Primary and Secondary Qualities in Early Modern Philosophy

First published Wed Jun 1, 2022

Many philosophers maintain there is a significant difference between primary and secondary qualities but disagree about its foundation. It may be plausible that we perceive things as having a small number of basic qualities which are determinates or degrees of the following: size, figure, extension, duration, motion, position, color, taste, odor, sound, heat, coldness, and tactual qualities such as hardness, softness, roughness and smoothness. The first six (to which solidity and number are sometimes added) are called “primary”; roughly speaking, they are said to be real objective properties of objects and to be distinctly known. The remaining, called “secondary”, are said to be in some way—metaphysically, epistemically, linguistically—derivative, less than fully real, or otherwise metaphysically feeble; or misleading, subjective, ambiguous, or otherwise not perspicuous. The lists map the extension of the division and the doctrine explains its basis.

The distinction presupposes that things we perceive by our senses are mind-independent material objects, or substances, which possess qualities and quantities, have relations, and take part in events. Bases for the distinction come from the age-old attempt to learn what there is in the natural world, manage it for our purposes, and attain theoretical explanatory knowledge about it. They are located in the material and structural aspects of the universe, the psychology of sense perception, and their intersection. John Locke’s famous distinction has notably different variants in the seventeenth century and all of them are disputed. Other versions are advanced and debated through the eighteenth century. Although the distinction ceases to be of much interest during the heyday of idealism, it attracts attention during the mid to late twentieth century. More recently, questions about color that can be traced to the seventeenth century have come to the fore. (See M. Wilson 1992 on the early modern inheritance of twentieth century debates. See also the entries on color, auditory perception, and touch.)

Instead of trying to establish a canonical doctrine of primary and secondary qualities, it is better to recognize the close temporal and conceptual connection between seventeenth century variants of the distinction and the innovative non-Aristotelian theories of matter and sense perception inspired by Kepler’s amendments to the Copernican astronomy. This article considers the seventeenth and eighteenth century versions which have most influenced recent analytic philosophy. There are two reasons for this restriction. First, the historical debates are nuanced and subject to several interpretations; comparison helps to focus the questions they are meant to answer. Second, more recent work on particular secondary qualities is heavily influenced by diverse philosophical movements and changing views of the relation between philosophy and the sciences which cannot be adequately considered here (see Ross 2015). This entry uses the following notational conventions: “PQ” stands for “primary quality”; “SQ”, for “secondary quality”; additional designations are formed in obvious ways. The name of one PQ or SQ is often used to indicate all qualities of the same type, e.g., “red, etc”. indicates red and the other SQs.)

1. Ancient Antecedents

It is not uncommon for historians to say seventeenth century advocates of the distinction of P/SQs take it from the ancient Greek atomists, Leucippus and Democritus. Evidence of this comes from fragments of Democritus’ works, such as:

By convention sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention colours; but in reality atoms and void. (Taylor 1999: 9)

C. C. W. Taylor (1999: 175–9) is among scholars who hold that this corresponds to the modern distinction of P/SQs, but the attribution is problematic. It is true, that the properties of atoms are sharply divided from things that are by convention, including some SQs, but the problem is that the range of things by convention is unspecified in the fragments. Other scholars cite ancient testimony to the effect that it is meant to include everything apprehended by sense perception (Lee 2011: 21–8; Pasnau 2007). If so, the ancient distinction does not map onto a division between SQs and PQs that are sensible. Because the textual context of the fragments is now unknown and ancient testimony about it is conflicting, a definitive interpretation is unlikely (Pasnau 2007).

The Atomists’ theory is, however, in the spirit of an important strain of the seventeenth century division of qualities. The ancients hold that reality is grasped solely by intellect. They accept two of Parmenides’ intelligibility constraints on change—that one thing cannot come from many things and many cannot come from one; they aim to construct a metaphysical system in which change under these constraints is possible and the experience of non-conforming change is explained (Taylor 1999: 160–4). Anaxagoras and Empedocles share a strategy for explaining a sort of change under these constraints: basic things, conceived either as the four elements or as stuffs and qualities, do not begin or cease to exist strictly speaking; but states or relations of substances, conceived as either mixtures or separations, have a qualified, or relative, being. Leucippus and Democritus take a somewhat similar line: atoms moving in the void always exist; they are indivisible, and never fuse along a common boundary, but bitter, sweet and the like are aggregates of atoms that come to be by convention, or relatively (Taylor 1999: 160–175). Atoms and the void are an a priori solution to a problem of intelligibility. Some later advocates of the P/SQ distinction, e.g., Galileo and Descartes, hold that intellect provides a priori knowledge of the essences of things. But although variants of the later distinction offer to explain the potentiality inherent in matter and the means by which change is regulated, the issues are not presented as a Parmenidian challenge to intelligibility. The target is rather the Aristotelian view that matter is potentiality and the bifurcated theory of accidental and substantial change. The influence of Parmenides on metaphysics in the modern era is complex, but advocates of the doctrine of P/SQs as a group show little of it beyond adherence to ex nihilo nihil fit. Although atomism is prevalent in the early seventeenth century, it is often coupled with the Aristotelian theory of elements (Kargon 1964). LoLordo (2011) argues that Gassendi’s adaptation of Epicurean atomism makes no distinction between PQs and SQs.

2. Galileo Galilei

2.1 The first known argument for a version of the P/SQ distinction

To the best of our knowledge, the doctrine of qualities is first stated by Galileo Galilei. A paradigm-destroying natural philosopher for whom “the book of nature is written in the language of mathematics” (Galileo 1623 [2008: 179–83]; Crombie 1972). Galileo argues for the distinction in a section of The Assayer (1623). Having been asked to explain why he thinks it may be possible that motion is the cause of heat, he produces a non-technical sample of his distinctive method of answering questions that arise in natural philosophy. The general method relies on intellect, thought experiments, hypotheses about things that are quantifiable, and sense perception of measurements that may testify to their reality (Crombie 1972: 72–4, 81–7; Piccolino and Wade 2008, passim)). The argument goes as follows. We cannot conceive a corporeal substance without a determinate figure, size, position, motion/rest, and number; nor can we imagine bodies separated from any of these attributes. Galileo calls them “primary affections” of matter. By contrast, it is not necessary to conceive that a body have a color, taste, aroma, or make a sound; if we lacked senses, intellect and imagination might never think of them.

