Medieval Theories of Practical Reason

First published Fri Oct 8, 1999; substantive revision Mon Nov 21, 2022

Medieval theories of moral reasoning have their origins in the moral theology of St. Augustine and the rational ethics of Aristotle. Until the thirteenth century Augustine’s responses to questions concerning free will, predestination, the nature of goodness, and divine freedom dominated moral speculation in the Latin West. For Augustine morality demands the human will’s conformity to the prescriptions of the immutable, necessary and eternal law. Augustine argues in his work on free will that the eternal law “is called supreme reason, which must always be obeyed, and through it the evil deserve an unhappy life and the good a blessed life; and through this law we have derived temporal laws rightly constructed and correctly emended.” The ideals of eternal law are universally imprinted upon human intellects and are the immutable standards by which human actions may be judged.

The earliest medieval commentators on the Nicomachean Ethics analyzed only the first three books of the work for reasons yet unexplained (Celano, 2022). The medieval authors of the first half of the 13th century, while aware of the existence of the remaining books of the Nicomachean Ethics generally had only the partial text at their disposal. Aristotle’s discussion of phronesis was mostly unknown until Robert Grosseteste’s complete translation of Aristotle’s text and the accompanying Greek commentaries appeared about 1248. During this period theologians such as Philip the Chancellor and William of Auxerre examined the nature of the moral act in their theological Summas. Like many medieval authors, William of Auxerre considered the Aristotelian virtue of phronesis (prudentia) to have both an intellectual component as a type of knowledge as well as a moral function in its ability to prescribe proper actions. Both William of Auxerre and Philip the Chancellor were instrumental in introducing into moral theory the concept of synderesis which they viewed as an innate human ability to recognize the eternal first principles of moral reasoning. Rather than leave the guiding principles of human actions to human experience they anchored moral decisions in the eternal law of God. Synderesis displays a universal code of correct actions to the moral agent (Eardley, 2021). Although their interpretation was decidedly un-Aristotelian it did influence the conclusions of later commentators, such as Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas. After the appearance of Grosseteste’s translation Albert the Great composed the first Latin medieval commentary on the entire text of the Nicomachean Ethics. His treatment of the prudence as a virtue with both intellectual and moral components, his acceptance of universal moral principles in the natural law, and his understanding of practical reason and its relation to human happiness had a profound effect upon the writings of his student, Thomas Aquinas.

1. The Thomistic Doctrine of Practical Reason

When one chooses through one’s free will to live ‘honorably and rightly’ in accordance with divine law, one can reasonably be thought to live a moral life. Despite the human ability to reason according to divine principles, the human condition does not permit the attainment of moral perfection through natural means alone. Augustine asserts that only through grace, sent freely by God to assist the human will can one achieve true moral goodness. Prudence, which is the ability to choose good and avoid evil, intellectual contemplation, moral and political virtue, friendship, education and character (all essential elements in Aristotle’s ethics) are subsumed in Augustine’s moral theology under the command to love God. For Augustine the complexity of Greek moral thought can be reduced to the simple rule of conformity to divine law.

Despite the contributions of Anselm in the eleventh century on questions concerning free choice, divine foreknowledge and predestination, and Peter Abelard’s startling assertion in the twelfth century that morality arises from the agent’s intention alone, it is not until the thirteenth century that a thoroughly scientific approach to human moral reasoning takes shape. Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, newly translated into Latin, provides a philosophical basis on which a fresh examination of Augustine’s doctrines could be based (Wieland, 1981). The first great medieval commentary on Aristotle’s ethics, which was the result of Albert the Great’s teaching activity at the Dominican House of Studies in Cologne, marks the beginning of ‘moral science’ in the Middle Ages. Albert’s careful exposition of Aristotle’s text and his clarification of the concepts of natural law, moral reasoning and human virtue, and its influence on his most famous pupil, Thomas Aquinas, led directly to a consideration of the question of practical reasoning in the Middle Ages.

The notion of medieval practical reason can be investigated in two ways: 1) in light of the distinction between practical and theoretical sciences in the writings of the medieval university masters in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries; 2) in comparison to the modern understanding of practical reason as described by Immanuel Kant. The first method allows for a strict adherence to the texts themselves, wherein the concept of ‘ratio practica’ is strictly limited to a type of philosophical reasoning. The second approach permits a deeper philosophical consideration of the parallels between the medieval understanding of the nature of moral goodness and the modern view of the will as practical reason. Both approaches are helpful in gaining a fuller understanding of the meaning of practical reason in the Middle Ages.

