# The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics

*First published Mon Nov 3, 2003; substantive revision Tue Apr 21, 2020*

Interference phenomena are a well-known and crucial aspect of
quantum mechanics,
famously exemplified by the two-slit experiment. There are many
situations, however, in which interference effects are artificially or
spontaneously suppressed. The theory of *decoherence* is
precisely the study of such situations. It is is relevant (or is
claimed to be relevant) to a variety of questions ranging from the
measurement problem to the arrow of time, and in particular to the
question of whether and how the ‘classical world’ may
emerge from quantum mechanics. (See also the entry on
philosophical issues in quantum theory.)

In
Section 1
we discuss the concept of suppression of interference and give a
simplified survey of the theory, emphasising features that will be
relevant later. In fact, the term decoherence refers to two largely
overlapping areas of research. The characteristic feature of the first
(often called ‘environmental’ or ‘dynamical’
decoherence) is the study of concrete models of (spontaneous)
interactions between a system and its environment that lead to
suppression of interference effects. The second (the theory of
‘decoherent histories’ or ‘consistent
histories’) is an abstract and more general formalism capturing
essential features of decoherence. The two are obviously closely
related, and will be reviewed in turn.
Section 2
then criticises the claim that decoherence solves the measurement
problem of quantum mechanics, and discusses the exacerbation of the
problem through the inclusion of environmental interactions. It is
thus important to consider not decoherence by itself, but the
interplay between decoherence and the various approaches to the
foundations of quantum mechanics that provide possible solutions to
the measurement problem and related puzzles.
Section 3
deals with the role of decoherence in relation to a number of such
approaches, including mainstream foundational approaches such as
Everett, Bohm and GRW, traditional approaches such as those by von
Neumann, Heisenberg and Bohr, and a few more. Finally, in
Section 4
we describe the overall picture of the emergent structures that
result from this use of decoherence, as well as a few more speculative
applications.^{[1]}

Suppression of interference has featured in many papers since the
beginning of quantum mechanics, such as Mott’s (1929) analysis
of \(\alpha\)-particle tracks. The modern foundation of decoherence as a
subject in its own right was laid by H.-D. Zeh in the early 1970s (Zeh
1970, 1973). Equally influential were the papers by W. Zurek from the
early 1980s (Zurek 1981, 1982). Some of these earlier examples of
decoherence (e.g., suppression of interference between left-handed and
right-handed states of a molecule) are mathematically more accessible
than more recent ones. A concise and readable introduction to the
theory is provided by Zurek in *Physics Today* (1991). This
article was followed by publication of several letters with
Zurek’s replies (1993), which highlight controversial issues.
More recent surveys are given in Zeh (2003a), Zurek (2003), and in the
books by Giulini *et al.* (1996, second edition Joos *et
al.* 2003), and by Schlosshauer (2007).

- 1. Theory of Decoherence
- 2. Decoherence and the Measurement Problem
- 3. The Role(s) of Decoherence in Different Approaches to Quantum Mechanics
- 4. Scope of Decoherence
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Theory of Decoherence

The two-slit experiment is a paradigm example of an
*interference* experiment. One repeatedly sends electrons or
other particles through a screen with two narrow slits, the electrons
impinge upon a second screen, and we ask for the probability
distribution of detections over the surface of the screen. One might
naively try to calculate them by summing over the probabilities of
detection at the slits multiplied by the probabilities for detection
at the screen conditional on detection at the slits. But these are the
correct probabilities for a different experiment, *with*
detections at the slits, whether or not we believe that measurements
are related to a ‘true’ collapse of the wave function
(i.e. that only *one* of the components survives the
measurement and proceeds to hit the
screen^{[2]}).
If there are no such detections, in general there is an additional
so-called interference term in the correct expression for the
probability, and this term depends on *both* the wave
components that pass through the
slits.^{[3]}

There are, however, situations in which this interference term does
not appear or is negligible, and the naive formula applies. This is
the case if some other systems interact with the electron between the
slits and the screen, leading to enough
entanglement
with the components of the wave going through the two slits. Then,
the probabilities of detection at the screen are *as if* we had
performed a detection at the slits.

It is not difficult to see why this must be so. If Alice and Bob share
a pair of systems that are entangled, then the probabilities for the
results of any measurements Bob might make *do not depend* on
whether or not Alice also makes any measurements (this is the quantum
mechanical no-signalling theorem). In exactly the same way, the
pattern of detections at the screen cannot distinguish mere
entanglement with some other systems from the actual use of those
systems for detection at the slits.

So, for example, there could be sufficiently many stray particles that
scatter off the
electron.^{[4]}
The phase relation between the two components of the wave function,
which is responsible for interference, is now well-defined only at the
level of the larger system composed of electron and stray particles,
and can produce interference only in a suitable experiment including
the larger system. Such a phenomenon of suppression of interference is
what is called decoherence.

### 1.1 Environmental decoherence

‘Environmental’ decoherence is decoherence that arises through suitable interaction of a system with its environment. The study of environmental decoherence consists to a large extent in the construction and investigation of concrete models of such interactions. We have already mentioned taking an environment of relatively light particles that scatter off a relatively heavy particle. Such a model can be used to study e.g. chiral molecules. Or one can take an atom in interaction with the electromagnetic field, or a harmonic oscillator in a thermal bath of oscillators, and many more. Various features of interest typically arise in such models: some are in common to most models, others are highly model-dependent.

One feature of these environmental interactions is that they suppress interference between states from some preferred set (‘eigenstates of the decohering variable’). This can be a discrete set of states, e.g. the upper and lower component of the wave function in our simple example of the two-slit experiment, or left- and right-handed states in models of chiral molecules; when an atom interacts with the electromagnetic field, the preferred states will be the stationary states (which are the states we observe in spectroscopy). Or it could be some continuous set, e.g. the ‘coherent states’ of a harmonic oscillator (in which case the terminology of ‘eigenstates’ or ‘eigenbasis’ of a preferred observable is not quite accurate). The intuitive picture is one in which the environment monitors the system of interest by spontanesouly and continuously ‘measuring’ some quantity characterised by the set of preferred states (i.e. the environment interacts with the system in such a way that it could in principle be used as a measuring apparatus).

Such a ‘measurement-like’ interaction intuitively does not
disturb the eigenstates of the monitored observable. Thus these
preferred states can in fact be characterised in terms of their
robustness or stability with respect to the interaction with the
environment. The system gets entangled with the environment, but the
states between which interference is suppressed are the ones that
would themselves get *least* entangled with the environment
under this interaction. In this connection, one also says that
decoherence induces ‘effective superselection rules’,
meaning the following. A strict superselection rule applies when there
are some observables – in technical terminology they are called
classical – that commute with all observables (for a review, see
Wightman 1995). Intuitively, these observables are infinitely robust,
since no possible interaction can disturb them (at least as long as
the interaction Hamiltonian is considered to be an observable). By an
*effective* superselection rule one means, analogously, that
certain observables (e.g. chirality) will not be disturbed by the
interactions that *actually* take place.

In many models of decoherence, the preferred states are robust in an even stronger sense, because information about them is stored in a redundant way in the environment (say, because a Schrödinger cat has interacted with so many stray particles: photons, air molecules, dust). This information can later be acquired by an observer without further disturbing the system (we observe – however that may be interpreted – whether the cat is alive or dead by intercepting on our retina a small fraction of the light that has interacted with the cat).

What states are preferred will depend on the details of the interaction, but in many cases, interactions are characterised by potentials that are functions of position, so preferred states are often related to position. For the chiral molecule, the left- and right-handed states are indeed characterised by different spatial configurations of the atoms in the molecule. For the harmonic oscillator, one should think of the environment ‘measuring’ approximate eigenstates of position, or rather approximate joint eigenstates of position and momentum, so-called coherent states (since information about the time of flight is also recorded in the environment).