Thus, from the point of view of the subject in which they seem to inhere [these things] are nothing but empty names, rather they inhere only in the sensitive body … [I]f one removes the animal, then all these qualities are … annihilated. (Galileo 1623 [2008: 185])

Primary affections are essential to bodies; taste, smells, etc. are inessential to bodies and sensory faculties are essential to tastes, and the rest; so in the absence of sensory systems, there are no tastes, and the like.

The argument is elaborated by means of a thought experiment. Suppose you run a hand over a marble statue and over the body of a human being. The hand does nothing but touch and move over the two bodies, but when the animate body is touched, it feels sensations which vary depending on where it is touched; e.g., a tickling sensation occurs when the hand makes contact with the sole of a foot or pit of an arm. The argument continues: “The sensation is entirely ours and not at all in the hand … [I]t would be a great error” to say the hand has a property in addition to motion and touching, namely, “the power to tickle”. Thr arumgent continues: a tickle sensation is entirely within the being who feels it; tickles plainly have no reality unless they are felt; so if the sentient being is removed, the tickle is nothing but an empty name; so it is possible that tastes, etc. “have a similar and no greater reality” (Galileo 1623 [2008: 185–6]).

2.2 A hypothesis about the corporeal causes of tastes, etc.

The basic hypothesis is that bodies need nothing other than determinate sizes, figures, etc. in order to arouse tastes, etc. in beings that have sensitive organs. Without ears, tongues, and skin around armpits, there are no sounds, tastes, or tickles but only various shapes, motions, etc.[1] In particular, some bodies are constantly divided into tiny particles; some of them rise, enter the nasal passages and start a process that ends with odors; others fall onto the surface of the tongue, mix with saliva and eventually produce tastes; tiny vibrations that pervade the air make contact with the ear drums which connect with other organs that produce sounds; finally, there is a particular sort of igneous particle found in fire which moves through pores of the body and makes us warm. Many observations are brought in support of these hypotheses (Galileo 1623 [2003: 188–9]). Thought experiments establish the possibility of this account. Two features of the hypothesis are particularly important. First, it sketches a program of explanation for natural philosophy in which the distinction of PQs and SQs has an essential part (Crombie 1972: 80–7). Second, it entails that SQs are not in bodies that cause them but internal to sentient bodies—effects of the mechanical affections of insensient bodies on the sensory organs of living bodies. Piccolino and Wade (2008: 1218–19, 1319–21) portray Galileo as advocating the sort of explanatory program urged later by Hermann Helmholtz and presently pursued in neuro-psychology. (On Helmholtz’ version of the P/SQ distinction, see Hatfield 2011.)

2.3 A non-Aristotelian account of the cognitive function of the senses

The mistake of supposing tastes, etc. are qualities that inhere in inanimate bodies is charged not to our senses, but to the use of language. It seems we give names to the primary affections which we know to exist in bodies and we give names to the sensations of our SQs as well. This makes us believe the names of the latter apply to bodies just as the names of the former do. According to Galileo, the names of SQs signify nothing when used in this way. This poses a challenge to the traditional Aristotelian scholastic theory of sense perception. According to Aristotle, the nature of sentient beings assures that they acquire perceptual knowledge in an environment such as ours. Some care is called for, but no special effort is generally needed. On Galileo’s theory, many sense perceptions are caused by insensible particles whose properties are by no means easy to know. When a fire makes us warm, it is easy to feel the warmth but the rapid motion of particles that causes it has to be discovered by rigorous-s use of an effective method of natural philosophical inquiry.

Galileo objects specifically to two principles of a contemporary version of the Aristotelian stance: that mathematics is only accidentally applicable to material things and the doctrine of proper and common sensibles. A proper sensible is an object that is directly perceived by only one sense—color, by sight alone; sound, by hearing, etc. The faculty and its proper object are said to be fitted to each other so that use of that faculty seldom results in misperception of the quality special to it. By contrast, the common sensibles—size. figure, motion/rest—are directly perceived by more than one sense; as a result, we are supposedly more liable to mistakes about them. Galileo’s objection reconceives the condition that makes perception of a body veridical or deceptive. (Crombie 1972: 74–9; Piccolino & Wade 2008: 1312–15) He argues that the appearance of a body corresponds to the properties of the body that are its cause;. It is not up to . philosophy to say how various apearances are related to the affections of the objects we perceive; rather it requires the technical methods of natural philosophy. For example, to avoid being deceived by the broken visual appearance of an oar half in water, we need to find the physical cause of the appearance. This will show that the visual appearance is correct. According to Galileo’s epistemology, we should assume appearances do not exhibit the properties of their causes but rather something from which we may be able to figure them out.

3. René Descartes

3.1 Roots of the distinction

Descartes formulates no distinction of P/SQs but familiar doctrines to which he is committed point to one. He maintains that his mechanist theory of matter and motion can explain everything in the corporeal world (CSM 1.285; AT 8.323).[2] He holds that bodies and minds are substances each of which can exist independently of the other (CSM 2.54; AT 7.78). According to him, knowledge of continuous extension, and the sizes, figures, positions, and local motions of its parts, is innate in the human intellect, or mind (CSM 2.44; AT 7.63). By contrast, we know SQs only with aid of the body (CSM 1.217; AT 8.33–4). The Cartesian P/SQ distinction implicit in these doctrines has three roots:

  • the theory of ideas which is central to Descartes’ epistemology and psychology,
  • the unity of a finite substance in general,
  • the composite unity of a human being. Brief explanations follow.

3.1.1 Ideas

In Meditations an idea is said to be a mental act that is “like an image” (CSM 2.25; AT 7.37). Most scholars take this to mean that ideas are presentational and intentional: we are acquainted with them and they direct thought to something else (M. Wilson 1978: 102–103; 1992: 69–83;). To apprehend anything at all (actual or possible) is to have an idea of it (CSM 2.2.25–26; AT 7.37). Meditations explicates intentionality in terms of objective being: the idea of the sun is the sun “existing in the intellect in the way its objects are normally there” (CSM 2.75 and 27–8; AT 7.103 and 40; CSM 1.198, note 1). As Descartes also puts it, ideas represent things (e.g., CSM 2.28; AT 7.40): an idea represents an object that is F just in case it represents the object as F (CSM 2.145–6, 163; AT 7.207, 234). The representation may be sensory or intellectual (CSM 2.126, 127–8; AT 7.179, 181): its cognitive value may range from clear and distinct to confused or obscure (e.g., CSM 2.29–30; AT 7.43; CSM 1.207, 317; AT 8.22–3, 33–34).

