Plato’s Ethics: An Overview
Like most other ancient philosophers, Plato maintains a virtue-based eudaemonistic conception of ethics. That is to say, happiness or well-being (eudaimonia) is the highest aim of moral thought and conduct, and the virtues (aretê: ‘excellence’) are the dispositions/skills needed to attain it. If Plato’s conception of happiness is elusive and his support for a morality of happiness seems somewhat subdued, there are several reasons. First, he nowhere defines the concept of happiness nor makes it the direct target of investigation but introduces it in an oblique way in the pursuit of other questions. Second, the treatment of the human good varies in the different dialogues, so that readers find themselves confronted with the problem of what to make of the discrepancies between different works. This touches on a fundamental problem with Plato’s work – namely, whether to follow a ‘unitarian’, ‘revisionist’, or ‘developmentalist’ approach to his writings. Whereas unitarians regard the dialogues as pieces of one mosaic and take the view that Plato, in essence, maintains a unified doctrine from his earliest to his latest works, revisionists maintain that Plato’s thought underwent a fundamental transformation later in his life, while ‘developmentalists’ hold that Plato’s views evolved significantly throughout his career. While revisionism has lost its impact in recent years, developmentalism has gained in influence. Although there is no unanimity, few unitarians nowadays deny that the character of Plato’s early, middle, and late works differs in style, language, scope, and content, as is to be expected in a philosopher who was at work for more than fifty years. Most developmentalists, in turn, agree that it is impossible to line up Plato’s works like pearls on a string and to reconstruct his progress from dialogue to dialogue; where the views expressed in different dialogues seem to disagree, there may be complementation or supplementation at work, rather than divergence. Given that Plato never speaks in his own voice, it is important to take note of who the interlocutors are and what role is assigned to Socrates, if he is the main speaker. Plato’s dialogues should never be treated in isolation when it comes to the reconstruction of his doctrine; but even the comparison and contrasting of ideas presented in different dialogues is not a safe recipe for interpreting this elusive thinker’s views (for a more detailed discussion see the entry on Plato).
Plato’s so-called ‘Socratic’ dialogues share certain characteristics as a group. They are short interrogations by Socrates of the kind indicated in his explanation of his divine mission in the Apology. They seem designed, inter alia, to undermine unquestioned traditional views and values rather than to develop positive accounts. The positive accounts contained in the middle, the so-called ‘Platonic’, dialogues – that are grouped around the Republic – treat happiness in different ways as a state of perfection in a moral as well as in an intellectual sense. The exact nature of this state of mind is not easy to pinpoint, however, because it is based on metaphysical presuppositions that are, at least prima facie, both hazy and out of the realm of ordinary understanding. There is not, as there is in Aristotle, an explicit determination of happiness as the actualization of one’s best potential in a well-organized community. Instead, at least in some texts, Plato’s moral ideals appear both austere and self-abnegating: The soul is to remain aloof from the pleasures of the body in the pursuit of higher knowledge, while communal life demands the subordination of individual wishes and aims to the common good.
The difficulties of assessing Plato’s ethical thought are compounded by the fact that the metaphysical underpinnings seem to change during his long life. In the Socratic dialogues, there are no indications that the search for virtue and the human good goes beyond the human realm. This changes in the middle dialogues that show a growing interest in an all-encompassing metaphysical grounding of knowledge, a development that leads to the positing of the ‘Forms’ as the determinants of the true nature of all things, culminating in the Form of the Good as the transcendent principle of all goodness. Though the theory of the Forms is not confined to human values but encompasses the whole of nature, Plato, in the middle dialogues, seems to assume no more than an analogy between human affairs and cosmic harmony. The late dialogues, by contrast, display an increasing tendency to assume a unity of the microcosm of human life and the macrocosmic order of the entire universe, a tendency that is displayed most fully in the Philebus and the Timaeus. While these holistic tendencies appeal to the imagination because they rely on harmonic relations expressed in mathematical proportions, the metaphysical status of the Forms is even harder to make out in the late dialogues than in the middle dialogues. Though Plato’s late works do not show any willingness to lower the standards of knowledge as such, Plato indicates that his design of a rational cosmic order is based on conjecture and speculation, an acknowledgment that finds its counterpart in his more pragmatic treatment of ethical standards and political institutions in his last political work, the Laws.
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. The early dialogues: Examining life
- 3. The middle dialogues: Justice and other virtues
- 4. The late dialogues: Ethics and cosmology
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If ethics is widely regarded as the most accessible branch of philosophy, it is so because many of its presuppositions are, seemingly, self-evident or trivial truths: All human actions, for example, serve some end or purpose; whether they are right or wrong depends on the agent’s overall aims. At least for secularists, the attainment of these overall aims is regarded as a major condition of the good life. What we regard as a life worth living also depends on the notion we have of our own nature and of the conditions of its fulfillment. This, in turn, is determined, at least in part, by the values and standards of the society we live in. Personal ends and purposes depend in each case not only on reason, but also on the individual agents’ dispositions (i.e., their ingrained likes and dislikes, which determine their personal character). The attainment of these ends can also depend at least in part on external factors, such as health, material prosperity, social status, and even on good looks or sheer luck.
Although these presuppositions may seem self-evident, most of the time, human beings are aware of them only implicitly because they lead their lives in accordance with pre-established standards and values that are, under normal circumstances, not objects of reflection. It is only in times of crisis that a society’s traditions and precepts are challenged by someone like Socrates, who sees the need to disturb his fellows’ complacency. The historical Socrates was, of course, not the first to question the Greek way of life. Presocratic philosophers such as Xenophanes, Heraclitus, or Empedocles had been critics of their times, and the sophists had argued provocatively that, contrary to the naïve view, it is custom and convention, rather than nature that set the standards for what is deemed right or wrong, good or bad, in every society. But if other thinkers preceded Socrates with moral and social criticism, he was certainly the first to challenge his fellows on an individual basis on the ground that ‘the unexamined life is not worth living’ (Ap. 38a). Whatever position one may take in the controversy concerning the degree to which Plato’s early dialogues are true to the historical Socrates’ discussions, the independent testimony of Xenophon leaves little doubt that Socrates’ cross-examinations (elenchos) provoked the kind of enmity against him that led to his conviction and execution. In the eyes of conservative Athenians, Socrates’ questioning undermined the traditional values of their society. As Socrates saw it, the ‘virtues’ – which is to say the social skills, attitudes, and character-traits possessed by most Athenian citizens of his time – were all too often geared towards their possessors’ wealth, power, and capacities for self-indulgence, to the detriment of public morality and the community’s well-being (see the entry on Socrates).
The Socratic legacy prompted Plato to engage in a thorough examination of the nature of knowledge and reality, an examination that gradually took him far beyond the scope of the historical Socrates’ discussions. Nevertheless, Plato continued to present most of his investigations as dialogues between Socrates and some partner or partners. And Plato preserved the dialogical form even in those of his late works where Socrates is replaced by a stand-in and where the didactic nature of the presentations is hard to reconcile with the pretense of live discussion. But these didactic discourses continue to combine questions of ethical, political, social, or psychological importance with metaphysical, methodological, and epistemological considerations. And it can be hard to assess the extent to which Plato agrees with the pronouncements of his speakers, whether that speaker is Socrates or anyone else. Furthermore, the fact that a certain ethical problem or its solution is not mentioned in a certain dialogue does not mean that Plato was unaware of it. There is, therefore, no certainty concerning the question: “What did Plato see and when did he first see it?” The lack of information about the order in which Plato wrote his works adds to this difficulty. It stands to reason, however, that he started with the short dialogues that question traditional virtues – wisdom, courage, justice, moderation, piety. It also stands to reason that Plato gradually widened the scope of his investigations by reflecting not only on the social and political conditions of morality but also on the logical, epistemological, and metaphysical presuppositions of a successful moral theory. These theoretical reflections often take on a life of their own. Several of Plato’s later works address ethical problems only marginally or not at all. The Parmenides, the Theaetetus, and the Sophist deal primarily or exclusively with epistemological and metaphysical problems of a quite general nature. Nevertheless, as witnessed by the Philebus, the Statesman, the Timaeus, and the Laws, Plato never lost interest in the question of the conditions of the good human life.
The early ‘Socratic’ dialogues are not concerned with the question of the good life and its conditions in general but rather with particular virtues. Socrates explores these virtues through discussions with persons who are regarded either as representatives of, or claim to be experts on, that virtue. Socrates’ justification for this procedure is that a paragon or expert must know the property that characterizes his particular virtue and must, therefore, be able to give an account or definition of it (cf. Xenophon Memorabilia I, 10; 16). Thus, in the Euthyphro, Socrates discusses piety/holiness with an alleged ‘expert’ on religious affairs. In the Laches, he discusses courage with two renowned generals in the Peloponnesian war, Laches and Nicias. Similarly, in the Charmides, Socrates addresses – somewhat ironically – the nature of moderation with two of the later Thirty Tyrants, namely with the then very young Charmides, an alleged model of modesty, and his guardian and intellectual mentor, Critias. In the Greater Hippias, Socrates raises the question of the nature of the beautiful with a producer of ‘beautiful things’, the sophist and polymath Hippias. In the Protagoras, Socrates focuses on the question of the unity of virtue in a discussion with Protagoras, the most famous teacher of ‘civic virtues’ among the sophists. And in the Gorgias, Socrates discusses the nature of rhetoric and its relation to virtue with the most prominent teacher of rhetoric among the sophists. Finally, in the Meno, the question of how virtue as such is acquired is raised by Meno, a disciple of Gorgias and an ambitious seeker of power, wealth, and fame, who later met a gruesome death in Persia in the pursuit of those very values.