The resulting localisation can be on a very short length scale, i.e.
the characteristic length above which coherence is dispersed
(‘coherence length’) can be very short. A speck of dust of
radius \(a = 10^{-5}\)cm floating in the air will have
interference suppressed between spatially localised components with a
width of \(10^{-13}\)cm. Even more strikingly, the time scales for
this process are often minute. This coherence length is reached after
a microsecond of exposure to air, and suppression of interference on a
length scale of \(10^{-12}\)cm is achieved already after a
nanosecond.^{[5]}

Within the environmental decoherence literature, models tend to be
formulated in terms of master equations for the evolution of the
density operator describing the system. As a consequence of
decoherence this very quickly becomes (at least approximately)
diagonal in the basis of preferred states (whether discrete or
continuous). Thus, the master equation for the density operator for
the system is essentially equivalent to an evolution equation for the
*probability distribution* over the preferred states. In models
where coherent states are preferred, one can then compare this to the
Liouville evolution of probability distributions over classical phase
space, and in fact one obtains extremely good quantitative agreement.

These features are not claimed to obtain in all cases of interaction
with some environment. It is a matter of detailed physical
investigation to assess which systems exhibit which features, and how
general the lessons are that we might learn from studying specific
models. One should thus beware of common overgeneralisations. For
instance, decoherence does *not* affect only and all
‘macroscopic systems’. It is true that middle-sized
objects, say, on the Earth’s surface will be very effectively
decohered by the air in the atmosphere, and this is an excellent
example of decoherence at work. On the other hand, there are also very
good examples of decoherence-like interactions affecting microscopic
systems, such as in the interaction of \(\alpha\)-particles with the gas
in a bubble chamber. (Note, however, that this also relies on the
\(\alpha\)-particles being emitted in states that are superpositions of
strongly outward directed wavepackets.) Further, there are arguably
macroscopic systems for which interference effects are not suppressed.
For instance, it has been shown to be possible to sufficiently shield
SQUIDS (a type of superconducting devices) from decoherence for the
purpose of observing superpositions of different macroscopic currents
– contrary to what one had expected (see e.g. Leggett 1984, and
esp. 2002, Section 5.4). Anglin, Paz and Zurek (1997) examine some
less well-behaved models of environmental decoherence and provide a
useful corrective as to its scope.

### 1.2 Decoherent histories

As mentioned above, when interference is suppressed in a two-slit
experiment, the naive probability formula applies, and we can
calculate the detection probabilities at the screen by adding
probabilities for what are formally the ‘trajectories’
followed by individual electrons. The decoherent histories or
consistent histories formalism (originating with Griffiths 1984;
Omnès 1988, 1989; and Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990) takes this as
the defining feature of decoherence. (See also the entry on the
consistent histories approach to quantum mechanics.
There are some differences between the various authors, but we shall
gloss them
over.^{[6]})

In a nutshell, the formalism is as follows. Take a sequence of times
\(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n\), and take
orthogonal families of (Heisenberg-picture) projections at those
times,^{[7]}
with

One defines *histories* as time-ordered sequences of projections
at the given times, choosing one projection from each family,
respectively. Such histories form a so-called alternative and
exhaustive set of histories.

Take a state \(\varrho\). We wish to define probabilities for the set of histories. If one takes the usual probability formula based on repeated application of the Born rule, one obtains

\[\tag{2} \text{Tr}(P_{\alpha_n}(t_n)\ldots P_{\alpha_1}(t_0) \varrho P_{\alpha_1}(t_0)\ldots P_{\alpha_n}(t_n)) \]
We shall take (2) as defining ‘candidate probabilities’.
In general these probabilities exhibit interference, in the sense that
summing over them is not equivalent to omitting the intermediate
projections in (2) (‘coarse-graining’ the histories). In
the special cases in which the interference terms vanish for any pair
of distinct histories, we say that the set of histories satisfies the
*consistency* or (weak) *decoherence* condition. It is easy
to see that this condition takes the form

for any pair of distinct histories (the real part of the ‘decoherence functional’ vanishes).

If this is satisfied, we can view (2) as defining the distribution
functions for a stochastic process with the histories as trajectories.
Decoherence in the sense of this abstract formalism is thus defined
simply by the condition that the quantum probabilities for later
events can be calculated *as if* the state had collapsed at the
intermediate times. Qualitatively one recovers classical behaviour, in
the sense that the histories are assigned quantum probabilities that
nevertheless satisfy the classical formula of total probability.

A stronger form of the decoherence condition, namely the vanishing of
both the real and imaginary part of the decoherence functional, can be
used to prove theorems on the existence of (later) ‘permanent
records’ of (earlier) events in a history, which is a
generalisation of the idea of ‘environmental
monitoring’.^{[8]}
For instance, if the state \(\varrho\) is a pure state \(\lvert \psi \rangle\langle\psi\rvert\)
this (strong) decoherence condition is equivalent, for all \(n\),
to the orthogonality of the vectors

and this in turn is equivalent to the existence of a set of orthogonal
projections
\(R_{\alpha_1 \ldots\alpha_i}(t_i)\)
(for any \(t_i \le t_n\))
that extend consistently the given set of histories and are perfectly
correlated with the histories of the original set (Gell-Mann and
Hartle 1990). Note, however, that these ‘generalised
records’ need not be stored in separate degrees of freedom, such
as an environment or measuring
apparatus.^{[9]}

Various authors have taken the theory of decoherent histories as
providing an *interpretation* of quantum mechanics. For instance,
Gell-Mann and Hartle sometimes talk of decoherent histories as a
neo-Everettian approach, while Omnès appears to think of
histories along neo-Copenhagen lines (perhaps as an experimental
context creating a ‘quantum phenomenon’ that can stretch
back into the
past).^{[10]}
Griffiths (2002) has probably developed the most detailed of these
interpretational approaches (also addressing various earlier
criticisms, e.g. by Dowker and Kent (1995, 1996)). In itself, however,
the formalism is interpretationally neutral and has the particular
merit of bringing out that when interference is suppressed, one can
reidentify different components of the state over time, making this
formalism especially appropriate for discussing temporal evolution at
the level of the non-interfering components.

### 1.3 Comparison

Work on environmental decoherence and that on decoherent histories tend to be unfortunately rather separate. In comparing the two, we shall need to look both at cases that can be described by both formalisms (and ask whether or not the two descriptions are equivalent), and at cases where only the more abstract formalism of decoherent histories applies.

With regard to the latter, there are of course cases in which the
decoherence functional vanishes just by numerical coincidence. But
there are also *systematic* cases of vanishing of interference
even without environmental monitoring, namely in the presence of
‘conservation-induced’ decoherence (see e.g. Halliwell
2010). As an example, take an isolated system (say, with discrete
energy levels), and consider histories composed of projections onto
its energy states at arbitrary times. Because energy is conserved, in
the energy basis each individual component is following the
Schrödinger equation without interfering with the other
components, and the corresponding histories decohere. While some
authors in the decoherent histories literature take
conservation-induced decoherence to be a significant novelty of the
theory, it should be noted that it lacks the robustness of
environment-induced decoherence, since it lacks a mechanism that
actively suppresses interference.

With regard to the former case, environmental decoherence can be
easily described also in terms of decoherent histories. One needs to
take times that are separated by intervals larger than the decoherence
time scale, and projections onto the preferred states. Then the
environmental monitoring ensures that the resulting histories
decohere. (In case of a continuous set of preferred states, one might
need to generalise the histories formalism slightly, using
‘effects’ rather than projections; see e.g. Kent 1998.) In
this sense, environmental decoherence can be seen as a special case of
decoherent histories, but the descriptions given by the two formalisms
are somewhat different. While decoherent histories define
*multi-time* distributions over the preferred states (at discrete
times), models of environmental decoherence essentially describe
*single-time* distributions over the preferred states. While they
have the advantage of being well-defined at all times, these
single-time distributions do not explicitly describe any temporal
evolution at the level of the individual components.