3.1.2 The substance-quality (mode) relation

Descartes argues, in general: if a particular quality or affection exists, it must subsist or reside in a substance that makes it exist (CSM 2.114; AT 7.61; CSM 1.210; AT 8.25). The substance must have the capacity to enable this particular quality to exist and any other quality in a range in which this one is included (CSM 2.124; AT 7.76) The range is determined by its principal attribute, or essence: all qualities (or modes) of a substance are referred to its essence and unintelligible without it (CSM 1.210; AT 7.25; CSM 2.54; AT 7.78). So the essence of a substance and all the qualities that do or can exist in it have reciprocal relations of conceptual dependence (Bolton 2013: 65–6). Scholars characterize the relation in several ways—as that between an occult quality and its known effects (Malebranche 1674–75 [1980: 622]), the atomic structure of gold and its sensible and laboratory properties (Rozemond 1998: 92; Beck 1965: 118–22), an absolute and its limits (Downing 2011: 122–25). But Secada (2000: 190–94) cites a letter in which Descartes speaks of the relation as an instance of the more general relation between two concrete things one of which is determined by the other (To Mersenne for Hobbes, 21 April 1641, CSM 3.178–9; AT 3.355) Secada (also Bolton 2013) concludes the relation should be understood as that between a highest order determinable and its determinates.

3.1.3 The union of mind and body

In addition to unities of nature (substances), Descartes recognizes “unities of composition”, for instance, the flesh and bones of the same animal-machine (CSM 2.285, 157; AT 7.423, 222). Other examples are a mouse, a human body and a human being. Such things are ens per se: although they have parts that can exist outside them, the parts are then regarded as incomplete. So the mind/body unity is robust enough to tag a mind separated from its body as incomplete (To Regius, December 1641; CSM 3.200; AT 3.461). Brown and Normore (2019: 52–60) contend that things with this status have a nature of the type Descartes calls “true and immutable” (hereafter “TIN”). Anything with a TIN has ground in reality indicated by its being the subject of demonstrable truths; corporeal nature, geometrical entities and God are mentioned in Meditation 5 (CSM 2.44–5; AT 7.63–5) and it is said to be true of Cartesian animals (Conversation with Burman, 16 April 1648; CSM 3.143–4; AT 5.160). The bi-conditional test for things with a TIN is having a property that arises from the conjunction of all its ingredients (CSM 2.84; AT 7.118; Brown & Normore 2019: 55–60). That is, the composite possesses some property that does not already belong to one of its parts, as in the case of Pegasus. For instance, a triangle inscribed in a square has a property the triangle does not have on its own, namely, having an area half that of the square that superscribes it (CSM 2.83–4; AT 7.117–18). Descartes maintains that the union of mind and body has a TIN which would, if known, account for a human being’s having appetites, emotions, and sensations of colors, etc. (CSM 1.208–9; AT 8.23).

3.2 Issues

Four issues about Descartes’ P/SQ distinction are prominent in recent secondary literature:

  • How he purports to show that SQs as we sense them do not inhere in bodies
  • The metaphysical status of SQs
  • Whether ideas of SQs are mere (non-intentional) presentations or also intentional and if the latter, whether their content is internal or external
  • How the intellect affects sense perception of PQs by comparison with SQs.

3.2.1 An argument that bodies do not resemble SQs as we perceive them

Scholars have difficulty finding an argument purporting to show that heat, etc. as we sense it does not inhere in bodies. Some suggest that his best argument is the intelligibility, simplicity, and explanatory adequacy of his mechanist theory (CSM 1.284–86, 288; AT 7.121–123, 326). But it is conclusive only in conjunction with the norm expressed by Ockham’s razor. (Downing 2011: 113–14). Another problem is that Descartes writes that his mechanist physics explains the nature of light, heat, etc. because he presupposes that they are “only in our senses… and not in the objects we perceive by sense” (Letter to Chanut,26 Feb 1649; CSM 3.369; AT 5.291–2). It is doubtful Descartes would advance the explanatory adequacy argument unless he had an independent argument for the presupposition (for a different analysis, see Downing 2011: 114).

It might seem Meditations offers such an argument. It states that our most common mistake about ideas in general consists in judging that they resemble things outside us (CSM 2.26; AT 7.37). Some scholars take this to be an attack on Aristotelian realism, but the argument is elusive. The problem is that the context indicates that assuming resemblance is an epistemic mistake but not necessarily a factual one (e.g., CSM 2.57; AT 7.82–3). That is, making the assumption is assenting to something we have no reason to think is true; but it may nevertheless be true. Perceptual realism about SQs tacitly goes by the board, but the opponent in view is the epistemic stance of those who formed the habit of implicitly relying on their senses as children and never reflected on its value for acquiring true beliefs. (For this interpretation of Descartes’ method of doubt, see Patterson 2007.)

Lisa Downing (2011: 115–17) argues that the first part of Principles of Philosophy (hereafter Principles), articles 66–71 provides basis for an a priori argument which Descartes could have had in mind but never stated. The articles explain what we clearly and distinctly perceive about color, what we might mistakenly judge about it, and what we can judge about its relation to bodies without error. According to Principles 1.71, sensations of heat, color, etc. “do not represent anything located outside our thought” (CSM 1.219; AT 8.35) Based on this, Downing (2011: 118–28) constructs a valid argument to show ideas of SQs as we sense them cannot exit in a substance with the principle attribute extension. But she argues, it requires the principle attribute of a body to be absolute geometrical extension and modes to be its limits. She finds this too restrictive to be tenable because it excludes modes such as force and inertia and it is a model of the attribute-mode relation that cannot be applied to substances with the principal attribute thought.

3.2.2 The metaphysical status of SQs

A few scholars maintain that heat, e.g., is nothing other than a sensation on the strength of Principles 1.70–71 (Vinci 1998: 199–200; MacKenzie 1990: 114–16). However, the scientific writings offer mechanist accounts of light and color as specific sorts of motions of insensible particles and suggest other SQs, too, are micro physical configurations (e.g., Optics, CSM 1.153, 155–6; AT 8.84–5, 88). Cottingham (1990: 237–38) among others cites a text that may seem to identify sensible qualities with causal dispositions (CSM 1.285; AT 8.323),[3] but Wolf-Devine (1993: 46–8) convincingly argues that the passage refers to mechanist microstructures. Other commentators maintain that Descartes either vacillates between mental and physical views of color or has an inconsistent theory (M. Wilson 1992: 228, 234; Wolf-Devine 1993: 46–8). However several more charitable interpretations accommodate both. According to Atherton (2004), Descartes’ opposition to certain scholastic doctrines motivates a bifurcated theory of color consisting of a mechanist physiological account paired with a mentalist psychological account of sense perception. She finds nothing that unites the parts of an essentially dualist theory of perception. According to Nolan (2011a), Descartes is a nominalist about SQs: they are abstractions from experience that have no de re counterparts. They are names we use to refer to both certain ideas and certain bodily modes. However, it seems the status of SQs should be understood as that of entities that emerge in the mind-body union in an environment such as ours (see Alanen 2005: 147–164; also Brown & Normore [2019: 185–6] who argue that the union is a subject of predicates without mentioning SQs). This view of SQs is explicit in Principles, Part I (CSM 1.208–09; AT 8.22–23).