In its strictest sense the term ‘practical reason’ (ratio practica) refers specifically to a type of reasoning, which is analogous to the deductions of speculative or theoretical science. When discussing human knowledge of the precepts of natural law Thomas Aquinas argues that these commands are related to practical reasoning as the first principles of demonstration are related to speculative reasoning; in each science there are certain principles of demonstration which are known in themselves (principia per se nota). These principles, which comprise the universal laws of moral behavior direct all subsequent moral reasoning. Thomas bases his theory of correct reasoning on the human ability to discover an underlying order in any field of inquiry. The order of reasoning which determines metaphysical knowledge is derived from a recognition of the principle of non-contradiction. Reasoning from the notion that being and non-being are contradictory terms, a metaphysician argues for certain conclusions about the nature of being. In practical reason one begins with the principle that all human acts are directed to an end and then comes to recognize the fundamental element of ethics to be ‘do good and avoid evil’:

Therefore the first principle in practical reason is that which is based on the nature of the good which is: the good is that which all things seek. This therefore is the principle of law: that good must be done and evil avoided. And on this <precept> all other precepts of natural law are based so that everything which is to be done or avoided pertains to the precepts of natural law. Practical reason naturally understands these precepts to be human goods. (S. th. I–II, 94, 2).

Although Albert sees a closer connection between prudence and practical reason than Thomas (“prudence and practical reason have the same acts in that reason gives the act while prudence informs the act by reason of justice, expediency and honesty.” De bono # 443), Albert essentially agrees with Thomas’ description of the method of practical reasoning (Super Ethica, VI, 7, pp. 436–437).

Thomas argues from the basic principle that what is a good always has the nature of the end to the conclusion that human beings seek to discover particular good acts as consequences of the determined end. Since practical reason mimics the deductive process of theoretical reasoning, the term, ‘ratio practica’, primarily refers to a type of human knowledge. There is, however, a fundamental difference between the conclusions of theoretical and practical science:

Because speculative reason is especially concerned with what is necessary and cannot be otherwise, the truth found in its conclusions is without flaw, just <the truth> in its general principles. But practical reason concerns what is contingent whose domain is human acts; and so even if there is some necessity in its general <principles>, the more one descends to its proper conclusions the more one finds a defect <in truth>. In speculative reasoning the truth is the same for all, both in principles and in conclusions. In operative reasoning there is not the same truth or practical rectitude according to its proper <conclusions>, but only according to its common principles. (S. th. I–II, 94, 4; Super ethica, VI, 7, p. 441).

Since the goal of practical reason is action not knowledge, the truth attained by the intellect must be caused by its conformity to right desire. There can be no necessary science of practical reason, since virtuous activity allows for variety and derivation from the universal rule in particular instances. Moral matters, which are within the domain of practical reason, are varied and inadequate (deformis), and cannot therefore provide the certainty which is expected in theoretical reasoning. If we are to have any science of practical reason at all, we must be content to apply the principles to various conclusions and proceed from rough arguments which demonstrate truth in a general way.

The variety and differences among the will’s acts lead Thomas Aquinas to use the term ‘ratio practica’ specifically to distinguish the method of moral reasoning from that of strictly scientific knowledge:

Therefore one finds something in practical reason which is related to operations just as a proposition in speculative reason is related to conclusions. (S. th. I–II, 90, 1 ad 2).

Albert argues that despite the similarities in method between the two types of reasoning, the force of a practical conclusion depends more on a particular desire than a universal principle. Since human desires differ so greatly, moral arguments are merely general and imperfectly formulated. (Super ethica, VI, 16, p. 491). These distinctions which are derived from Aristotle’s analysis of the nature of human knowledge, do not approach the understanding of science found in the philosophy of Kant. For Kant, speculation does not, and cannot, give us knowledge of being, nor should we begin with being as the object of science, as is seen in the medieval principle of existential non-contradiction. Kant restricts speculative science to a consideration of the laws of appearance. Practical science, or practical reason, in Kant’s philosophy, however, is concerned with freedom rather the natural good or the human end. Kant’s practical reason attains the kind of rigor, based on pure a priori principles, which would be impossible in the ethics of Aristotle, Albert and Thomas who are content with a science of practical reason whose domain is contingent and changeable acts. The secure foundation which Kant sought for every moral choice would be considered beyond the scope of practical reason as formulated by the medieval commentators on Aristotle’s ethics.