In a number of models of environmental decoherence, however, it is
obvious what the dynamical behaviour should be even at the level of
individual components. Specifically, in models where the preferred
states are coherent states, comparison of the master equation for the
reduced state of the system with the evolution of a classical
Liouville distribution suggests that the trajectories of individual
components in fact approximate surprisingly well the corresponding
Newtonian trajectories. Intuitively, one can explain this by noting
that the preferred states (which are wave packets that are narrow in
position and remain so because they are also narrow in momentum) are
the states that tend to get least entangled with the environment.
Therefore they will tend to follow the Schrödinger equation more
or less undisturbed. But, as a matter of fact, narrow wave packets
follow approximately Newtonian trajectories, at least if the external
potentials in which they move are uniform enough across the width of
the packets (results of this kind are known as ‘Ehrenfest
theorems’). Thus, the resulting trajectories will be close to
Newtonian ones (on the relevant
scales).^{[11]}

This picture cannot be *exact*, because as soon as a localised
wave packet has spread enough, it will be decohered into new more
localised packets, so that intuitively one will get some kind of
‘fanning out’ of trajectories. In fact, such deviations
from Newtonian behaviour are due both to the tendency of the
individual components to spread and to the localising effect of the
interaction with the environment, which further enhances the
collective spreading of the components (because a narrowing in
position corresponds to a widening in momentum). See Rosaler (2016)
for a very nice treatment (that uses an ‘open systems’
version of Ehrenfest). A vivid example are the observed trajectories
of \(\alpha\)-particles in a cloud chamber, which are indeed extremely
close to Newtonian ones, except for additional tiny
‘kinks’.^{[12]}

In other models, e.g. when the electromagnetic field privileges the stationary states of an atom, there is no such comparison with classical equations, and the lack of multi-time distributions becomes a limitation of the model. Such limitations might be overcome by combining models of environmental decoherence with more phenomenological models of ‘continuous measurement’ (as done in a different example by Bhattacharya, Habib and Jacobs 2000). As shown by Brun (2002), the dynamics of stationary states (quantum jumps!) can be obtained from first principles in the decoherent histories formalism.

## 2. Decoherence and the Measurement Problem

One often hears the claim that decoherence solves the measurement problem of quantum mechanics (see the entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory). Physicists who work on decoherence generally know better, but it is important to see why even in the presence of decoherence phenomena, the measurement problem remains or in fact gets even worse.

The measurement problem is really a complex of problems, revolving around the question of whether one can apply quantum mechanics itself to the description of quantum measurements. One can just deny this, if one takes quantum mechanics to be a phenomenological theory. But if quantum mechanics is not the fundamental theory that explains the phenomenology of quantum measurements, the question arises how we can explain what ‘measurements’ and ‘results’ are. This is the measurement problem in the wide sense of the term.

If instead we assume that quantum mechanics is itself applicable to
the description of measurements, then the question becomes one of how
one should model a measurement within quantum theory, specifically as
some appropriate interaction between a ‘system’ and an
‘apparatus’, and of whether by so doing one can
*derive* from the unitary evolution for the total system of
system and apparatus the three phenomenological aspects of quantum
measurements: that measurements have results, that these results
obtain with some characteristic probabilities, and that depending on
the result of a measurement the state of the system is generally
transformed in a characteristic way (for this subdivision of the
problem, see Maudlin 1995). This derivation, however, appears to be
impossible.

Indeed, as pointed out already by von Neumann (1932, Section VI.3),
one cannot reproduce the correct probabilities by assuming that they
arise because we are ignorant of the exact state of a macroscopic
apparatus. But whatever the exact initial state of the apparatus, if
the system (say, an electron) is described by a superposition of two
given states, say, spin in \(x\)-direction equal \(+\frac{1}{2}\) and spin in
\(x\)-direction equal \(-\frac{1}{2}\), and we let it interact
with a measuring apparatus that couples to these states, the final
quantum state of the composite will be a sum of two components, one in
which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered) \(x\)-spin \(= +\frac{1}{2}\), and one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered)
\(x\)-spin \(= -\frac{1}{2}\).^{[13]}
This is the measurement problem in the narrow sense of the term.

### 2.1 Solving the measurement problem?

The fact that interference is typically very well suppressed between
localised states of macroscopic objects suggests that it is at least
relevant to why macroscopic objects in fact appear to us to be in
localised states. In the special case of measuring apparatuses, it
would then be relevant to why we never observe an apparatus pointing,
say, to two different results. Does modelling measurements
*including* the decoherence interactions with the environment
allow one to derive that measurements always have results? This is
somewhat part of the ‘folklore’ of decoherence, but as
pointed out by many physicists and philosophers alike (e.g. Pearle
1997; Bub 1997, Chapter 8; Adler 2003; Zeh 2003a, pp. 14–15), it
is not the case: while decoherence *does* explain why we do
*not* observe superpositions of measurement results, it does
*not* explain why we *do* observe measurement results in the
first place.

Indeed, what happens if we include decoherence in the description?
Decoherence tells us, among other things, that plenty of interactions
are taking place all the time in which differently localised states of
the apparatus registering, say, different \(x\)-spin values of an
electron couple to different states of the environment. But now, by
the same arguments as above, the *composite* of electron,
apparatus and environment will be a superposition of (i) a state
corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in
turn to the value \(+\frac{1}{2}\) for the spin, and of (ii) a state corresponding
to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in turn to the
value \(-\frac{1}{2}\) for the spin. We are thus left with the following choice,
*whether or not* we include decoherence: either the composite
system is not described by such a superposition, because the
Schrödinger equation actually breaks down and needs to be
modified, or it is described by such a superposition, but then we need
to either to supplement quantum mechanics with appropriate hidden
variables, or to give an appropriate interpretation of the
superposition.

Therefore, decoherence as such does not provide a solution to the
measurement problem, at least not unless it is combined with an
appropriate foundational approach to the theory – whether this
be one that attempts to *solve* the measurement problem, such as
Bohm, Everett or GRW; or one that attempts to *dissolve* it, such
as various versions of the Copenhagen interpretation. (See also
Wallace 2012b.)

### 2.2 Widening the measurement problem

Decoherence is clearly neither a dynamical evolution contradicting the
Schrödinger equation, nor a new supplementation or interpretation
of the theory. As we shall discuss, however, it both reveals important
dynamical effects *within* the Schrödinger evolution, and
may be *suggestive* of possible interpretational moves. As such
it has much to offer to the philosophy of quantum mechanics. At first,
however, it seems that discussion of environmental interactions should
actually exacerbate the existing problems. Intuitively, if the
environment is carrying out lots of spontaneous measurements even
without our intervention, then the measurement problem ought to apply
more widely, also to these *spontaneously* occurring
measurements.

Indeed, while it is well-known that localised states of macroscopic
objects spread very slowly with time under the free Schrödinger
evolution (i.e., if there are no interactions), the situation turns
out to be different if they are in interaction with the environment.
Although the different components that couple to the environment will
be individually incredibly localised, collectively they can have a
spread that is many orders of magnitude larger. That is, the state of
the object and the environment could be a superposition of zillions of
very well localised terms, each with slightly different positions, and
that are collectively spread over a *macroscopic distance*,
even in the case of everyday
objects.^{[14]}
Given that everyday macroscopic objects are particularly subject to
decoherence interactions, this raises the question of whether quantum
mechanics can account for the appearance of the everyday world even
apart from the measurement problem.

There is thus an even wider problem, which we can call the problem of
the *classical regime* of quantum mechanics, and quite analogous
to the measurement problem. Can quantum mechanics be applied to the
description of classical systems? We can deny it (as orthodox
approaches do), but then what are classical systems in the first
place? And if we apply quantum mechanics also to the systems that seem
to populate our everyday world, can we *derive* from quantum
mechanics the behaviour that is characteristic of such
‘classical’ systems? But such a derivation appears
impossible. To put it crudely: if everything is in interaction with
everything else, everything is generically entangled with everything
else, and that is a worse problem than measuring apparatuses being
entangled with measured systems.

