Pietro Pomponazzi

First published Tue Nov 7, 2017; substantive revision Tue Oct 19, 2021

Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525) was a leading philosopher of Renaissance Italy. Teaching primarily at the universities at Padua and Bologna, he developed innovative approaches to Aristotelian natural philosophy and psychology. He gained particular fame, and notoriety, for his philosophical investigations into the mortality of the soul and for his naturalistic explanations of seemingly miraculous phenomena and of the development of religions. Pomponazzi was notable for his philosophical challenges to religious doctrine as well as for his use of Alexander of Aphrodisias’s writings and Stoic ideas to forge what he considered to be a purer or more accurate interpretation of Aristotle’s natural philosophy and psychology.

1. Life

Born in Mantua, Pomponazzi studied at Padua, obtaining his degree in arts in 1487. He then taught there, first as extraordinary and then ordinary professor from 1488–1496 (Nardi 1965: 54–55). His teacher and fellow professor at Padua Nicoletto Vernia as well as his colleague Alessandro Achillini openly endorsed Averroes’ view of the unicity of the material intellect, a view that Bishop Pietro Barrozzi condemned with the threat of excommunication in 1489, leading them to revise or hide their teachings (Hasse 2016: 184–214). Pomponazzi questioned and ultimately rejected Averroes’ unicity position. Perhaps influenced by his other teachers Pietro Trapolino and Francesco Securo da Nardò, he respected Thomas Aquinas’s views even if he found them to use theological premises that he believed were unwelcome in natural philosophy and contrary to Aristotle’s philosophy. Despite rejecting Averroes’ view on the material intellect, throughout his career, Pomponazzi’s lectures relied on Averroes’ commentaries. For example, among Pomponazzi’s writings are quaestiones based on Averroes’ De substantia orbis (On the Substance of the Orbs). Around 1496, he obtained a doctorate in medicine (Oliva 1926: 179), a common step for those who wished to rise in the universities of northern Italy, where philosophy was often taught as preparation to the study of medicine (see Kristeller 1993: vol. 3, 436–38; Kraye 2010: 93). Although Pomponazzi never taught medicine he was consulted for his medical expertise (see Park 2006: 175–76) and frequently considered medical teachings in his writings on wondrous phenomena, Aristotle’s zoological writings, and Meteorologica IV (see Perfetti 2004: xliii–xlv; Martin 2002). During this first stint at Padua, he wrote Quaestio de maximo et minimo (Question on the Maximum and the Minimum), which attacked William Heytesbury and the calculatory tradition (see Biard 2009). Beginning in the 1330s, Heytesbury and others at Merton College at Oxford applied mathematical and logical analysis on a range of topics, including natural philosophical questions regarding kinematics. Pomponazzi remained hostile to the calculatory and terminist traditions throughout his life because he considered their interpretations of Aristotle’s texts as veering too far from a strict exegesis of Aristotle. In 1496, Pomponazzi left Padua, after disputing with Agostino Nifo, and tutored Prince Alberto Pio da Carpi, who was in exile at Ferrara. Alberto Pio remained for years a supporter of Aristotelian thought, commissioning translations of Averroes and Aristotle, and Pomponazzi dedicated his 1514 De intensione et remissione formarum (On the Intension and Remission of Forms) to him (see Schmitt 1984).

After returning to Padua in 1499, he taught natural philosophy there until 1509, when the university closed due to the War of the League of Cambrai. He stayed briefly in Ferrara, where he taught at the university for a year, and then returned to his native Mantua, before moving to the university of Bologna in 1511. He remained there for the rest of his life, teaching natural and moral philosophy (Oliva 1926: 265). His years at Bologna were both productive and filled with controversy, including being unsuccessfully accused of heresy in 1514 and in 1518 (Nardi 1965: 70; Bianchi 2008: 132). All his works printed during the sixteenth century stem from his tenure at Bologna (Lohr 1988: 347–62). In 1514 he completed a disputation on the intension and remission of forms; and in 1515 he published the question De reactione (On Reaction). A year later he published Tractatus de immortalitate animae (Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul). The work defends a materialist reading of Aristotle in which the human soul depends on and perishes with the body. The treatise came out three years after the Fifth Lateran Council issued the bull Apostolici regiminis. The bull demanded that philosophers refrain from teaching that the soul is one in number or mortal and that the universe eternal. It also demanded that philosophers defend Christian doctrine to the best of their ability. As Pomponazzi’s teaching appeared to many to run against the bull, he was attacked, but also defended, by a number of scholars and ecclesiastical authorities. Although he was denounced as a heretic, he was not tried and never abjured, protected by the powerful Venetian Cardinal Pietro Bembo (see Bianchi 2008: 130–34; Pine 1986: 124–28).

Despite these controversies, Pomponazzi maintained his position at Bologna and continued to teach and write, pursuing many of the themes found in his psychological writings. In 1520, he completed De naturalium effectuum admirandorum causis sive de incantationibus (On the Causes of Marvelous Natural Effects or On Incantations). The work circulated in manuscript widely before being printed first in 1556 and again in 1567 (Regnicoli 2010). In the same year he finished De fato, de libero arbitrio, de praedestinatione (On Fate, Free Will, On Predestination), which was not printed until 1567. In 1521, he published De nutritione et augmentatione (On Nutrition and Growth). Given greater freedom to choose the subject of his lectures as the result of contract negotiations, Pomponazzi lectured on a number of Aristotle’s writings that were not part of the typical duties of an ordinary professor. These topics include Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione and his zoological and meteorological writings. His Dubitationes in quartum Meteorologicorum librum (Doubts on Meteorologica IV) were printed in 1563. Pomponazzi, after several years of illness, died from kidney disease in 1525 (Nardi 1965: 205–6).