Despite their enthusiastic reception of Aristotle’s works, the medieval moralists did not grant him complete authority in moral reasoning. The flexibility of Aristotle’s ethics, which Thomas himself acknowledges, did not lead medieval writers to construct a moral theory which, like Aristotle’s, is based on societal norms, tradition and human actions. The medieval moralists sought a more secure foundation for determining ethical action than Aristotle’s appeal to the man of practical wisdom (phronimos). A modern author recognizes the tensions that exist in medieval ethical theory when he writes of Thomas Aquinas: ‘How is it that Aquinas can seem so Aristotelian in his description of human action and yet be so Augustinian in his insistence on the need for conformity to the eternal law?’ (Westberg, 34). The answer to this question lies the account of the genesis of the human moral act and the conditions for its rectitude. Practical reason requires a foundation more secure than the accepted practice of human actions. In the search for that basis, Thomas and his contemporaries construct a theory of practical reason far more complex than the mere designation of a type of intellectual reasoning; it becomes an account of the nature of moral goodness itself.

The designation of the will as rational appetite, its end as goodness and its relationship to the intellect are well-known features of medieval followers of Aristotle and need not be treated at length here. What is of more interest in a discussion of practical reason is the analysis of those first principles which regulate moral reasoning. Thomas in developing the ideas of his former teacher, Albert, insists that the will must be moved by an end that is perceived as good. (S. th. I–II, 6, 1 & 8, 1; Super ethica, VI, 7, pp. 436–437). More specifically he argues that:

… the good in common, which has the nature of the end, is the object of the will. Therefore because of this element the will moves the other powers of the soul to their acts. (S. th. I–II, 9, 1)

Even though the intellect moves the will by presenting the object to be desired, the will itself has a natural inclination toward the good. The ultimate human end, or supreme good, is beatitude, the perfect, all-encompassing human good. Such a supreme good could never be perceived by practical reason as evil. (S. th. I–II, 13, 6 & 10, 2 ad 3; Super ethica, VI, 17, p. 497). The determination of the human end as beatitude says very little about the first principles of practical reason upon which specific moral judgments should be based. When the will desires, it seems to want more specific objects than the vague longing for beatitude. Thomas and Albert specify their theory of volition by means of the doctrines of natural law, synderesis, and prudence.

The source of the first principles in any science is a critical element in determining the validity and nature of that science. In moral reasoning the origin of the principles of actions not only reveals the understanding of the nature of goodness, but directs also all subsequent analysis as well. In Thomas’ theory of practical reason the first principle of human actions is that of law:

Just as reason is the first principle of human acts, so too in this reason something is the principle with respect to every other act. Thus it is necessary for law to pertain principally and most extensively. The first principle in actions, for which there is practical reason, is the ultimate end. The ultimate end of human life is happiness or beatitude. It is necessary for law to reflect in the highest degree that order which leads to beatitude. ( I–II, 90, 2)

The dictates of natural law have a direct bearing on the attainment of human fulfillment. Despite an overly optimistic view of how Aristotelian happiness leads to eternal beatitude, R. McInerny (p. 34) recognizes the connection between natural law and the goal of human life: “Of course natural law cannot be discussed without presupposing what was said earlier about the ultimate end. The precepts of natural law have to do precisely with the end. In its proper sense, a precept is command to do precisely what will lead to an end.” McInerny views the Aristotelian admonition to regard beatitude as possible only insofar as it pertains to human beings to be an admission that the ideal of happiness can only be imperfectly attained in this life. This statement allows for Thomas to subsume what Aristotle had to say of the good life into a richer vision of the ultimate goal that overcomes the vicissitudes of life (McInerny, p. 33). This interpretation is common among those who wish to see an orderly progression from the life of virtue to perfect beatitude, but Thomas’ position is more complex. Thomas’s comments on Aristotle’s text rightly distinguishes between happiness in its essential activity and a type of earthly beatitude that includes the benefits of good fortune. On Aristotle’s own position concerning human moral perfection Thomas claims that the Philosopher left the question of eternal bliss open because he did not deem it entirely within the sphere of philosophy. The role of prudence in the production of human happiness becomes more restricted in Thomas’ theory than it does in Aristotle’s ethics, since the prudential person must follow the logical progression from the principles of natural law to the deduction of specific actions. The freedom of the practically wise person to chose a life with elements from practical and theoretical activities is restricted by the obligation to pursue the precepts of eternal law (Celano, 2007).

Albert formulates this position succinctly when he says, “prudence is regulated by divine and human law.” (Super ethica, VI, 4, p. 417). While no other law than the dictates of practical reason guides human choices, the eternal law (lex aeterna) primarily and principally orders a human being to the end and determines the corresponding means. As a result, acts that are at odds with the eternal law must always be considered as contrary to the dictates of practical reason. (S. th. I–II, 71, 6 ad 3).