3.2.3 The intentionality of ideas of SQs

Descartes repeatedly says we mistakenly suppose the things represented by ideas of SQs resemble the ideas. Is it possible for ideas to represent things and yet be misleading about what they are? The issue comes to a head in remarks about “materially false” ideas in Mediation 3. This is a non-judgmental sort of falsity “that occurs in ideas when they represent non-things as things”; for instance, ideas of heat and cold do not enable us to know whether one is the privation of the other, both are privative, or both are positive. Because there cannot be an idea that is not intentional, or of something, the idea that represents it as something positive should be called false (CSM 2.30; AT.7, 43–44). Arnauld objects that on Descartes’ theory, X cannot exist objectively in the mind as something other than it is; were the idea of X materially false, it would not be an idea of X (CSM 2.145–46; AT 7.206–07). Three points in Descartes’ reply are reasonably clear. First, material falsity does not have to do with the relation between an idea and its object but with the mental operation that makes the object appear in a manner that does not enable us to tell whether its object is privative or positive (CSM 2.162–3; AT 7.232). Second, ideas of SQs are confused and obscure; they involve sensations which are often wrongly taken to be the objects the ideas represent. Third, Descartes agrees with Arnauld: the idea of cold, e.g., cannot represent cold as something it is not (CSM 2.164; AT 7.234; for a different interpretation, see M. Wilson 1978: 114–16). The upshot is that ideas of color etc. are confused. They provide opportunity for error but are not erroneous representations (Hatfield 2011: 143–148). Scholars disagree about how to interpret these texts in an internally consistent way. There are two basic positions:

  • Colors, etc. are non-intentional sensations;
  • Ideas of color, etc. are intentional but confused or obscure.
SQs are non-intentional sensations

Several scholars urge that in Descartes’ considered opinion, SQs are sensations without representative content (M. Wilson 1978: 114–16; Vinci 1998: 196–98, 199–200; MacKenzie 1990). This is based on Principles 1.68 and 70, which say that colors, etc, are clearly known when they are regarded merely as sensations and we make no error if we judge there is something in bodies whose nature we do not know which causes the sensations in us. But these texts would mark a change of mind if they implied these ideas represent nothing but what we clearly know. The scholars mentioned in the next section are among those who are not persuaded that Descartes abandons the view of ideas of SQs in Meditation 3 and the exchange with Arnauld.

Ideas of SQs are intentional and confused

There are two things advocates of this view have to explain: what the intentional objects of these ideas are and what is the source of the confusion that stops short of misrepresentation. The literature offers several carefully developed accounts but brief descriptions will have to suffice here.

  • SQ ideas do not intrinsically or presentationally represent modifications of bodies but some texts imply they extrinsically represent things in our environment such as their causes (M. Wilson 1990 [1999]; Schmaltz 1992). See De Rosa (2010: 69–93) for critical discussion.
  • Simmons (2001) maintains ideas of SQs have teleo-semantic content. They represent things in the external world that are beneficial or harmful to the perceiver. This is critically discussed by Detlefsen (2013a) and De Rosa (2010).
  • De Rosa (2010: 117–61) argues that the idea of color has two components: a manifest phenomenal presentation caused by interaction between parts of the body and the mind, and a latent clear and distinct idea of the external corporeal cause of the idea. The idea misrepresents the entity it represents because the representative aspect is latent. See Paul and Morrison (2014) for critical discussion.
  • Lilli Alanen (2003: 147–164) offers a comprehensive, complex and subtle account of materially false ideas. Two features of this interpretation broadly considered can be mentioned here. Sensory ideas in general represent elements and events comprised in the mind/body union and do so by virtue of the complex relation that unites the mind and body. To this extent, they are intrinsically representative and ineliminably confused because the union is unintelligible to us. In addition, sensory ideas are signs of the external objects that cause them, informing us of their existence, changes, and effects on us. In this capacity, they have extrinsic content which is, again, incomprehensible to us. A second point is that sensory ideas comprise sensations and unnoticed judgments which accrue to them in childhood; some of these judgments ascribe qualities to objects they do not have. In this respect, ideas of SQs, and perhaps some PQs, are materially false.
  • Gary Hatfield (2013: 138–148) offers another comprehensive and subtle account. Here we can sketch three points. Ideas of colors, etc. are intrinsically representational; they represent by virtue of a similitude that is not phenomenally recognizable but understood with the aid of metaphysics and natural philosophy. They manifestly represent external objects as having colors, being red, e.g., and they obscurely represent micro-structural modes of bodies. So they accord with the account of material falsity in the Fourth Replies, i.e., they give opportunity for false belief and still represent their objects as they are. This comports well with relevant texts but the supposed similitude between SQs as we perceive them and configurations of insensible particles in motion may strain credulity.

3.3 Intellect’s involvement in sense perception of PQs by comparison with SQs

A related issue is whether intellect is involved in perceptual knowledge of PQs but not in perception of SQs, There are two main positions:

  1. Sense perception of secondary qualities involves only the sensory faculties whereas perception of PQs deploys knowledge provided by intellect (M. Wilson 1993 [1999: 26–40]; Maull 1980: 31 and 33);
  2. Both intellect and the perceptual faculty have important parts in producing perception of PQs and SQs (Simmons 2003; Ortín Nadal 2019).

3.3.1 Perceptual knowledge is bifurcated

Advocates of the first position point to several texts:

  • the proof that in general, sensory ideas are caused by a substance that has all the qualities we clearly and distinctly perceive to exist in corporeal substance; clear and distinct perception is intellectual (CSM 2.55; AT 7.80; CSM 1.223; AT 8.40–41);
  • the pragmatic non-theoretical purpose of sense perception (CSM 2.57; AT 7.82–3; CSM 1.224;AT 8.42);
  • the theory that we see distance by a natural geometry (Optics, CSM 1.170; AT 6.137–80);
  • the doctrine that we know PQs and SQs of objects in quite different ways: “our knowledge of what it is for an object to have a shape is more clear than our knowledge of what it is for it be coloured” (CSM 1.18–9; AT 8.34).