2. Writings, Methods, and Interpretative Challenges

There are numerous challenges to interpreting the writings of Pomponazzi. In addition to his writings printed during the sixteenth century, many reportationes (transcripts) made by listeners of his lectures are extant. Due to the nature of their creation, they potentially contain errors or are incomplete. At times, they appear to present conflicting views. Filled with witticisms and ironic statements, they reveal insights into Pomponazzi’s popularity as a lecturer. Adding to the difficulty of interpretation, are Pomponazzi’s repeated statements of not having solutions to philosophical questions and his promotion of the idea that philosophy teaches the practice of doubting (Perfetti 1999). Accordingly, he questioned at times both ecclesiastical authority and the prevailing philosophical environment of Padua and Bologna that was characterized by Averroism (Hasse 2016: 196).

An additional impediment in interpreting Pomponazzi stems from his arguments that he characterized as in naturalibus (based on nature). Similarly, he at times described himself as following the via peripatetica (the Peripatetic path), which meant investigating according to Aristotelian principles without influence from other fields, most prominently theology. Restricting arguments to those that are in naturalibus or following the via peripatetica required determining Aristotle’s view, regardless of its truth. Pomponazzi justified this approach on the grounds that natural philosophy possesses different principles than theology and therefore those fields should not use the principles of other fields. Consequently, at times he maintained that as a lay person he was unable to pronounce on theological questions. Furthermore, his duties as professor of philosophy, as in essence a professional Aristotelian, required him to expound the views of Aristotle, regardless of their conformity to theological truth. Thus, he included provisos in On the Immortality of the Soul, On Incantations, and Apology that stated that his conclusions were merely according to philosophy and that he accepted the determinations of the Catholic Church as having a greater degree of authority than philosophy. Some of his contemporaries and later scholars have seen the inclusion of these provisos as being disingenuous, a means to protect himself from prosecution (Renan 1852: 286; Pine 1986: 123). But other scholars have argued for the philosophical coherence of his employment of probable arguments and deference to faith (see Perrone Compagni 1999: lxxxv–xcvi). In the thirteenth century Albertus Magnus had distinguished between investigations of nature and the divine, contending that the fields have distinct methods and that revelation disagrees at times with arguments based on reason and experience (Martin 2014: 16–18). Although at times Albertus’s position was controversial, a number of medieval philosophers endorsed his view. Thus even if Pomponazzi included these provisos as a protective measure, he nevertheless simultaneously endorsed a long medieval tradition that held that natural philosophy was separate from theology and that theological truths prevailed over philosophical ones (Bianchi 2008).

Pomponazzi used the methods and language typical of the medieval scholastic tradition (Kraye 2010), primarily relying on reason and experience as the key tools for investigation. The former refers to the logical and philosophical principles of Aristotelianism, the latter refers to both quotidian experience and the experiences found in the writings of authorities, witnessed in testimonies of contemporaries, and taken from his own personal history. He had a critical attitude toward some humanist writers, for example, judging Giovanni Pico della Mirandola’s attack on astrology to be ignorant of the workings of the field. And while his Latin prose did not match the polished elegance of Renaissance humanists, in other ways his writings, through their extensive consideration of ancient philosophical and literary sources, reflect developments of humanism. Despite never learning Greek as many of his fellow philosophers did, including his rival Agostino Nifo, Pomponazzi relied on new translations of Greek commentators on Aristotle, most significantly those of Alexander of Aphrodisias (Kessler 2011). Furthermore, his later writings, especially On Incantations, take evidence from a broad range of Greek, Roman, and Renaissance poets and historians, interspersed among citations of the typical authorities of the scholastic traditions. In that work, he also discussed the possible natural causes of the Delphic oracle (see Ossa-Richardson 2010).

3. Psychology

Pomponazzi’s most complete discussion of the human soul was published in his 1516 On the Immortality of the Soul. The work builds on earlier discussions found in quaestiones delivered in 1503 and 1504 (Pomponazzi 2018; Poppi 1970: 27–92; Kristeller 1944) and in lectures on De anima given in 1514–15 (Bakker 2007). In On the Immortality of the Soul, he sought to establish whether the human intellect is separable and immortal using a methodology that did not exceed “natural limits”, that is, without supposing “something from faith or revelation” and to determine what is “in conformity with the words of Aristotle” (ch. 8). He cautioned that he did not affirm anything contrary to Thomas Aquinas’s views but his critiques advance “in the way of doubt and not of assertion” (ch. 8). Moreover, he tempered his considerations by declaring his preference for scripture over “human reasoning and experience” (ch. 8).

In what manner the human intellect is separable was a frequently debated question in Renaissance discussions of the soul. Many of Pomponazzi’s contemporaries adopted Averroes’ solution that the possible or material intellect must be one in number and thus shared by all humans. Pomponazzi rejected Averroes’ view, deeming it “most false, unintelligible, monstrous, and quite foreign to Aristotle” (ch. 4). After rejecting Averroes’ unicity thesis, Pomponazzi maintained that the most probable arguments according to natural philosophy and Aristotle’s view are contrary to Thomas’s position that the individual human intellect is immortal, separable, and unqualifiedly immaterial.

A central premise for Pomponazzi’s psychology is that the entire human soul falls under the study of natural philosophy. The human soul has three powers—vegetative, sensitive, rational—but is unified; these powers do not have distinct substantial forms (see Casini 2007). Pomponazzi generally referred not to the intellect but rather to the intellective soul, meaning the rational power of the human soul (Sellars 2016). This intellective soul, or rational soul, rests midway between the eternal and perishable (ch. 1; see Bakker 2007: 165–67). Accordingly, he emphasized the relation between the intellectual soul and the sensitive soul, citing Aristotle’s statement that “the soul does not know at all without some phantasm (phantasma)” (De anima 3.7 431a16–17). The intellectual soul’s dependence on these phantasms—images that the imagination creates based on what has been sensed—is confirmed for Pomponazzi not just by Aristotle’s authority but also by our own experience and by experiences with those who have suffered injuries to the relevant organs. Since the sensitive soul resides within a material organ and sensation occurs in time, it is dependent on matter both with respect to subject (i.e., the sense organ) and object (i.e., the sensible). The human intellectual or rational soul, however, is dependent on matter for its object (i.e., the phantasms) but is only immaterial with respect to its subject (i.e., cognition) (see Brenet 2009).