The insistence upon the binding force of eternal law and the natural human inclination towards, and participation in, it (which is called natural law) marks a decisive step away from Aristotle’s ethics of phronesis. The ground of moral action is no longer thought to be the conformity of conduct to that of an outstanding person (phronimos); it is found in an external and universally binding source (eternal law). The process of correct practical reasoning is governed, and measured, by the conformity of acts to the precepts of this law:

A similar process is found in practical and speculative reason… just as in speculative reason conclusions of diverse sciences are produced from indemonstrable principles naturally known… so too from the precepts of natural law as if from certain common and indemonstrable principles human reason proceeds necessarily to those things to which it should be more particularly disposed. (S. th. I–II, 91, 3)

The recognition of the principles of natural law allows practical reason to demonstrate how a human being naturally participates in eternal law according to its common principles.

Developing ideas found in Albert’s work, Thomas argues that the will must be determined by its acceptance of the dictates of practical reason, which necessarily conform to the precepts of natural law:

that human reason rules the human will, by which its goodness is measured, comes from the eternal law, which is divine reason. Thus the goodness of the human will clearly depends much more on eternal law than on human reason, and where human reason is deficient it is necessary to turn to eternal reason. (S. th. I–II, 19,5; Super ethica, VI, 4, p.417)

The content of the precepts, the way they are known and their influence on volition are the final elements in the natural law theory of practical reason. The assertion that natural law reflects eternal law gives little indication as to its specific precepts, but it does indicate that according to the order of natural inclinations an order of the precepts of natural law exists. There is in a human being, as in all other types of being, a primary inclination to self-preservation. It is, however, in the discussions of synderesis that Thomas and Albert most clearly identify those principles which are the foundation of human moral reasoning. Synderesis was introduced into Latin by Jerome, perhaps as a variant of the Greek term, ‘syneidesis’ (insight), and has no meaning whatsoever in Greek. While Albert compares the moral principles of synderesis to the innate natural seeds of law (seminaria iuris), Thomas defines synderesis as “the law of our intellect insofar as it is a habitus containing the precepts of natural law which are the principles of human acts.” ( I–II, 94, 1, ad 2). In an earlier work Thomas explains synderesis either as a natural habit similar to the habit of principles, or as the power (potentia) of reason with such a habit. He sees little difference in these two designations, since each describes the universal natural ability of reason to recognize the first principles of morality. The parallels to speculative reasoning that marked practical reasoning are also a feature of deriving conclusions from the dictates of synderesis. Thomas’ claim that the function of synderesis is to recognize universal moral laws leaves little doubt that he understood the first principles of practical reason, natural law and synderesis to be the same:

Just as there is a certain natural habit of the soul whereby it knows the principles of speculative science, which we call the understanding of the principles, so too in the soul is there a certain natural habit of the first principles of actions, which are the natural principles of natural law; and this habit pertains to synderesis and exists in no other power than reason. (De veritate, q. 16, a. 1)

The specific dictate of synderesis which refers to the eternal law is that one must obey God; the primary imperative with respect to the natural law is that one should avoid evil and seek the good. These principles are obviously not mutually exclusive, ‘but the dictate of reason to pursue good is rationally and necessarily derived from the command to obey God.’ Synderesis is the ability of reason that never errs in the recognition of those universal rules of moral action, since a denial of their universal validity contravenes human reason. Reason can, however, err in the application of the universal principle to a particular action. Moral wrong is then the result of an imperfect, or false, deduction from the principle. So properly speaking, error is not ascribed to universal principles (synderesis), but rather to conscience which may incorrectly apply a universal judgment. (De veritate, q. 16, a. 2, ad 2; Super ethica VI, 7, p. 441; Hoffmann, 2012; Trottmann, 2000).

The ability to apply correctly the principles of practical reason to specific acts in particular circumstances is the function of the intellectual virtue of prudence, defined succinctly as recta ratio agibilium. Prudence “represents the agent’s ability to deliberate, decide and properly to order the process of practical reason to action.” (Westberg, p. 187). Prudence does not, however, direct the will infallibly to right conclusions. Since it merely directs choices, but does not determine them, the will can be said to remain free. Thomas argues that the will can choose freely in three ways, although it could never express a desire contrary to the primary moral rule of pursuing good. The will can be mistaken 1) with respect to its own act in that it can either will or not will; 2) with respect to its object in that it can either want or not want a particular thing; 3) with respect to what is ordered to the end insofar as it wills a particular good or evil act. (De veritate, q. 16, a. 2, ad 2 & q. 16, a. 1). Thomas’ description of the will’s freedom seems at times to be overwhelmed by his insistence upon the will’s determination by the human intellect. This theory of freedom seems to consist merely in the human tendency for faulty reason, since both Albert and Thomas think it unlikely, or even impossible, for a human being to choose contrary to knowledge of the first principles and their application to particular circumstances:

