Plato’s Cratylus

First published Sat May 6, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by David Meißner replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

The Cratylus is the only Platonic dialogue devoted exclusively to language and its relation to reality. But its specific topic—the “correctness of names” (orthotês tôn onomatôn)—seems to have so little to do with the concerns of modern philosophers of language that it needs some introduction. The first thing to note is that the Greek term onomata (onoma in the singular), standardly translated as “names”, denotes not only proper names and common nouns, but also adjectives and even verbs in infinitive and participle mood. When investigating the “correctness of names”, the Cratylus attempts to ascertain why it is correct to use certain members of this motley class of linguistic items to refer to certain elements of reality. Most of us would not hesitate to assert that correctness in this sense is a matter of decision or convention. Saying that it is correct to use the common noun “horse” to refer to horses can only mean, it seems, that “horse” is conventionally used in this way. This appealing position, widely known as conventionalism, is not absent from the Cratylus: It is championed by Hermogenes, the dialogue’s first protagonist. But Cratylus, the dialogue’s second protagonist, begs to differ. He stubbornly espouses a rather cryptic naturalism, claiming that a correct name for any given element of reality needs to fulfil an elusive natural standard. Socrates, the dialogue’s third protagonist, adjudicates on the contested issue.

The Cratylus is (in)famous for its surprising twists and turns, and it is often considered one of Plato’s most vexing works. It has also proven difficult to determine its place within Plato’s oeuvre. As it introduces Platonic forms in a way that is reminiscent of the Phaedo, many commentators assume that it must have been written in the same period as this dialogue (see, e.g., Ross 1955; Luce 1964; Levin 2001: 4 n. 4). But it also provides a somewhat preliminary treatment of issues that are discussed more fully in later dialogues like the Theaetetus and the Sophist, and so a variety of alternative datings have been discussed (see, e.g., Kirk 1951; Mackenzie 1986; Sedley 2003: 6–16). There is, however, another (and arguably more important) sense in which the Cratylus is hard to pin down: It is not clear how its main topic—the correctness of names—is connected with Plato’s other philosophical concerns. This is probably the reason why this fascinating dialogue is often treated in a cursory way in general discussions of Plato’s philosophy.

1. The Cratylus and Its Personae—a First Overview

Who are the protagonists of the Cratylus? All of them are historical figures—citizens of fifth and fourth century Athens, to be precise. Hermogenes was a (possibly illegitimate) offspring of a very wealthy and powerful Athenian dynasty (on which see Nails 2002: 68–74), but did apparently not inherit anything from his family (391c). Always in financial troubles (384c), he was a committed member of the circle around Socrates; as the Phaedo (59b) indicates, he was even present at Socrates’ death. Cratylus was a philosopher who, according to Aristotle’s report, taught the young Plato (Metaphysics 987a29–b7). He is known as a radical advocate of the Heraclitean claim that everything is in flux; apparently, he even stopped speaking at some point because he took speaking to be senseless in a world of flux (Metaphysics 1010a7–15). In the Cratylus, he appears to be at an early stage of his philosophical career, just beginning to appropriate Heraclitean positions (440d–e; cf. Kirk 1951: 236). About Socrates, the third protagonist, there is so much to say that interested readers should consult the entry on Socrates. One well-known fact appears to be particularly relevant in the present context, however: Socrates was the other teacher of the young Plato—which means that the Cratylus is an encounter between the two philosophers who influenced Plato most directly.

The Cratylus begins when Socrates joins the on-going debate between Cratylus and Hermogenes as an arbiter. He first invites Hermogenes to state his conventionalist view of the correctness of names (383a–386e)—and refutes him by presenting an argument for the conclusion that names are indeed subject to a standard of natural correctness (386e–390e). Asked to expand on this standard (391a), Socrates conjectures that a correct name needs to be a portmanteau: Like the name “shepherd” (from “sheep” and “herder”), it needs to be composed of other names in a way that ensures that it encapsulates a description of what its referents are (390e–394e). He illustrates this conjecture by uncovering the descriptive content of many Greek names in a famous—and famously extensive—etymological survey (394e–421c). The survey ends abruptly when Socrates realizes that he cannot account for the correctness of all names in this way; there must, after all, be some names that are not composed of other names. Socrates’ hypothesis is that these names are correct because they are imitations of what their referents are (421c–427d). He thus arrives at a two-tiered naturalist theory of the correctness of names. Cratylus, who takes over from Hermogenes as Socrates’ interlocutor, endorses this theory enthusiastically. But in a surprising twist, Socrates turns against his own brainchild and compels Cratylus to admit that convention is a factor that contributes to the correctness of names (427d–435d). He never spells out, however, what exactly the contribution of convention is. He rather goes on to refute Cratylus’ further claim that unearthing the descriptive content of names yields unshakable evidence for the belief that reality is in a state of flux (435d–439c)—and ends his investigation by sketching four arguments for the existence of unchangeable forms (439c–440e).

2. Exegetical Divides

As should be clear from the above summary, the Cratylus is a long and intricate work, and it raises many pressing questions. But there seems to be one question that must play a role in any attempt to arrive at an overall interpretation of this dialogue:

Which view of the correctness of names does the Cratylus support?

Given the obvious importance of this question, it is reasonable to provide a quick overview of the possible answers before taking a closer look at the Cratylus. There are three such answers, corresponding to three possible readings of the Cratylus:

  • Reading A: Some commentators believe that the Cratylus supports Hermogenes’ conventionalism. In their view, Plato’s readers are not supposed to accept Socrates’ refutation of conventionalism and the naturalist theory he elaborates at 390e–427d. Instead, they are to infer from Socrates’ criticism of this naturalist theory at 430a–435b that Hermogenes was right all along with his denial of a natural correctness of names. (See Lanzalaco 1955; Guzzo 1956; Robinson 1956; Bestor 1980; Rehn 1982; Schofield 1982; and Ademollo 2009 and 2011.)
  • Reading B: Other commentators take the arguments of 430a–435b to establish a very different result: Conventions may ensure that (some) names fulfil a certain minimal standard of correctness; but nevertheless, the extent to which names are correct depends on how well they describe or imitate what their referents are. It is thus the naturalist theory of the correctness of names elaborated at 390e–427d that is borne out by the Cratylus, albeit in a refined version which ascribes a certain limited role to convention. (See Grote 1865: ch. XXIX; Benfey 1866: Weingartner 1970; Anagnostopoulos 1973; Fine 1977; Palmer 1989; Barney 2001; and Sedley 2003.)
  • Reading C: Yet other commentators urge a sharp distinction between the claim that there is a natural correctness of names and the claim that correct names need to describe or imitate what their referents are. They argue that the Cratylus supports the former and undermines the latter claim. (See Kretzmann 1971; Kahn 1973; Gold 1978; Ketchum 1979; Heitsch 1984; and Meißner forthcoming a.)

It would be an exaggeration to say that these are the only available interpretations of the Cratylus. There are, for example, authors who claim that Plato’s main goal in the Cratylus is to debunk the idea that etymological analyses can lead to philosophical knowledge (Baxter 1992 and Keller 2000), or that he wishes to make an ontological point about flux and stability (Gaiser 1974). But the most important dividing lines among interpreters of the Cratylus have certainly been exhibited by distinguishing between Reading A, Reading B, and Reading C; and it will become evident in due course that many scholarly disputes about individual passages and arguments can be traced back to the differences between these readings.

3. Hermogenes’ Conventionalism (383a–386e)

When Socrates agrees to join the debate between Hermogenes and Cratylus, Hermogenes immediately bursts out with his own view of the correctness of names (384c–e). Frustrated by the on-going quarrel with a recalcitrant Cratylus, he is probably hoping for some sort of support, or at least for clarity. However, Socrates reacts by asking questions and presenting arguments that do not make any immediately recognizable contribution to the clarification of the issue at hand (384e–386e). The present section will ascertain what Hermogenes wishes to claim and discuss the perplexing way in which Socrates responds to Hermogenes’ contentions.

3.1 What Hermogenes Does (Not) Say

Hermogenes’ main claim is—as has already been indicated—that it is completely dependent on conventions and decisions whether any given name is a correct name for any object or kind of object. Today, a convention ensures that “Boris Johnson” is a correct name for a former prime minister of the United Kingdom; but if Hermogenes is right, this convention might be changed tomorrow, and the very same name might then be a correct name for the cat that currently lives in 10 Downing Street. One can thus never go wrong in imposing a name on a given (kind of) object—such an act will automatically turn the name into a correct name for this (kind of) object.