Because the human intellectual soul depends on the operations of the sensitive soul, which are part of a material and perishable body, it cannot function after the body has been destroyed. Accordingly, in Pomponazzi’s view, the human intellectual soul is immortal only in a relative or qualified sense. Because the act of understanding does not require a material organ as subject, the human intellectual soul is more immortal than the sensitive soul or the souls of animals. The human soul partakes in the immortal through its limited knowledge of the forms of species, without being immortal in itself. Yet because it cannot function without the sensitive soul, it is lower than God’s intelligence and than the intelligences that move the celestial spheres, which are separated substances. Moreover, the human soul differs from these separated intelligences in that it is the actualization of a body while the intelligences merely actuate, that is, set in motion, the celestial spheres without receiving anything from the matter of the orb. The human’s soul dependency on matter means that human cognition is less abstracted than that of the intelligences, which know through intuition not sensation. Accordingly, the human soul cannot know universals unqualifiedly but only in relation to singulars. Thereby, the human rational soul, with its functioning tied to material objects, sits midway between the material and the immaterial and between the eternal and the perishable; and human knowledge, while partaking in the knowledge of universals, possesses it in limited manner (ch. 8).

While most scholarship has emphasized Pomponazzi’s argument related to the connection between the intellectual and sensitive soul, he put forth several other arguments based on Aristotelian principles against the immortality of individual human souls. He argued that if the human soul survives the death of the body at that point it must be an individual indivisible substance that is either in some place or nowhere. If it is somewhere, it must have arrived there through locomotion, yet Aristotle denies that indivisibles can move in space. If it is nowhere, then Aristotle could have posited intelligences that do not move the spheres and potentially there could exist an infinite number of intelligences, which in turn is prohibited by Aristotle’s arguments against the realization of an infinite multitude. Similarly, he argued that if human souls are immortal and individual, given that the world and its species are eternal according to Aristotle, the number of human souls must be infinite or souls must transmigrate, both propositions that Aristotle rejected. Additionally, Pomponazzi dismissed Thomas Aquinas’s view that God creates each human soul placed within the body as being an explanation unacceptable to natural philosophy because Aristotle held that according to natural philosophy the soul is not created but rather generated “by the sun and man” (Physics 2.2. 194b13) and everything that is generated perishes (ch. 8).

Given the importance of the immortality of the soul to Catholic doctrine, Pomponazzi considered the ramifications of the soul’s mortality to ethics and the possibility of human happiness and blessedness (see Cuttini 2012). He countered the argument that immortality of the soul is necessary for a happy end achieved by perfecting the intellect by contending that achieving such intellectual perfection is only possible for someone with superior intellectual ability and of sound health, who has withdrawn from worldly affairs. Yet, such individuals are extremely rare—“even in long centuries, barely one is found”—and the human race and its societies do not permit all humans to devote themselves to philosophy (ch. 13). To the potential objection that belief in the mortality of the soul encourages immoral acts since some persons would choose to commit crimes because there would be no punishment or rewards after death, Pomponazzi responded that there are sufficient motivations for virtue without considerations of the afterlife. In his view, the essential reward of virtue is virtue itself, which is humankind’s greatest good and brings security and peace of mind. Accordingly, the religious teachings of immortality are not true according to the principles of natural philosophy but were introduced in order to persuade those incapable of understanding philosophy to behave in a moral fashion, thereby allowing society to function (ch. 14).

Keeping with his earlier statements that his arguments were probable and according to natural principles, Pomponazzi concluded that the question of the immortality of the soul is a neutral problem, meaning that there are no arguments based only on nature that prove either immortality or mortality. His application of the term “neutral problem” was not novel. John Duns Scotus had come to the same conclusion about the immortality of the soul, and Thomas Aquinas regarded the question of the eternity of the world as a neutral problem. Consequently, faith is the ultimate arbiter of the question, and Pomponazzi maintained that Christians must follow the doctrine of immortality that has been established by the Church fathers and Pope Gregory I, who were the greatest experts in divine matters (ch. 15).

On the Immortality of the Soul provoked numerous polemics, in which Pomponazzi defended his views. In 1518, he published Apologia (Apology). The first book of Apology responds to the objections made by his former student Gaspare Contarini, and the second book answers critiques made by other philosophers and theologians. These books address questions about free-will and wondrous phenomena, which were later discussed in greater depth in On Incantations. The third and final book recounts Pomponazzi’s reactions to Ambrogio Flandino’s hostile preaching and to public uproar in Venice. Pomponazzi asserted his innocence from these charges, while proclaiming his belief in the immortality of the soul, emphasizing that his book only concluded that Aristotle held the soul to be mortal (3.1.3). He argued that theologians from Augustine to Duns Scotus maintained that the soul is mortal according to Aristotle and therefore sustaining such a position should not be considered heretical (3.3.4). In fact, Tommaso de Vio (Gaetano), a former general of the Domincan order, who at the time was a cardinal and close to Leo X, had recently cast doubt over whether the immortality of the soul is demonstrable according to Aristotle (Gilson 1963: 173–83). Furthermore, Pomponazzi maintained that he could not be considered a heretic because the definition of heresy entails adhering firmly to one’s own opinion, but he had never received warnings from ecclesiastical authorities and therefore could not have adhered firmly to anything contrary to the Catholic Church’s teachings (3.3.1–2). In 1519, Pomponazzi published Defensorium (Defense) in reply to Agostino Nifo’s lengthy attack that argued that intellection is possible without phantasms (de Boer 2018: 19–25). The Defense was printed together with Giovanni Crisostomo Javelli’s response that offered theological and Platonic counterpoints to Pomponazzi’s views. The theologians Ambrogio Flandino and Bartolomeo Spina also published attacks on Pomponazzi’s treatment of the soul (see Blum 2007: 223–27).