Socrates’ interlocutors are usually, at first, quite confident about their own competence in the discussion. And such confidence is not unreasonable. If virtue is a kind of ‘skill’ or a special property that enjoys general recognition, its possessor should know and be able to give an account of that skill or proficiency. As Socrates’ examinations demonstrate, however, such self-confidence is usually unfounded, and the ‘knowledge’ professed by Socrates’ partners is revealed to be, at best, an implicit familiarity. When they are confronted with their inability to explain the nature of their cherished virtue or expertise, they end up admitting their ignorance, but often with considerable chagrin or anger (on the ‘Socratic’ dialogues, see the entry in SEP Plato’s Shorter Ethical Works by Paul Woodruff). Socrates’ purpose in conducting these sometimes cruel-looking games is not just to undermine the false confidence of his interlocutors but also to pave the way towards general definitions and standards concerning the virtues. There were no widely acknowledged standards of definition in Socrates’ time, but by exposing the flaws in his partners’ abortive arguments in his investigations, Socrates contributed significantly to the development of such standards. The respective flaws vary greatly in kind and gravity: Socrates shows that enumerations of examples are not sufficient to capture the nature or essence of the virtue in question. Definitions that consist in the replacement of the concept in question with a synonym are open to the same objections as the original definition. Definitions may be hopelessly vague or miss the mark entirely, which is to say that they may be either too wide and include unwanted characteristics or subsets, or too narrow so that they exclude essential characteristics. Moreover, definitions may be incomplete because the object in question does not constitute a unitary phenomenon. If generally accepted ‘social excellences’ are not simple conditions, they may be subject to conflicting convictions. Examples of all these problems are provided in Plato’s early dialogues, where Socrates exposes the exact nature of the underlying deficiencies with more or less diagnostic transparency.
Given that the focus in the early dialogues is almost entirely on the exposure of flaws and inconsistencies, one cannot help wondering whether Plato himself knew the answers to his queries and had some cards up his sleeve that he chose not to play for the time being. This would presuppose that Plato had not only a clear notion of the nature of the different virtues but also a definitive conception of the good life as such. Since Plato was neither a moral nihilist nor a sceptic, he cannot have regarded moral perplexity (aporia) as the ultimate end, nor regarded continued mutual examination, Socratico more, as a way of life for everyone. Perplexity, as is argued in the Meno, is just a wholesome intermediary stage on the way to knowledge (Me. 84a–b). But if Plato assumes that the convictions that survive Socratic questioning will eventually coalesce into a coherent account of the good life, then he keeps this expectation to himself. Nor would such optimism seem warranted, given Socrates’ disavowal of knowledge. There is no guarantee that only false convictions are refuted in a Socratic cross-examination, while true ones are retained – for promising suggestions are often as mercilessly discarded as their less promising brethren. Perhaps Plato counted on his readers’ intelligence to straighten out what is skewed in Socratic refutations, as well as to detect unfair moves and to supplement what is missing. It is, in fact, often not difficult to make out problematic or fallacious moves in Socrates’ argument and to correct them, but such corrections must remain incomplete without sufficient information about Plato’s overall conception of the good life and its moral presuppositions at that point in time. It is, therefore, a matter of conjecture whether Plato himself held any positive views while he composed one aporetic dialogue after the other. He may have regarded his investigations as experimental stages or have seen each dialogue as an element in a network of approaches that he hoped to integrate eventually.
If there is a general lesson to be drawn from the many failed accounts of the virtues by Socrates’ different partners, beyond the particular shortcomings of individual definitions and assertions, it is that isolated definitions of single virtues, summed up in one sentence, will not do. The evidence that Plato wanted his readers to draw this very conclusion already in his early dialogues is somewhat contradictory, however. He famously pleads for the unity of the virtues in the Protagoras and seems intent to reduce them all to knowledge. Scholars are, therefore, wont to speak of the ‘intellectualistic’ character of the so-called ‘Socratic ethics’ because it leaves no room for other motivational forces, such as desires and emotions. Socrates’ proof in the Protagoras that reason cannot be overcome by the passions has, from Aristotle on, been treated as a denial of akrasia, of the phenomenon that was later somewhat misleadingly dubbed as ‘weakness of the will’. This intellectualizing tendency does not tell us, however, what kind of master-science would fulfill all of the requirements for defining virtues, nor what its content should be. Moreover, the emphasis on knowledge does not rule out an awareness on Plato’s part of the importance of other factors, even in his early dialogues. Though Plato often compares the virtues with technical skills, such as those of a doctor or a pilot, he may have realized that virtues also involve emotional attitudes, desires, and preferences but not yet have seen a clear way to coordinate or combine the rational and the affective elements that constitute the virtues. In the Laches, for instance, Socrates’ partners struggle when they try to define courage, invoking two different elements. In his attempt to define courage as ‘steadfastness in battle’, Laches, one of the two generals and ‘experts’ on courage, is faced with the dilemma that steadfastness seems not to be a satisfactory definition of courage either in itself or in combination with knowledge (La. 192a–194c). His comrade Nicias, on the other hand, fails when he tries to identify courage exclusively as a certain type of knowledge (197e–200a). The investigation of moderation in the Charmides, likewise, points up that there are two disparate elements commonly associated with that virtue – namely, a certain calmness of temper on the one hand (Chrm. 158e–160d) and self-knowledge on the other (166e–175a). It is clear that a complex account would be needed to combine these two disparate features, for moral skills not only presuppose sufficient ‘operative’ rationality but also require appropriate evaluative and emotional attitudes towards the ends to be attained and towards the means to be employed. Such an insight is at least indicated in Socrates’ long and passionate argument in the Gorgias against Polus and Callicles that the just life is better for the soul of its possessor than the unjust life, an argument that he fortifies with a mythical depiction of the soul’s reward and punishment after death (523a–527e). But the nature of justice, and what is required for the proper care of one’s soul, is thereby illuminated only indirectly. For the most part, Socrates’ interrogations focus on the incompatibility of his interlocutors’ selfish aims with their more selfless and noble tendencies. In his earlier dialogues, Plato may or may not already be envisaging the kind of solution that he is going to present in the Republic to the problem of the relationship between the different virtues, with wisdom, the only purely intellectual virtue, as their basis. Courage, moderation, and justice presuppose a certain steadfastness of character as well as a harmony of purpose between the disparate parts of the soul, but their goodness depends entirely on the intellectual part of the soul, just as the virtue of the citizens in the just state depends on the wisdom of the philosopher kings (R. 428a–444e). The existence of ‘demotic’ virtues of character is thus acknowledged, but they are relegated to second place (500d; 522a–b).
There are at least some indications that Plato already saw the need for a holistic conception of the good life when he composed his ‘Socratic’ dialogues. At the end of the Laches, he lets Nicias founder in his attempt to define courage as the ‘knowledge of what is to be feared and what should inspire confidence’. Nicias is forced to admit that such knowledge presupposes the knowledge of good and bad tout court (La. 199c–e). In a different but related way, Socrates alludes to a comprehensive knowledge at the end of the Charmides. In his final refutation of Critias’ definition of moderation as ‘knowledge of knowledge’, he urges that this type of knowledge is insufficient for the happy life without the knowledge of good and bad (Chrm. 174b–e). Pointing out what is wrong or missing in particular arguments is a far cry from a philosophical conception of the ultimate good in human life. But the fact that Plato insists on the shortcomings of a purely ‘technical’ conception of virtue suggests that he was at least facing up to these problems. The discussion of the ‘unity of the virtues’ in the Protagoras – regardless of the probably intentionally unsatisfactory structure of its proofs – confirms that Plato realized that a critique of the inconsistencies implied in conventional values is insufficient to justify such a unitary point of view. Nevertheless, the evidence that Plato already had a unified conception of the good life in mind when he wrote his earlier dialogues remains, at most, indirect.
It may be helpful to begin with a consideration of the method of ethical inquiry that Socrates is portrayed as using in the early dialogues. A reflection on the meaning of Socrates’ quest for definitions in the early dialogues suggests that Plato cannot have been blind to the sterility of a purely negative way of argument, or if he was blind at first, his blindness cannot have lasted long, for Socrates’ quest for definitions has important consequences. First and foremost, definitions presuppose that there is a definable object; that is to say, it must have a stable nature. Nothing can be defined that is of a variable nature. In addition, the object in question must be a unitary phenomenon, even if its unity may be complex. If definitions are to provide the basis of knowledge, they require some kind of essentialism. This presupposition is indeed made explicit in the Euthyphro, where Plato employs, for the first time, the terminology that will be characteristic of his full-fledged theory of Forms. In response to Euthyphro’s enumeration of various examples of pious behavior, Socrates demands an account of the one feature (Euthphr. 5d: idea; 6d: eidos; 6e: paradeigma) that is common to all cases of what is holy or pious. Despite this pregnant terminology, few scholars nowadays hold that the Euthyphro already presupposes transcendent Forms, in a realm of their own – models that are only incompletely represented by their representatives under material conditions. The terms eidos and idea had preserved their original meaning of ‘look’ or ‘shape’ into the classical age, but they were also often used in the more abstract sense of ‘form’, ‘sort’, ‘type’, or ‘kind’. No more than piety or holiness in the abstract sense seems to be presupposed in the discussion of the Euthyphro. There is, at any rate, no mention of any separation of a sensible and an intelligible realm, let alone of an existence of ‘the holy itself’, as a transcendent entity.
The passage in the Euthyphro where Socrates asks Euthyphro to identify the one feature that is common to all that is holy or pious makes intelligible, however, the reason why Plato felt encouraged to develop the conception of transcendent Forms. The requisite unity and invariance of entities such as ‘the holy’, ‘the beautiful’, ‘the just’, or ‘the equal’, necessarily prompts reflections on their ontological status and on the appropriate means of access to them. Given that they are the objects of definition and the models of their ordinary representatives, there is every reason not only to treat them as real but also to assign to them a higher kind of unity and perfection. And once this step has been taken, it is only natural to make certain epistemological adjustments, for access to paradigmatic entities is not to be expected through ordinary experience but presupposes some special kind of intellectual insight. It seems, then, that once Plato had accepted invariant and unitary objects of thought as the subject of definition, he was predestined to follow the path that led him to adopt a metaphysics and epistemology of transcendent Forms. The very fact that mathematics was already an established science with rigorous standards and unitary and invariant objects seems to have greatly enhanced Plato’s confidence in applying the same standards in moral philosophy. It led him to search for models of morality beyond the limits of everyday experience. This, in turn, explains the development of his theory of recollection and the postulate of Forms as transcendent, immaterial objects as the basis of both reality and thought that he refers to in the Meno and that he presents more fully in the Phaedo.