In opposition, critics note that most of these passages concern features of sense perception in general and the one exception is a passage that does not apply to sensory knowledge at all.

  • Perception of the particular figures of particular things is less certain than our knowledge that figures, etc. exist in the causes of our sensory ideas in general (CSM 2.27, 55, 57; AT 7.39, 80, 83); we make mistakes about the size and distance of the sun.
  • Sense perception in general has a pragmatic purpose (CSM 2.57; AT 7.82–3).
  • Our initial visual ideas of distance are, like our initial ideas of all sensible qualities, direct effects of motions in and around the pineal gland (Optics, CSM 1.167; AT 6.130; Hatfield 2015).
  • The greater clarity of our knowledge of PQs is not manifested by sense perception but by reflection on what we know a priori about the nature of corporeal substance and its modes (Ortín Nadal 2019: 1129–31).

3.3.2 Perceptual knowledge is unified

In support of the second position, Simmons (2003) constructs an argument based on the three grades of sensory response defined in Sixth Replies (CSM 2.294–96; AT 7.437–39) and physiological and psychological accounts,in Optics and Treatise on Man, of the operations that form experience in early childhood. In brief: the first grade of sensory involvement starts with impingement of particles on the organs of sense and includes all their physiological effects; the second grade comprises the immediate effects produced in the mind as a result of its union with a body provided with sensory organs; the third grade, which is the first to involve intellect, comprises all the “judgments about things outside us we are accustomed to making in childhood” (CSM 2.295; AT 7.437). Simmons argues that the early scientific works ascribe two sorts of judgments to intellect—those that falsely project resemblance and those that construct the appearances of sensible things. She finds that the latter are associative cognitive acts that connect sensations of qualities with images drawn from memory (Simmons 2003: 554; on images and the intellect, see Letter to Mersenne, July 1641, CSM 3.186; AT 3.395). The model of clear and distinct perception promoted in Descartes’ later philosophical works hardly fits the construction of images and ill-considered judgments that engage the intellect of a young child (on the diversity of intellectual operations, see Simmons (2003: 565–75, 77–8).[4] The upshot is that sense perception of the world features PQs and SQs and its purpose is practical rather than scientific (CSM 2.57–8; AT 7.83; CSM 1.223–4; AT 8.41–42.) Once we attain clear and distinct a priori perception of the essence and properties of bodies, we are unable to conceive how a body could resemble a sensory presentation of color, etc.

According to Ortín Nadal (2019: 1129–1132), the fundamental difference between qualities of the two types is not that ideas of SQs provide more material for error; in perception, specific ideas of both sorts can misrepresent particular physical causes. They differ with regard to the mistakes we can make about their causes. To judge that a body resembles the sensation of a color is to error about the nature of matter, whereas to make an error about the determinate PQ of a particular object is still to know that it has the determinable quality it comes under.

4. Robert Boyle

Robert Boyle’s variant belongs more to philosophy of science than theory of perception. It is integral to the corpuscular theory (hereafter “CT”), the mechanist natural philosophy he promotes. He is an avid experimentalist and prolific author of works on ethics, theology, natural religion, and both alchemical and mechanist natural philosophy (Stewart 1991: xi–xii, xv–xvi; Anstey 2000: 9). Boyle strongly opposes any intrusion of metaphysical and logical entities in natural philosophy (Boyle 1666 [1991: 3, 8, 22, 28]; Stewart 1991: xiii). The targets are Suarez’s real qualities and scholastic accidental and substantial forms. The former, as Boyle understands them, are entities that naturally inhere in material substance but have independent causal powers (see Boyle 1666 [1991: 21–2]). Boyle avoids controversial metaphysical doctrines that divide mechanists, such as Epicurean atomism, innate motion, Cartesian essences and the endless actual separation of parts of bodies (1666 [1991: 7–8]). According to CT, observable bodies are composed of very small relatively stable corpuscles, composed of minima naturales with tightly cohering parts rarely separated in nature (Anstey 2000: 10–11, 43–4).

Boyle’s best known work in natural philosophy is The Origin of Forms and Qualities According to the Corpuscular Philosophy (1666) (hereafter “OFQ”). A large part of OFQ is devoted to reports of experiments intended to show the superiority of CT over its scholastic and chemical competitors (OFQ [1991: 18]; also Boyle 1674). According to the theoretical part, matter is one extended impenetrable substance to which motion in accord with contingent laws is added by God. Local motion, the “grand agent” of natural change (OFQ [1991: 19]), divides matter into parts, each modified by a determinate size, shape, and local motion. The corresponding determinable modifications are inseparable from every part of matter, and designated “primary” because they are simple, primitive, and sufficient to derive all qualities (OFQ [1991: 97]). Texture, a fourth primary modification, is the configuration, i.e., mutual orientation and order, of the corpuscular parts of a body (OFQ [1991: 30]). Texture is composed of the primary affections of many insensible particles which jointly form a novel modification that none of the particles has by itself, much as TINs do for Descartes. All four primary affections are intrinsic properties. Boyle calls them “mechanical affections” (hereafter “MAs”) because, he says, the operations of machines are commonly explained by them (OFQ [1991: 18–21]). The stated aim of OFQ is

to make it probable by experiment … that almost all sorts of qualities … may be produced … by corporeal agents … that work [only] by virtue of motion, size, figure, and contrivance of their own parts. (OFQ [1991: 17])

Qualities are entities of a different type: causal capacities and, for the most part, relations between two bodies (OFQ [1991: 13, 23–30]). The terms “quality” and “power” are treated as synonyms. The quality-making relation is not fully explicit. A relation of congruence, or fit, between the MAs of the two bodies is often mentioned; spatial temporal co-incidence is implicit; connections with other things in the environs are suggested (O’Toole 1974; Kaufman 2006: 166–173). The relational theory is motivated by arguments of two sorts (OFQ [1991: 23–30]). One is illustrated by the legend that the first lock was forged without a key; Boyle argues that when a piece of metal of a certain size and shape was subsequently made, the lock acquired the power to be worked; so the power to be worked and the power to work are relations between the key and the lock; but in the bodies themselves there is nothing distinct from their sizes, figures, motions and those of their parts. The second is an argument from parsimony. If every new quality a body acquired added something to the body itself, it would contain a vast number distinct entities that serve no physical purpose.