4. Wondrous Nature, the Preternatural, and Miracles

In 1520, Pomponazzi finished On Incantations, a work that expanded many themes of his psychological writings. The book undermines the use of demonic and supernatural explanations for sublunary phenomena. The work is presented as a response to the question: How would Aristotelians explain what “seems to be beyond the order of nature” (praeter naturae ordinem) or, in other words, what seems preternatural? The category of preternatual, which included diseases and strange, seemingly irregular phenomena, formed the subject matter of numerous early modern philosophical inquiries (see Daston 2000). With respect to On Incantations, Pomponazzi’s friend, Ludovico Panizza, asked him to explain the extraordinary recoveries of three boys from a skin disease, burns, and a sword that physicians could not remove (Praefatio.1). The actions of demons could explain these recoveries; Pomponazzi stated that these demonic acts are justified in accordance with ecclesiastical law (ex decreto Ecclesiae) and are capable of “saving many experiences”. Yet, Pomponazzi contended that Aristotelians should not use demons to explain these wondrous events. In Pomponazzi’s view even if demons exist, a premise that Aristotle did not admit according to Pomponazzi’s interpretation of Metaphysics Lambda, they would not be able to affect the sublunary world because they would not have adequate knowledge of its particulars. Demons’ knowledge of sublunary particulars must derive either through essences or from sensation and phantasmata (i.e., mental images). Knowledge through essences, however, does not provide knowledge of singulars but only universals and species. Moreover, knowledge from sensation and phantasmata entails generation, corruption, and corporeality, properties which cannot belong to demons (1.1).

Demons’ lack of knowledge of natural particulars is merely one reason they cannot be the cause of wondrous sublunary events. Citing Augustine, Pomponazzi contended that all theologians hold that while demons can directly move bodies from one place to another they cannot alter them directly but must do so through natural bodies. Yet, Pomponazzi rejected the likelihood that demons affect change by applying active powers to passives, just like humans imperfectly do when they apply medicines. For Pomponazzi, this understanding of demonic action is untenable because it requires that demons use sensible material substances, which would be detectable. Presumably demons must carry these substances in pillboxes and bags, all of which is contrary to experience (1.2). Finally, he concluded that it is superfluous to suppose demonic influence “because we can save these kinds of experiences through natural causes” (1.3). Accordingly, the first half of On Incantations posits hypothetical natural causes of preternatural experiences in an attempt to show the inadequacy and superfluity of demonic explanation. Pomponazzi presented his conclusions as part of a process that leads closer to the truth, arguing that “sciences develop through steps” (scientiae enim fiunt per additamenta) (9.1). He likened this process to changes in legal codes, whereby better laws replace older inferior ones, admitting that his solutions should be accepted only while there are no preferable alternatives (Peroratio.1).

Employing doctrines key to natural magic, Pomponazzi put forth three potential ways that natural causes could explain wondrous effects: directly through manifest causes, such as heat and cold; through occult qualities or powers; or indirectly through vapors and spirits that had been altered by such powers (3.1–3; Copenhaver 2015: 272–84). In support of these explanations, citing Albertus Magnus, Marsilio Ficino, Pliny, and unnamed botanists, he maintained that herbs, stones, minerals, and animal extracts possess nearly countless occult powers and that if we knew them it would be possible to reduce those effects that the unlearned attribute to demons and angels to the actions of these occult powers. In support of the existence of these occult powers Pomponazzi described experiences with herbal medicines, magnets, electric rays (torpedines), and remoras—fish that allegedly could halt ships with the power of their mouths—experiences, all verified as true by respected authorities (3.2–3).

Pomponazzi contended that similar powers reside in humans, either through the temperament, the sensitive soul, or the intellectual soul. He based this contention on the fact that human temperaments were widely recognized to affect and determine human habits, inclinations, and physiognomy (3.4). Following Aristotle’s De motu animalium and Ficino’s Platonic Theology, he argued that the actions of the soul are not only spiritual but also real and cause alterations in the body, as is manifest in the physical effects of emotions, such as tremors and blushing (3.6). Finally, he maintained that it is possible that the human mind can produce what it thinks through real bodily means, such as spirit and blood, in an analogous way to the intelligences’ production of changes in the sublunary world through corporal intermediaries, namely celestial bodies (3.6).

Applying these causes, Pomponazzi explained that many of those accused of necromancy, like the medieval physicians and astrologers Pietro d’Abano and Cecco d’Ascoli, were merely very knowledgeable and capable of applying actives to passives (4.1). Moreover, it is possible that some humans possess extraordinary occult powers that allow them to affect cures through touch, like the kings of France, or to perform other marvelous feats such as charming snakes and opening doors without touching them (4.2). Pomponazzi argued that the powers of imagination can produce real effects. For example, he cited the widespread belief that women’s thoughts at the time of conception will produce a fetus that is similar to those thoughts. Therefore, the power of fascination and imaginative powers transmitted through vapors might explain unexpected cures and diseases just as they are supposedly responsible for the spread of leprosy and plague (4.3). While Pomponazzi admitted that some supposedly magical works are acts of deception—such as fraudulent magicians conjuring through sieves—he allowed that it might be possible that some men possess natural occult powers that allow them to move a sieve or transmit vapors through prayers so that they form images on mirrors (4.4). Pomponazzi used this analysis to respond to the possible objection that these three kinds of natural causes eliminate the acceptance of miracles. He maintained that many the deeds reported in the Bible can be “superficially reduced to natural causes”, but that some cannot, such as the resurrection of Lazarus, the eclipse during the crucifixion of Jesus, and the satisfaction of the hunger of a thousand people with five loaves of bread and two fish (6.7). Furthermore, while he conceded that there is a remote possibility that the cross found in Saint Catherine’s heart and Saint Francis’s stigmata arose from natural causes, he nonetheless stated it is more likely and more pious to understand them as miracles (6.8).