As it stands, this claim seems plausible. Note, however, that it needs to be distinguished very carefully from the infinitely less plausible claim that one cannot go wrong in using a name that has already been imposed on some (kind of) object. Scholars used to agree that Hermogenes fails to make this vital distinction: that he does not keep apart name imposition and name use and thus ends up denying the possibility of misapplying a name and, ultimately, the possibility of false speaking (see, e.g., Gold 1978: 242f.; Williams 1982: 90; and Mackenzie 1986: 126). But as more recent work (especially Barney 1997) has demonstrated, this diagnosis is not borne out by the evidence. For Hermogenes consistently uses the term tithenai to refer to acts of name imposition and the term kalein to refer to acts of name use. Given this terminological circumspection, it would be uncharitable to charge him with a crude conceptual confusion. (However, see Healow 2020 for a defense of the claim that Hermogenes is less clear about the distinction between name imposition and name use at 384c–e than at 385d–e.)

But who exactly has the authority to impose names on things—linguistic communities or even individual speakers? Pressed on this point, Hermogenes opts for the latter option (385a–b). If you decide to impose the name “Boris Johnson” on the cat that lives in 10 Downing Street while all other speakers continue to use this name for the former prime minister, “Boris Johnson” will be a private correct name for the cat and a public correct name for its former human housemate—or so Hermogenes says. This concession does not imply, as scholars used to think, that a speaker with solipsistic inclinations can apply names in a way that is in principle immune to criticism and correction (see, e.g., Robinson 1956: 338; Kahn 1973: 158f.; and Baxter 1992: 18). For Hermogenes never considers naming conventions that are private in the sense that no other speakers could possibly become party to them; he talks about naming conventions that are accidentally private, not about naming conventions that are essentially private. And it is hard to see how a speaker’s adherence to naming conventions that are only accidentally private would allow her to apply names in a way that is in principle immune to criticism and correction (Barney 1997: 152–156).

While older discussions of the passage 383a–386e thus tended to paint Hermogenes as a confused or radical “anything goes” conventionalist, there are good and widely accepted reasons for reversing this traditional verdict. All Hermogenes wishes to claim is, apparently, that speakers are at least in principle completely free to impose any name they like on any given (kind of) object. And this view seems to be very much in tune with common sense.

3.2 True and False Names

According to all extant manuscripts of the Cratylus, Socrates reacts to Hermogenes’ concession that private naming conventions are possible by presenting an argument for the conclusion that “it is possible to say a true and a false name” (385b–d).[1] But as this conclusion is so strange, and as there is also a philological problem with the transition from 385d1 to 385d2–3 (Schofield 1972: 248), it is contested whether Socrates’ argument really belongs where the manuscripts have it. While many commentators claim that it should either be transposed between 387c5 and c6 (Schofield 1972: 246–251 and Barney 2001: 28) or excised from the text altogether (Sedley 2003: 10–13), some are strictly opposed to such radical measures (Baxter 1992: 32–17 and Ademollo 2011: 68–70).

As it is not possible to summarize the immensely complicated debate about the textual status of the contested passage in the confines of this entry, the best course is to switch to the conditional mood and provide a brief discussion of the questions that would be most pressing if Socrates’ argument did belong where the manuscripts have it:

  1. What is the purport of the conclusion that “it is possible to say a true and a false name”?
  2. Why does Socrates establish this conclusion here?

Regarding (i), it is tempting to assume that Socrates’ conclusion rests on the false idea that names have the same properties—truth and falsehood, in particular—as the sentences of which they are parts (Robinson 1956: 328). But a more charitable reading is available: Socrates might not be saying that names can be true and false in the same absolute sense as sentences, but that they can be true or false of objects (Fine 1977: 295f.; cf. Lorenz & Mittelstraß 1967 and Luce 1969). If that were the case, he would be making a respectable and important point about the logical properties of names, comparable to a point made by Quine (Quine 1959: 65).

Regarding (ii), one might wonder whether Socrates’ argument is supposed to undermine Hermogenes’ position (see, e.g., Kretzmann 1971: 127; Gaiser 1974: 20; and Bagwell 2011: 20). But as Hermogenes does not make any claims that would compel him to deny that “it is possible to say a true and a false name”, this is not a plausible conjecture. So maybe Socrates is pursuing a more constructive purpose here. He might be interested, for example, in ascertaining Hermogenes’ attitude towards the distinction between truth and falsehood—not least because Hermogenes’ claim that one cannot go wrong in imposing names might wrongly be taken to imply that false speaking is impossible (Richardson 1976: 136f.; Ademollo 2011: 65–68).

3.3 Conventionalism and Relativism

Once Socrates’ has drawn the conclusion that “it is possible to say a true and a false name”, Hermogenes reaffirms his conventionalist position loudly and clearly (385d–e). Socrates proceeds to inquire whether Hermogenes accepts Protagoras’ claim that “however the objects appear to me to be, such they are for me” (385e–386a). This is a radical claim, entailing that objects have their properties in a subject-dependent manner: that it only makes sense to ask whether it is the case for some subject S that an object O has property P, but not whether it is objectively the case that O has P. Hermogenes admits that he found this relativist outlook tempting at some point, but is nevertheless unwilling to adopt it (386a). Socrates then presents an argument against relativism: Since there are both virtuous and wicked persons, and since virtuous persons are wise and wicked persons unwise, Protagoras cannot be right in saying that no one is ever wrong about anything (386a–e). A very similar argument is found to be wanting in the Theaetetus (166d–167d). But here in the Cratylus, Socrates is happy to conclude from his reflections that “objects have some stable being of their own” (386e). He thus asserts that objects have their properties in a subject-independent manner: that it makes sense to ask whether a subject S is objectively right or objectively wrong in believing that an object O has property P.

It is not clear why Socrates discusses Protagorean relativism with Hermogenes. Commentators used to think that he does this because Hermogenes defends an “anything goes” conventionalism that has relativist implications (see, e.g., Mackenzie 1986: 129; Palmer 1988: 44–50; and Silverman 1992: 31–34); but as has been noted, Hermogenes’ position is in fact a very sensible one. If there really is a connection between Hermogenes’ conventionalism and Protagorean relativism, it must thus be of a more indirect nature (Barney 1997: 156–162; Meißner 2021). It has also been argued, however, that Plato has Socrates discuss relativism with Hermogenes to prevent misunderstandings and show that conventionalism about names has nothing to do with relativism (Ademollo 2011: 80f.).

4. The Tool Analogy (386e–390e)

Socrates’ initial reaction to Hermogenes’ conventionalist position is puzzling. But his philosophical agenda becomes more transparent when, at 386e–390e, he uses the result that Protagorean relativism is false to show against Hermogenes that there is a natural correctness of names. The argument he presents for this highly significant interim conclusion is analogical in nature: It compares names to tools such as knives or drills to establish that they are subject to a natural standard and need to be introduced by an expert. This section takes a closer look at this major turning point of Socrates’ investigation.

4.1 The Name as a Tool for Naming

To set up the analogy between names and tools, Socrates considers actions. Given that objects have a stable being or a stable nature of their own, actions too must have a stable nature (386e). This seems to mean that a particular act needs to meet a certain objective standard to count as a genuine instance of a given action type.[2] As Socrates points out, one will meet this standard if and only if one handles a naturally suitable tool in a naturally fitting way (387a–b). This entails, crucially, that a tool for a given action needs to fulfil an objective or natural standard: It needs to be such as to enable a competent person to perform this action.

What do these plausible reflections about tools have to do with names? To make the connection, Socrates argues that naming qua part of speaking is an action with a stable nature (387b–d). He combines this claim with his observation that actions with a stable nature need to be performed by means of a naturally suitable tool—and infers that naming needs to be performed by means of such a tool. This tool is—unsurprisingly—the name (387d–388a). It follows that names are subject to a natural standard in the same (or at least a similar) sense as drills or shuttles.