## 3. The Role(s) of Decoherence in Different Approaches to Quantum Mechanics

Despite the fact that decoherence interactions extend the measurement
problem to the wider problem of the classical regime, decoherence
*is* relevant to the solution of both problems because *at the
level of components* of the wave function the quantum description
of decoherence phenomena (tantalisingly!) includes both measurement
results and other quantum phenomena (such as quantum jumps) as well as
classical behaviour. This suggests that to a large extent decoherence
provides an interpretation-neutral strategy for tackling the
measurement problem and the problem of the classical regime (a thesis
developed in greater detail by Rosaler 2016), and that the solution to
these problems lies in *combining* decoherence with the main
foundational approaches to quantum mechanics.

There are a wide range of approaches to the foundations of quantum
mechanics, however (see also the entry on
philosophical issues in quantum theory).
In some cases, one just needs to point out how an approach fits into
the overall picture suggested by decoherence, other approaches are in
fact less able to exploit the results of decoherence. (The term
‘approach’ here is more appropriate than the term
‘interpretation’, because several of these are in fact
*modifications* of or *additions* to the theory.) We
shall thus discuss in turn a number of approaches and how they relate
to decoherence. These will be: the three most widespread approaches in
the philosophy of physics (Everett, Bohm and GRW), followed by the
more ‘orthodox’ approaches of von Neumann, Heisenberg and
Bohr, and a few others.

We shall start with the Everett theory (or many-worlds interpretation) in some of its main variants. This is in fact most closely related to decoherence, since the latter can be used to naturally identify stable (if branching) structures within the universal wave function that can instantiate the multiplicity of worlds or measurement records or conscious experiences characteristic of Everettian views. Another approach that arguably makes crucial use of decoherence is pilot-wave theory (or de Broglie–Bohm theory, or Bohmian mechanics), where particle positions (or other suitable ‘beables’) are guided in their temporal evolution by the universal wave function. The branching structure of the latter will clearly have an effect on the character of the evolution of the variables it guides. Instead, spontaneous collapse theories intuitively have less to do with decoherence because they seek to suppress unwanted superpositions. Still, they are also arguably able to make use of decoherence, perhaps with some qualifications.

More traditional approaches to quantum mechanics that somehow privilege the notion of measurement or observation also may have less-than-obvious connections with decoherence and in fact fit less well with it, but we shall look at von Neumann’s, Heisenberg’s and Bohr’s views. Finally, we shall briefly mention other approaches and remark on their various relations to decoherence. These will be Nelson’s stochastic mechanics, modal interpretations, and QBism.

### 3.1 Everett theories

The Everett theory (see the entries on Everett’s relative-state interpretation and on the many-worlds interpretation) was originally developed in 1957, before the theory of decoherence (Everett 1957). As we shall see, in recent years decoherence has become a defining notion of the theory, but it arguably fits rather well also with Everett’s original formulation.

The central technical notion in Everett’s own formulation of the
theory is a *relative state*: e.g. the electron is in a state of
spin up relative to the corresponding read-out state of the apparatus
and in a state of spin down relative to the other read-out state. But Everett is interested in the emergence of
*stable structures* in the universal wavefunction in terms of
relative states. His paradigm example is that of a hydrogen atom: put
a proton and an electron in a box, both spread out over the entire
volume. After a while, the proton and electron will have relaxed. The
position of the proton will still be spread out over the entire box,
but relative to each position state of the proton, the electron wil
now be in the usual ground state of the hydrogen atom. According to
Everett, *this is what we mean by a stable atom forming.* Everett
thinks of classical systems (a cannonball!) along the same lines, and
uses these arguments as justifying the assumption that classical
systems exist, in particular ones that are complex enough to store
(and perhaps act upon) records of measurement-like interactions they
have had with their environments. Everett’s aim is to recover
the usual predictions of quantum mechanics for the memory registers of
such
‘servomechanisms’.^{[15]}^{[16]}

It should be clear that the theory of decoherence is an ideal
technical tool if (like Everett) one wishes to identify stable
structures within the universal wave function. And, indeed, some of
the main workers in the field such as Zeh (2000) and (perhaps more
guardedly) Zurek (1998) and Gell-Mann and Hartle (e.g. 1990) suggest
that decoherence is most naturally understood in terms of Everett-like
interpretations.^{[17]}
This role of decoherence has been emphasised most prominently by
Saunders (e.g. 1993) and by Wallace (e.g. 2003), and is in fact
responsible for the extraordinary renaissance of the Everett theory
within the philosophy of physics since the
mid-1990s.^{[18]}

Until then, Everett was thought to be suffering from a problem of the
‘preferred
basis’:^{[19]}
it was thought that without putting in by hand what should count as
‘worlds’, there were too many possible ways of defining
such worlds, or too many ways of defining relative states. But looking
for potentially relevant structures that are already present in the
wave function allows one to identify worlds (or other relevant
structures) without having to *postulate* the existence of some
preferred states (whether or not they form an orthonormal basis).

A *justification* for this identification can be variously
given by suggesting that a ‘world’ should be a
*temporally extended* structure and thus reidentification over
time will be a necessary condition for defining worlds; or similarly
by suggesting that in order for observers to have *evolved*
there must be *stable records* of past events (Saunders 1993,
and the unpublished Gell-Mann and Hartle 1994 – see the
Other Internet Resources
section below); or that observers must be able to access *robust
states*, preferably through the existence of redundant information
in the environment (Zurek’s ‘existential
interpretation’,
1998).^{[20]}
But the most comprehensive justification of the use of decoherence in
terms of how Everett can be understood using structures in the
universal wave function has been given by Wallace, starting with his
(2003) and given its final form in his book (2012a). Wallace places
his discussion in the wider context of an approach to emergence based
on Dennett’s notion of ‘real patterns’. Higher-level
theories are functionally *instantiated* by lower-level (more
fundamental) ones if there exist relatively simple mappings from
solutions of the lower-level theory over a certain domain to solutions
of the higher-level theory. Higher-level structures are thus reduced
to patterns at the more fundamental level, which are real in the
(quasi-)Dennettian sense that they are objectively useful in terms of
both predicting and explaining phenomena at the higher level. At the
same time they are emergent, because they could be multiply realised,
and because finding the relevant mapping may be possible only in a
top-down perspective. Everettian worlds are such real patterns,
because decoherence ensures their dynamical independence of each
other.

Alternatively to some global notion of a world, one can look at the
components of the (mixed) state of a (local) system, either from the
point of view that the different components defined by decoherence
will separately affect (different components of the state of) another
system, or from the point of view that they will separately underlie
the conscious experience (if any) of the system. The former sits well
with the relational interpretation of Everett as put forward in the
1990s by Saunders (e.g. 1993), possibly with Zurek’s (1998)
views, and arguably with Everett’s (1957) original notion of
relative
state.^{[21]}
The latter leads directly to the idea of ‘many-minds’ in
the sense used by Zeh (2000; also 2003a, p. 24). As Zeh puts it,
the ‘psycho-physical parallelism’ invoked by von Neumann
(cf. below Section 3.4.1) is to be understood as the
requirement of supervenience of the mental on the physical: only one
mental state is experienced, so there should be only one corresponding
component in the physical state. In a decohering no-collapse universe
one can instead introduce a *new* psycho-physical parallelism,
in which individual minds supervene on each non-interfering component
in the physical state. (This is different from the many-minds
interpretation of Albert and Loewer (1988), where the mental
does *not* supervene on the physical, because individual minds
have trans-temporal identity of their
own.^{[22]}) Zeh
indeed suggests that, given decoherence, this is the most natural
interpretation of quantum
mechanics.^{[23]}

### 3.2 Pilot-wave theories

‘Hidden variables’ approaches seek to explain quantum phenomena as equilibrium statistical effects arising from a deeper-level theory, rather strongly in analogy with attempts at understanding thermodynamics in terms of statistical mechanics (see the entry on philosophy of statistical mechanics). Of these, the most developed are the so-called pilot-wave theories, in particular the theory by de Broglie and Bohm (see also the entry on Bohmian mechanics). Pilot-wave theories are no-collapse formulations of quantum mechanics that assign to the wave function the role of determining the evolution of (‘piloting’, ‘guiding’) the variables characterising the system, say particle configurations, as in de Broglie’s (1928) and Bohm’s (1952) theory, or fermion number density, as in Bell’s (1987, Chapter 19) ‘beable’ quantum field theory, or again field configurations, as in various proposals for pilot-wave quantum field theories (for a recent survey, see Struyve 2011).