Perhaps the most controversial portions of On Incantations surround his explanation of why both pagan and monotheistic societies give credence to the works of demons. His answer derives from his largely Aristotelian and Averroistic conception of the ordering of the universe (see Perrone Compagni 2011: xxxiii–lxxi). For Pomponazzi, God is both the final and efficient cause of the universe, a view he put forth in his earlier quaestiones on Averroes’ De substantia orbis (Pomponazzi Corsi inediti: 1:299–304). God, possessing knowledge of the essences of all species of beings, arranges the universe through the celestial intelligences (10.2). In turn, the celestial intelligences through the powers of the stars cause the eternal cycles of change in the universe. Accordingly, the entire arrangement of the world, including human society and religion, reflects and derives from God’s power. Thus, pronouncements in favor of the existence of demonic works from serious and important authorities, both religious lawmakers and philosophers including Plato, are the result not of their truth but of their usefulness for creating a virtuous populace. Since a large portion of humanity is incapable of understanding philosophical truths, lawmakers have created and employed myths or fables to inculcate virtue. The legislator, like the physician who deceives a patient for the patient’s own good, composes such fables because they contribute to the larger purpose. These fables should not be judged as philosophical doctrines—they contain neither falsity or truthfulness per se but have an allegorical or poetic meaning. For Pomponazzi, these myths are not cynically used merely to gain political power but are harmonious with the universe’s nature and order, as arranged by God and the celestial intelligences. Political authority and obedience are necessary for ensuring the persistence of political structures that are ordained for humanity, for which nature has given leaders and organization just as it has for flock animals, like bees and quail (10.2). Consequently, the growth and decline of religions are in accordance with the cyclical workings of nature.

Pomponazzi’s judgment that the bulk of humanity is incapable of understanding philosophical truths corresponds to his statements in On the Immortality of the Soul about the differences between divine and human souls and the scarcity of humans who develop into philosophers with comprehensive and accurate knowledge of nature and the universe. The inability of nearly all of humanity to understand true causes has led to further misunderstandings of prodigies, omens, divination, and oracles. Pomponazzi held that, instead of being direct messages from God, they are reflections of a purposeful and well-ordered universe.

Pomponazzi contended that fields such as astrology and physiognomy read signs that are causally connected through celestial influences or physiological links. Celestial prodigies, omens, and apparitions in the sky both signal and cause future events by affecting vapors and spirits that in turn influence the outcomes of human activity. Some apparitions, such as the recent image of Saint Celestine that appeared in the sky above Aquila while its residents prayed for protection from excessive rain, result from the collective imagination affecting vapors, exhalations, and clouds (see Giglioni 2010). Moreover, Pomponazzi argued that the prodigies’ indicative character explains their purpose and final cause that is linked to nature, which is interdependent, well ordered, and under God’s providence. The possibility of using prodigies to predict the future is analogous to physicians’ ability to give prognoses for diseases using symptoms that seemingly are not directly connected to the maladies. Similarly ignorant people have mistakenly understood the prognostications of sibyls and other seers as being caused by demons when in fact they possess either extraordinary occult natural powers or are caused by astral powers.

Invoking celestial powers, occult virtues, the force of the imagination, and the intermediary actions of vapors and spirits, Pomponazzi contended that by using only Aristotelian natural principles it was possible to save or explain seemingly miraculous, prodigious, and preternatural phenomena. Pomponazzi accepted the veracity of many of these phenomena, trusting for the most part in the accounts of contemporaries and ancient histories (12.7). At times, however, he rejected accounts from history as implausible, such as tales of Vespasian curing with his saliva and his foot (8.1). Nevertheless, in his view, the numerous historical narratives of presages, oracles, and divination confirmed their reality (10.2).

In the closing of On Incantations, Pomponazzi stated that while he believed that what the Peripatetics would have probably (verisimiliter) believed is in agreement with Christianity, he would nevertheless revoke the entire work and submit himself to the Catholic Church in the event that this writing were judged to oppose Catholic doctrine (Peroratio.1). A number of interpreters have found this conclusion to be disingenuous, and the Holy Office placed the work on the Index of Prohibited Books by the 1570s. A censor wrote that while Pomponazzi put forth arguments that seem to undermine the existence of miracles he did make strong ones in their favor (Baldini & Spruit 2009: vol. 1, tome 3, 2279).

5. Fate and Providence

Several months after Pomponazzi completed On Incantations in 1520, he finished De fato, de libero arbitrio, et de praedestinatione (On Fate, Free Will, and Predestination), a work that addressed Alexander of Aphrodisias’s De fato (On Fate), which had been printed in Girolamo Bagolino’s Latin translation in 1516. Alexander criticized Stoic deterministic understandings of causation because they deny the possibility of chance, contingency, and human choice. In On Fate, Pomponazzi largely sided not with Alexander but in favor of his Stoic opposition.