As it stands, this analogical argument is frustratingly abstract. Its purport becomes clearer when Socrates provides two closely related accounts of naming a little later. He says, first, that “we teach something to each other and separate the objects as they stand” (388b) when we name; and he says, second, that we use names for “teaching and for separating being” (388b–c). What is the purport of these two accounts of naming? Consider the first one first. It is widely and plausibly assumed that Socrates explicates the sense in which “we teach something to each other” in naming when he says that we “separate the objects as they stand”, and so it is best to focus on this phrase. Many authors read it as a description of the act of using a name to mark off a species or a kind. Some believe that this act occurs only in the context of Platonic division and must be distinguished from more mundane forms of naming (see, e.g., Sedley 2003: 60f. and Ademollo 2011: 112f.); others point out that even in the bread-and-butter sentences “I love dogs” or “Her favorite pastime is reading”, the names “dog” and “reading” seem to pick out a kind of animal and a kind of activity (Meißner 2019: 127–132). Be that as it may—it seems reasonable to assume that Socrates defines naming as the act of picking out objects (in the broadest sense of the term) as a kind or a species. This construal of Socrates’ first account of naming makes his second account transparent as well. Readers of the Platonic dialogues are, after all, well acquainted with the idea that if a name is used to designate a class of objects that have something in common, it can also be said to refer to what its referents have in common—the way of being or the ousia they share (see, e.g., Laches 190e–192a or Meno 71e–72c). It thus makes sense to move from the claim that we “separate the objects as they stand” to the contention that we use names “for separating being” or a way of being.

When Socrates ascribes a stable nature to naming, he is thus relying on the assumption that one performs an act of naming if and only if one picks out a kind or, equivalently, the way of being that is shared by the members of this kind. Given this result, the application of his reflections on tools like drills or shuttles to names at 387b–388c is a little easier to follow. His central point is presumably that names are subject to a natural standard insofar as they need to be suitable instruments for picking out a kind. The second stage of his analogical argument will elaborate this—still somewhat vague and elusive—point.

4.2 Creating (and Evaluating) Names

Socrates proceeds to argue that names are like drills or shuttles not only insofar as they are subject to an objective or natural standard: Precisely because they are subject to such a standard, they are also similar to ordinary tools insofar as they need to be created by a skilled expert. This expert is a lawgiver or nomothêtes (388d–389a). A lawgiver, Socrates explains, will create a naturally suitable name only if he looks “to that thing itself which is a name” (390a). The thought is probably that the lawgiver’s creative efforts need to be guided by knowledge of how to produce a linguistic device that enables a competent user to perform the action of naming. Socrates adds that the lawgiver needs to fulfil a second condition: He needs to embody “the form of the name appropriate to each in syllables of whatever sort” (390a). What does this mean? In making a parallel claim about shuttle production, Socrates’ point is that there are different specific versions of the action for which shuttles are made—separating linen warp and weft, e.g., or separating woolen warp and weft—and that the carpenter needs to create a naturally suitable tool for one of these specific action types (389b–c). Socrates must thus be assuming that there are different specific versions of naming, and that the lawgiver needs to create a suitable tool for one of these versions. Given that naming has been defined as the action of picking out a kind, it is not difficult to see what the versions of naming might be: If A and B are different kinds, picking out A and picking out B will certainly be different versions of naming. Hence, Socrates’ claim is that the lawgiver needs to make sure that his product is a suitable tool for picking out a specific kind.

All of this sounds rather complicated. But while the details of Socrates’ argument are indeed obscure at times, the big picture is clearer. Socrates proceeds from the idea that names are tools for picking out kinds to the idea that an individual name needs to be suited for picking out a specific kind and must be created accordingly. And even though he does not say this in so many words, there can be no doubt that he thus arrives at the following characterization of correct names:

A correct name for a given kind is a linguistic device that has been created from letters and syllables in a way that guarantees that it is suited for picking out this kind (or, equivalently, the way of being shared by its members).

As Socrates hastens to point out (390a–e), an expert dialectician is responsible for ascertaining whether a name fulfils the standard described by (NAT). It is clear, then, that while there are many humdrum contexts in which names are used, their true purpose is to make possible dialectical inquiries.

4.3 Assessing the Argument of the Tool Analogy

At 390e, Socrates concludes the tool analogy by stating “that names belong to the objects by nature” (390d/e). As the above analysis indicates, the purport of this conclusion is captured by (NAT). But (NAT) is still a highly abstract claim. It is far from clear what it takes to create a linguistic device in a way that guarantees that it is suited for picking out a given kind (or the being of its members); and consequently, it is far from clear how a correct name for a given kind differs from a linguistic device that does not deserve that title. This unclarity makes it very hard to say what exactly the tool analogy contributes to Socrates’ investigation. One widespread assumption is that the tool analogy’s conclusion is a blueprint for the theory of the correctness of names that Socrates elaborates at 390e–427d: that (NAT) anticipates the claim that correct names need to be composed of letters and syllables in a way that ensures that they describe or imitate the being of their referents. Champions of both Reading A and Reading B are committed to this assumption. That does not mean, however, that they agree in their overall assessment of the tool analogy and its conclusion—quite the contrary. Champions of Reading A contend that while the analogy between names and tools may be highly suggestive, Plato wants his readers to realize that comparing the introduction of a name for a given kind to the creation of a tool for a specific task is ultimately misleading—and to discard the conclusion that there is a natural correctness of names. Champions of Reading B disagree strongly: They assume that Plato wants his readers to accept the argument of the tool analogy and its conclusion.

One way of dealing with the exceedingly abstract conclusion of the tool analogy is thus to construe it as an anticipation of the claim that correct names need to be descriptions or imitations, and to ask in a next step whether Plato want his readers to accept this claim. But there is also a radically different approach to the problem at hand. Champions of Reading C take the tool analogy’s conclusion to boil down to the claim that names are correct if they have been assigned to genuine kinds by adopting suitable conventions (whereas they are not correct if they have been assigned to gerrymandered classes of things such as, e.g., the class that comprises all cats and all donkeys and nothing else). They argue that Plato wants his readers to accept this claim—and to see that Socrates is going astray when he moves on to elaborate the theory that correct names are descriptions or imitations of their referents’ being. It has been objected, however, that assigning a name to a kind and creating a correct name in the sense of (NAT) seem to be two very different things (Ackrill 1994: 18 f.; Smith 2014). Whether Reading C’s take on the tool analogy is a viable alternative to Reading A’s and Reading B’s interpretation is thus a matter of debate (Meißner forthcoming a).

5. Correctness and Etymological Meaning (390e–394e)

When Socrates infers from the argument of the tool analogy “that names belong to the objects by nature” (390d/e), Hermogenes is not fully convinced and demands to know what “the natural correctness of a name consists in” (390e). As has become evident by now, this is a good question—it is in fact not clear what Hermogenes would commit himself to if he accepted (NAT). Socrates attempts to answer Hermogenes’ question at 390e–394e by discussing the name “Astyanax”. “Astyanax” is actually a proper name of a victim of the Trojan war (Hector’s son, who would have become king of Troy had the city not been destroyed). However, Socrates does not treat it as a proper name, but as a general term that refers to the kind (genos) of kings. He gives the following account of its correctness:

“Astyanax” is a correct name for the kind (genos) of kings because its etymological meaning (“townlord”) ensures that it indicates (dêloun) the way of being (ousia) that the members of this kind share.

What does this account entail? What, in particular, does it mean to say that “Astyanax” indicates the way of being that is shared by all kings? It has been claimed that indicating a way of being is tantamount to disclosing its definition (see, e.g., Barney 2001: 103). But Socrates’ examples, and his later use of the term dêloun (see section 8.2), suggest that this is an overinterpretation (Ademollo 2011: 165f.). Apparently, a way of being is indicated if and only if it is distinguished from other ways of being—if it is picked out, as it were.

How, then, does the etymological meaning of the name “Astyanax” ensure that it picks out the way of being that is characteristic of kings? Socrates’ idea seems to be that the etymological meaning of the name ensures that it functions as a description of what it means to be a king. It is important to note, however, that indicating something does not necessarily entail describing it; as Socrates will explain at 421c–427e, names that are not composed of other names indicate a way of being in virtue of imitating it. But in the passage at hand, he ignores this possibility and focuses on names that are composed of other names—etymologically complex names, as one might say.

Socrates does not stop to distill a general account of the correctness of etymologically complex names from his reflections on the name “Astyanax”. But he clearly has the following account in mind:

If an etymologically complex name is a correct name for a given kind, this is because its etymological meaning ensures that it describes and thus indicates the way of being (ousia) that the members of the kind share.