De Broglie’s idea was to modify classical Hamiltonian mechanics
in such a way as to make it analogous to classical wave optics, by
substituting for Hamilton and Jacobi’s action function the phase
\(S\) of a physical wave. Such a ‘wave mechanics’ of
course yields non-classical motions, but in order to understand how de
Broglie’s dynamics relates to typical quantum phenomena, we must
include Bohm’s (1952, Part II) analysis of the appearance of
collapse. In the case of measurements, Bohm argued that the wave
function evolves into a superposition of components that are and
remain separated in the total configuration space of measured system
and apparatus, so that the total configuration is
‘trapped’ inside a *single component* of the wave
function, which will guide its further evolution, as if the wave had
collapsed (‘effective’ wave function). This analysis
allows one to recover the apparent collapse upon measurement (and the
quantum probabilities are further recovered via statistical
considerations).

It is natural to extend this analysis from the case of measurements induced by an apparatus to that of ‘spontaneous measurements’ as performed by the environment in the theory of decoherence, thus applying the same strategy to recover both quantum and classical phenomena. The resulting picture is one in which de Broglie–Bohm theory, in cases of decoherence, describes the motion of particles that are trapped inside one of the extremely well localised components selected by the decoherence interaction. Thus, de Broglie–Bohm trajectories will partake of the classical motions on the level defined by decoherence (the width of the components). This use of decoherence would arguably resolve the puzzles discussed, e.g., by Holland (1996) with regard to the possibility of a ‘classical limit’ of de Broglie’s theory. One baffling problem, for instance, is that trajectories with different initial conditions cannot cross in de Broglie–Bohm theory, because the wave guides the particles by way of a first-order equation, while, as is well known, Newton’s equations are second-order and possible trajectories in Newton’s theory do cross. Now, however, the non-interfering components produced by decoherence can indeed cross, and so will the trajectories of particles trapped inside them.

If the main instances of decoherence are indeed coextensive with
instances of separation in configuration, de Broglie–Bohm theory
can thus *use* the results of decoherence relating to the
formation of classical structures, while providing an interpretation
of quantum mechanics that explains why these structures are indeed
observationally
relevant.^{[24]}
This picture is natural, but not self-evident. De Broglie–Bohm
theory and decoherence contemplate two a priori *distinct*
mechanisms connected to apparent collapse: respectively, separation of
components in configuration space and suppression of interference.
While the former obviously implies the latter, it is equally obvious
that decoherence need not imply separation in configuration space. One
can expect, however, that decoherence interactions of the form of
approximate position measurements will.

A discussion of the role of decoherence in pilot-wave theory in the
form suggested above has been given by Rosaler (2015, 2016). An
informal discussion is given in Bohm and Hiley (1993, Chapter 8),
partial results are given by Appleby
(1999),^{[25]}
and some simulations have been realised by Sanz and co-workers (e.g.
Sanz and Borondo
2009).^{[26]}
Relevant results have also been derived by Toroš, Donadi and
Bassi (2016) who show quantitative correspondence with a spontaneous
collapse model (see also Romano 2016). A rather different approach is
instead suggested by Allori (2001; see also Allori and Zanghì
2009).^{[27]}

While, as argued above, it appears plausible that decoherence might be
instrumental in recovering the classicality of pilot-wave trajectories
in the case of the non-relativistic particle theory, it is less clear
whether this strategy might work equally well in the case of field
theory. Doubts to this effect have been raised, e.g., by Saunders
(1999) and by Wallace (2008, 2012b). Essentially, these authors doubt
whether the configuration-space variables, or some coarse-grainings
thereof, are, indeed, decohering
variables.^{[28]}

### 3.3 Spontaneous collapse theories

Spontaneous collapse theories
seek to modify the Schrödinger equation, so that superpositions
of different ‘everyday’ states do not arise or are very
unstable. The best known such theory is the so-called GRW theory
(Ghirardi Rimini and Weber 1986), in which a material particle
spontaneously undergoes *localisation* in the sense that at
random times it experiences a collapse of the form used to describe
approximate position
measurements.^{[29]}
In the original model, the collapse occurs independently for each
particle (a large number of particles thus ‘triggering’
collapse much more frequently); in later models the frequency for each
particle is weighted by its mass, and the overall frequency for
collapse is thus tied to mass
density.^{[30]}

Can decoherence be put to use in GRW? Such approaches may have intuitively little to do with decoherence since they seek to suppress precisely those superpositions that are created by decoherence. Nevertheless their relation to decoherence is interesting (and, as we shall see in the next section, interestingly different from the role that decoherence at least implicitly plays in von Neumann’s collapse postulate).

Qualitatively at least, since spontaneous collapse produces
localisation, the effect appears formally similar as in some of the
models of decoherence. But we have ‘true’ collapse instead
of suppression of interference, and spontaneous collapse occurs
*without* there being any interaction between the system and
anything else. In cases in which the decoherence interaction indeed
also takes the form of approximate position measurements, the relation
betweeen spontaneous collapse and decoherence presumably boils down to
a quantitative comparison. If collapse happens faster than
decoherence, then the superposition of components relevant to
decoherence will not have time to arise, and insofar as the collapse
theory is successful in recovering classical phenomena, decoherence
plays no role in this recovery. Instead, if decoherence takes place
faster than collapse, then the collapse mechanism can find
‘ready-made’ structures onto which to truly collapse the
wave function.

Not much explicit work has been done on modelling decoherence in the
setting of spontaneous collapse theories, however. Simple comparison
of the relevant rates in models of decoherence and in spontaneous
collapse theories suggests that decoherence is generally faster (Tegmark
1993, esp. Table 2). The more detailed model by Toroš, Donadi and
Bassi (2016, esp. Section V) indicates that the effect of the collapse
is amplified through the presence of the environment, i.e. the
collapse rate is increased. The situation may be more complex when the
decoherence interaction does not approximately privilege position
(e.g. when instead it selects for currents in a SQUID), because
collapse and decoherence might actually ‘pull’ in
different
directions.^{[31]}

A further aspect of the relation between decoherence and spontaneous
collapse theories relates to the *experimental testability* of
spontaneous collapse theories. Indeed, if we assume that collapse is a
real physical process, decoherence will make it extremely difficult in
practice to detect empirically when and where exactly spontaneous
collapse takes place: on the one hand, decoherence makes it look as if
collapse has taken place already, while on the other it makes it
difficult to perform interference experiments to check whether
collapse has not yet taken place. (See the nice discussion of this
issue in Chapter 5 of Albert (1992)).

Even worse, what might be interpreted as evidence for collapse could be reinterpreted as ‘mere’ suppression of interference within an Everett or pilot-wave approach, and only those cases in which the collapse theory predicts collapse but the system is shielded from decoherence (or perhaps in which the two pull in different directions) could be used to test collapse theories experimentally.

One particularly bad scenario for experimental testability is related
to the speculation (in the context of the ‘mass density’
version) that the cause of spontaneous collapse may be connected with
gravitation. Tegmark (1993, Table 2) quotes some admittedly uncertain
estimates for the suppression of interference due to a putative
quantum gravity, but they are quantitatively very close to the rate of
destruction of interference due to the GRW collapse (at least outside
of the microscopic domain). Similar conclusions are arrived at in the
more detailed work by Kay (1998). If there is indeed such a
quantitative similarity between these possible effects, then it would
become extremely difficult to distinguish between the two. In the
presence of gravitation, any positive effect could be interpreted as
support for either collapse or decoherence. And in those cases in
which the system is effectively shielded from decoherence (say, if the
experiment is performed in free fall), then if the collapse mechanism
is indeed triggered by gravitational effects, no collapse should be
expected
either.^{[32]}

### 3.4 Orthodox approaches

#### 3.4.1 Von Neumann

In the final Chapter VI of his book (von Neumann 1932), von Neumann provided a systematic discussion of quantum mechanics with collapse upon measurement (described by what he calls an intervention of type \(\mathbf{1})\), as distinct from the Schrödinger equation (intervention of type \(\mathbf{2})\), and traditionally associated with a role for conscious observation. (The two types of interventions are introduced already in Section V.1, but von Neumann postpones their conceptual discussion to the final chapter.)