We do not know when, precisely, Plato adopted this mode of thought, but it stands to reason that his contact with the Pythagorean school on his first voyage to Southern Italy and Sicily around 390 BC played a major role in that development. Mathematics as a model-science has several advantages. It deals with unchangeable entities that have precise definitions. It also makes plausible the claim that the essence of these entities cannot be comprehended in isolation but only in a network of interconnections that have to be worked out at the same time as each particular entity is defined. Thus, to understand what it is to be a triangle, it is necessary – inter alia – to have a clear notion of the nature of points, lines, planes, and their interrelations. That Plato was aware of that fact is indicated in his introduction of the theory of recollection in the Meno, 81d: “As the whole of nature is akin, and the soul has learned everything, nothing prevents a man, after recalling one thing only – a process men call learning – discovering everything else for himself, if he is brave and does not tire of the search; for searching and learning, are, as a whole, recollection (anamnesis).” The somewhat mystifying claim of an ‘overall kinship’ is then illuminated by the famous ‘mathematical experiment’ (Me. 82b–85c). The slave manages, with some pushing and pulling by Socrates, and thanks to some illustrations drawn in the sand, to double the area of a given square. In the course of this interrogation, the disciple gradually discovers the relations between the different lines, triangles, and squares. That Plato regards these interconnections as crucial features of knowledge is subsequently confirmed by the distinction that Socrates draws between knowledge and true belief (97b–98b). As he argues, true beliefs are unreliable because they behave like ‘the statues of Daedalus that easily run away as long as they are not tied down’. The requisite ‘tying down’ happens (98a) “by giving an account of the reason why. And that, Meno my friend, is recollection, as we previously agreed. After they are tied down, in the first place, they become knowledge, and then they remain in place.” This explanation indicates that, according to Plato, knowledge does not consist in a mere mental ‘gazing’ at isolated models but rather in uncovering the invariant relations and interrelations that constitute the objects in question.
The complexity underlying Plato’s theory of the Forms as it surfaces in the Phaedo is easily overlooked because its discussion initially suggests that recollection is no more than the grasping of concepts. Thus, the concept of ‘exact equality in size’ is prompted by the perception of more or less equal-seeming sticks and stones (74a–e). The same condition applies to the other examples of Forms, 65d–e: “Do we say that there is such a thing as the Just itself or not? And the Beautiful, and the Good? […] I am speaking of all things such as Tallness, Health, Strength, and in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is.” But Plato does not employ his newly established metaphysical entities as the basis for working out a definitive conception of the human soul and the appropriate way of life in the Phaedo. Rather, he confines himself to warnings against the contamination of the soul by the senses and their pleasures, and quite generally against corruption by worldly values. He gives no advice concerning human conduct beyond the recommendation of a general abstemiousness from worldly temptations. This seems a rather austere picture of human life, and an egocentric one, to boot, for nothing is said about relations between human beings beyond Socrates’ exhortations that his friends should likewise take care of their souls as best they can. It is unclear whether this otherworldly and ascetic attitude is the sign of a particularly pessimistic period in Plato’s life or whether it merely reflects the circumstances of the discussion – Socrates’ impending death. But as long as this negative or otherworldly attitude towards the physical side of human nature prevails, no interest is to be expected on the part of Plato in nature as a whole – let alone in the principles of the cosmic order (but cf. 5.1 below). But it is not only the apparent asceticism that stands in the way of a wider perspective. Socrates himself seems to have been quite indifferent to the study of nature. While in the Phaedo Socrates confesses his inability to deal with the causes of natural processes, the Apology contains an energetic denial of any concern with natural philosophy on Socrates’ side. The accusations that depict him as “a student of all things in the sky and below the earth” are quite unfounded (18c); he has never conversed on such issues at all, and the attribution to him of the Anaxagorean tenet that the sun is a stone and the moon consists of earth is a sign of his accusers’ recklessness (26d–e). Similarly, in the Phaedrus, Socrates explains his preference for the city and his avoidance of nature (230d): “Landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me – only the people in the city can do that.” That Plato is not distorting the facts here is confirmed by the testimony of Xenophon, who is equally emphatic about Socrates’ repudiation of the study of heavenly phenomena and his concentration on human affairs (Memorabilia I 1.15–16). If Plato later takes a much more positive attitude towards nature in general, this is a considerable change of focus. In the Phaedo, he quite deliberately confines his account of the nature of heaven and earth, with its heavenly order and hellish geography, to the myth about the soul’s afterlife (108d–114c). As he states in conclusion, this mythical depiction is not to be taken literally but as an encouragement to heed its moral message and to take care of one’s soul (114d–e). This is as constructive as Plato gets in his earlier treatment of the principles of ethics.
If Plato went through a period of open-ended experimentation and tentative suggestions, this stage was definitely over by the time he wrote the Republic, the central work of his middle years. Because of the Republic’s importance, a more detailed account will be provided here in order to explain the ethical principles set forth in that work, for these principles are closely intertwined with Plato’s political, psychological, and metaphysical conceptions. That the work represents a major change in Plato’s thinking is indicated already by the dialogue’s setting. The aporetic controversy about justice in the Republic’s first book is set off quite sharply against the constructive discussion that ensues in its remaining nine books. Like the Gorgias, the first book presents three interlocutors who defend, with increasing vigor and contentiousness, their notion of justice against Socrates’ elenchos. Of these disputes, the altercation with the sophist Thrasymachus has received the most attention because he defends the provocative thesis that natural justice is the right of the stronger and that conventional justice is, at best, high-minded foolishness. The counter-arguments employed by Socrates at the various turns of the discussion will not be presented here. Though they reduce Thrasymachus to angry silence, they are not above criticism. Socrates himself expresses dissatisfaction with the result of this discussion R. 354c: “As far as I am concerned, the result is that I know nothing, for when I don’t know what justice is, I’ll hardly know whether it is a kind of virtue or not, or whether a person who has it is happy or unhappy.” But for once, the speakers’ confession of aporia is not the end of the discussion. At the beginning of the next book, two members of the audience, Plato’s brothers Glaucon and Adeimantus, challenge Socrates: Perhaps Thrasymachus has defended his case badly, but if Socrates wants to convince his audience, he must do better than that. The brothers demand a positive account both of what justice is and of what it does to the soul of its possessor.
The change of character in the subsequent discussion is remarkable. Not only are the two brothers not subjected to elenchos, they get ample time to elaborate on their objections (357a–367e). Though they profess not to be convinced that injustice is better than justice, they argue that, in the present state of society, injustice pays – with the gods as well as with humans – as long as the semblance of respectability is preserved. To prove this claim, the brothers play devil’s advocate by unfolding a scathing picture of their society’s attitude towards justice. As the story of the Ring of Gyges and its gift of invisibility proves, everyone who does not have a god-like character will eventually succumb to such a ring’s temptations (359c–360d). Instead of the wolf of Thrasymachus’ account, it is the wily fox who is the paragon of injustice (365a-d). He will succeed at every level because he knows how to play the power-game with cunning. The just man, by contrast, pays no heed to the mere semblance of goodness but rather to its substance and, therefore, must suffer a Christ-like fate because he does not comply with the demands of favoritism and blandishment (361e). Even the gods, as the poets confirm, are on the side of the successful scoundrel since they can be propitiated by honors and sacrifices. Given this state of affairs, a logic-chopping argument that justice is better than injustice is quite insufficient (367b–e: logôi). Instead, Socrates must show what effect each of them has on the souls of their possessors. As this critique indicates, Plato, at this point, clearly regards refutation as an insufficient way of making true converts. Whether he ever had such confidence in the power of refutation must remain a moot point. But the Republic shows that the time had come for a positive account of morality and of the good life. If elenchos is used in Plato’s later dialogues, it is never again used in the knock-down fashion of the early dialogues. But in his treatment of justice, Plato does not directly resort to the theory of Forms. Instead, he develops a political and psychological model as a solution to the problem of the nature of justice. That there is also a metaphysical way to determine the nature of justice is indicated only briefly and enigmatically when Plato speaks of a ‘longer way’ that would also have been possible for him to take (435d; 504b)
A brief sketch of Plato’s inquiry into the nature of justice must suffice here to make intelligible his distinction of justice from the other kinds of virtue and of their role in the good life (for a more penetrating analysis, see the entry Plato’s Ethics and Politics by Eric Brown). This question is addressed in a quite circuitous way. Justice is first to be studied in the ‘larger text’ of the state rather than in the hard-to-decipher ‘small text’ of the individual soul. A study of how a city comes to be will supposedly reveal the origin of justice and injustice (369a). Its founding principle is – at least at first – no high-minded concern of humankind, but mutual economic need: “A city comes to be because none of us is self-sufficient (autarkês), but we all need many things. … And because people need many things, and because one person calls on a second out of one need (chreia) and on a third out of a different need, many people gather in a single place to live together as partners and helpers.” The ‘need’ is, at least at this point, purely economic. The minimal city is based on the need for food, clothing, shelter, and for the requisite tools. It is economic efficiency that dictates the adoption of the principle of the ‘division of functions’: It is best if everyone performs the task s/he is naturally most fit for. This principle determines not only the structure of the minimal, self-subsistent state of farmers and craftsmen but also the subsequent division of the city’s inhabitants into three classes in the ‘fevered state’ that caters to higher demands, for a more luxurious city needs protection by a professional army as well as the leadership of a class of philosopher-kings and -queens. Beyond the claim that the division of functions is more economical, Plato gives no justification for this fateful decision that determines the social order in the state, as well as the nature of the virtues. Human beings are not born alike but with different abilities that predestine them for different tasks in a well-ordered state. This leads to Plato’s principle: ‘one person – one job’ (R. 370a–c; 423d).
Because the division of functions paves the way for the definition of justice as ‘doing your own thing and not meddling with that of others’ in Book IV (432d–433b), it is necessary to briefly review the kind of social order Plato has in mind, the psychological principles he assumes, and the political institutions by which that order is to be secured, for this explains not only the establishment of a three-class society and the explanation of the corresponding structure of the soul but also Plato’s theory of education and the metaphysical underpinnings. That economic needs are the basis of the political structure does not, of course, mean that they are the only human needs Plato recognizes. It indicates, however, that the emphasis here is on the unity and self-sufficiency of a well-structured city, not on the well-being of the individual (423c–e; 425c). This focus should be kept in mind when assessing the ‘totalitarianism’ and the rigorous cultural conservatism of the political philosophy of Plato’s middle years.