Anstey (2000: 52) maintains that qualities have a reductive structure: MAs are not powers and qualities, which are powers, are reduced to their respective MAs. The quality is, then, explained by its constituents: the congruent mechanical affections of a pair of bodies explain what happens when one is duly applied to the other in terms that are intelligible and familiar from our understanding of machines. Boyle repeatedly claims that in the bodies that constitute qualities, there is nothing distinct from their MAs, but often remarks that qualities derive from or depend upon the MAs of bodies. Anstey is one of several scholars who find a tension between these two claims. The worry is that “nothing distinct from” expresses ontological reduction; that the dependence in view is asymmetric; and a thing cannot have an asymmetric relation to itself.

The tension is at the center of one of the two main scholarly disagreements about Boyle’s theory of qualities. The other questions whether he consistently adheres to the relational theory or retreats to a monadic notion of dispositive qualities in some passages.

4.1 Are qualities reduced to mechanical affections of bodies or dependent on them?

This is usually discussed in connection with qualities of the sort Boyle calls “sensible”. These are our SQs—in fact, on two occasions, Boyle refers to them as “secondary qualities”. Sensible qualities are present in bodies that operate on human beings so as to cause the sort of ideas on account of which we ascribe colors, etc. to bodies. Names given to the various ideas of SQs are also used to designate the corresponding qualities, so “color”, “green”, etc. can be used to stand for qualities in the scope of corpuscularian explanation (OFQ [1991: 24, 30–4, 51–2]). Boyle is a Cartesian mind-body dualist. Although he discusses perception in several texts, he has no well developed account (see Anstey 2000: 68–85). OFQ sticks to the physical project announced at the start.

Scholars have taken five basic positions on this question.

  • Peter Alexander (1974: 229–238; 1985: 73–85) argues that qualities that are sensible are textures, but colors, green, blue, etc. are nothing but mind-dependent sensations. But textual evidence of this is compromised by the ambiguity of names of SQs (Anstey 2000).
  • Mackie (1976: 14–15) suggests SQs are dispositions based on the intrinsic MAs of the bodies to which the qualities belong, The main problem is that the texts do not clearly articulate the distinction between a disposition and its basis in things that are so disposed. Boyle’s terminology is unstable across different works, and less than precise (Stewart 1991: xiv), and the texts focus on the horizontal two-place relation between bodies (or bodies and perceivers) that form a quality without saying much about the vertical presumably three-place relation between a quality and two sets of MAs.
  • According to Anstey (2000: 105–07), Boyle’s natural philosophical work shows a deep interest in framing hypotheses about the corpuscular constitutions of specific qualities, i.e., physical reductions of qualities deemed possible, but his work also exhibits a deep investment in the CT which states that MAs are basic and qualities are dependent entities which are explained by them. Anstey concludes these commitments are inconsistent and irreconcilable.
  • Keating (1993) argues that Boyle’s strong inclination toward the reduction of qualities to MAs pushes him to say that colors, etc. are mind-dependent sensations.
  • O’Toole (1974: 307–13; followed by Kaufman (2006: 190–1)) argues that for Boyle, qualities are relational properties of bodies rather than intrinsic to any one body. He notes that the texts taken to say the SQs of a pair of bodies are identical to their MAs actually say that in each body there is nothing but its MAs while saying the quality is a relation over and above that We mentioned congruance and spatial and temporal co-existence; means of applying one body to the other are also suggested.

4.2 The “dispositive sense” of having a sensible quality

Sensible qualities pose a particular problem, one that is said to be the “chiefest difficulty” for CT: “it seems evident that [colors, odors, and the like] have an absolute being irrelative to us” (OFQ [1991: 32]). Two reasons are given:

  1. snow would be white and a glowing coal would be hot if there were no sentient beings and
  2. the heat of the coal would still melt ice and warm wax if sentient beings were taken away.

Boyle does not deny that the objection has some basis in fact but contends it is consistent with CT (OFQ [1991: 32–37]). That is, the absolute, non-relational, nature of colors, etc. seems evident for misguided reasons that Boyle traces to Suarezian metaphysical assumptions. With regard to (b), his long response makes the point that it is not heat but the insensible corpuscular constitutions of bodies that are hot that have the power to melt ice according to CT. The response to (a) is a matter of controversy. It specifies a “favorable sense” in which it can be said that bodies would have sensible qualities if there were no sentient beings; but, Boyle contends, it does not suffice to establish that SQs are absolute.

As Boyle explains it, the dispositive sense is conveyed by this: If there were no perceivers, snow, which is actually cold, would in virtue of its corpuscular constitution, be such that if it were applied to the tactual sensory organs of an animal, it would produce “such a quality (sic)”, whereas a body, which does not actually have a SQ, would not produce such a quality. This is to be “dispositively” cold, or “fit” to be cold, but actually to be endowed only with certain MAs (OFQ [1991: 31]). Why would the lack of competent perceivers prevent snow’s being cold given that snow need not be perceived in order to be cold?

Anstey (2000: 103) takes this to be a retreat from the relational theory. Curley (1972: 448–50) finds Boyle ambiguous and mistaken. Stewart (1991: xiv) holds that instability in Boyle’s use of terms precludes a definitive interpretation. However, Kaufman (2006) argues that the dispositive sense is consistent with the relational theory and as Boyle says, part of his defense of it. As Kaufman sees it, the theory of qualities is a consequence of Boyle’s method in natural philosophy, especially his commitment to reasoning from nothing but observational data and antipathy to a priori argumentation. It is possible here to give only a rough sketch of two important points of this interesting, detailed, and complicated interpretation.

First, Kaufman (2006: 175–85) notes that if a body that has MAs in virtue of which it is dispositively cold is not actually cold, then it might seem that the relational account of qualities is expendable. One reason is that from the fact that a body is dispositively cold and the tenets of any adequate mechanist theory, we can predict and explain what the body would do if it were applied to the tactual organ of a perceiver; so it might seem that CT can do without relational qualities. According to Kaufman, this is not right. This is said to be because by Boyle’s empiricist lights, we have no way of knowing what would happen if snow and the right sort of perceiver were to come together except by observing the event. The point is that we cannot attribute dispositive coldness to a body unless such bodies have, or once had, the relational quality cold.