The premise of Pomponazzi’s arguments coincides with his understanding of causation presented in On Incantations. The work also reaffirms the limitations placed on the human intellect in On the Immortality of the Soul. In On Fate, Pomponazzi argued that God, as efficient cause of the world, acts on the sublunary world using the celestial bodies. God is the principal cause, and the celestial bodies are the instrumental cause of accidental effects in the sublunary world, which Alexander and Thomas Aquinas viewed as contingent and without a cause (1.7.II/15). The celestial bodies’ motion, contiguous to the lower world, drives and determines alterations on earth. Therefore, accidental effects, ultimately resulting from God acting as an efficient cause, occur by necessity (1.7.II/16). Pomponazzi maintained that they are mistakenly called contingent as a result of human ignorance of causes and future events but not from any irregularity in matter, natural powers, or celestial influences. Rather, all accidental effects and what appears to result from luck or chance can be traced back to fixed causes (1.7.II/23–26).

Applying this deterministic framework, Pomponazzi rejected Alexander’s understanding of free will as the ability to choose between alternatives. Pomponazzi maintained that human will functions just like the rest of nature. It depends on an eternal, external mover, namely God’s will and the celestial motions ( Just as for other natural beings, if there is a potentiality and no impediment, by necessity the potentiality will be realized. Thus, the human will reacts to external factors according to its powers and the absence of impediments ( Consequently, the human will depends on higher, universal causes. The apparent ability of humans to deliberate between choices using reason, however, is an illusion because every actor is in fact directed toward one of the choices by external causes (–4).

The rejection of the existence of free will presented difficult ramifications for Christian ethics and theology, which depend on the freedom to choose a virtuous life. In resolving these difficulties, Pomponazzi chose fate over freedom because he thought that it better preserved God’s complete power and providence. If God had granted freedom to humans, the lack, or extreme rarity, of truly virtuous humans on earth demonstrates the absence of a truly providential plan in which humans’ freedom to choose a completely moral good life is realized. Similarly, if humans have the ability of free choice, God must not know these future decisions and humans are thereby limited with respect to his knowledge and power. As a consequence, Pomponazzi opted for fate and determinism, rejecting what he considered to be a denial of God’s providence, omnipotence, and omniscience. The world’s order and the cosmic laws that govern the eternal motions of the universe include the existence of good and evil as part of the necessary cycles of change.

At the beginning of the third book, Pomponazzi maintained that his naturalistic arguments (argumentationes naturales) of the first two books were by no means certain and were to be rejected if they contradicted the teachings of the Catholic Church (3.1.1). He then proposed to find solutions to the questions of fate and divine providence that preserve free will. Accordingly, Pomponazzi, seemingly in opposition to the arguments outlined in the first two books, opened the door for the possibility of freedom of choice that potentially could be in line with Christian theology by identifying the human will with the intellect. He argued that God limited his omnipotence and foreknowledge, thereby allowing for the possibility of future contingents. This divine self-limitation allows for the possibility that the human intellect, through the power of deliberation, is capable of suspending predetermined acts of volition that go against the moral interests of the actor, thereby being able to choose to sin or not sin. Human liberty is defined in negative terms, a privation and a suspension, since the will does not produce action in these instances but only impedes it (3.8). While some commentators have seen this line of argumentation as a potential “line of defense for the opinio christiana” (Poppi 1988: 659), it was specifically condemned in 1576 by a censor who placed the work on the Index of Prohibited Books (Baldini & Spruit 2009: vol. 1, tome 3: 2279–80).

The fifth and final book of On Fate continues the theological discussions of the previous two books, turning to an examination of predestination, a concept that according to Pomponazzi is not mentioned by philosophers but is key to Christian theology, being tied to doctrines on fate and God’s providence. In this book, he put forward two distinct, incompatible accounts of predestination. The first account argues that God does not act in an indeterminate or contingent manner and, therefore, has determined everything for eternity, eliminating the importance or even the possibility of human choice (5.2). The second account argues that God has created the universe perfect with respect to all its parts, including humans who have the capacity to choose or refrain from sin. God, however, has not made all humans equal with respect to their ability to obtain perfection, and only some have been granted grace or are “elected”. This election, or grace is not certain, as those that have been chosen still have the possibility to choose to sin and thereby forfeit the grace that had been conceded to them. The chosen, however, who follow God’s will can be certain to obtain the glory that God has conditionally promised (5.7). The epilogue reiterates his conviction that the Stoic conception of the universe is preferable. He maintained that if the universe is like an animal, the sublunary world represents excrements, while the heavenly spheres are perfect and free of evil. Finally, he confessed that he has never understood how Christian theologians preserve divine providence and human free will, describing it as an illusion and a trick (5.epilogus.7–10).

That the first two books of On Fate at times seem to be in disagreement with the latter three presents difficulties for interpreting it, having led some scholars to assume Pomponazzi’s true position corresponds to arguments in On Incantations and is found in the first books (see Poppi 1988). Others have seen the last three books as an attempt to undermine Christianity by demonstrating the weakness or incompatibility of the Christian doctrines of predestination and God’s omnipotence and omniscience (see Di Napoli 1970). Alternatively, scholars have seen the latter books to be a genuine attempt to critique and reform Thomistic theology (see Perrone Compagni 2004: cix–clviii) that offers innovative solutions to outstanding theological problems (see Ramberti 2007: 109–50).

6. Later Works

Pomponazzi elaborated on many themes found in On Fate, On Incantations, and On the Immortality of the Soul in the final years of his life while he lectured on Aristotle’s Parva naturalia, De generatione et corruptione, De partibus animalium, and Meteorologica. The only new work printed during these years was On Growth and Nutrition (1521), which discussed a central topic of De generatione et corruptione. The work is explicitly naturalistic in outlook and provides potential natural explanations for what some considered miracles—that St. Paul’s tongue spoke after his head was severed from his body—in addition to asserting that the human intellect requires a bodily organ (1.11, 1.23; see Ramberti 2010).