At first blush, (NAT*) seems to be a far cry from (NAT), the central claim of the tool analogy. But this impression might be misleading. According to (NAT), a correct name for a given kind is a linguistic device that has been created in a way that makes it fit for picking out the way of being that the members of this kind share. As has just been indicated, picking out a way of being and indicating a way of being are the same act. Hence, (NAT) would appear to be equivalent to the claim that a correct name for a given kind must be suited for indicating the way of being that the members of this kind share. And clearly, (NAT*) does provide an explanation of how a name can be suited for this act.

There is one more thing to note before we move on: As virtually all commentators who take a closer look at 390e–394e agree, Socrates’ discussion of the name “Astyanax” is peppered with blatant mistakes. Proponents of Reading A and Reading C see this as Plato’s way of discrediting (NAT*) (Heitsch 1984: 53–57; Eckl 2003: 135–155; Ademollo 2011: 146–180); proponents of Reading B, on the other hand, need to bite the bullet and argue that Plato is simply not aware of Socrates’ blunders (Sedley 2003: 75–86).

6. The Etymological Section (394e–421c)

Having arrived at the conjecture that there is a connection between the correctness of names and their etymological meaning, Socrates begins to uncover the etymological meaning of Greek names—and does not stop until he has spent more than 25 Stephanus pages on discussing more than 100 names. Remarkably, his etymological analyses gradually take on a Heraclitean character; taken together, they suggest that many Greek names encapsulate descriptions that would be true of the being of their referents if and only if Heraclitus were right in claiming that everything is in flux. The Greek name for excellence, arêtê, is characterized as an abbreviation of the descriptive phrase “that which always flows” (aei rhêon), for example (415c–d); and the name for practical wisdom, phronêsis, is said to have the meaning “understanding of movement and flux” (phôras kai rhou noêsis) (411d). These and many comparable analyses eventually lead Socrates to the conclusion that all (or at least many) Greek names must be built up from a small set of basic names that refer to movements and processes—such as, e.g., the names ion, rheôn, and doun. This result, in turn, prompts him to augment his naturalist theory by investigating the correctness of these basic names.

Insofar as the etymological section provides an incentive to complete the naturalist theory of correctness, it has a clear dialectical function. But given its extraordinary length, this can hardly be its only function. How else does the etymological section contribute to Socrates’ inquiry, then? Three (non-exclusive) answers to this question suggest themselves:

  1. The etymological section might shine a light on the prospects and problems of etymological research.
  2. The etymological section might make a point about the correctness of names.
  3. The etymological section might draw attention to the ontological challenge of Heracliteanism.

The present section zooms in on these possible answers.

6.1 Prospects and Problems of Etymological Research

The Cratylus introduces its readers to two very different forms of etymological research. Socrates is engaged in one form of etymological research when he tries to uncover the etymological meaning of names; Cratylus is engaged in a different (if not independent) form of etymological research when he later derives claims about the being of the referents of a name from conjectures about its etymological meaning (435d–440e; see section 9). Taking one’s cue from Sedley’s universally accepted distinction between the exegetical and the philosophical correctness of etymological analyses (Sedley 2003: 28), one might thus say that Socrates practices exegetical etymology and Cratylus philosophical etymology.

The etymological section illustrates vividly that philosophical etymology is a nonstarter. For it shows that one would just take over the Heraclitean opinions of the ancient lawgivers if one relied on philosophical etymology—and as Socrates himself points out, these opinions are mistaken (411b–c). While this much is acknowledged by all commentators, matters are more complicated when it comes to exegetical etymology. Some commentators point out that many of Socrates’ etymological analyses are obviously absurd, and that he punctuates these analyses with ironical remarks about his unusually inspired state (see, e.g., 396c–397a or 410e) and with reflections on the methodological pitfalls of etymological research (414c–415a and 418a–b); they conclude that the etymological section must be read as a parody of exegetical etymology (see, e.g., Schleiermacher 1824: 5–9; Heitsch 1984: 51; and Trivigno 2012). But other commentators object that Socrates’ etymological analyses will have seemed much less absurd to ancient readers than they appear to modern readers, and downplay the significance of his intermittent meta-observations. In their view, Plato does not make fun of exegetical etymology, but puts forward claims that are at least “bonâ fide guesses” (Grote 1865: 526) about the etymological meaning of names (see, e.g., Grote 1865: 518–529; Sedley 1998 and 2003; and Ademollo 2011: 237–256).

As this scholarly dispute is still unresolved, it is very hard to say which point the etymological section is supposed to make about exegetical etymology. One plausible minimalist assumption would seem to be that Socrates’ etymological analyses suggest that exegetical etymology is not a science and does not lead to true knowledge. There are, to be sure, commentators who reject even this minimalist assumption (Sedley 2003: 41–50). But since it is compatible with both the idea that Socrates’ analyses are “bonâ fide guesses” and the claim that these analyses are meant to parody exegetical etymology, it might be acceptable to a solid majority among scholars.

6.2 Application or Subversion?

Which conclusion(s) about the correctness of names might the etymological section suggest? Here is one possible answer to this question. Socrates’ etymological analyses indicate that the etymological meanings of many Greek names mirror mistaken Heraclitean assumptions about the being of their referents. It follows that many etymologically complex names fail to indicate the being of their referents by describing it. If one does not want to assume that these names are all incorrect, one is compelled to conclude that etymologically complex names can be correct even if they encapsulate descriptions that do not apply to the being of their referents. This conclusion is clearly incompatible with (NAT*)—with the hypothesis, i.e., that a correct etymologically complex name for a given kind needs to encapsulate a description of the way of being that the members of this kind share. It is a very natural thought, then, that the etymological section might be meant to discredit (NAT*) and the naturalist theory of which (NAT*) is part.

This elaboration of the idea that the etymological section makes a point about the correctness of names appeals, unsurprisingly, to champions of Reading A and Reading C. It is not the only possible elaboration of this idea, however. The alternative is to contend that Plato wants his readers to conclude that many of the names under scrutiny are not correct. If one is willing to commit oneself to this assumption, one is free to argue that the etymological section does not discredit (NAT*), but applies this account of the correctness of names to assess the correctness of selected Greek names. On this interpretation, which obviously appeals to champions of Reading B, the etymological section relies on Socrates’ naturalist theory of correctness to show that one should not place one’s trust in the correctness of actual Greek names.

6.3 The Challenge of Heracliteanism

What remains to be discussed is the idea that the etymological section is meant to draw attention to the ontological challenge of Heracliteanism. As it is clear from other dialogues like the Theaetetus that coming to grips with Heracliteanism is a philosophical task of paramount importance for Plato, this idea is indeed plausible. But what, exactly, is the challenge of Heracliteanism? This is a very difficult and contested question. It is not even clear how the notion of flux is to be construed. Some commentators believe that for Plato, flux amounts to what Irwin has called “aspectual change” (Irwin 1977). If that were true, the claim that all things are in flux would be equivalent to the claim that all things have opposing properties in different respects. Heracliteanism would then not be a theory that reduces reality to genuine change and motion, but a position that is very close to (a certain variety of) relativism (see, e.g., Sedley 2003: 109–112). It has also been claimed, however, that the etymological section presents Heracliteanism as “a robustly physical theory according to which everything is engaged in spatial change, i.e. locomotion” (Ademollo 2011: 233). If that were the case, there would be a sharp distinction between Heracliteanism and relativism.

If it is controversial how the Heraclitean claim that everything is in flux should be construed—can one at least be sure about Plato’s assessment of this claim? He has Socrates disagree strongly with Heraclitus in the etymological section (411b–c); and later on, he has him postulate forms and thereby acknowledge the existence of entities that are exempt from flux (439c–440e). Hence, Plato certainly takes Heraclitus and his followers to err insofar as they overlook that there is a flux-less intelligible realm. But what about the sensible realm—the realm of the things that surround us? Might Plato not believe that these things are in flux and thus accept a restricted version of Heracliteanism? The issue is once again contested: While some commentators do indeed take the Cratylus to lend support to the venerable claim that Plato is a Heraclitean when it comes to sensible things (Gaiser 1974: 61–80; Barney 2001: 73; Sedley 2003: 99–122), it has been objected that Socrates seems to consider Heracliteanism as “wrong across the board” in the etymological section (Ademollo 2011: 207f.).

