context. By doing so, Hick thought that apparently conflicting descriptions of the sacred could be reconciled as representing different perspectives on the same reality, the Real (see Hick 2004, 2006).
The response to Hick’s proposal has been mixed. Some contend that the very concept of “the Real” is incoherent or not religiously adequate. Indeed, articulating the nature of the Real is no easy task. Hick writes that the Real
cannot be said to be one thing or many, person or thing, substance or process, good or bad, purposive or non-purposive. None of the concrete descriptions that apply within the realm of human experience can apply literally to the unexperienceable ground of that realm…. We cannot even speak of this as a thing or an entity. (1989: 246).
It has been argued that Hick has secured not the equal acceptability of diverse religions but rather their unacceptability. In their classical forms, Judaism, Islam, and Christianity diverge. If, say, the Incarnation of God in Christ did not occur, isn’t Christianity false? In reply, Hick has sought to interpret specific claims about the Incarnation in ways that do not commit Christians to the “literal truth” of God becoming enfleshed. The “truth” of the Incarnation has been interpreted in such terms as these: in Jesus Christ (or in the narratives about Christ) God is disclosed. Or: Jesus Christ was so united with God’s will that his actions were and are the functional display of God’s character. Perhaps as a result of Hick’s challenge, philosophical work on the incarnation and other beliefs and practice specific to religious traditions have received renewed attention (see, for example, Taliaferro and Meister 2009). Hick has been a leading, widely appreciated force in the expansion of philosophy of religion in the late twentieth century.
In addition to the expansion of philosophy of religion to take into account a wider set of religions, the field has also seen an expansion in terms of methodology. Philosophers of religion have re-discovered medieval philosophy—the new translations and commentaries of medieval Christian, Jewish, and Islamic texts have blossomed. There is now a self-conscious, deliberate effort to combine work on the concepts in religious belief alongside a critical understanding of their social and political roots (the work of Foucault has been influential on this point), feminist philosophy of religion has been especially important in re-thinking what may be called the ethics of methodology and, as this is in some respects the most current debate in the field, it is a fitting point to end this entry by highlighting the work of Pamela Sue Anderson (1955–2017) and others.
Anderson (1997 and 2012) seeks to question respects in which gender enters into traditional conceptions of God and in their moral and political repercussions. She also advances a concept of method which delimits justice and human flourishing. A mark of legitimation of philosophy should be the extent to which it contributes to human welfare. In a sense, this is a venerable thesis in some ancient, specifically Platonic philosophy that envisaged the goal and method of philosophy in terms of virtue and the good. Feminist philosophy today is not exclusively a critical undertaking, critiquing “patriarchy”. For a constructive, subtle treatment of religious contemplation and practice, see Coakley 2002. Another key movement that is developing has come to be called Continental Philosophy of Religion. A major advocate of this new turn is John Caputo. This movement approaches the themes of this entry (the concept of God, pluralism, religious experience, metaphysics and epistemology) in light of Heidegger, Derrida, and other continental philosophers. (For a good representation of this movement, see Caputo 2001 and Crocket, Putt, & Robins 2014.)
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I am indebted to John Deck, Cara Stevens, and Thomas Churchill for comments and assistance in preparing an earlier version of this entry. Portions of this entry appeared previously in C. Taliaferro, “Philosophy of Religion”, in N. Bunnin and E.P. Tsui-James (eds.), The Blackwell Companion to Philosophy, 2nd edition, Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.