It should be said that the root of liberty is the will as subject, but reason as its cause. The will therefore can be freely drawn to diverse things, since reason can be drawn to diverse things, since reason can have various conceptions of the good. (S. th. I–II, 17, 1)

For Albert the delight that arises from intemperate desire does not corrupt the natural habit of prudence, but rather its rule, when prudence fails in drawing the proper moral conclusion. In other words, no one can act contrary to the universal principles of morality, but only in their particular application. (Super ethica, VI, 7, p. 441).

According to these views human freedom could never lead a human being to act contrary to his own interests. To choose against the principles of natural law would not constitute freedom, but rather foolishness. Although the will’s natural inclination to pursue the good presented by the intellect does not compel the will to act, the moralists of the natural law theory think it psychologically impossible to choose something incompatible with a properly deduced conclusion of practical reason:

A second necessity can be imposed on the will, namely the will must necessarily chose x, if x must be pursued as good or x is to be avoided as evil. (De veritate, q. 17, a. 3)

2. The Franciscan Critique

The ethics of natural law, with its impressive union of the Augustinian theory of eternal principles and the Aristotelian method of moral reasoning, did not remain long unchallenged. Franciscan theologians, John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, were especially critical of a theory which they considered too restrictive of human freedom. Although Scotus and Ockham never produced treatises specifically devoted to moral theory, the main lines of their critiques may be sketched from their theological works.

Scotus’ main concern in his arguments against the intellectualism of Albert’s and Thomas’ ethics is his doctrine of the supremacy and freedom of the human will. He claims that there could be no basis for judging an action right or wrong if the will were not free to choose against the dictates of the intellect. The will, even if it should act ‘with reason’ still is able to choose between opposite courses of action that lie within its power; the intellect however, has no power of self-determination, since it must assent to what it recognizes as true. Only the will acts freely, for it has the power of self-determination. Scotus argues that a theory of practical reason in which judgments about actions were restricted to the type of reasoning characteristic of speculation not only restricts freedom, but also removes any basis for merit or blame. If the moral agent must act in accordance with intellectual deduction, then he can only be praised for his intellectual prowess, and not for his moral goodness.

Scotus is influenced by Aristotle’s assertion that the end of practical knowledge is truth in agreement with right desire. For Scotus this philosophical expression of the natural law leads him to assert one fundamental universal moral principle: ‘God should be loved’. This law is so deeply rooted in human reason that even God’s power cannot release a human being from its obligations. This principle allows Scotus to view his moral theology as consistent with Aristotle’s ethics, since reason leads man to obey God’s commands. The will necessarily and perpetually seeks happiness and the will naturally desires its own perfection. The primary universal command informs the will’s natural desire for perfection, and so particular actions, regardless of circumstances, are judged in accordance with the will’s conformity to the precept to love God.

Scotus’ primary consideration as a moral theologian is the nature of freely determined volitional choices. Only secondarily does he consider the goodness of the desired end of the action. When the will freely chooses in accordance with right reason only then can the act be considered morally good. Scotus does have some difficulty explaining the relationship between the will and the intellect. If a human being realizes intellectually that the most desirable goal is union with God, it seems that human intellectual reason would compel him to pursue such an end. If the will does not act in agreement with the rationally derived first principle then it must be necessarily wrong. It is thereby difficult to see how the will’s absolute freedom can be maintained.

Faced with such a dilemma, Scotus argues that although the will pursues an object rationally determined by the intellect, this does not mean that the will is conditioned by ‘natural necessity’. The apprehension of a possible action is offered to the will as something neutral, while the will remains always free. (Ordinatio, IV, d. 46). In Scotus’ view the natural law is comprised of self-evident a priori principles, whose validity the intellect immediately recognizes from the coherence of terms. The will then is naturally inclined to assent to their dictates, but is not compelled to do so. For Scotus the clearest expression of natural law is the decalogue, which directs all human actions towards the attainment of beatitude. The commands of natural law are not good merely because they are commanded, but are commanded because they are good. (Ordinatio IV, 17) Scotus considers the first two commandments, that God must be worshipped and revered, to be absolutely unalterable. God himself could never negate such moral principles and human beings are morally bound to their adherence.