In actual fact, von Neumann starts his discussion by pointing out that
measurements are different from other physical processes both
phenomenologically and by presupposing conscious observation. But he
insists on preserving what he calls ‘psycho-physical
parallelism’, requiring that the process of observation be
describable also in purely physical terms. He thus requires that a
boundary be drawn between the ‘observed’ and the
‘observer’, but also crucially that this boundary be
movable *arbitrarily far* towards the observer end. (Note that
von Neumann stops short of at least explicitly attributing to
consciousness a causal role in collapsing the quantum state.)

Von Neumann thus needs to show that the final predictions for what we consciously observe are insensitive to how far along such a ‘measurement chain’ one chooses to continue applying intervention \(\mathbf{2}\), thus ensuring that every step in the process of observation can be described purely in physical terms. In von Neumann’s example of a measurement of temperature, we need not apply intervention \(\mathbf{1}\) to the system itself, but may apply it to the thermometer, or to the retina in the eye, or to the optic nerve, or anywhere else within the physical realm between the system and the ‘abstract ego’ of the observer. By the same token, however, we can (much more practically!) apply it also directly to the measured system.

As a preliminary, von Neumann discusses the relation between states of systems and subsystems, in particular the notion of partial trace and the biorthogonal decomposition theorem (i.e. the theorem stating that an entangled quantum state can always be written in terms of perfect correlations between two special bases for the subsystems). He also shows (as mentioned above) that the usual statistics of measurements cannot be recovered by assuming that the ‘observer’ is initially in a mixed state. He then proves that it is always possible to define an interaction Hamiltonian that will correlate perfectly the eigenstates of any given observable of an ‘observed’ system with the eigenstates of some other suitable observable of an ‘observer’, leaving as an exercise for the reader to show that predictions are independent of where one places the boundary between the two.

What the reader is supposed to do is to imagine a series of such
interactions, between the system and the thermometer, between the
thermometer and the light, between the light and the retina, etc., and
rely on the *absence of interference* at each step to argue that,
even if we describe a number of systems using intervention \(\mathbf{2}\),
they behave for the purpose of the application of intervention
\(\mathbf{1}\) *as if* they had collapsed already. In this sense, even
though he is quite clearly not thinking in terms of mechanisms for
suppressing interference, he is relying on decoherence. A fuller
treatment (e.g. a detailed model of how the thermometer interacts with
light, and some of the light is then sampled by the eye) would
resemble more closely an analysis in terms of environmental
decoherence.

#### 3.4.2 Heisenberg

Similar considerations may be made about Heisenberg’s views on quantum mechanics, even though Heisenberg’s conceptual framework is arguably rather different from von Neumann’s.

For Heisenberg, the application of quantum mechanics requires a
‘cut’ between the system to be described quantum
mechanically, and what is to be considered external to the system and
is to be treated classically. Indeed, if one were to apply quantum
mechanics to the entire universe, one would have a perfectly closed
system in which nothing would ever happen. But Heisenberg places
special emphasis on the idea that *any* special system must be
describable using quantum mechanics (indeed, that such a system is in
principle always able to display interference effects if placed under
the appropriate
conditions^{[33]}).
Self-consistency of the theory then requires the arbitrary
*movability of the cut* away from the system. (The most detailed
presentation of these ideas is in Heisenberg’s draft reply to
the
Einstein–Podolsky–Rosen argument
– see Crull and Bacciagaluppi (2011) in the
Other Internet Resources.)

If one thinks about some of the examples that Heisenberg considers to
be measurements, it is even clearer than in von Neumann’s case
that the movability of the Heisenberg cut in fact requires
decoherence. In particular, his discussion of \(\alpha\)-particle tracks
involves *successive measurements* whenever the \(\alpha\)-particle
ionises an atom in a cloud chamber. If we require that the Heisenberg
cut be movable to the level of the entire cloud chamber, we shift
directly to a Mott-type analysis of the \(\alpha\)-particle tracks.

One further aspect that is characteristic for Heisenberg and that
*prima facie* does not fit with the theory of decoherence, is
that Heisenberg does *not* take quantum states as fundamental.
For him, Schrödinger’s notion of a ‘state’ was
just a mathematical artifact that is convenient for calculating
transition probabilities between values of (measured) observables.
This can also be seen as underpinning the movability of the cut: there
is no matter of fact about when the collapse takes place, and all that
matters physically are the transition probabilities between values of
observables. This view is still compatible with decoherence, however,
as long as one sees the role of the quantum state there as again just
a convenient tool for calculating transition probabilities (say, in a
decoherent histories
framework).^{[34]}

#### 3.4.3 Bohr

Bohr shared with von Neumann and with Heisenberg the idea that that
quantum mechanics is in principle applicable to any physical system
(as shown e.g. by his willingness in the course of his debates with
Einstein to apply the uncertainty relations to parts of the
experimental apparatus *when not used as an apparatus*), while
denying that it is meaningful to apply it to the entire universe. What
is central to Bohr’s views, however, is not so much the
movability of the cut within a given experimental arrangement, but the
fact that different experimental arrangements will generally select
*complementary* aspects of the description of a physical system,
corresponding to different equally necessary classical pictures that
however cannot be combined. In this sense, for Bohr classical concepts
are conceptually prior to quantum mechanics. In a terminology
reminiscent of Kant, the quantum state is not an *anschaulich*
(‘intuitive’) representation of a quantum object, but only
a *symbolic* representation, a shorthand for the quantum
phenomena that are constituted by applying the various complementary
classical pictures. (See also the entry on the
Copenhagen interpretation.)

Thus, if we understand the theory of decoherence as pointing to how
classical concepts might in fact emerge from quantum mechanics, we see
a tension with Bohr’s basic position. According to decoherence,
even though classical concepts are autonomous in the sense of being
emergent, they are *not* fundamentally prior to quantum
mechanics. In another sense, however, decoherence does support
Bohr’s point of view, because we can see decoherence (in
particular environmental decoherence) as suggesting that there are no
*quantum phenomena* without *classical records*: it is the
suppression of interference that creates the conditions for restoring
the objectivity that gets lost through what Bohr sees as the loss of
independent reality attaching to both the system and the measuring
apparatus.^{[35]}

Both of these aspects can be seen in the reception of Everett’s
ideas by Bohr and his circle. While Everett saw his own theory as
directly opposed to von Neumann’s approach, he believed that he
could provide a justification for Bohr’s idea of
complementarity. Bohr, however, rejected the attempt to apply the
notion of quantum state to a description of the whole universe. (The
rejection of Everett’s ideas in Copenhagen in fact rather
tragically contributed to Everett leaving physics in favour of
military operations
research.^{[36]})

### 3.5 Other approaches

#### 3.5.1 Nelson’s stochastic mechanics

Nelson’s (1966, 1985) stochastic mechanics is a proposal to
recover the wave function and the Schrödinger equation as
effective elements in the description of a fundamental diffusion
process in configuration space. Insofar as the proposal is
successful,^{[37]}
it shares many features with de Broglie–Bohm theory. Indeed,
the current velocity for the particles in Nelson’s theory turns
out to be equal to the de Broglie–Bohm velocity, and the
particle distribution in Nelson’s theory is equal to that in de
Broglie–Bohm theory (in equilibrium).