The need for a professionally trained army leads to the discussion of education and moral psychology because the preservation of internal peace and external security presupposes the combination of two quite different character-traits among the ‘guardians’ (‘the philosophical watchdogs’, 375d–376c): friendliness towards their fellow-citizens and fierceness towards their enemies. The injunctions concerning the citizens’ education are very detailed because it must combine the right kind of ‘muses’ (poetry, music, and other fine arts) with the appropriate physical training in order to develop the right temperament and attitude in the soldiers (376d–403d). The organisation and supervision of education is the special task of the third class, that of the rulers of the city (412b–417b). They are to be selected through tests of both intelligence and character from among the soldiers – individuals who are unshakable in their conviction that their own well-being is intimately tied to that of the city. To ensure that members of the military and the ruling class retain the proper attitude towards their civic duties, members of both classes must lead a communal life without private homes, families, or property. When Socrates’ interlocutors object that such a life is not apt to make these citizens happy, the topic of happiness is addressed for the first time, but Socrates quickly brushes it aside at this point on the ground that the political order is designed to make the entire city happy, rather than any one particular group (419a-e).
The division of functions that leads to the separation of the three classes for the purpose of achieving the social conditions for justice concludes the discussion of the social order (427d–434c). The peculiar manner in which Socrates further develops his explanation of the nature of justice can best be understood with reference to the upshot of this discussion. The catalogue of what in later tradition has been dubbed ‘the four cardinal Platonic virtues’ – wisdom, courage, moderation, and justice – is first presented without comment. Piety, as the text indicates, is nοt treated as a virtue; religious practices should, rather, be left to tradition and to the oracle of Apollo at Delphi on the ground that: “We have no knowledge of these things” (427b–c). The definition of justice is to be discovered by a process of elimination. If there are four virtues in the city, then justice must be the one that is left over after the other three have been identified. There is no proof offered that there are exactly four virtues in a state, nor that they are items that can be lifted up, singly, for inspection, like objects from a basket. Instead, Socrates points out the role they play in the maintenance of the social order. About wisdom (sophia) – the only purely intellectual virtue and the exclusive possession of the rulers – little more is said at this point than that it is ‘good council’ (euboulia) in decisions about the internal and external affairs of the city. Courage (andreia) is the soldiers’ specific virtue. Socrates takes some trouble explaining its nature because it is a mixture of belief (doxa) and steadfastness of character (sôtêria). It is compared to colorfast wool: Through thick and thin, the guardians must be dyed-in-the-wool adherents to the laws’ decrees about what is to be feared and what is to be faced with confidence. Moderation (sôphrosunê) is not an intellectual excellence either, but rather a combination of belief with a certain disposition to support order. It is a conviction (doxa, 431e) shared by all classes about who should rule – a conviction based on a state of ‘order’ (kosmos), ‘consonance’ (sumphônia), and ‘harmony’ (harmonia). The state’s third class, then, has no specific virtue of its own. Finally, the identification of justice is due to the sudden insight on Socrates’ part that justice is the principle that has been at work all along in the founding of the model state – namely, that everyone is to “do their own thing and not meddle with that of another” (433a).
The promise to establish the isomorphic structure of the city and soul has not been forgotten. After the definition and assignment of the four virtues to the three classes of the city, the investigation turns to the role and function of the soul’s virtues. The soul is held to consist of three parts corresponding to the three classes in the city. The lengthy argument for the tri-partition of the soul into a rational (logistikon), a spirited (thumoeides), and an appetitive (epithumêtikon) part (434d–441c) can here be neither reproduced nor subjected to a critical evaluation. That Plato lets Socrates express reservations concerning the adequacy of his own procedure, despite his unusually circumspect way of justifying the division of the soul’s faculties, indicates that he regards it as an important innovation. Indeed, there is no indication of separate parts of the soul in any of the earlier dialogues; irrational desires have been attributed there to the influence of the body. In the Republic, by contrast, the soul itself becomes the source of the appetites and desires. The difference between the rational and the appetitive part is easily justified because the opposition between the decrees of reason and the various kinds of unreasonable desires is familiar to everyone. The existence of a third, a ‘spirited’ or courageous part – different from both reason and appetite – is harder to prove. But the phenomenon of moral indignation is treated as evidence for a psychic force that is reducible neither to reason nor to any of the appetites; it is rather an ally of reason in a well-ordered soul, a force opposed to the unruly appetites. This concludes the proof that there are three parts in the soul, corresponding to the three classes in the city – namely, the rational part representing the wisdom of the rulers, the spirited part, manifest in the courage of the soldiers, and the appetitive part that motivates the rest of the population in its quest for material gain.
The discussion of the division of the soul sets the stage for the final determination of the contrast between justice and injustice (441c-445e): There will be justice in the city if the members of all three classes mind their own business; similarly, in the individual soul, there will be justice if each part of the soul fulfills its own function properly. This presupposes that the soul’s two upper parts have been given the right kind of training and education in order to control the appetitive part. The three other virtues are then assigned to the respective parts of the soul. Courage is the excellence of the spirited part, wisdom belongs to the rational part, and moderation is the consent of all three parts about who should rule and who should obey. Justice turns out to be the overall unifying quality of the soul, for the just person not only refrains from meddling with what is not his externally but also harmonizes the three parts of the soul internally. While justice is order and harmony, injustice is its opposite: It is a rebellion of one part of the city or soul against the others, and it results in the inappropriate rule of their inferior parts. Justice and injustice in the soul are, then, analogous to health and illness in the body. This comparison suffices to bring the investigation to its desired result: If justice is health and harmony of the soul, then injustice must be disease and disorder. Hence, it is clear that justice is a good state of the soul that makes its possessor happy, and injustice is its opposite. As no one in his right mind would prefer to live with a ruined body, similarly no one would prefer to live with a diseased soul. In principle, the discussion of justice has, therefore, reached its promised goal already at the end of Book IV. Socrates has met Glaucon’s and Adeimantus’ challenge to prove that justice is a good, in and by itself, for the soul of its possessor, and that it is preferable to injustice.
That the Republic’s discussion does not end here but occupies six more books is due most of all to several loose ends that need to be tied up. Apart from the fact that reason and order are to reign supreme, little has been said about the citizens’ way of life. This gap will be filled, at least in part, by the description of the communal life of the upper classes without private property and family in Book V. More importantly, nothing has been said about the rulers and their particular kind of knowledge. This is a crucial point because, as the definitions of the three ‘inferior’ virtues show, their quality is contingent on the rulers’ wisdom. Socrates addresses this problem with the provocative thesis (473c–d): “Until philosophers rule as kings or those who are now called kings and leaders genuinely and adequately philosophize ... cities will have no rest from evils, nor will the human race.” This thesis starts the discussion of the philosophers’ knowledge and of their upbringing and education, which will continue through Books VI and VII. Because they also introduce the special objects of the philosophers’ knowledge, these books provide the metaphysical underpinning of the entire conception of the good soul and the good state, for the ‘Form of the Good’ turns out to be the ultimate source of all being and knowledge. A short summary of the upshot of the educational program must suffice here. The future philosophers, both women and men, are selected from the group of guardians whose general cultural training they share. If they combine moral firmness with quickness of mind, they are subject to a rigorous curriculum of higher learning that will prepare them for the ascent from the world of the senses to the world of intelligence and truth, an ascent whose stages are summed up in the similes of the Sun, the Line, and the Cave (508a–518b). To achieve this ascent, the students have to undergo, first, a preparatory schooling of ten years’ duration in the ‘liberal arts’: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, and theoretical harmonics (518c–531c). Afterwards, they are admitted to the training in the master-science of ‘dialectic’, a science that supposedly enables its possessor to deal in a systematic way with the objects of real knowledge – the Forms in general – and with the Form of the Good in particular – the principle of the goodness of all else (531c–535a). This study is to last for another five years. Successful candidates are then sent back into the Cave as administrators of ordinary political life for 15 years. At the age of fifty, the rulers are granted leave to pursue philosophy, but even that pursuit is interrupted by periods of service as overseers over the order of the state. This completes, in a nutshell, the description of the philosopher-kings’ and -queens’ education and activities (539d–541b).
Plato’s design of an autocratic rule by an aristocracy of the mind has received a lot of flak. But our assessment of his politics must here be limited to an assessment of the kind of happiness it supposedly provides. Regardless of whether or not we find plausible Plato’s assumption of an overall principle of the good as the basis of the political order, his model state has, at least in theory, the advantage that it guarantees both internal and external peace. That is no mean feat in a society where interstate and civil wars were a constant threat and often enough ended in the destruction of the entire city. In addition, the division of functions guarantees a high degree of efficiency if every citizen does what he/she is naturally suited to do. But what about the citizens’ needs beyond those for security and material goods? Are they to find their life’s fulfillment only in the pursuit of their jobs? Plato seems to think so when he characterizes each class by its specific kind of desire and its respective good (581c): The philosophers are lovers of wisdom (philosophoi), the soldiers lovers of honor (philotimoi), and the workers are lovers of material goods (philochrêmatoi). That human beings find, or at least try to find, satisfaction in the kinds of goods they cherish is a point that is further pursued in the depiction of the decay of the city and its ruling citizens, from the best (the aristocracy of the mind) down to the worst (the tyranny of lust) in Books VIII and IX. A discussion of the tenability of this explanation of political and psychological decadence will not be attempted here. It is supposed to show that all inferior forms of government of city and soul are doomed to fail because of the inherent tensions between the goods that the different citizens aim for.
Some brief comments on Plato’s conception of happiness are in order at this point. He clearly goes on the assumption that human beings are happy insofar as they achieve the goals they cherish. Though this notion seems to come close to the ‘preference satisfaction’ for all citizens that is nowadays regarded as the primary aim of every liberal state, Plato’s restriction of each class to one type of good must seem objectionable, most obviously in the case of the citizens of the third class who supposedly covet nothing but material goods. This ‘reductive’ view of their human nature militates not only against present-day intuitions – it should also militate against Plato’s own moral psychology, in that all human souls consist of three parts – a rational, a spirited, and an appetitive part – whose health and harmony constitute the soul’s and the state’s happiness. Why, then, reduce the third class to animal-like creatures with low appetites, as suggested by the comparison of the people to a strong beast that must be placated (493a–c)? This comparison is echoed later in the comparison of the soul to a multiform beast, where reason just barely controls the hydra-like heads of the appetites and manages to do so only thanks to the aid of a lion-like spirit (588c–590d). Is Plato thereby giving vent to anti-democratic sentiments, showing contempt for the rabble, as has often been claimed? He can at least be cleared of the suspicion that the workers are mere serfs of the upper classes because he explicitly grants them the free enjoyment of all the customary goods that he denies to the upper classes (419a): “Others own land, build fine big houses, acquire furnishings to go along with them, make their own private sacrifices to the gods, entertain guests, and also, of course, possess what you were talking about just now, gold and silver and all the things that are thought to belong to people who are blessedly happy.” ‘Appetite’ is clearly not confined to food, drink, and sex. But apart from the granting of material largesse, the members of the third class are quite neglected in Plato’s ideal city. Apparently, no education is provided for them, for there is no suggestion that they participate in the guardians’ musical and athletic training, and there is no mention that obedience to the rulers’ commands is not the only source of happiness for the third class. Plato seems to sidestep his own insight that all human beings have an immortal soul and have to take care of it as best they can, as he not only demands in the Phaedo but is going to confirm in a fanciful way in the Myth of Er at the end of Republic Book X.