As these considerations show, the etymological section’s treatment of Heracliteanism leaves open many important questions. This is clearly no coincidence. Just like the whole Cratylus, the etymological section is not aimed at providing a thorough metaphysical discussion of the ins and outs of Heracliteanism (this is, arguably, the job of the Theaetetus). It illustrates, however, that such a discussion is of much greater necessity and consequence than an inquiry into the hidden meanings of names could ever be. And thus, it dovetails with the conclusion that Socrates reaches at the very end of his investigation (440c–d).

7. Correctness and Imitation (421c–427d)

Having discovered that many Greek names are built up from names like ion, rheôn, and doun, Socrates observes that the process of etymological analysis must necessarily stop after finitely many steps. There must be “first names” (prota onomata), then—names that do not have an etymological meaning in virtue of the fact that they are composed of other names (421c–422c). Since ion, rheôn, and doun seem to be among these etymologically simple names, their correctness cannot possibly depend on their etymological meaning. Socrates thus finds himself in a predicament: For his theory of the correctness of etymologically complex names would be built on sand if it were impossible to account for the natural correctness of etymologically simple names (cf. 426a–b). Hence, he decides to “investigate in some other manner” what the correctness of these names “consists in” (422b). The present section focuses on this investigation.

7.1 Indicating by Imitating

Socrates assumes that etymologically simple names must meet the same standard as etymologically complex names: They need to “indicate what each of the beings is like” (422d)—which turns out to mean that they need to indicate the being of their referents (423e). He argues that etymologically simple names can only meet this standard by imitating the being of their referents (422e–423e). And thus, he arrives at this augmented version of (NAT*), his earlier account of the correctness of etymologically complex names:

If an etymologically complex name is a correct name for a given kind, this is because its etymological meaning ensures that it describes and thus indicates the way of being (ousia) that the members of this kind share; and if an etymologically simple name is a correct name for a given kind, this is because its composition from letters and syllables ensures that it imitates and thus indicates the way of being that the members of this kind share.

(NAT**) is a full-fledged, completely general theory of the correctness of names. The most pressing question raised by this theory is probably how exactly the imitation of a way of being by means of letters and syllables is supposed to work. Socrates’ answer to this question presupposes that individual letters or individual syllables resemble the basic kinds of beings (424d–425a); he takes this to ensure that a combination of different letters and syllables can resemble—and thus imitate—any given way of being. Note that Socrates does not take the resemblance between letters and syllables on the one hand and the basic kinds of beings on the other hand to depend on the sound of these letters and syllables, but on the way in which the mouth and the tongue move in articulating them. For him, imitation is not onomatopoetic, but “articulatory” (Ademollo 2011: 309–311; cf. Belardi 1985: 33).

Socrates’ theory of the correctness of etymologically simple names has its problems and omissions; it does not take into account, e.g., that the mimetic qualities of a name would probably not only depend on the letters and syllables from which it is composed, but also on the way in which these letters and syllables are arranged (Barney 2001: 105 n. 31). Characterizing etymologically simple names as imitations is nevertheless an ingenious attempt at filling the explanatory gap left by (NAT*).

7.2 An Ideal Language?

Having formulated (NAT**), Socrates seems to take up his original task of accounting for the correctness of concrete etymologically simple names like ion, rheôn, and doun (424a–b). But very soon, he digresses: Instead of examining existing names, he expands on how a lawgiver should ideally go about creating names that imitate the being of their intended referents (424b–425a). His explanation is dense and difficult, and a crucial sentence—424d1–5—is fraught with philological problems. The basic idea seems to be that an ideal lawgiver would have to do four things:

  1. He would have to provide a taxonomy of all the letters;
  2. he would have to identify and distinguish those basic kinds of beings to which all things can be traced back;
  3. he would have to determine which letters or syllables resemble which basic kinds; and
  4. he would have to form concatenations of letters and syllables that imitate the being of the nominanda.

What Socrates sketches here is clearly a very ambitious research project. Some parts of this research project—the taxonomy of letters and, especially, the taxonomy of beings—are certainly close to Plato’s heart; they are, after all, strongly reminiscent of the dialectical investigations that are conducted (or at least envisaged) in dialogues such as the Sophist, the Statesman, and the Philebus. It is less clear, however, whether Plato really believes that a linguistic lawgiver should detect correlations between the two taxonomies and introduce names that imitate the being of their referents on the basis of these correlations. Some commentators do indeed contend that the passage at hand contains Plato’s recipe for the creation of an ideal language. Most of these commentators are—unsurprisingly—adherents of Reading B (see, e.g., Anagnostopoulos 1973: 331f.; Baxter 1992: 80–85; and Barney 2011: 97). Other commentators—usually proponents of Reading A and Reading C—object that the language Socrates describes here would have no real advantage over other possible languages, since its users would not be able to access and appropriate the system of knowledge it encodes unless they embark on their own philosophical investigation (see, e.g., Williams 1982: 92). These commentators conclude that the passage 424b–425a is meant to show that even a mimetically perfect language would not be particularly useful—and thus to discredit (NAT**).

7.3 Reductio ad Absurdum?

At 425a, Socrates abruptly returns to his examination of individual etymologically simple Greek names. He confesses that he is not up to a systematic classification of both letters and beings, and that he will thus have to work with conjectures about the resemblance between letters and basic kinds of beings (425b–426b). These conjectures appear “absolutely outrageous and ridiculous” (426b) not only to many scholars, but also to Socrates himself. What Socrates suggests is, e.g., that the Greek letter rhô (or, more precisely, the way in which the mouth moves in articulating this letter) resembles movement (426c–e), or that the letter iota resembles fine things “which should most go through everything” (426e–427a). Building on these and similar suggestions, he ascertains what many etymologically simple names imitate—that names like psychron or zeon imitate “what is blowy” (427a), for example.

Given the avowedly “outrageous and ridiculous” quality of Socrates’ mimetological discussion, it might seem tempting to assume that Plato must be out to debunk the idea that a name qua concatenation of letters and syllables can resemble and imitate a way of being, and thus to discredit (NAT**). But while some proponents of Reading A and Reading C endorse this assumption (see, e.g., Heitsch 1984: 40–43; Belardi 1985: 39–41; and Trivigno 2012: 63–67), there is reason for doubt. What Socrates calls “outrageous and ridiculous” is his attempt to spell out which letters and syllables resemble which basic kinds of beings. But crucially, his self-critical remarks do not seem to be directed against the idea that the imitation of a way of being by means of letters and syllables is possible in principle (Sedley 2003: 76; Ademollo 2011: 313–315). Whether Plato accepts or rejects this idea is very hard to tell from the passage at hand.

8. Criticizing Naturalism (427d–435d)

Once Socrates has concluded his discussion of individual etymologically simple names, Hermogenes wants to know whether Cratylus accepts Socrates’ account of the natural correctness of names. Cratylus endorses this account wholeheartedly (427d–428c). Fearing that he might have fallen prey to some sort of self-deception, Socrates suggests revisiting his account together with Cratylus (428d). Cratylus agrees and takes over from Hermogenes as Socrates’ interlocutor. It soon turns out that he is committed not only to (NAT**), but to some very counterintuitive additional claims. He thus espouses a radical version of the naturalist theory of correctness that Socrates has presented (428e–430a). Socrates marshals a series of arguments against Cratylus’ position (430a–435b)—and is led to a disappointingly vague conclusion about the correctness of names (435b–d). This section takes a closer look at this pivotal and difficult passage.

8.1 Cratylus’ Naturalism

Socrates begins his discussion with Cratylus by observing that the products of craftsmen are usually of variable quality (428e–429a). Cratylus denies that this principle applies to the products of (linguistic) lawgivers (429b). Even though he takes etymologically simple names to be imitations, he thus commits himself to the following claim:

No name can be any better or worse than any other name.

Socrates takes (C1) to imply that “all names have been set down correctly” and asks Cratylus whether he accepts this implication (429b/c). Cratylus responds by endorsing a second claim (429c):

A linguistic device is a name for its (conventional) referents if and only if it fulfils the standard of correctness described by (NAT**).

And it soon turns out that there is yet another claim that Cratylus wants to defend (429c–430a):

If a name is not a correct name for an object, it cannot possibly be applied to this object (and thus be used to speak falsely).