It follows that many results from pilot-wave theories can be imported
into Nelson’s stochastic mechanics, including those based on
decoherence. In particular, the strategies used in pilot-wave
theories to recover the appearance of collapse and the emergence of a
classical regime can be applied also to the case of stochastic
mechanics, even though so far very little has been done along these
lines. Doing so will arguably also resolve some conceptual puzzles
specific to Nelson’s theory, such as the problem of two-time
correlations raised in Nelson
(2006).^{[38]}

#### 3.5.2 Modal interpretations

The first ‘modal interpretation’ of quantum mechanics was
proposed by Van Fraassen (1973, 1991), and was strictly an
interpretation of the theory (while other later versions came more to
resemble pilot-wave theories; see the entry on
modal interpretations).
Van Fraassen’s basic intuition was that the quantum state of a
system should be understood as describing a collection of
possibilities, represented by components in the (mixed) quantum state.
His proposal considers only decompositions at single instants, and is
agnostic about re-identification over time. Thus, it can directly
exploit only the fact that decoherence produces descriptions in terms
of classical-like states, which will count as possibilities in Van
Fraassen’s sense. This ensures ‘empirical adequacy’
of the quantum description (crucial in Van Fraassen’s
constructive empiricism).
The dynamical aspects of decoherence can be exploited indirectly, in
that single-time components will exhibit *records* of the past,
which ensure adequacy with respect to observations, but about whose
veridicity Van Fraassen remains agnostic.

A different strand of modal interpretations is loosely associated with the (distinct) views of Kochen (1985), Healey (1989) and Dieks (see e.g. Dieks and Vermaas 1998). We focus on the last of these to fix ideas. Van Fraassen’s possible decompositions are restricted to one singled out by a mathematical criterion (related to the biorthogonal decomposition theorem mentioned above in Section 3.4.1), and a dynamical picture is explicitly sought (and was later developed). In the case of an ideal (non-approximate) quantum measurement, this special decomposition coincides with that defined by the eigenstates of the measured observable and the corresponding pointer states, and the interpretation thus appears to solve the measurement problem (for this case at least). In Dieks’s original intentions, the approach was meant to provide an attractive interpretation of quantum mechanics also in the case of decoherence interactions, since at least in simple models of decoherence the same kind of decomposition singles out more or less also those states between which interference is suppressed (with a proviso about very degenerate states).

Interestingly, this approach fails when applied to other models of
decoherence, e.g., that in Joos and Zeh (1985, Section III.2). Indeed,
it appears that in more general models of decoherence the components
singled out by this version of the modal interpretation are given by
*delocalised* states, and are unrelated to the localised
components naturally privileged by decoherence (Donald 1998;
Bacciagaluppi 2000). Thus the relation with decoherence has been the
touchstone for these versions of the modal interpretation. Note that
Van Fraassen’s original interpretation is untouched by this
problem, and so are possibly some more recent modal or modal-like
interpretations by Spekkens and Sipe (2001), Bene and Dieks (2002),
and Berkovitz and Hemmo (2006).

The general idea of modal interpretations, more or less in the spirit
of Van Fraassen, can be applied more widely. For one thing, it is
cognate to some of the views expressed in the decoherent histories
literature. Decoherent histories could be seen as alternative possible
histories of the world, *one* of which is in fact actualised. A
discussion in these terms has been outlined by Hemmo (1996). Such
views are also possibly quite close to Everett’s own views, who
(maybe surprisingly for the modern reader) was not a realist but an
empiricist. A discussion of Everett with parallels to Van Fraassen is
given by Barrett (2015). One final view that has some similarities
with Van Fraassen’s and should be equally able to exploit the
results of decoherence is Rovelli’s
relational quantum mechanics
(see also Van Fraassen 2010).

#### 3.5.3 QBism

QBism (originally short for ‘quantum Bayesianism’) is a
view of quantum mechanics developed by Chris Fuchs and co-workers,
which has made current the idea that subjective probabilities à
la de Finetti can be used also in quantum mechanics (see the entry on
quantum Bayesian and pragmatist views of quantum theory).
The position is more radical than this, however, in that it does not
only claim that the quantum probabilities as defined by the quantum
state should be interpreted subjectively, but that the quantum state
*itself* is merely an expression of an agent’s degrees of
belief.^{[39]}

The role of decoherence in QBism is rather downplayed. E.g. Fuchs and Schack (2012, Section 7) see it in light of the reflection principle (concerning an agent’s beliefs about their future beliefs). Specifically, in the context of a von Neumann measurement chain, an agent can use the state of the system as decohered by some later elements of the chain as an expression of their beliefs about what their beliefs will be after the previous elements of the measurement chain have been completed. (And of course, the results of decoherence can be taken into account if an agent is considering making measurements on a system that is in interaction with some environment.)

Because they are subjectivists not just about probabilities but also about the quantum state, however, what QBists cannot exploit is the relevance of decoherence to the emergence of the entire classical world in which (human) agents have in fact evolved – unless, that is, agents are*not*treated as agents but as mere physical systems. The QBist’s predicament thus is similar to Bohr’s: decoherence clearly appears to be relevant to the emergence of the very structures that are deemed to be conceptually prior to their analysis of quantum mechanics itself.

## 4. Scope of Decoherence

We have seen in the last section that not all approaches to quantum
mechanics can make full use of decoherence. In those approaches that
can, however, decoherence is instrumental in yielding a wealth of
structures that emerge from the unitary Schrödinger (or
Heisenberg) dynamics. How far can this *programme of
decoherence* (Zeh 2003a, p. 9) be successfully developed?

### 4.1 The world according to decoherence

What seems very clear is that decoherence is crucial for the emergence of much of the macroscopic world around us, from the motions in the solar system (cf. the discussion of the motion of Saturn’s moon Hyperion – for an assessment of which see Schlosshauer (2008)) and down to the working of enzymes (which relies on their molecular shapes). The detailed picture of the world that emerges from decoherence, however, is full of subtleties.

For one thing, while the more ‘macroscopic’ a system, the more pervasive the effects of decoherence and the more complex the structures that emerge through it, this is only a rule of thumb. Not all molecules are chiral (bound ammonia groups tend to be in superpositions for instance), and there is no clear-cut criterion for when a system should count as macroscopic. Indeed, even apart from examples like superconducting systems, there might be surprising cases in which not all interference effects have been suppressed by decoherence even at the macroscopic level. A famous proposal by Hameroff and Penrose (1996) links the phenomenon of consciousness with the possibility of quantum superpositions within microtubules (and their subsequent active suppression via collapse); other authors interpret the mathematically quantum-like effects described within ‘quantum cognition’ as actual quantum effects (for both, see the entry on quantum approaches to consciousness). At present, most macroscopic quantum effects remain speculative at best, but plausible cases for the continuing relevance of quantum superpositions at the macroscopic level can be found in quantum biology, notably the studies of possible quantum effects in the navigational system of migrating birds (Cai, Guerreschi and Briegel 2010).

Closer to home, while the classical world is recognised as having been
all the time a dynamical pattern emerging from quantum mechanics, it
turns out to be less classical than we might have expected. One
interesting example is the description of classically chaotic systems.
A straightforward application of the techniques allowing one to derive
Newtonian trajectories at the level of components has been employed by
Zurek and Paz (1994) to derive *chaotic trajectories* in
quantum mechanics. The problem with the quantum description of chaotic
behaviour is that *prima facie* it should be impossible. Chaos
is characterised roughly as extreme sensitivity in the behaviour of a
system on its initial conditions, in the sense that the distance
between the trajectories arising from different initial conditions
increases exponentially in time (see the entry on
chaos).
Since the Schrödinger evolution is *unitary*, it
preserves all scalar products and all distances between quantum state
vectors. Thus, it would seem, close initial conditions lead to
trajectories that are uniformly close throughout all of time, and no
chaotic behaviour is possible (‘problem of quantum
chaos’). The crucial point that enables Zurek and Paz’s
analysis is that the relevant trajectories defined by decoherence are
at the level of *components* of the state of the system.
Unitarity is preserved because the vectors in the environment, to
which these different components are coupled, are and remain
orthogonal: how the components themselves more specifically evolve is
immaterial. Explicit modelling yields a picture of quantum chaos in
which different trajectories branch (a feature absent from classical
chaos, which is deterministic) and then indeed diverge exponentially.
(As with the crossing of trajectories in de Broglie–Bohm theory
in
Section 3.2,
one has behaviour at the level of components that is qualitatively
different from the behaviour derived for wave functions of an isolated
system.) The qualitative picture is the same as we mentioned above in
Section 1.3,
of classical trajectories that are kicked slightly off course
(trajectories with slight kinks). In the case of classically chaotic
systems, however, this has a dramatic effect. This means that systems
like the weather turn out to be ‘branching’ all the time
due to decoherence interactions, so that what we usually think of as
classical unpredictability is in fact quantum indeterminism! (For an
excellent discussion, see Wallace 2012a, Chapters 3 and 10.)