The lifestyle designated for the upper classes also seems open to objections. The soldiers’ musical and physical training is strictly regimented; they must take satisfaction in obedience to the laws for the sake of preserving the city’s inner and outer peace, and in the deeds of valor in war. Theirs is an austere camp-life; not all of them will be selected for higher education. But even the philosophers’ lives leave a lot to be desired, and not only because they have to starve their common human appetites and devote many years to administrative duties back in the ‘Cave’. Their intellectual pursuits are also not altogether enviable, as a closer inspection would show. Not only do the philosophers have two jobs – in violation of the rule ‘one person – one function’ – in that they are responsible for both administrative work and philosophical thought. They are also not to enjoy open-ended research but are, rather, subject to a mental training that is explicitly designed to turn their minds away from the enjoyment of all worldly beauty in order to focus exclusively on the contemplation of the Forms. This is indicated by the injunctions concerning the study of astronomy and harmonics (529a–531d): The students are not to crane their necks to watch the beauty of the “embroidery in the heavens” but rather to concern themselves with the ideal motions of ideal moving bodies in a purely geometrical fashion, and they are not to listen to audible sounds, but to attend to the mathematics of harmonics. The universe is not treated as an admirable cosmos – with the explicit purpose of providing moral and intellectual support to the citizens – in the way Plato is going to explain in the Philebus, the Timaeus, and in the Laws. Given these limitations of the philosophers’ mental exercises in the Republic, the claim that their lives are 729 times more pleasant than the tyrants’ (IX 587e) seems like a gross exaggeration, even if they enjoy the pleasures of being filled with pure and unadulterated truths while everyone else enjoys only semblances of the really real (581e–588a).
For all the advances that the Republic represents in certain respects, Plato’s ideal city must seem to us far from ideal. The system resembles a well-oiled machine where everyone has their economic niche and function, but its machine-like character must seem repellent to us, given that no deviations are permitted from the prescribed pattern. If innovations are forbidden, no room is left for creativity and personal development. Plato seems to presuppose that the fulfillment of a person’s function is sufficient to secure her happiness, or at least that is suggested by the ‘functional’ argument that defeats Thrasymachus (352d–354a). It states that every object, animal, and person has a specific function or work (ergon). If it performs its function well, it does well: For a living thing, ‘doing well’ means ‘living well’ and living well is tantamount to ‘living happily’. Though Socrates’ refutation of Thrasymachus is found wanting as a proof of justice’s superiority, the ergon-argument is nowhere revoked. On the contrary, it is affirmed by the principle of ‘one person – one job’ that is the very basis of Plato’s ideal city. But the confinement of everyone’s activities to just one kind of work seems rather a narrow one in the case of the citizens of the third class, given that they are not permitted to engage in politics, even if it may be economically most efficient. These features suffice to make the ideal life in Plato’s city unattractive to us, not to speak of certain other features that have not been explored here, such as the communal life envisaged for the upper classes and the assignment of sexual partnerships by a lottery that is rigged for the purposes of eugenics. But the feature that must strike us as strangest about Plato’s depiction of his citizens’ lives is that he does not acknowledge the one factor that could throw a more favorable light on the life of the third class, the life of tailors, carpenters, doctors, architects, sailors, i.e., that they will take pride and joy in their own work and in what they produce, given that they each in their own way make valuable contributions to the community’s well-being, without which the city could not function. Plato does not seem to acknowledge this when he addresses them, rather ungraciously, as ‘money-lovers’, indicating that he regards material gain as the only motivating factor in their lives.
Have these deficiencies escaped Plato’s notice? Justified as this critique must seem, it should be pointed out that Plato is clearly not concerned with the conditions that would make his city attractive to all citizens. His aim is rather more limited: He wants to present a model and work out its essential features. The same explanation applies to his depiction of the city’s and its citizens’ decay in Books VIII and IX. Contrary to certain critics’ assumptions, Plato is not there trying to predict and explain the course of history. Rather, he wants to explain the generation and decay typical of each political system and the psychopathology of its leaders. Plato finds the basis of both in the specific values – be they honor, money, freedom, or lust – that are embedded in the constitutions of the different types of state. It is unlikely that Plato presupposes that there are, in reality, pure representatives of these types, though some historical states may have been better representatives of those types than others. But the question remains whether he had a notion of the fact that his black-and-white picture of civic life in the model-state disregards the claim of individuals to have their own aims and ends and not to be treated like automata, with no thoughts and wishes of their own. Though the Republic contains some suggestions that would mitigate this bleak picture, for the sake of balancing this picture, it is more fruitful to look at other works of Plato’s middle period that concentrate on and prioritize the conditions of the individual soul rather than focus on the demands of the community. These works are the Symposium and the Phaedrus, for though each dialogue should be studied as a unity of its own, it is also necessary to treat the different dialogues as part of a wider picture.
The Symposium and the Phaedrus are two dialogues that focus on the individual soul and pay no attention to communal life at all. Instead, they concentrate on self-preservation, self-improvement, and self-completion. The Symposium is often treated as a dialogue that predates the Republic, most of all because it mentions neither the immortality nor the tripartition of the soul. But its dramatic staging – the praise of Eros by a company of symposiasts – is not germane to the otherworldly and ascetic tendencies of the Gorgias and the Phaedo. In addition, Plato has good reasons for leaving aside a discussion of the soul’s separability from the body in the Symposium (a feature it shares with the much later Philebus). He aims to show in the Symposium that love is an incentive, not only for all humans but for all other living beings as well. Contrary to all previous speakers, Socrates denies that Eros is a god because the gods are in a state of perfection. Love, by contrast, is a desire by needy creatures (endeeis) for the beautiful and the good (199c–201c). Socrates thereby corrects the previous speakers’ confusion of love itself with the beloved object. This important insight is presented not as Socrates’ own but as the upshot of a ‘lecture on the nature of love by the wise priestess Diotima’ (201d–212b): Eros is a powerful demon, a being between (metaxu) what is mortal and what is immortal, an ever needy hunter of the beautiful. Human beings share that demonic condition, for they are neither good nor bad but desire the good and the beautiful, the possession of which would constitute happiness for them. Because all people want happiness, they pursue the good as well as they can (205a–206b). In each case, they desire the particular kinds of objects that they hope will fulfill their needs. Such fulfillment is not a passive possession; it is, rather, the appropriation of the objects of love that are deemed to be essential in the struggle for self-preservation, self-completion, and self-fulfillment (207d): “For among animals the principle is the same as with us, and mortal nature seeks so far as possible to live forever and be immortal. And this is possible in one way only: by reproduction, because it leaves behind a new young one in place of the old.” There is, then, a constant need for self-restoration and self-improvement by procreation in the quest for an ‘earthly immortality’ manifest in all living things (206e et pass.). This need is explained by Diotima with an impressive depiction of the constant flux that all organisms undergo, which, in the case of human beings, not only affects their physical constitution but their moral and intellectual condition as well. Without constant replenishment, none of them even stays the same over time (207c-208b).
In the case of human beings, these needs express themselves in different ways. The search for ‘self-eternalization’ may result in, or even be fulfilled by, the production of biological children or of so-called ‘children of the mind’ (e.g., works of art), or even by the creation of order in the city that is then guided by the virtues of justice and moderation (209a–e). Diotima’s lecture is finally crowned by a depiction of the famous scala amoris – the explanation of the refinement and sublimation that a person experiences when recognizing higher and higher kinds of beauty (210a–212a). Starting with the love of one beautiful body, the individual gradually learns to appreciate not only all physical beauty but also the beauty of the mind, and in the end, she gets a glimpse of the supreme kind of beauty; namely, the vision of the Form of the Beautiful itself – a beauty that is neither relative, nor changeable, nor a matter of degree.
Because beauty of the higher kind is tied to virtue and is attained by the comprehension of what is common in laws and public institutions, it is clear that Plato does not have purely aesthetic values in mind but the principles of good order that are ultimately tied to the Form of the Beautiful/Good. The difference between the Republic’s and the Symposium’s accounts lies in the fact that the scala amoris treats physical beauty as an incentive to the higher and better, an incentive that, in principle, affects every human being. There is no talk of a painful liberation from the bonds of the senses or of a turn-around of the entire soul that is reserved only for the better educated. Brief as the Symposium’s explanation of happiness is, it shows three things: First, all human beings aim for their own self-preservation and -perfection. Second, this drive finds its expression in the products of their work, in creativity. Third, their respective activities are instigated by each person’s own particular desire for the beautiful. There is no indication that individuals must act as part of a community. Though the communitarian aspect of the good and beautiful comes to the fore in the high praise of the products of the legendary legislators (209e–210a), the ultimate assent to the Beautiful itself is up to the individual. That message of the Symposium is not unique in Plato’s works. The Lysis shares its basic assumption concerning the intermediary state of human nature between good and bad, and it regards need (endeia) as the basis of friendship. Due to the aporetic character of that dialogue, its lesson remains somewhat obscure, but it is obvious enough that it shares the Symposium’s general anthropological presuppositions.