Despite his unrelenting criticisms of many of Scotus’ positions, William of Ockham’s moral theology develops, rather than dismisses, the main lines of Scotus’ ethical deliberations. Ockham too is concerned primarily with the preservation of volitional freedom, both divine and human. Ockham specifically rejects the theory of natural law for determining human acts invariably toward an intellectually determined end. His insistence upon the dignity of human nature and the absolute power of the will for self-determination lead Ockham to reject his predecessors’ morality of natural law. Ockham’s critique of the metaphysics of common nature was not limited to logical and metaphysical speculation; it pertains also to his moral doctrine, wherein the will must be free even to choose ‘evil which is neither really or apparently good.’

The autonomy of the will is so great that it can absolutely refuse to pursue beatitude even when it is presented either as a general or particular idea. Even after death (in patria) the will can refuse to desire its own perfection. Volitional freedom is absolute in Ockham’s moral theology; it can be defined as a natural inclination to an end, only insofar as it is an observed general human tendency. The human will can just as easily reject its end, as it can pursue it. (Ordinatio I, d. 1, q. 6).

The natural foundation of morality, so essential to Albert and Thomas and still an important element of Scotus’ thought, is rejected by Ockham in favor of a more complete notion of volitional freedom. Still Ockham does not advocate an ethics of relativism. The basis for human moral judgments lies in the will’s conformity to divine commands. Impressed by Scotus’ dictum, ‘Deus nullius est debitor’ (God is indebted to no one), Ockham extends the power of God to reformulate all moral laws. Not only can the commandments that regulate human interactions be altered, but also those that determine the relationship between God and man. God could command human beings to hate him and such a precept must be considered as morally binding. Ockham’s use of the more common language of medieval moral theory does not prevent him from emphasizing the contingency of human morality. His belief in the power of human reason to discern the rational principles of an ordered life cannot overcome his desire to preserve the unlimited power of God, on whose will all moral principles depends and are subject to change. Both Scotus and Ockham construct a moral theory of volitional freedom, rather than one that they believe to be the moral determinism of Aristotle and his followers.

3. The Place of Practical Reason in Moral Theory

The question remains as to how the doctrine of practical wisdom relates to the general moral theory of medieval thinkers. Writers such as Eckhart and Taler rejected Aristotelian virtues in favor of more religious ones, acceptance (Gelassenheit) and detachment (Abgeschiedenheit), but even Thomas Aquinas had difficulty incorporating the rational theory of practical wisdom into his overall understanding of the moral life. Confronted with the conflicting claims of Aristotelian Ethics and the Augustinian doctrine of grace, he asserts in a sermon to young Dominicans:

The faith teaches all that is needed for living well. This is clear because no philosopher with all his efforts before the coming of Christ could know as much about God and what is necessary for life as an old woman does through faith…

When faced with a clear choice between the two often conflicting moral doctrines Thomas, like his contemporaries, preferred the religious doctrines to the rationally based ethics of practical wisdom.

The earliest thirteenth-century interpretations of Aristotle’s notion practical wisdom emphasized the intellectual nature of moral virtue. The pre-1250 commentators on the NE understood phronesis as a means whereby a human being could be united to the supreme good, happiness. These early interpreters of Aristotle made the moral life an essentially passive one, in that the felix is elevated to happiness by divine causality. With the appearance of the work of Robert Kilwardby, Albert the Great, and Thomas Aquinas a deeper understanding of Aristotle’s moral thought infused the commentaries of the second half of the thirteenth century. These thinkers, however, were also troubled by the relation between felicitas and prudentia.

Thomas follows the lines sketched by his former teacher, and transforms the nature of Aristotelian ethics into a moral doctrine that is more easily aligned with Christian moral theology. Albert and Thomas were not content with the unspecified nature of the principles of the moral syllogism as described by Aristotle. They left the formal structure of the Aristotelian moral act the same, but altered the content by adding the specific formulations of the fundamental principles of natural law that direct all action toward the human good. The moral agent is no longer free to determine from the observation of customs and practices the principles of actions that direct the practical syllogism. The precepts of natural law, which are recognized through the natural power (Albert), or the natural habit (Thomas), of synderesis, ensure a universally binding code of conduct. Prudence becomes a mechanism whereby one deduces specific actions from determined laws. The science of morality becomes closer to speculative theory because of the unerring process of determining singular decisions from universal commands. The Franciscan critics of the intellectualism of the Dominican commentators on Aristotle emphasized the volitional nature of the will’s desire for goodness. Despite their agreement that all human moral actions lead ultimately to union with God, the commentators differ upon the natural moral means by which such a union is caused.