And as we have also mentioned, quantum phenomena themselves
are a feature of the world that emerges through decoherence (Zeh
2003a, p. 33; see also Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.2): not only the
stability of the outcomes of laboratory measurements, and thus
‘quantum phenomena’ in the specific sense of Bohr, but
also quantum jumps or the appearance of \(\alpha\)-particle trajectories
are a direct consequence of decoherence. The classical world yielded
by decoherence is thus one (or one of many!) *punctuated by quantum
phenomena*.

### 4.2 Further applications

Further along these lines, Zeh (2003b) argues that decoherence can
explain the appearance of *particle detections* within quantum
field theory (see the entry on
quantum field theory).
Therefore, only fields need to be included in the fundamental
concepts, and ‘particles’ are a derived concept, unlike
what might be suggested by the customary introduction of fields
through a process of ‘second quantisation’. Another
application to quantum field theory is the suggestion that the
justification for the (strict) superselection rule for charge in
quantum field theory can also be phrased in terms of decoherence. As
pointed out by Giulini, Kiefer and Zeh (1995; see also Giulini *et
al*. 1996, Section 6.4), an electric charge is surrounded by a
Coulomb field (which electrostatically is infinitely extended; the
argument can also be carried out using the retarded field, though).
States of different electric charge of a particle are thus coupled to
different, presumably orthogonal, states of its electric field. One
can consider the far-field as an effectively uncontrollable
environment that decoheres the particle (and the near-field), so that
superpositions of different charges are indeed always
suppressed.^{[40]}

Another claim about the significance of decoherence relates to time asymmetry (see e.g. the entries on time asymmetry in thermodynamics and philosophy of statistical mechanics). Insofar as apparent collapse (branching) is indeed a time-directed process, decoherence will have direct relevance to the emergence of this ‘quantum mechanical arrow of time’. This is not a straightforward issue, however, and questions familiar from the foundations of statistical mechanics arise also in the context of decoherence. Specific issues include the fact that models of environmental decoherence tend to assume very special (unentangled) initial conditions, and the fact that the definition of the decoherence functional in the histories approach is itself asymmetrical (although symmetric versions also exist). For a spectrum of discussions, see Hartle (1998, and references therein), Zeh (2001, Chapter 4), and Bacciagaluppi (2002, Section 6.1; 2007). Whether decoherence is connected to the other familiar arrows of time is a more specific question. Indeed, should decoherence allow us to recover the time-symmetric classical description of, say, particle trajectories in a gas, or does it allow us to derive time-asymmetric thermodynamic behaviour directly, by-passing classical attempts at understanding it? Note that insofar as classical systems such as gases are believed to be chaotic, the origin of the probabilities in classical statistical mechanics will arguably be quantum. For various discussions, see e.g. Zurek and Paz (1994), Hemmo and Shenker (2001), and Wallace (2012a, Chapter 9; and 2001, 2013a, 2013b in the Other Internet Resources).

Finally, it has been suggested that decoherence should be a useful
ingredient in a theory of quantum gravity (see the entry on
quantum gravity),
as discussed e.g. by Kiefer (1994). First, because a suitable
generalisation of decoherence theory to a full theory of quantum
gravity should yield suppression of interference between different
classical spacetimes (see e.g. also Giulini *et al*. 1996,
Section 4.2). Second, it is speculated that decoherence might solve
the so-called *problem of time*, which arises as a prominent
puzzle in (the ‘canonical’ approach to) quantum gravity.
This is the problem that the candidate fundamental equation (in this
approach) – the Wheeler–DeWitt equation – is an
analogue of a time-*independent* Schrödinger equation, and
does not contain time at all, so that time needs somehow to emerge. In
the context of decoherence theory, one can for instance construct toy
models in which the analogue of the Wheeler–DeWitt wave function
decomposes into non-interfering components (for a suitable sub-system)
each satisfying a time-*dependent* Schrödinger equation,
so that decoherence appears in fact as the source of time. An
accessible introduction to and philosophical discussion of such models
is given by Ridderbos (1999), with references to the original papers.
See also the more recent model by Halliwell and Thorwart
(2002).^{[41]}

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## Academic Tools

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## Other Internet Resources

- Bacciagaluppi, G. (Utrecht University), 2013, ‘Review of:
*The Everett Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics. Collected Works 1955–1980 with Commentary*. Hugh Everett III, edited by Jeffrey A. Barrett & Peter Byrne. Princeton: Princeton University Press (xii+389 pp.)’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive. - Crull, E. (City College, New York), and Bacciagaluppi, G. (Utrecht University), 2011, ‘Translation of W. Heisenberg: “Ist eine deterministische Ergänzung der Quantenmechanik möglich?”’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Diósi, L. (Wigner Centre, Budapest) 1994, ‘Critique of Weakly Decohering and Linearly Positive Histories’, available online in the arXiv.org e-Print archive.
- Gell-Mann, M. (deceased), and Hartle, J. B. (Santa Fe Institute), 1994, ‘Equivalent Sets of Histories and Multiple Quasiclassical Realms’, available online in the arXiv.org e-Print archive.
- Wallace, D. (University of Pittsburgh), 2001, ‘Implications of Quantum Theory in the Foundations of Statistical Mechanics’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Wallace, D. (University of Pittsburgh), 2013a, ‘Probability in Physics: Stochastic, Statistical, Quantum’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Wallace, D. (University of Pittsburgh), 2013b, ‘Inferential vs. Dynamical Conceptions of Physics’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Decoherence Website, maintained by Erich Joos. This is a site with information, references and further links to people and institutes working on decoherence, especially in Germany and the rest of Europe.
- Quantum Mechanics on the Large Scale, maintained by Philip Stamp (University of British Columbia). This page has links to the available talks from the Vancouver workshop mentioned in footnote 1; see especially the papers by Tony Leggett and by Philip Stamp.
- A Many-Minds Interpretation Of Quantum Theory, maintained by Matthew Donald (University of Cambridge). This page contains details of Matthew Donald’s many-minds interpretation, as well as discussions of some of the books and papers quoted above (and others of interest). Follow also the link to the ‘Frequently Asked Questions’, some of which contain useful discussion of decoherence.
- The arXiv.org e-Print archive, formerly the Los Alamos archive. This is the main physics preprint archive.
- The Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive. This is the main philosophy of science preprint archive.

### Acknowledgments

I wish to think many people discussions with whom have shaped my understanding of decoherence over the years, in particular Marcus Appleby, Elise Crull, Matthew Donald, Beatrice Filkin, Meir Hemmo, Wayne Myrvold, Josh Rosaler, Simon Saunders, Max Schlosshauer, David Wallace, and Wojtek Zurek. For more recent discussions, correspondence and suggestions relating to this article I wish to thank Valia Allori, Maaneli Derakhshani, Bob Griffiths, Ronnie Hermens, Peter Holland, Martin Jones, Brian Josephson, Tony Leggett, Hans Primas, Alberto Rimini, Philip Stamp, and Bill Unruh. I also gratefully acknowledge my debt to Steve Savitt and Philip Stamp for an invitation to talk at the University of British Columbia, to Claudius Gros for an invitation to talk at the University of the Saarland, and for the opportunities for discussion arising from those talks. Finally I wish to thank the following: the referee for this entry, David Wallace, for his clear and constructive commentary; my former subject editor, John Norton, who corresponded with me extensively over a previous version of part of the material and whose suggestions I took to heart; my current subject editor, Wayne Myrvold; our editor-in-chief, Ed Zalta, and all his staff, for their saintly patience; and my late and lamented friend, Rob Clifton, who invited me to write on this topic in the first place.