The idea that eros is the incentive to sublimation and self-completion is further pursued in the Phaedrus. Although the close relationship between the two dialogues is generally acknowledged, the Phaedrus is commonly regarded as a much later work. Not only does it accept the Republic’s psychological doctrine of a tri-partite soul, it also advocates the immortality of the soul – doctrines that are conspicuously absent in the Symposium. But this difference seems due to a difference in perspective rather than to a change of mind. The discussion in the Symposium is deliberately confined to the conditions of self-immortalization in this life, while the Phaedrus takes the discussion beyond the confines of this life. If it shares the Republic’s doctrine of a division of the soul into three parts, it does so for reasons of its own: The three parts of the soul in the Phaedrus are not supposed to justify the separation of people into three classes. They explain, rather, the different routes taken by individuals in their search for beauty and their levels of success. If the Phaedrus goes beyond the Symposium, it does so in order to show how the enchantment by beauty can be combined with an element of Plato’s philosophy that seems quite alien to the notions of self-improvement and sublimation through the love of beauty. That element is abruptly identified as dialectic, the systematic method of collection and division that is characteristic of Plato’s later work. At first sight, it might seem that the dialogue’s topic, Eros, is hardly the right tie to keep together the dialogue’s two disparate parts – i.e., the highly poetical depiction of the enchantment by beauty and the ensuing heavenly voyage to a hyperouraneous place, and Plato’s subsequent, quite pedestrian, methodological explanations of the presuppositions of rhetoric (249b–c). But although the coherence of the Phaedrus cannot be argued for in full here, the notion that the Phaedrus is disjointed does not do justice to the dialogue’s careful composition and overall aim.
Rhetoric, its purpose and value, is, in fact, the dialogue’s topic right from the start. The misuse of rhetoric is exemplified by the speech attributed to the orator Lysias, a somewhat contrived plea to favor a non-lover rather than a lover. Socrates’ retort points up Lysias’ presuppositions: that love is a kind of sickness, an irrational craving for the pleasures of the body; that a lover tries to dominate and enslave the beloved physically, materially and mentally; and, most importantly, that the lover tries to deprive the beloved of philosophy. Once restored to his senses, the lover will shun his former beloved and break all his promises. This one-sided view of Eros is corrected in Socrates’ second speech: Eros, properly understood, is not a diseased state of mind but a kind of ‘divine madness’ (theia mania). To explain the nature of this madness, Socrates employs the comparison of the tripartite soul to a charioteer with a pair of winged horses, an obedient white one and an unruly black one. The crucial difference between the Phaedrus’ tripartition and that in the Republic lies in this: Instead of a long and arduous liberation through education, the Phaedrus envisages a liberation through the uplifting force of love, a love that is – just as it is in the Symposium – instigated by physical beauty. That is what first makes the soul grow wings and soar in the pursuit of a corresponding deity, to the point where it will attain godlike insights. The best-conditioned souls – those where the charioteer has full control over his horses – get a glimpse of true being, including the nature of the virtues and of the good (247c–e). Depending on the quality of each soul, the quality of the beauty pursued will also determine the cycle of reincarnations that is in store for each soul after death (248c–249c).
What is remarkable in the Phaedrus’ depiction of the uplifting effect of beauty is not only its exuberant tone and imagery, which goes far beyond the Symposium’s unadorned scala amoris, but also its intricate interweaving of mythical and philosophical elements. For, in the midst of his fanciful depiction of the different fates that are in store for different kinds of souls, Plato specifies, in quite technical terms, that the capacity “to understand speech in terms of general Forms, proceeding to bring many perceptions together into a reasoned unity” (249b–c: synienai kat’ eidos legomenon, ...eis hen logismôi synairoumenon), is the condition for the reincarnation of individual souls as human beings. It is this capacity for abstract thought that he then calls “recollection of what the soul saw when it was travelling with god, when it disregarded the things we now call real and lifted up its head to what is truly real instead.” The heavenly adventure now seems to amount to no more than the employment of the dialectical method that Socrates is going to describe, without further mythical camouflage, in the dialogue’s second part. The ability to work out a taxonomy, establishing the unity in a given subject-matter and dividing it up according to its natural kinds, is the art that characterizes the ‘scientific rhetorician’ (265d–266b). Socrates professes the greatest veneration for such a master: “If I believe that someone is capable of discerning a single thing that is also by nature capable of encompassing many, I follow ‘straight behind, in his tracks, as if he were a god’.” So the heavenly voyage has a quite down-to-earth counterpart in the dialectical method – a method that Plato regards as a ‘gift of the gods’, as he is going to confirm in the Philebus (16c). At the same time, Plato’s esteem for taxonomy explains the inner unity of the Phaedrus’ seemingly incongruous two parts as two sides of one coin, and it also shows why Plato no longer treats the sensory as a mere distraction and disturbance of the mind. Instead, the properly conditioned souls’ sensory impressions are its first incentives to seek the higher and better.
What concept of happiness is suggested by this ‘divinely inspired’ view of human life? Individuals do not, here, find their fulfillment in peaceful interactions in a harmonious community. Instead, life is spent in the perennial pursuit of the higher and better. But, in that task, the individual is not alone; she shares it with kindred spirits. The message of both the Symposium and the Phaedrus is, therefore, two-pronged. On the one hand, there is no permanent attainment of happiness as a stable state of completion in this life. In the ups and downs of life (and of the afterlife), humans are in constant need of beauty as an incentive to aim for self-perfection. Humans are neither god-like nor wise; at best, they are god-lovers and philosophers, demonic hunters for truth and goodness. To know is not to have, and to have once is not to have forever. In the Symposium, Diotima states in no uncertain terms that humans have a perennial need to replenish what they constantly lose, both in body and soul, because they are mortal and changeable creatures, and the Phaedrus confirms the need for continued efforts because the heavenly voyage is not a one-time affair. On the other hand, there is also the message conveyed that the pursuit of the good and the beautiful is not a lonely enterprise. As indicated in the Symposium and further elaborated in the Phaedrus, love for a beautiful human being is an incentive to search for a higher form of life, a sacred joint journey of two friends in communion (255a–256e). The need for, and also the possibility of, constant self-repletion and -perfection is a motive that will reappear in the ethical thought of Plato’s late works, a motif he sometimes presents as the maxim that humans should aim at the ‘likening of oneself to god’ (homoiôsis theôi in Theaetetus 176b; Timaeus 90c).
Sober philosophers have a tendency to ignore such visionary talk as a kind of Schwärmerei that lacks the substance to be worth serious thought. That Plato, appearances notwithstanding, is not indulging in a god-besotted rêverie in the Phaedrus is indicated by his interweaving of the mythical depiction in the dialogue’s first part with his specification and exploration of the dialectical method in the later part (259e-279c), where Socrates attempts to determine the requirements of ‘scientific rhetoric’ (259e–279c). Artful speaking, as well as artful deception, presupposes knowledge of the truth, especially where the identity of the phenomena is difficult to grasp, because similarities can be misleading. This applies in particular to concepts like the good and the just, as witnessed by the wide disagreement about their nature (263a–c). The development of the ‘sharp eye’ that is needed to assign each object to the right class is the aim of Plato’s method of collection and division, a method on which he expounds at some length in the Phaedrus. He discusses the care that is needed in order to “see together things that are scattered about everywhere, and to collect them into one kind (mia idea)”, as well as “to cut the unity up again according to its species along its natural joints, and to try not to splinter any part, as a bad butcher might do (265d–e).” That this method is supposed to serve an overall ethical purpose is confirmed by the fact that rhetoric based on truth must reflect the speaker’s knowledge not only of the different types of souls and the types of speech that fit them (271d) but also of the truth about just and good things (272d).
That dialectic is geared to this end is somewhat obscured in the subsequent discussion in the Phaedrus. First of all, Plato turns away from this issue in his long depiction of the iniquities of contemporary rhetoricians when he contrasts their efforts with that of the scientific rhetorician. And Plato continues this excursion with a discussion of speaking and writing, culminating in his famous ‘critique of writing’. Second, although Plato makes ample use of the method of collection and division in later dialogues such as the Sophist and the Statesman, he seems to pay little heed there to problems of ethics, with the exception of the Philebus. But the aptness of the dialectical method in discerning the nature of the good has already been emphasized in the Republic (534b–c): “Unless someone can distinguish in an account the Form of the Good from everything else, can survive all refutation as if in battle... you will say that he does not know the good itself or any other good.” Brief as these remarks are, they show that the application of dialectic is of central importance to the understanding and pursuit of the good. That the good is nowhere subjected to such treatment must be due to the enormity of the task involved in undertaking a systematic identification of all that is good and in working out the criteria of distinction. Although it is unclear whether Plato in the Republic had already refined the dialectical method in the systematic way indicated in the Phaedrus, the hints contained about a ‘longer way’ (435d; 504b) to determine the nature of justice and that of the other virtues suggest that the development of a systematic method of collection and division was at least ‘in the works’. As a closer look at the much later Philebus will show, the determination of what is good about each kind of thing presupposes more than a classification by collection and division: the internal structure of each kind of entity has also to be determined. Knowledge is not confined to the comprehension of the objects’ being, identity, difference and other interrelations that exist in a given field. It also presupposes the knowledge of what constitutes the objects’ internal unity and complexity. It would, of course, be rather presumptuous to claim that Plato had not seen the need to investigate the ontological ‘anatomy’, as well as the taxonomy, of the Forms from early on. But as the late dialogues show, it took him quite some effort to develop the requisite conceptual tools for such analyses.
Before we turn to the late dialogues, a final review is in order of the kind of good life that Plato envisages in the dialogues under discussion here. In the Symposium, the emphasis is on the individual’s creative work, which involves others at least as catalysts in one’s efforts to attain self-perpetuation and self-perfection. The quality of life attainable by each person differs depending on the kind of ‘work’ each individual is able to produce. This is what the scala amoris is all about. In the Phaedrus, the emphasis is on the ‘joint venture’ of two kindred souls. True friends will get to the highest point of self-fulfillment through the joint insights that they attain. Just as in the Symposium, the philosophical life is deemed the best. But then, this preference is found everywhere in Plato, and it is not unique to him: All ancient philosophers regard their own occupation as the true fulfillment of human nature – as they saw it. If there are differences between them, they concern the kinds of study and occupation that they deemed appropriate for the philosopher. The more individualistic view of happiness espoused in the Symposium and in the Phaedrus need, however, not be seen as a later stage in Plato’s development than the Republic’s communitarian conception. They may present complementary, rather than rival, points of view, and no fixed chronology need be assumed in order to accommodate both.