Second, as Kaufman (2006: 186–90) describes it, Boyle maintains that the MAs of snow in the actual world are de re identical to the MAs of snow in a world without perceivers, but Boyle wants to say snow is cold in the actual world and only fit to be cold in the perceiverless world. This is problematic because it seems there is no respect in which they could be different. Kaufman suggests a solution along the following line. Because CT states that a body gains or looses a quality if its relatum begins or ceases to exist and Boyle recognizes a difference between a body’s having a quality and someone’s knowing that it does, he maintains that a body has a dispositive quality in virtue of how someone thinks of its MAs. That is, under the condition that animals are, or are assumed to be, absent from the world, a corpuscularian may reasonably think of the MAs of snow as being fit to manifest cold were they to operate on a competent perceiver. That marks the difference between the MAs of snow in a perceiverless world and in the actual world, yet in the latter snow is not cold. On this interpretation, dispositive qualities are beings of reason with a foundation in things (Kaufman 2006: 190).

5. John Locke

5.1 Locke’s argument for the distinction of P/SQs

Although Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689–90) (hereafter Essay or E, cited by Book, Chapter, and Section number) contains the canonical distinction, it is an inquiry into the origin, limits and sufficiency of human cognition. It is not meant to contribute to theoretical natural philosophy, but to expose abuses of language that hamper it (E [1975: 9–10]). Locke’s attitude toward CT is mixed: he points to its failure to account for the cohesion of the parts of matter and communication of motion (E 2.23.26, 28) but holds it up as the hypothesis that “goes farthest in an intelligible Explanation of the Qualities of Bodies”, (E 2.23; 4.3.12–13).

That PQs and SQs are placed in the same category, that of things that subsist in substance, reflects Locke’s interest in what we know by means of the senses. For him, substance and quality are inseparble. So if we know that qualities exist, we can rightly infer there is a substance in which they inhere, and we know qualities exist because we receive ideas of sensation caused by substances. Ideas of sensation are one of two sorts of ideas which are the simple elements of all our thoughts and can only be acquired in experience according to Locke. Essay, book 2, chapter 8, which exposits and defends the distinction of PQs and SQs, comes immediately after five chapters that define and classify simple ideas. The sixth breaks down the relation between simple ideas of sensation and qualities in order to show that most of the former do not resemble the later.

The argument of Essay 2.8 can be divided into seven stages.

First, sections 1–6 urge that privations, e.g., rest and darkness act as causes just as their positive opposites do.

Second, sections 7–8 distinguish qualities and ideas:

Whatsoever the Mind perceives in itself, or is the immediate object of Perception, Thought, or Understanding, that I call Idea; and the Power to produce any Idea in our mind, I call Quality of the Subject wherein that power is. (E 2.8.8)

A snowball has powers to produce ideas of white, cold, and round; the mind possesses the ideas. The point is that ideas are intentional and ontologically distinct from the qualities. Yet Locke says he will sometimes speak of ideas as in the subjects but should be understood to mean qualities of the subjects that cause the ideas in us. This is said elsewhere to comply with ordinary ways of speaking (E 2.32.2). Locke apparently sees little harm in indulging this once it is understood that it cannot be correct. This is one of several ordinary but inexact uses of language that play a role in Locke’s theory of qualities; on civil and philosophical uses of language, see Essay 3.9.3.

Third, sections 9–10 introduce the distinction of primary qualities, secondary qualities, and a sub-species of the latter. There is a criterion by which PQs are selected: inseparability from bodies in whatever state they may be—in perception, conception, all alterations bodies undergo, and in an imaginary act of repeatedly dividing a sensible particle into insensible parts. Secondary qualities are characterized as

nothing in the Objects themselves, but Powers to produce various Sensations in us by their primary Qualities, i.e., by the Bulk, Figure, Texture and Motion of their insensible parts. (E 2.8.10)

The sub-species includes attributes such as the sun’s power to melt wax and thereby give it the power to cause ideas of warmth. According to Locke, these attributes are commonly regarded as powers but are “as much real Qualities in the Subject, as those which I to comply with the common way of speaking, call Qualities, but for distinction, secondary Qualities,” (E 2.8.10; E 2.31.2) Recall that Boyle uses the traditional term “sensible qualties” to signify warmth, color, etc. So SQs are designated by the term “quality” but are wrongly supposed to be qualities. More on this in stage seven.

Fourth, sections 12–14 declare it is “manifestly by impulse” that ideas are caused in minds (E 2.8.11). A little reflection is taken to show that when we perceive a body, motions of insensible particles convey motions to parts of our bodies that ultimately result in sensory ideas. If it is true that bodies acton our sense only by impulse, this is a reason to accept the characterization of SQs in Essay 2.8.10.

Fifth, sections 15–21 state and defend what is commonly called the “Resemblance Thesis” (hereafter “RT”). It has a positive and a negative part: ideas of primary qualities resemble features of the bodies that cause them—“their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves”—but “there is nothing like the ideas [of SQs] in the bodies themselves” (E 2.8.15). This is presented as an evident consequence of the claims in sections 8 through 14. The sections that follow argue directly for the positive and negative assertions.

The negative claim is supported by at least two lines of thought. The first ascribes the common belief in the resemblance of SQs and their ideas to a misguided metaphysical theory implicit in a common way of speaking: “Flame is denominated Hot and Light … from the ideas [it produces] in us” (E 2.8.16). But, Locke argues, fire causes ideas of both heat and pain and we have no more reason to think heat resembles something in the fire than that pain does (E 2.8.16). Many scholars take the remark about use of language to say we give the same names to sensations and the qualities that cause them (e.g., Ayers 1991: 63–4), but although this might account for the assumption that ideas are in substances, which Locke indulges, it hardly explains belief in idea-quality resemblance. Jacovides (2007b) convincingly argues that the usage to which Locke refers is paronymous, i.e., the name of one thing is given to something which has a certain relation to the one but with a change of ending. Locke speaks of the names of general ideas of kinds of things in this way; e.g., we are denominated “human” from the abstract idea, humanity (E 3.8.1). In Essay 2.8, ideas produced by SQs are almost always given names of abstract ideas: “sweetness”, “warmth”, etc. Jacovides suggests Locke’s point is that the paronymous use of names of ideas of SQs may convey that there is something in objects that gives them their colors, etc. The second argument against resemblance questions why warmth, etc. is supposed to resemble something in bodies but pain is not (E 2.8.16).