4. Comparison with Kant

The final question remains: can the medieval explanations of practical reason be aligned with Kant’s description of practical reason? Kant’s well known definition of practical reason is:

Everything in nature works according to laws. Only a rational being has the ability to act in accordance with the concept of laws, that is according to principles; in other words, only a rational being has a will. Since reason demands the derivation of actions from laws, the will is nothing other than practical reason. (Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, II, 37)

For Kant the aim of moral philosophy is to discover ideas and principles that would constitute as pure a concept of will as possible and not to determine the actions and conditions of willing, which are mainly the concerns of psychology (Grundlegung, Intro., XII). The good will is good not through its result or its capacity to attain a predetermined end, but only by means of the willing itself. (Grundlegung, I, 3). The will’s ability for self-determination according to universally binding laws conveys the objectivity demanded by the proper concept of reason. Since a rational nature declares itself by the self-imposition of the end, morality is the relationship of actions to the autonomy of the will; and this autonomy is the relation of the will to the most universal mandating (Gesetzgebung) possible. (Grundlegung, II, 83 & 85–86). The will purified of any inclination and desire for an ulterior end is the proper matter for practical reason.

The differences between Kantian and medieval theories of practical reason are obvious even from such a short description of their elements. The adherence of Albert and Thomas to the Greek view of human nature led them to their conviction of the will’s natural inclination toward the good. Such a notion permits Thomas to advise us to seek naturally what is useful to us. (De veritate, q. 24, a. 8). What is truly advantageous to human beings must always be conducive to attaining the human end, beatitude; utility in this sense will always be a reliable guide to correct moral choice. Thomas claims that every thing to which man has a natural inclination human reason apprehends as good. For Kant human beings cannot be permitted to pursue their inclinations which are to be viewed as subjective desires. Such desires lead to moral error at least as often as they produce right action. The objectivity of the pure concept of the human will precludes the recognition of human inclination as a measure of human goodness.

Despite their insistence upon volitional freedom, which in some aspects anticipates Kant’s thought, Scotus and Ockham argue that the true measure of morality lies in the conformity of the human will with the commands of God. Such precepts may change if God so desires and so Scotus and Ockham produce an ethics quite different in spirit from that of Kant’s theory of universal imperatives. Ockham in his rejection of the intellectual basis for morality argues that an act in total conformity with right reason may not be virtuous, since God could possibly create such an act without human volitional consent. The act would be completely rational and in conformity with divine commands, but would lack any merit or virtue. For Ockham the goodness of any action lies completely in the will’s desire to obey divine commands (De connexione virtutum, III, 11). When Kant describes practical reason as a necessary law for all rational beings, whose actions are always to be judged according to maxims completely bound to the concept of the will of a rational being, one may see parallels to the Franciscan doctrine of the autonomy of the will. As Thomas and Albert describe the genesis of moral action as a process in which practical reason has the ability to accept, understand and obey the principles of a universal law consonant with human nature, they approach Kant’s description of the dignity of the will more closely than those who insist upon the necessity for adherence to the possibly arbitrary precepts of God. Practical reason as the desire for the good as good, as expressed in the first principle of natural law or obedience to divine commands, and the conformity of the will through free choice to the universally binding principles of practical reason indicate that in some important elements of their moral theories medieval philosophers approach the spirit of Kant as they move away from the legacy of Aristotle.


Primary Literature

  • Albertus Magnus, De bono, H. Kühle et al. (eds.), in Opera omnia 28, Münster; Westphalia, 1951.
  • –––, Quaestiones, A. Fries et al. (eds.) in Opera omnia 25, 2 Münster; Westphalia, 1993.
  • –––, Super ethica commentum et quaestiones, W. Kubel (ed.), in Opera omnia 14, 1&2, Münster; Westphalia, 1968/1987.
  • Aquinas, Thomas Sententia libri ethicorum, R.-A. Gauthier (ed.), in Opera omnia, 47, 1 Rome, 1969.
  • –––, Summa theologiae, Piana (ed.), Ottawam, 1914.
  • Kant, I., Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, W. Weischedel (ed.), Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp Verlag, , 1994.
  • Philip the Chancellor, Philippi Cancellarii Pariensis Summa de Bono, N. Wicki (ed.), Corpus Philosophorum Medii Aevi: Opera philosophica mediae aetatis, II, Bern: Franke, 1985.
  • William of Auxerre, Summa aurea magistri Guillelmi Altissioderensi, J. Ribaillier (ed.), Paris: Spicelegium Bonaventurianum, 18, 1980–1987,
  • William of Ockham, Scriptum in librum sententiarum ordinatio, G. Gal and S. Brown (eds.), in Opera theologica I and II, St. Bonaventure, NY, 1967/1970.
  • –––, Circa virtutes et vitia, in Quaestiones variae, G. Etzkorn, et al. (eds.), in Opera theologica VII, St. Bonaventure, NY, 1984.