Most modern readers of Plato tend to ignore the significance of Plato’s late dialogues for his ethical views, for late dialogues such as the Timaeus appear to concentrate on nature and metaphysics — and, for the most part, drop questions such as the nature of the virtues and the moral psychology of the soul. This appears to be a shift in emphasis since nature and natural things are not among the objects that concern Plato in his earlier and middle philosophical investigations. Thus, in the Republic, he dismisses the study of the visible heaven from the curriculum of higher learning, along with the study of audible music. But, such generalizations about Plato’s intentions may be misleading. What he denigrates is not the study of the heavenly order as such or that of harmonics; it is, rather, the extent to which humans must necessarily rely on their eyes and ears in those concerns. Students of philosophy are, rather, encouraged to work out the true intelligible order underlying the visible heaven and audible music. Not only that: The ascent out of the Cave does include recognition of objects outside, especially “the things in the sky” (R. 516a–b). If Plato is critical of natural science, it is because of its empirical approach. This echoes the Phaedo’s complaint that one ruins one’s eyes by looking directly at things, most of all at the sun (Phdo. 99d–e), while ignoring the ‘binding force’ of the good. But what kind of ‘binding force’ does Plato attribute to ‘the Good’? His reticence about this concept, despite its centrality in his metaphysics and ethics, is largely responsible for the obscurity of his concept of happiness and of what it is to lead a good life. The philosophers’ knowledge supposedly provides a solid basis for the good life of the entire community, as well as for that of the – perhaps uncomprehending – majority, because all benefit from the good order of the state. But what is ‘the Good’ that is responsible for the goodness of all other things? A lot of ink has been spilt over the following passage in Republic book VI, 509b: “Not only do the objects of knowledge owe their being known to the Good, but their being (ousia) is also due to it, although the Good is not being, but beyond it (epekeina) in rank and power.” The analogy with the sun’s maintenance of all that is alive suggests that the Good is the intelligent inner principle that determines the nature of every object that is capable of goodness, in the sense that these objects fulfill their respective functions in the appropriate way. Plato does not attempt to state how such a principle of goodness works in all things in the Republic, nor does he indicate whether he has in mind a unifying principle in a strong sense. That he is indeed thinking of an internal ‘binding force’ for all kinds of things is indicated, however, in Book X, in his elucidation of the ontological differences that exist, respectively, between the Forms as the products of a divine maker, their earthly copies, and the imitation of these copies by an artist (R. 596a ff.). According to Plato, in each case, it is the use or function that determines what it is to be good (601d): “Aren’t the virtue or excellence, the beauty and correctness of each manufactured item, living creature, and action related to nothing but the use (chreia) for which each is made or naturally adapted?” Given that Plato does not limit this account to tools or instruments but explicitly includes living things and human actions, he seems to have a specific criterion in mind for what constitutes each thing’s excellence. But what determines the ‘use’ of a human being, and to what extent can there be a common principle that accounts for all good things? In the Republic, this question is answered only indirectly through the isomorphism of the just state and the just soul, based on a harmonious internal order. The postulate of such an orderly structure is not explicitly extended beyond the state and the soul. In the later dialogues, by contrast, the Good clearly operates on a cosmic scale. That such is Plato’s view comes to the fore in his excursus on the philosopher’s nature in the Theaetetus (173c–177c). Contrary to Socrates’ denial in the Apology, Socrates in the Theaetetus affirms that the philosopher is to pursue both “what lies below the earth and the heights above the heaven” (173e): “tracking down by every path the entire nature of each whole among the things that are.” And Socrates also concerns himself there with the question of “What is man? What actions and passions properly belong to human nature and distinguish it from all other beings?” In that connection, he compares the discovery of truth with ‘likening oneself to God’ (homoiôsis theôi) and indicates that there is a unitary principle of goodness. The ability to achieve this superhuman state depends on one’s readiness to engage in strenuous philosophical discourse (177b).
If, in the Republic, the goodness of the individual soul is explained in terms of its being a smaller copy of a harmonious society, in the Timaeus, Plato goes for an even larger model. The universe and its soul now supply the ‘large text’ for deciphering the nature of the human soul. The structure of the world-soul is replicated in the nature of the human soul. That there is, nevertheless, a close affinity between the Republic and the cosmological project that Plato means to pursue in the Timaeus and its intended sequel is clearly indicated in the preface to the Timaeus. The tale of the origin of the universe, including human nature, is presented as the first step towards fulfilling Socrates’ wish to see his own best city ‘in action’ (Ti. 19b–c). From antiquity on, this introduction has created the impression that the Timaeus is the direct continuation of the Republic, an impression that explains its juxtaposition in the Corpus Platonicum. Strong indications speak, however, for a much later date of the Timaeus. If Plato establishes a link between these two works, his intent is to compare as well as to contrast. The continuity consists solely in the fact that Socrates reaffirms his adherence to his ideal city’s order – at least in principle (Ti. 17c–19b). It is this order that Critias promises to illustrate by a narration of the tale of two cities, of the war between pre-historic Athens, a city that exemplifies the ideal order, and Atlantis, a powerful tyrannical superpower (Ti. 20d–26e). However, Plato never completed this project: The Critias breaks off after some 15 Stephanus-pages, in mid-sentence, and the third dialogue in the series, Hermocrates, whatever was to have been its content, was never written at all. So, the story of Socrates’ ideal city in action and of the life of its citizens remains untold. All we have is Plato’s cosmic model for such a state and the soul of its inhabitants (on Plato’s cosmology, see the entry Plato’s Timaeus by Donald Zeyl and Barbara Sattler in SEP).
A crucial difference between the philosophical approach in the Republic and that in the Timaeus lies in the fact that, in the latter dialogue, Plato concerns himself with the structure of the visible heaven as a model for the human soul and also with the material conditions of human physiology. What is confined to mythology in Plato’s earlier works is here worked out – though not without a caveat to the effect that Plato is merely offering a likely story rather than a scientific explanation of the structure of the universe, of the human soul, and of human physiology. Plato’s choice of presenting his explanation of the order of the universe as a story of creation by a so-called demiurge or ‘divine workman’ is certainly no accident. It can be understood as a kind of ‘retractation’ of his deprecatory depiction of the divine workman’s heavenly embroidery in Republic VII 528e-530d, where such a product is depreciated because of its inferiority to a model conceivable in theory. To be sure, the Timaeus presupposes the Forms as the divine workman’s unchanging models, and he resorts to mathematical principles to explain the cosmic order (27d–29d; 30c–31b), but the focus is almost exclusively on the construction of the visible heavens. Plato now seems to have convinced himself that in order to explain the nature of a living being, it is necessary to show what factors constitute such a live organism.
This intention explains certain peculiarities of the Timaeus that make the dialogue hard to penetrate, for it falls into three rather disparate parts. The first part describes the structure of the world-soul and its replication in the human soul in a way that combines the general principles with those of mathematics and harmonics and illustrates it with fantastic imagery (29d–47e). The second part consists of a rather meticulous account of the elementary corporeal constituents of nature, which are supposedly formed out of geometrically constructed atoms (47e–69a). The third part combines elements from the first and second parts in a lengthy explanation of human physiology and psychology (69b–92c). The first, cosmological, part of the Timaeus greatly taxes one’s ability to relate the notion of a divinely created world-soul to the motions of the visible heavens because Plato offers only the barest hints concerning the intelligible, mathematical, and harmonic structure that is to explain these motions. By contrast, the explanations in the second and third parts are hard to follow because of Plato’s quite unique concern with the structure and the dynamics of the basic elements of the physical world in general and with that of human physiology in particular.
But why does Plato burden himself and his readers with such a complex machinery, and what does this heavenly instrument have to do with ethics? Since the human soul is formed out of the same ingredients as the world soul (albeit of a less pure kind) and displays the same structure (41d–e), Plato is clearly not just concerned with the order of the universe but with that of the human soul as well. He attributes to it the possession of the kinds of concepts that are necessary for the understanding of the nature of all things, both eternal and temporal. The soul’s ingredients are here limited to the purely general concepts and to mathematical proportions. There is no reference to a theory of recollection of the nature of all things. Rather, Plato is concerned to ascertain that the soul has all the tools for dealing with all objects: (1) the most important concepts necessary for the identification and the differentiations in the way required for dialectical procedure; (2) the numbers and proportions needed to understand numerical relations and harmonic structures of all sorts; (3) the capacity of the soul to perform and comprehend harmoniously coordinated motions. This, it seems, is all the soul needs and all it gets so that it can perform its various tasks. The unusual depiction of the soul’s elements and composition makes it hard, at first, to penetrate to the rationale of its construction, and it must remain an open question to what extent Plato expects his model to be taken in a literal rather than in a figurative sense. His overall message should be clear, however: The soul is a harmoniously structured entity that can, in principle, function forever, and it also comprehends the corresponding structures of other entities and, therefore, has access to all that is good and harmonious. This last point has consequences for his ethical thought that are not developed in the Timaeus itself, but that can be detected in some of the other late dialogues.
Plato’s concern with ‘right measure’ in a sense that is relevant for ethics is, of course, not confined to his late work. It shows up rather early. Already in the Gorgias, Socrates blames Callicles for the undisciplined state of his soul and attributes it to his neglect of geometry (508a): “You’ve failed to notice that proportionate equality (geometrikê isotês) has great power among both gods and men.” But it is unclear whether this expression is to be taken in a more than metaphorical sense; it is, at any rate, not repeated anywhere else in Plato’s earlier work. There is also no indication that Plato takes seriously the idea of a ‘quantification’ of the nature of the virtues in his middle dialogues. If mathematics looms large, then, it is as a model science on account of its exactness, the stability of its objects, and their accessibility to reason. A systematic exploration of the notion that measure and proportion are the fundamental conditions of goodness is confined to the late dialogues. Apart from the Timaeus’ emphasis on a precise cosmic and mental order, there is a crucial passage in the Statesman (283d–285c), where the Eleatic Stranger distinguishes two kinds of ‘art of measurement’. The first kind is the ordinary measuring of quantities relative to each other (‘the great and small’). The second kind has a normative component: It is concerned with the determination of ‘due measure’ (to metrion). The latter is treated with great concern, for the Eleatic Stranger claims that it is the basis of all expertise, including statesmanship, the very art that is the subject of that dialogue (284a–b): “It is by preserving measure in this way that they produce all the good and fine things they do produce.” His point is that all good productions and all processes of generation that come to a good end presuppose ‘right measure’, while arbitrary quantities (‘the more and less’) have no such results. The Eleatic Stranger therefore suggests a separation of the simple arts of measuring from the arts concerned with due measure (284e): “Positing as one part all those sorts of expertise that measure the numbers, lengths, depths, breadths and speeds of things in relation to what is opposed to them, and as the other, all those that measure in relation to what is in due measure (to metrion), what is fitting (to prepon), the right moment (to kairion), what is as it ought to be (to deon) – everything that is removed from the extremes to the middle (meson).” This distinction finds no application in the Statesman itself, except that due measure must be presupposed in the final definition of the statesman as a ‘kingly weaver’, weaving together the fabric of the state by combining the aggressive and the moderate temperaments in the population so as to produce a harmonious citizenry (305e– 311c). But no mathematic procedure is specified as the condition of such a ‘mixing together of the citizens’ characters’ in due measure.