These three claims are very counterintuitive, and Socrates immediately begins to attack (C3) and (C1). His arguments against these two claims rely on the presupposition that etymologically simple names are imitations and can thus be compared to pictures. To refute (C3), Socrates observes that it is possible to assign a picture of a man to a woman, and that it should therefore be equally possible to apply an etymologically simple name that does not imitate the being of a given object to this object (430a–431c). This suffices to show that one can speak falsely by misapplying names. To debunk (C1), Socrates points out that if someone were to produce an object that is perfectly like Cratylus in every respect, this object would not be a picture of Cratylus, but a second Cratylus (432a–c). He infers from this that pictures can resemble the objects they depict only to a certain degree (432c/d). But if resemblance comes in degrees, imitative success comes in degrees, and qualitative differences between imitations must be possible. Consequently, qualitative differences between etymologically simple names must be possible (433a).

8.2 The Return of Convention

Socrates’ convincing arguments against (C1) and (C3) lead him to the interim conclusion that even if (NAT**) holds, etymologically simple correct names imitate the being of their referents only in outline, but not perfectly (432d–433b). His next argument—the so-called sklêrotês argument—complements this interim conclusion by undermining (C2) and re-introducing convention into the picture. The basic premise of this argument is the following one:

If a convention ensures that a name is a means to indicate (dêloma) the being (ousia) of its referents,[3] the correctness of this name is conventional. (433d–434a)

Socrates’ reliance on this premise is a bit surprising. After all, he had first introduced the concept of indication when he began to elaborate his naturalist theory of correctness at 390e–394e; but now, he is characterizing the assumption that names are used to indicate as a shared tenet of naturalism and conventionalism. He must believe, then, that conventionalism and naturalism do not differ in their account of the use to which speakers put names, but in their account of what makes this use possible (Ademollo 2011: 385–388).

At any rate, Socrates moves on to apply (P1) to the name sklêron (“hard”).[4] He considers this name a correct etymologically simple name that can be used to indicate the way of being that unites all hard things—hardness. Using the results of his earlier mimetological discussion of individual letters, he points out that while sklêron contains one letter—rhô—that resembles hardness, it also contains one letter—lambda—that resembles the opposite of hardness, softness (434c–d). Hence, sklêron contains as many letters that resemble the opposite of hardness as letters that resemble hardness; and consequently, it cannot be a means to indicate hardness in virtue of being an imitation of hardness. He then introduces two more premises to show that sklêron is such a means in virtue of a convention:

If a convention ensures that a hearer understands that a speaker who articulates the name sklêron is thinking of hardness, then a convention ensures that sklêron is a means to indicate the being of its referents (= hardness). (435a)
A convention ensures that a hearer understands that a speaker who articulates the name sklêron is thinking of hardness. (434e)

Cratylus does not object to any of this and is compelled to accept the following conclusion:

The correctness of the name sklêron is conventional (435a–b).

This argument is certainly plausible. What is very important to see is that its conclusion is explicitly framed as a claim about the correctness of the name sklêron. It thus cannot be right to assume (as, e.g., Williams 1982: 83) that Socrates shows only that sklêron is a name for hardness in virtue of a convention, but not that it is correct in virtue of a convention. As a matter of fact, Socrates does not distinguish between names and correct names at this crucial moment (Barney 2001: 137; cf. Ademollo 2011: 2–4). And consequently, his argument does not only show that (C2) is wrong: It also demonstrates that (NAT**) cannot be true as it stands.

8.3 Socrates’ Conclusion

Having established (CONV), Socrates makes a more general claim that is apparently supposed to wrap up his whole investigation (435b):

Convention contributes to the correctness of names.

To lend further support to this conclusion, Socrates argues that there would be a problem if one did not assume that convention has “some authority concerning the correctness” of the names for the natural numbers (435b/c). But as he does not elaborate on the nature of this problem, the precise purport of his argument is contested (see, e.g., Sedley 2003: 142 and Robinson 1956: 117). He goes on, in any case, to state that while “he likes the idea that names are, as far as possible, similar to the objects” (435c), he sees no alternative to accepting (CONV*).

(CONV*) is Socrates’ last word on the correctness of names—and a disappointingly vague claim. How can one make sense of Socrates’ concluding remarks despite their vagueness? One option, favoured by champions of Reading A, is to argue that Socrates understates the true result of his investigation when he formulates (CONV*). What he could conclude after presenting the sklêrotês argument, and what Plato’s readers are supposed to work out for themselves, is that the correctness of all names is completely conventional. For while the sklêrotês argument and its conclusion (CONV) concern only one name, it seems obvious that this argument could be generalized and would then vindicate a thoroughly conventionalist view. (To see why this may seem obvious, take another look at the premises of the sklêrotês argument. (P1) is about all correct names, and (P2) does not seem to concern the name sklêron in particular. But even when it comes to (P3), which is specifically about sklêron as a name that does not successfully imitate hardness, a generalization seems to be warranted. For even if it is granted that a given name succeeds at imitating hardness or any other way of being, it will still not seem to be this imitative success which guarantees that a hearer understands what a speaker is thinking of when using the name. As only a shared convention would seem to ensure such understanding, (P3) appears to convey an insight that applies to all correct names. And if one combines this insight with (P1) and a generalized version of (P2), one will arrive at the conclusion that the correctness of all names is completely conventional.)

But of course, one could also take Socrates’ endorsement of the vague (CONV*) to indicate that he is not convinced that the correctness of all names is completely conventional and wants to stick to a suitably modified version of (NAT**). This alternative assessment of Socrates’ concluding remarks, which is favoured by champions of Reading B, can be elaborated in different ways. It has been argued, for instance, that the sklêrotês argument concerns only those names which—like the name sklêron—contain letters that resemble a certain way of being and an equal number of letters that resemble the opposite way of being. While Socrates does indeed acknowledge that convention is crucial for the correctness of those names, he believes that the correctness of all other names is completely dependent on their mimetic qualities or their etymological meaning (Sedley 2003: 144f.). But the sklêrotês argument has also been taken to show only that names fulfil some sort of minimal condition for correctness in virtue of a convention, and thus to be compatible with the idea that the degree of a name’s correctness is a function of its mimetic qualities or its etymological meaning (Barney 2001: 134–142). There may be yet other elaborations of the idea that Socrates’ concluding remarks do not amount to a total repudiation of (NAT**). They must all agree, however, in characterizing the import of the sklêrotês argument as more limited than it might appear to be.

Is it also possible to maintain that Socrates rejects (NAT**) at 435b–d, but not the more general claim that there is a natural correctness of names? This is obviously how champions of Reading C would have to read Socrates’ concluding remarks. Unfortunately, there is no in-depth discussion of these remarks by any proponent of this reading (see, however, Kretzmann 1971: 138, for some reflections on the issue). Two conjectures about the shape that the suggested interpretation would have to take seem reasonable, however:

  1. Proponents of Reading C would have to read Socrates’ official conclusion (CONV*) as the claim that while there is a natural correctness of names, the ways in which correct names are composed of letters and syllables is conventional (see section 4.3).
  2. To defend such an assessment of (CONV*), it would be necessary to explain how the sklêrotês argument can justify a wholesale rejection of (NAT**) and yet fail to show that the correctness of all names is completely conventional.

Choosing between these exegetical options is exceedingly difficult. The fact that Socrates avowedly “likes the idea that names are, as far as possible, similar to the objects” might be thought to prove that he does not completely reject (NAT**). But a different reading is available: Socrates could be expressing the conviction that most (etymologically simple) names are indeed similar to their referents while steering clear of the claim that this similarity constitutes their correctness (Ademollo 2011: 415). It is true, however, that it is not easy to make sense of 435b–d, and especially of the vague (CONV*), if one takes Socrates to believe that the correctness of all names is completely conventional. But on the other hand, it is harder to do justice to the sklêrotês argument if one does not ascribe this belief to Socrates. Given the mixed signals Socrates sends, the debate about his conclusion is not likely to end anytime soon.