Pomponazzi reaffirmed his views about the mortality of the soul in his lectures on De generatione et corruptione given in 1522 (Nardi 1965: 251–68). His lectures on De partibus animalium display his skepticism toward complete human knowledge of the natural world (see Perfetti 1999). This skepticism expressed in the biological works also appears in his lectures on Aristotle’s Meteorologica, in which he puts forward doubts about knowledge of the final causes of disasters and the certainty of a number of meteorological explanations (see Martin 2011: 30–33, 44–50). In these lectures he followed several teachings of On Incantations, affirming the place of prodigies in the ordering of the universe and the stars’ role in causing sublunary change (see Graiff 1976).

7. Influence and Legacy

Given the controversial nature of many of his writings and the difficulty in interpreting his works, Pomponazzi’s influence was varied. Opponents accused him of undermining organized religion, abetting Lutheranism, and contributing to the development of atheism. Alternatively, he has been praised for promoting intellectual freedom, improving methods for interpreting Aristotle, and preparing the way for the materialism and positivism of modern science.

Although his writings do not appear to follow the demand of Apostolici regiminis that philosophers defend Catholic dogma to the best of their ability, ecclesiastical authorities did little to enforce the Fifth Lateran Council. While never convicted of heresy, or even tried for it, nevertheless after the publication of On the Immortality of the Soul he faced significant turmoil, including accusations of heterodoxy and the burning of copies of his books at Venice. Some adversaries, such as Ambrogio Flandino, associated On Fate with Martin Luther’s and Jan Hus’s denials of free will, an association that continued throughout the sixteenth century (Del Soldato 2010). That Guglielmo Gratarolo, a Calvinist exiled from Bergamo living in Basel, printed On Incantations and On Fate potentially confirmed perceived links to heterodoxy (Maclean 2005). As the Counter Reformation more clearly defined Catholic orthodoxy in the second half of the sixteenth century, many Catholic theologians and philosophers, especially Jesuits, saw his teachings as noxious and a potential source of heresy. During the seventeenth century, concerns over Pomponazzi grew in part due to the convicted and executed heretic Giulio Cesare Vanini (d. 1619), who appropriated a number of Pomponazzi’s arguments. Subsequently, many scholars, including François Garasse, Marin Mersenne, and Tommaso Campanella, linked him to atheism and to Niccolò Machiavelli’s promotion of religious imposture as a political tool. Yet he still had his defenders. The erudite Frenchman Gabriel Naudé praised Pomponazzi both for his wit and for his historically accurate interpretation of Aristotle. As a result, Pomponazzi became linked to seventeenth-century libertinism (Martin 2014: 94–95, 124–44).

Despite numerous negative assessments, some sixteenth-century philosophers pursued Pomponazzi’s approach. For example, Simone Porzio, a professor of philosophy at Pisa, followed his mortalist and Alexandrian take on the human intellect (Del Soldato 2010). Even though many throughout the seventeenth century condemned his view that the soul dies with the body, Pierre Bayle absolved Pomponazzi of impiety, found him to be an example of freedom of thought, and praised him for his ethical teachings that spurned the inducements of the afterlife (Bayle 1740: vol. 3, 777–83). In the nineteenth century, he was championed by positivists, such as Ernest Renan and Roberto Ardigò, who upheld Pomponazzi as a model for the scientific spirit that opposed religious oppression (Ardigò 1869; Renan 1852: 284–88). During the twentieth century, a number of scholars endorsed the views of seventeenth-century libertines, interpreting Pomponazzi as insincere, a promoter of religious imposture, or as a determined enemy of Christianity (see Busson 1957: 44–69; Charbonnel 1919: 220–74, 389–438). Accordingly, he gained among some the epithet “Radical Philosopher” (see Pine 1986). Other scholars, following the leads of Bruno Nardi and Paul Oskar Kristeller, placed him in the context of the secular tradition of medieval philosophy that separated theology from philosophy (Bianchi 2008). Under that interpretation, Pomponazzi was not necessarily an instigator or harbinger of the conflicts between church and science of the modern period but rather better understood as continuing scholastic philosophical practices, which included open inquiry, that took root in the thirteenth century.


For extensive bibliographies, including lists of manuscripts and editions of university lectures and short works, see Lohr 1988; Pietro Pomponazzi, [1567] 2004; Pietro Pomponazzi, [1525] 2013: 2715–69.

