Notes to Plato’s Cratylus

1. For the translations in this entry, see Ademollo 2011.

2. Some commentators believe that when Socrates ascribes a stable nature to actions, he indicates that we need to meet a certain objective standard to perform any given action well (see, e.g., Sedley 2003: 56–58). It is clear, however, that this is a misinterpretation of the text (Ademollo 2011: 98). For while Socrates does indeed say that we will, e.g., cut correctly if we use the right tool in the right way, the alternative he envisages is that we do not cut at all “and get nothing done”, not that we cut incorrectly or badly (see also 387c–d).

3. When Socrates introduces this premise, he says that a correct name is “a means to indicate the object” (433d)—which would seem to imply that it is a means to indicate its referents (and not their being). But as Socrates had earlier switched freely between saying that a correct name imitates a thing and saying that a name imitates a thing’s being (see 430a–b and 431d), it is clear that he is just expressing himself carelessly at 433d, and that it is indeed (P1) he has in mind.

4. Socrates first talks about the noun sklêrotês (which is why his argument is known as the sklêrotês argument); but in the decisive lines 434e–435a, it is the adjective sklêron he considers.

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