The importance of ‘measure’ in a seemingly literal sense is made explicit; however, in the Philebus, the dialogue that is concerned with the question of whether pleasure or knowledge is the state of mind that constitutes happiness. In that dialogue, number (arithmos), limit (peras), and measure (metron) play a crucial role at various points of the discussion, and the Philebus is also the dialogue where Plato requires that numerical precision must be observed in the application of the ‘divine gift’ of the dialectical procedure of collection and division (16c–17a). The dialectician must know precisely how many species and subspecies a certain genus contains; otherwise, he has no claim to any kind of expertise. Despite this emphasis on precision and on the need to determine the numerical ‘limit’ in every science, Socrates does not provide the envisaged kind of collection and division of pleasure and knowledge. He avoids that task with the pretense that he suddenly remembers that neither of the two contenders suffices in itself for the happy life and that a mixture of the two is preferable. To explain the nature of this mixture, Socrates introduces a fourfold division of all beings (23c–27c), a division that uses the categories of ‘limit’ and ‘measure’ in a different way than the one suggested earlier for the ‘divine method of dialectic’. Limit now concerns the objects’ internal structure. As Socrates states, all beings belong in one of four classes – namely (1) limit (peras), (2) the unlimited (apeiron), (3) the mixture (meixis) of limit and the unlimited, or (4) the cause (aitia) of such a mixture. As the subsequent explications concerning the four classes show, the unlimited comprises all those things that have no exact measure or grade in themselves, such as what is hotter and colder, faster and slower. Although at first the examples are confined to relative terms, the class of the unlimited is then extended to things like hot and cold, dry and moist, fast and slow, and even heat and frost, i.e., to all that has no fixed limit or degree. Mixture takes place when such qualities take on a definite quantity (poson) or due measure (metrion) that puts a definite limit on their variety. That only measured entities qualify as mixtures is not only suggested by the examples Socrates refers to (health, strength, beauty, music, and the seasons) but by his assertion, later in the dialogue, that a mixture without due measure or proportion does not deserve its name (64d–e): “it will necessarily corrupt its ingredients and most of all itself. For there would be no blending in such cases at all but only an unconnected medley, the ruin of whatever happens to be contained in it.” The upshot of this discussion is that all stable entities represent a harmonious equilibrium of their otherwise limitless ingredients. Since indeterminate elements usually turn up in pairs of opposites, the right limit in each case must be the right proportion necessary for their balance. In the case of health, there will be the right balance between the hot and the cold, the dry and the moist. The cause of the proper proportion for each mixture turns out to be reason; it is the only member of the fourth class. As Socrates indicates, divine reason is the ultimate source of all that is good and harmonious in the universe, while human reason constitutes order down here (26e–27c; 28a–30e).
The adoption of this fourfold ontology allows Socrates to assign pleasure and knowledge to two of the four classes of being: Pleasure turns out to be unlimited because it admits of the ‘more and less’. Reason, by contrast, belongs to the fourth class, to the causes of good mixtures. On the basis of this classification, Socrates provides the criteria for a critical assessment of the different kinds of pleasure and knowledge (31b–59d) and presents happiness as a mixture of all kinds of knowledge with true and pure kinds of pleasure (59d-64b). In a final ‘ranking of goods’, measure and due proportion, unsurprisingly, get the first rank among the possessions of the soul, things in proper proportion come in second, reason is ranked third, the arts and sciences obtain fourth place, whereas the true and pure pleasures get fifth and last place on the scale of goods (64c–67b). If Plato in the Philebus is more favorably disposed towards a hedonist stance than in some of his earlier works, he is so only to a quite limited degree: He regards pleasure as a necessary ingredient in human life because both the physical and the psychic equilibria that constitute human nature are unstable. In a sense that recalls the Symposium, Plato presupposes that there is always some deficiency or lack that needs supplementation. Because the range of such ‘supplements’ includes learning and the pursuit of the virtues, there are some pleasures that are rightly cherished. But even they are deemed goods only insofar as they are a compensation for human imperfection.
Given the importance of ‘measure’, there is the question of how serious Plato is about such a ‘mathematization’ of his principles, quite generally. Though harmony and order have been treated as important principles in Plato’s metaphysics and ethics from early on, in his late dialogues, he seems to envisage right measure in a literal sense. This explains his confidence that even physical entities can attain a relatively stable state. As he suggests both in the Timaeus and in the Philebus, not everything is in a constant flux. On the contrary, those things that possess the measures that are right for their type are stable entities and can be the objects of ‘firm and true beliefs and convictions’ (Ti. 37b–c). This applies not only to the nature of the visible universe but also to the human body and mind. Plato seems to have felt encouraged to embrace such theories by the advances of astronomy and harmonics in his own lifetime so that he postulates ‘due proportion’ in an arithmetical sense as the cause of all harmony and stability.
Plato’s confidence seems to have extended not only to the physical but also to the moral state of human nature. That assumption is confirmed not only by the emphasis on right mixture in the Philebus but also by the discussion in the Laws about how the laws are to achieve peace in the state and harmony in the souls of the citizens. Plato no longer treats the emotions as a menace to the virtues; rather, he assigns to the legislators the task of providing for an adequate balance of pleasure and pain by habituating the citizens in the right way (632a–643a). This balance, through paideia, is crucial for maintaining a truly liberal soul (I 636e): “Pleasure and pain flow like two springs released by nature. If a man draws the right amount from the right spring at the right time, he lives a happy life.” Suffice it to note that the comments concerning the right measure of pleasure and pain form the preface to the entire project. That there is a considerable re-evaluation of the emotions in the Laws, compared to that in the Republic, is confirmed by the fact that, according to Laws II, education is supposed to provide the citizens with the right habituation (ĕthos) concerning the measure of pleasure and pain. The function assigned, there, to the right measure of pleasure and pain in the citizens’ sentimental education clearly anticipates the Aristotelian conception of the moral virtues as the right mean between excess and deficiency (II 653b–c): “Virtue is this general concord of reason and emotion. But there is one element you could isolate in any account you give, and this is the correct formation of our feelings of pleasure and pain, which makes us hate what we ought to hate from first to last, and love what we ought to love.” The confidence expressed in the Laws in the power of due measure culminates in the famous maxim that God (rather than Protagoras’ Man) is the measure of all things (IV 716c–d): “In our view, it is God who is preeminently the ‘measure of all things’, much more so than any man, as they say. So if you want to recommend yourself to someone of this character, you must do your level best to make your own character reflect his, and on this principle the moderate man is God’s friend, being like him, whereas the immoderate and unjust man is not like him and is his enemy; and the same reasoning applies to the other vices too.” But because Plato, like Aristotle after him, carefully refrains from any kind of specifications of concrete right measures, we should treat the ‘arithmetic’ of the good life with a pinch of salt. That individuals differ in their internal and external conditions is as clear to Plato as it is to Aristotle. This does not shake Plato’s faith in the Laws that right habituation through the right kind of education, most of all in the arts, will provide the necessary inner equilibrium in the soul of the good citizen.
Are Plato’s views of human nature and the human good more sympathetic to democratic standards in his last works? If we look at the requirements in the Timaeus concerning the good state of the human soul in ‘orderly circles’, Plato seems to remain as demanding and elitist as ever. But he no longer puts so much emphasis on the distance between the best and the ordinary. As he remarks in the Statesman, statesmen don’t stick out from the rest of humankind in mind and body like the queen-bees do in the hive (301d-e). Further, even the best of the souls of human beings are far inferior to the world-soul, because, in the case of human souls, their ‘incorporation’ means disorder that subsides only gradually (Ti. 42e-44c). That this applies to all human beings suggests that Plato has become more democratic in the sense that he regards the ‘human herd’ as a more uniform flock than he did in his earlier days. He retains the conviction, however, that a well-ordered soul is the prerequisite of the good life and that human beings stand in need not only of a careful moral education but also of a well-regulated life. Whether a life in Plato’s nomocracy would better please modern minds than a life ruled by philosopher-kings is a question that would require a careful perusal of that enormous compendium of regulations and laws, which makes the task of reading and understanding the Laws very hard work. But that compendium is at the same time a valuable sourcebook for all those interested in Plato’s late moral thought (for a more detailed evaluation of the Laws, see the entry Plato on Utopia in SEP by Chris Bobonich and Katherine Meadows).
- account: logos
- appetitive part: épithumetikon
- art: technê
- being: ousia
- cause: aitia
- consonance: sumphonia
- courage: andreia
- difference: heteron
- education: paideia
- enthusiasm: enthusiasmos
- excellence: aretê
- form: eidos, idea
- function: ergon
- habit: ethos
- happiness: eudaimonia
- harmony: harmonia
- kind: eidos, idea
- justice: dikaiosunê
- likening to god: homoiôsis theô
- limit: peras
- look: idea
- love: erôs
- madness, divine: theia mania
- measure: metron; metrion
- mixture: meixis
- model: paradeigma
- moderation: sôphrosunê
- need: endeia; chreia
- number: arithmos
- order: kosmos
- perplexity: aporia
- quantity: poson
- rational part: logistikon
- reason: nous
- reasoning: logos
- recollection: anamnêsis
- refutation: elenchos
- sameness: tauton
- self-mastery: egkrateia
- self-sufficiency: autarkeia
- soul: psuchê
- sort: eidos, idea
- spirited part: thumoeides
- steadfastness: sôtêria
- unlimited: apeiron
- virtue: aretê
- weakness of the will: akrasia
- wisdom: sophia
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