Primary Sources: Pietro Pomponazzi

  • 1514, Tractatus utilissimus in quo disputatur penes quid intensio et remissio formarum (On the Intension and Remission of Forms), Bologna; reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525. [Tractatus utilissimus… available online]
  • 1515, Tractatus de reactione (On Reaction), Bologna; reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525. [Tractatus de reactione available online]
  • 1516, Tractatus de immortalitate animae (Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul), Bologna;
    • reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525;
    • Abhandlung über die Unsterblichkeit der Seele, edited and translated (German) by Burkhard Mojsisch, Hamburg: Meiner, 1990;
    • On the Immortality of the Soul, translated (English) by William Henry Hay II and John Herman Randall, Jr., in The Renaissance Philosophy of Man, edited by Ernst Cassirer, Paul Oskar Kristeller, and John Herman Randall, Jr., Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956;
    • Trattato sull’immortalità dell’anima, translated (Italian) by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Florence: Olschki, 1999;
    • Traité de l’immortalité de l’âme. Tractatus de immortalitate animae, edited and translated (French) by Thierry Gontier, Paris: Les Belle Lettres, 2012.
    • [Tractatus de immortalitate animae available online]
  • 1518, Apologia (Apology), Bologna;
    • reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525;
    • Apologia, translated (Italian) by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Florence: Olschki, 2011.
    • [Apologia available online]
  • 1519, Defensorium (Defense), Bologna; reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525. [Defensorium available online]
  • 1521, Tractatus de nutritione et augmentatione (On Growth and Nutrition), Bologna; reprinted in Tractatus acutissimi, 1525. [Tractatus de nutritione … available online]
  • 1525 [Tractatus acutissimi], Tractatus acutissimi, utillimi et mere peripatetici, Venice;
    • Tutti i trattati peripatetici, edited and translated (Italian) by Francesco Paolo Raimondi and José Manuel García Valverde, Milan: Bompiani, 2013.
    [Tractatus acutissimi available online]
  • 1556 [On Incantations], De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus (On the Causes of Marvelous Natural Effects or On Incantations), Basel;
    • reprinted 1567 and in Opera, 1567;
    • De incantationibus, edited by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Florence: Olschki, 2011;
    • Les causes des merveilles de la nature, ou Les enchantements, translated (French) by Henri Busson, Paris: Rieder, 1930 [partial];
    • Gli incantesimi, translated (Italian) by Cristiana Innocenti, Florence: La Nuova Italia, 1997.
    [De naturalium effectuum causis… available online]
  • 1563, Dubitationes in quartum Meteorologicorum Aristotelis librum (Doubts on Meteorologica IV), Venice. [Dubitationes… available online]
  • 1567 [On Fate], De fato, libero arbitrio, praedestinatione, providentia Dei libri V (On Fate, Free Will, On Predestination), in Opera, Basel;
    • Libri quinque de fato, libero arbitrio et praedestinatione, edited by Richard Lemany, Lugano: Thesaurus Mundi, 1957;
    • Il fato, il libero arbitrio e la predestinazione, translated (Italian) by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Turin: Nino Aragno, 2004.
    [De fato… available online]
  • 1966–1970, Corsi inediti dell’insegnamento padovano, 2 volumes, edited by Antonino Poppi, Padua: Antenore, volume 1 (1966), volume 2 (1970).
  • 2004, Expositio super primo et secundo de partibus animalium, edited by Stefano Perfetti, Florence: Olschki.
  • 2018, Expositio super I De anima Aristotelis et Commentatoris 1503 riportata da Antonio Surian, edited by Massimiliano Chianese, Rome: Storia e Letteratura.

Other Primary Sources

  • Alexander of Aphrodisias, On Fate, edited and translated by R. W. Sharples, London: Duckworth, 1983.
  • Aristotle,
    • De anima
    • De generatione et corruptione
    • De motu animalium
    • De partibus animalium
    • Metaphysics
    • Meteorologica
    • Parva naturalia
    in The Complete Works of Aristotle (The Revised Oxford Translations), Jonathan Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984
  • Averroes, De substantia orbis (On the Substance of the Orbs), Venice: Giunta, 1560.
  • Ficino, Marsilius, Platonic Theology, 6 volumes, edited and translated by Michael J.B. Allen and James Hankins, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2001–06.

Secondary Works Cited

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  • Blum, Paul Richard, 2007, “The Immortality of the Soul”, in The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy, James Hankins (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 211–33. doi:10.1017/CCOL052184648X.011
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  • Daston, Lorraine, 2000, “Preternatural Philosophy”, in Biographies of Scientific Objects, Lorraine Daston (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 15–41.
  • de Boer, Sander W., 2018, “Imagination, Images, and (Im)Mortality”, in Image, Imagination, and Cognition, Christoph Lüthy, Claudia Swan, Paul Bakker and Claus Zittlel (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 11–31.
  • Del Soldato, Eva, 2010, Simone Porzio: Un aristotelico tra natura e grazia, Roma: Storia e letteratura.
  • –––, 2010, “Immagini di Pomponazzi e Lutero”, Sgarbi 2010: 365–84.
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  • Gilson, Étienne, 1961, “Autour de Pomponazzi. Problèmatique de l’immortalité de l’âme en Italie au début du XVIe siècle”, Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 28: 163–279.
  • Hasse, Dag Nikolaus, 2016, Success and Suppression: Arabic Sciences and Philosophy in the Renaissance, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
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  • –––, 1993, Studies in Renaissance Thought and Letters, Rome: Storia e Letteratura.
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  • Maclean, Ian, 2005, “Heterodoxy in Natural Philosophy and Medicine: Pietro Pomponazzi, Guglielmo Gratarolo, Girolamo Cardano”, in Heterodoxy in Early Modern Science and Religion, John Brooke and Ian Maclean (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1–29.
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  • –––, 2011, Renaissance Meteorology: Pomponazzi to Descartes, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Subverting Aristotle: Religion, History, and Philosophy in Early Modern Science, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
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  • Park, Katharine, 2006, Secrets of Women: Gender, Generation, and the Origins of Human Dissection, New York: Zone Books.
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  • –––, 2004, “Introduzione”, in Expositio super primo et secundo de partibus animalium, Stefano Perfetti (ed.), Florence: Olschki, vii–lxxxiv.
  • Perrone Compagni, Vittoria, 1999, “Introduzione”, in Trattato sull’immortalità dell’anima, translated by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Florence: Olschki, v-ci.
  • –––, 2004, “Critica e riforma del cristianesimo nel De fato di Pomponazzi”, in Pomponazzi [1567] 2004: ix–clviii.
  • –––, 2011, “Introduzione, la fondazione ‘scientifica’ della magia nel De incantationibus”, in Pomponazzi [1556] 2011: xi–lxxi, Florence: Olschki.
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  • –––, 1988, “Fate, Fortune, Providence and Human Freedom”, in The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Charles B. Schmitt, Quentin Skinner, and Jill Kraye, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 641–67.
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  • –––, 2010, “Esegesi del testo aristotelico e naturalismo nel De nutritione et augumentatione”, Sgarbi 2010: 314–45.
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Other Internet Resources

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