9. Coda: The “Power” of Names (435d–440e)

As soon as Socrates has concluded his investigation of the correctness of names, he turns to a different (if closely related) topic and asks Cratylus what the “power” (dynamis) of names is. Cratylus answers that names have the power to teach (435d). While this is reminiscent of Socrates’ earlier contention that names are instruments for teaching (388b–c), it soon turns out that Cratylus has something more radical in mind. What he wants to defend is the claim that analysing names is the only way of gaining knowledge about their referents’ being. For him, philosophical etymology (see section 6.1) and mimetological studies are thus not a, but the path to knowledge. Socrates objects by making an observation that is illustrated well by his earlier etymological and mimetological discussions: that examining names will at the very best lead one to the opinions of the ancient lawgivers who have introduced the names, and that these opinions can be wrong (436a–b). Cratylus has a response: He argues that the opinions of the ancient lawgivers are coherently Heraclitean in character, and that this coherence guarantees their truth (436b–c). Unimpressed, Socrates retorts that coherence does not guarantee truth (436c–d) and that there are also some cases in which the analysis of names suggests that the ancient lawgivers held decidedly un-Heraclitean opinions (436d–437d). He also points out that the knowledge that Cratylus ascribes to the ancient lawgivers cannot—on pain of regress—have resulted from an examination of names (438a–d).

All in all, Socrates presents a very compelling case against Cratylus’ conviction that one needs to analyse names in order to learn anything about reality. But he also draws a positive conclusion from his reflections: It must be possible “to learn about the beings without names” (438e). The purport of this conclusion is not immediately clear. One might think that Socrates means to advertise some sort of intuitive, non-linguistic understanding (see, e.g., Derbolav 1972: 201–207; Silverman 2001: 25f.). But that seems implausible; for Socrates will soon go on to use names to gain insight into the nature of reality. According to a more plausible interpretation, Socrates wants to claim that one should examine things instead of names, but not that one should refrain from using names when investigating (Sedley 2003: 162; Ademollo 2011: 445). He might also have a special mode of inquiry in mind when he says that it must be possible to learn without names: He might be thinking of a broadly transcendental inquiry that aims at ascertaining how reality must be organized if language and knowledge are to be possible (Thomas 2008).

Whatever Socrates’ exact theoretical point is when he suggests an “inquiry without names”—he very soon starts his own investigation into the nature of reality, arguing that Heraclitus cannot be right when he claims that everything is in flux. His case against this claim is based on the presupposition that there are not only beautiful or good things, but also the beautiful itself or the good itself (439c–d)—Platonic forms, it would seem. As Socrates points out, four absurd consequences follow if one assumes that even these entities are in constant flux:

  1. One could not make true statements about them, because they would change while one speaks (439d);
  2. they would not be anything, because being something presupposes staying in the same state for some time (439d–e);
  3. they would not be knowable, because they would change before one could get to know them (439e–440a); and
  4. there would be no knowledge, because knowledge itself would be in constant flux (440a–b).

These arguments against Heraclitus’ theory of flux are very compressed and leave open many questions. Fittingly, Socrates admits that he is not sure whether he has really established that Heraclitus is wrong in claiming that everything is in flux and declares that the issue should be investigated more thoroughly without relying on philosophical etymology (440c–d). Cratylus, on the other hand, is still convinced that Heraclitus is right (440d–e). Accompanied by Hermogenes, he leaves for the countryside—and ends the dialogue that bears his name.


A. Translations

  • Dalimier, Catherine (trans.), 1998, Platon: Cratyle (Garnier Flammarion 954), Paris: Flammarion. (French)
  • Fowler, Harold North (trans.), 1926, Plato: Cratylus, Parmenides, Greater Hippias, Lesser Hippias (Loeb Classical Library 167), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. (Greek/English)
  • Méridier, Louis, 1931, Platon, Cratyle, Paris: Les belles lettres. (French)
  • Reeve, C. D. C., 1997, Plato, Cratylus: translated with introduction and notes, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett.
  • Schleiermacher, F. W. D., 1824, Platons Werke II 2, Berlin: Realschulbuchhandlung. (German)
  • Staudacher, Peter, 2021, Platon: Kratylos. Übersetzung und Kommentar, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Rupprecht. (German)

B. Greek text

  • Duke, E. A., W. F. Hicken, W. S. M. Nicoll, D. B. Robinson, J. C. G. Strachan (eds.), 1995, Platonis Opera, tomus I, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

C. Commentary

  • Ademollo, Francesco, 2011, The Cratylus of Plato: A Commentary, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511779022
  • Rijlaarsdam, Jetske C., 1978, Platon über die Sprache. Ein Kommentar zum Kratylos, Utrecht: Bohn, Scheltema & Holkema.