Secondary Literature

  • Bejczy, I., 2011, The Cardinal Virtues in the Middle Ages: A Study in Moral Thought from the Fourth to the Fourteenth Century, Leiden: Brill.
  • Celano, A. J., 2000, From Priam to the Good Thief: The Significance of a Single Event in Greek Ethics and Medieval Moral Teaching (The Etienne Gilson Series 23, Studies in Medieval Moral Teaching 3), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies Press.
  • –––, 2007, “Phronesis, Prudence and Moral Goodness in the Thirteenth Century Commentaries on the Nicomachean Ethics,” Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum, 36: 5–27.
  • –––, 2015, Aristotle’s Ethics and Medieval Philosophy: Moral Goodness and Practical Wisdom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2022, Robert Kilwardby’s Commentary on the Ethics of Aristotle, Leiden, Boston: Brill. (Contains the Latin Edition of Kilwardby’s Commentary).
  • Eardley, P. 2021, “Medieval Theories of Conscience”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Farrell, D., 2012, The Ends of Moral Virtues and the First Principles of Practical Reason in Thomas Aquinas, Rome: Gregorian and Biblical Press.
  • Hoffmann, T., 2012, “Conscience and Synderesis,” The Oxford Handbook of Aquinas, B. Davies and E. Stump (eds.), Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 255–264.
  • –––, 2013, Prudence and Practical Principles: Aquinas and the Nicomachean Ethics, T. Hoffmann, J. Müller and M. Perkams (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 165–183.
  • Langston, D., 2001, Conscience and Other Virtues: From Bonaventure to MacIntyre, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania University Press.
  • McCluskey, C., 2001, “Albertus Magnus and Thomas Aquinas on the Freedom of Human Action,” Albertus Magnus zum Gedenken nach 800 Jahren. Neue Zugänge, Aspekte und Perspektiven, W. Senner et al. (eds.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 243–254.
  • McInerny, R., 2004, “Thomistic Natural Law and Aristotelian Philosophy,” in St. Thomas Aquinas and the Natural Law Tradition: Contemporary Perspectives, J. Goyette, et al. (eds.), Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, pp. 25–42.
  • Müller, Jörn, 2001, Natürliche Moral und philosophische Ethik bei Albertus Magnus (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters: Texte und Untersuchungen, Neue Folge, 59), Münster, pp. 275–285.
  • –––, 2009, Willenschwäche in Antike und Mittelalter. Eine Problemgeschichte von Sokrates bis zum Johannes Duns Scotus, Leuven: Leuven University Press.
  • Perkhams, M., 2013, “Aquinas on Choice, Will and voluntary Action,” Aquinas and the Nicomachean Ethics, T. Hoffmann et al. (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 72–90.
  • Stammkötter, F.-B., 2001, “Die Entwicklung der Bestimmung der Prudentia in der Ethik des Albertus Magnus,” in Albertus Magnus zum Gedenken nach 800 Jahren: Neue Zugänge, Aspekte und Perspektiven, W. Senner et al. (eds.), Berlin, pp. 303–310.
  • Tracey, M., 2009, “Prudence in the Parisian Summae of William of Auxerre, Philip the Chancellor, and Albert the Great,” Subsidia Albertina II: Via Alberti Texte–Quellen–Interpretationen, L. Honnefelder et al. (eds.), Münster, Aschendorff, pp. 267–293.
  • Trottmann, C., 2001, “La syndérèse selon Albert le Grand,” in Albertus Magnus zum Gedenken nach 800 Jahren: Neue Zugänge, Aspekte und Perspektiven, W. Senner et al. (eds.), Berlin, pp. 255–273.
  • –––, 2000, “Scintilla synderesis. Pour une auto-critique mediévale de la raison la plus pure en son usage practique,” Miscellanea mediaevalia, 27, 116–130.
  • Westberg, D., 1994, Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, Prudence in Aquinas, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wieland, G., 1981, Ethica—scientia practica. Die Änfänge der philosophischen Ethik im 13. Jahrhundert (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, Neue Folge, 21), Münster.
  • Wolter, A., 1986, Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University Press. (Contains Latin texts and English translations.)

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2022 by
Anthony Celano <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free