D. Interpretation

  • Ackrill, John L., 1994, “Language and Reality in Plato’s Cratylus”, in Realtà e Ragione: Studi di Filosofia Antica, Antonina M. Alberti (ed.), (Accademia Toscana di Scienze e Lettere. La Colombaria. Studi 140), Firenze: Leo S. Olschki, 9–28. Reprinted in his Essays on Plato and Aristotle, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997, pp. 33–52. Page reference is to the original.
  • Ademollo, Francesco, 2009, “Un’ interpretazione del Cratilo di Platone”, in Michele Alessandrelli, Mauro Nasti de Vincentis (eds.), La logica nel pensiero antico, Naples: Bibliopolis, pp. 15–73.
  • –––, 2021, “Why the Cratylus Matters, or: Plato’s Cratylus and the Philosophy of Language”, in Mikeš (ed.) 2021: 26–47.
  • Anagnostopoulos, Georgios, 1972, “Plato’s Cratylus: The Two Theories of the Correctness of Names”, The Review of Metaphysics, 25(4): 691–736.
  • –––, 1973, “The Significance of Plato’s Cratylus”, The Review of Metaphysics, 27(2): 318–345.
  • Annas, Julia, 1982, “Knowledge and language: the Theaetetus and Cratylus”, in Schofield and Nussbaum 1982: 95–114.
  • Aronadio, Francesco, 2011, I fondamenti della riflessione di Platone sul linguaggio: il Cratilo, Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura.
  • Bagwell, Geoffrey, 2011, “Does Plato Argue Fallaciously at Cratylus 385b–c?”, Apeiron, 44(1): 13–21. doi:10.1515/apeiron.2011.003
  • Barney, Rachel, 1997, “Plato on Conventionalism”, Phronesis, 42(2): 143–162. doi:10.1163/156852897762700070
  • –––, 1998, “Socrates Agonistes: the Case of the Cratylus Etymologies”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 16: 63–98.
  • –––, 2001, Names and Nature in Plato’s Cratylus, New York/London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203800645
  • Baxter, T. M. S., 1992, The Cratylus: Plato’s Critique of Naming, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Belardi, Walter, 1985, “Platone e Aristotele e la dottrina sulle lettere e la sillaba”, in his Filosofia grammatica e retorica nel pensiero antico, Rome: Edizioni di Ateneo, pp. 21–89.
  • Benfey, Theodor, 1866, “Über die Aufgabe des platonischen Dialogs Kratylos”, Abhandlung der Königlichen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaft zu Göttingen, Phil. Hist. Kl., 12: 189–330.
  • Bestor, Thomas Wheaton, 1980, “Plato’s Semantics and Plato’s ‘Cratylus’”, Phronesis, 25(3): 306–330. doi:10.1163/156852880X00179
  • Calvert, Brian, 1970, “Forms and Flux in Plato’s Cratylus”, Phronesis, 15(1–2): 26–47. doi:10.1163/156852870X00035
  • Casertano, Giovanni (ed.), 2005, Il Cratilo di Platone: struttura e problematiche, Naples: Loffredo.
  • Colvin, Matthew, 2007, “Heraclitean Flux and Unity of Opposites in Plato’s Theaetetus and Cratylus”, The Classical Quarterly, 57(2): 759–769. doi:10.1017/S0009838807000705
  • Demand, Nancy, 1975, “The Nomothetes of the Cratylus”, Phronesis, 20(2): 106–128. doi:10.1163/156852875X00021
  • Derbolav, Josef, 1972, Platons Sprachphilosophie im Kratylos und in den späteren Schiften, Saarbrücken: West-Ost Verlag.
  • Diehl, Christoph, 2012, Platons Semantik. Die Theorie sprachlicher Bedeutung im Kratylos, Münster: Mentis.
  • Driscoll, Sean Donovan, 2022, “Plato’s Tool Analogy in Cratylus 386e-390e”, Ancient Philosophy, 42(2): 367–388. doi:10.5840/ancientphil202242226
  • Eckl, Andreas, 2003, Sprache und Logik bei Platon. Erster Teil: Logos, Name und Sache im Kratylos, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Fine, Gail, 1977, “Plato on Naming”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 27(109): 289–301. doi:10.2307/2218949
  • Gaiser, Konrad, 1974, Name und Sache in Platons Kratylos, Heidelberg: Karl Winter Universitätsverlag.
  • Gold, Jeffrey B., 1978, “The Ambiguity of ‘Name’ in Plato’s ‘Cratylus’”, Philosophical Studies 34(3): 223–251. doi: 10.1007/BF00372890
  • Goldschmidt, Victor, 1940, Essai sur le Cratyle, Paris: Vrin.
  • Grote, George, 1865, Plato and the Other Companions of Sokrates, 3 vols., London: John Murray.
  • Guzzo, Augusto, 1956, “La problematica del Cratilo”, Filosofia, 7(4): 609–666.
  • Healow, Christopher G., 2020, “Extreme and Modest Conventionalism in Plato’s Cratylus”, Apeiron, 54(1): 1–28. doi:10.1515/apeiron-2019-0023
  • Heitsch, Ernst, 1984, Willkür und Problembewußtsein in Platons Kratylos, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Irwin, Terence H., 1977, “Plato’s Heracleiteanism”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 27(106): 1–13. doi:10.2307/2218924
  • Kahn, Charles H., 1973, “Language and ontology in the Cratylus”, in Edward N. Lee, Alexander P. D. Mourelatos, Richard M. Rorty (eds.), Exegesis and Argument, New York: Humanities Press, pp. 152–76.
  • Keller, Simon, 2000, “An Interpretation of Plato’s Cratylus”, Phronesis, 45(4): 284–305. doi:10.1163/156852800510234
  • Ketchum, Richard J., 1979, “Names, Forms and Conventionalism: Cratylus, 383-395”, Phronesis, 24(2): 133–147. doi:10.1163/156852879X00081
  • Kretzmann, Norman, 1971, “Plato on the Correctness of Names”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 8(2): 126–38.
  • Lanzalaco, Antonio, 1955, “Il convenzionalismo platonico del Cratilo”, Acme, 8: 205–248.
  • Levin, Susan B., 1995, “What’s in a Name?: A Reconsideration of the Cratylus’ Historical Sources and Topics”, Ancient Philosophy, 15(1): 91–115. doi:10.5840/ancientphil199515137
  • –––, 2001, The Ancient Quarrel between Philosophy and Poetry Revisited. Plato and the Literary Tradition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lorenz, Kuno and Jürgen Mittelstrass, 1967, “On Rational Philosophy of Language: The Programme in Plato’s Cratylus Reconsidered”, Mind, 76(301): 1–20. doi:10.1093/mind/LXXVI.301.1
  • Luce, J.V., 1965, “The Theory of Ideas in the Cratylus”, Phronesis, 10(1): 21–36. doi:10.1163/156852865X00031
  • –––, 1969, “Plato on Truth and Falsity in Names”, The Classical Quarterly, 19(2): 222–232. doi:10.1017/S0009838800024630
  • Mackenzie, Mary Margaret, 1986, “Putting the Cratylus in Its Place”, The Classical Quarterly, 36(1): 124–150. doi:10.1017/S0009838800010600
  • Meißner, David, 2019, Natur, Norm, Name. Sprache und Wirklichkeit in Platons Kratylos, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • –––, 2021, “Conventionalism and Relativism in Plato’s Cratylus”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 38(2): 119–135.
  • –––, forthcoming a, “Reappraising Plato’s Cratylus”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, first online: 24 March 2022. doi:10.1515/agph-2021-0017.
  • –––, forthcoming b, “Plato’s Cratylus”, in Vasilis Politis and Peter Larsen (eds.), The Platonic Mind, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Mikeš, Vladimír (ed.), 2021, Plato’s Cratylus: Proceedings From the Eleventh Symposium Platonicum Pragense, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Palmer, Michael D., 1989, Names, Reference, and Correctness in Plato’s Cratylus, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Pfeiffer, W. M., 1972, “True and False Speech in Plato’s CRATYLUS 385 B-C”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 2(1): 87–104. doi:10.1080/00455091.1972.10716866
  • Quine, W. V. O., 1959, Methods of Logic, New York: Henry Holt.
  • Rehn, Rudolf, 1982, Der logos der Seele. Wesen, Aufgabe und Bestimmung der Sprache in der platonischen Philosophie, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Richardson, Mary, 1976, “True and False Names in the ‘Cratylus’”, Phronesis, 21(2): 135–145. doi:10.1163/156852876X00093
  • Robinson, Richard, 1955, “The Theory of Names in Plato’s Cratylus”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 9(2): 221–236.
  • –––, 1956, “A Criticism of Plato’s Cratylus”, The Philosophical Review, 65(3): 324–341. doi:10.2307/2182143
  • Rosenmeyer, Thomas G., 1998, “Name–Setting and Name–Using: Elements of Socratic Foundationalism in Plato’s Cratylus”, Ancient Philosophy, 18(1): 41–60. doi:10.5840/ancientphil19981813
  • Schofield, Malcolm, 1972, “A Displacement in the Text of the Cratylus”, The Classical Quarterly, 22(2): 246–253. doi:10.1017/S0009838800042051
  • –––, 1982, “The dénouement of the Cratylus”, in Schofield and Nussbaum 1982: 61–81.
  • Schofield, Malcolm and Martha C. Nussbaum (eds.), 1982, Language and Logos: Studies in Ancient Greek Philosophy Presented to G.E.L. Owen, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sedley, David, 1998, “The Etymologies in Plato’s Cratylus”, The Journal of Hellenic Studies, 118: 140–154. doi:10.2307/632235
  • –––, 2003, Plato’s Cratylus, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511482649
  • Silverman, Allan, 1992, “Plato’s Cratylus: The Naming of Nature and the Nature of Naming”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 10: 25–71.
  • –––, 2001, “The End of the Cratylus: Limning The World”, Ancient Philosophy, 21(1): 25–43. doi:10.5840/ancientphil20012115
  • Smith, Imogen, 2008, “False Names, Demonstratives and the Refutation of Linguistic Naturalism in Plato’s Cratylus 427d1-431c3”, Phronesis, 53(2): 125–151. doi:10.1163/156852808X278703
  • –––, 2014, “Taking the Tool Analogy Seriously: Forms and Naming in the Cratylus”, The Cambridge Classical Journal, 60: 75–99. doi:10.1017/S1750270514000037
  • Stewart, M. A., 1975, “Plato, Cratylus 424c9 sqq.”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 57(2): 167–171.
  • Thomas, Christine J., 2008, “Inquiry Without Names in Plato’s Cratylus”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46(3): 341–364. doi:10.1353/hph.0.0027
  • Trivigno, Franco V., 2012, “Etymology and the Power of Names in Plato’s Cratylus”, Ancient Philosophy, 32(1): 35–75. doi:10.5840/ancientphil20123213
  • Weingartner, Rudolph H., 1970, “Making Sense of the Cratylus”, Phronesis, 15(1–2): 5–25. doi:10.1163/156852870X00026
  • Williams, Bernard, 1982, “Cratylus’ theory of names and its refutation”, in Schofield and Nussbaum 1982: 83–93.

E. Historical issues

  • Ademollo, Francesco, 2012, “The Platonic Origins of Stoic Theology”, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 43: 216–243. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199666164.003.0008
  • –––, 2013, “Cratylus 393b–c and the Prehistory of Plato’s Text”, The Classical Quarterly, 63(2): 595–602. doi:10.1017/S0009838813000128
  • Allan, D. J., 1954, “The Problem of Cratylus”, The American Journal of Philology, 75(3): 271–287. doi:10.2307/292439
  • Kirk, Geoffrey S., 1951, “The Problem of Cratylus”, The American Journal of Philology, 72(3): 225–253. doi:10.2307/292074
  • Luce, J. V., 1964, “The Date of the Cratylus”, The American Journal of Philology, 85(2): 136–154. doi:10.2307/293061
  • Nails, Debra, 2002, The People of Plato: A Prosopography of Plato and Other Socratics, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett.
  • Ross, David, 1955, “The date of Plato’s Cratylus”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 32(2): 187–96.
  • Smith, Colin C., 2022, “The Case for the 399 BCE Dramatic Date of Plato’s Cratylus”, Classical Philology, 117(4): 645–661. doi:10.1086/721536

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