In support of the positive resemblance between PQs and ideas of them, Locke appeals to practical action: it is by being moved from A to B that a body causes the idea of its motion from A to B. so the idea represents motion “as it really is” in the body (E 2.8.18); “A Circle or Square are the same whether in Idea or Existence.” (E 2.8.18) Quick as this argument is, it is taken to show that motion and figure “are really in bodies whether we take notice of them or no.” (E 2.8.18) The following sections 19 through 21 propose thought experiments regarding the color of porphyry in the presence and absence of light, the taste of an almond before and after a pounding, and a bowl of water in which one person has placed both hands one of which has been in ice water and the other in hot water. Curley (1972) decisively argues that none of this is meant to show that appearances of SQs—unlike PQs—are perceiver relative unreliable bases on which to judge the properties of things we perceive. But scholars have had difficulty seeing what the examples are intended to show: whether to substantiate the resemblance thesis, the corpuscular theory, or the reality of qualities and non reality of powers. For different views, see, e.g., Alexander (1985: 124–29), Atherton (1992), Lowe (2005: 51–2), Rickless (2014: 88–93), McCann (2011: 175–6). Robert Wilson (2004: 204–06); on the color of porphyry, Stuart (2003) and Jacovides (2007b: 641–2).

Seventh, sections 22–6 stress that PQs are real qualities whereas SQs are imputed qualities. Two things are said to mark PQs as real:

  • mind-independence: PQs are in bodies whether they are perceived or not (E 2.8.23); bodies would have them if there were no sensible beings (E 2.31.2) and
  • the dependence of SQs on PQs of insensible particles (E 2.8.23).

The vast secondary literature on this doctrine raises a large number of debatable questions. The following issues are considered here because they are particularly important for understanding what is distinctive about Locke’s version of the P/SQ distinction:

  • Whether SQs are a sort of quality or a sort of power
  • The epistemic basis of the criteria of PQs
  • The metaphysical status of SQs
  • What it is for the idea of a PQ to resemble a PQ of a body according to Locke.

5.2 Issues

5.2.1 Are SQs qualities or powers?

Essay 2.8 speaks of qualities, real qualities, imputed qualities, powers, and mere powers. Which difference coincides with the distinction of P/SQs? Locke’s report of what he calls “quality” in the subject, unlike the report of what he calls “idea in the mind”, is often taken to be a definition (Curley 1972: 443; Rickless 2014: 84; Jacovides 2007a: 110–11; Stuart 2013: 34–9). Accordingly, Curley (1972: 443–45) argues roughly as follows. For Locke, all qualities are powers to cause ideas by definition, but SQs are such powers and only imputed to be qualities. So SQs are not consistently said to be qualities; but they are consistently said to be powers. He concludes that there are, for Locke, two sorts of powers and the famous distinction is based on RT. One problem is that RT is presented as a consequence of the P/SQ distinction, not the source of it (R. Wilson 2015: 200; Rickless 2014: 88).

Jacovides (2007a: 111–12; also Mackie 1976: 14–5) holds that qualities are defined as powers and argues that this is consistent with saying that SQs are powers and not qualities because Locke’s notion of power is ambiguous as shown by this:

  1. power is an ability to do something which neither causes nor explains its manifestations, e.g., the ability to digest does not digest (E 2.21.20)
  2. power is “the source from which action proceeds”, and “when they [sc. powers of substances] are exerted into act, they are called ‘causes’” (E 2.22.11).

But these texts contain only one notion of power: (a) argues that powers are not exerted by powers, but by substances—the will doesn’t will; (b) identifies substances that exert their powers with causes.

We can suggest a different solution. Locke’s remarks about what he calls “idea” and “quality” in E 2.8.8 are not definitions by his lights; see E 3.3.15–7 on real and nominal essence. They are more like sufficient conditions for being designated by the terms “idea” or “quality.” Being a power is sufficient for being designated by “quality,” as shown by color, etc., but it is not necessary, as shown by the PQs of insensible particles which are not powers to cause ideas, but constituents of such powers. McCann (2011: 59–67) argues that the PQs found in the microstructures of bodies are the causes of both ideas of SQs and ideas of the PQs of sensible bodies. He urges a divsion of types of PQs based on a division of labor—insensible PQ are primary PQs whereas PQs of gross bodies are secondary PQs. For other solutions to the present issue, see Rickless (2014: 85), Stuart (2013: 34–9), R. Wilson (2015: 207–8).

5.2.2 Epistemic basis of the criteria for PQs

The view that Locke argues for the distinction of P/SQs, at least in part, from the truth or adequacy of the CT (held by Alexander 1985: 111–30; Mackie 1976: 17–8) is met with two objections: Locke’s main interest in Essay Book 2 is in ideas (Atherton 1992) and Locke endorses neither the truth nor adequacy of CT (Ayers 2011: 136–7; Downing 1998; McCann 2011: 179–85).

Robert Wilson (2015) argues that there are four inseparability criteria for primary qualities; two pertain only to sensible bodies and the others form a transdictive inference, i.e., an inductive inference from what is true of all sensible bodies to what is true of insensible ones (on transdictive arguments, see R. Wilson 2002). Stuart (2013: 46–52) objects that limiting two modes of inseparability to sensible bodies lacks textual support. Stuart maintains that the criteria for PQs are the same as those for ideas included in the general abstract idea of body. But Jacovides (2007a: 115) points out that Locke’s account of this idea includes only extension, solidity, and capacity to communicate motion, not the full roster of Locke’s PQs (see E 2.23.22).

Michael Ayers (2011: 138–42) suggests Locke’s distinction of qualities can be seen not as a consequence of the virtues of CT but as a source of its perspicuity. On this reading, the argument of Essay 2.8 is a pre-theoretical philosophical reflection on the variety of affections bodies are observed to have and the intelligible mechanical interactions among observable solid rigid bodies.

Downing (2007: 354–59) argues that the inseparability criteria are part of a corpuscularian argument for the distinction of qualities which accords with our natural understanding of physics. Locke does not endorse the adequacy or truth of CT but, she contends, he regards it as an imperfect example of an ideal demonstrative physics which would deduce all operations of bodies from their real essences, or internal constitutions (see E 3.3.15; 4.6.11). She suggests Essay 2.8.8 through 14 makes an argument that relies on the implicit ideal (see E 3.3.17). (See Ayers 1981, also Downing 1998)

McCann (2011) objects that Downing’s account accords undue epistemic weight to the natural line of thought in Essay 2.8. He maintains Locke’s reasoning is non-theoretical and unable to justify assent. Its force is limited to showing how “ordinary folks have to think” about the qualities ordinarily ascribed to bodies (McCann 2011: 184–6). The discussion has weight enough to overtop the common views about the resemblance of ideas of SQs to their causes, which is all Locke intends it to do (McCann 2011: 175, 171–2).

5.2.3 Metaphysical status of SQs and powers in general

According to Curley (1972), Alexander (1974: 168–171), and others, SQs are textures. Alexander also maintains that colors, etc. are not SQs but ideas in minds. But the explicit account of SQs in Essay 2.8.10, repeated in E 2.8.23, 24; 2.21.73, stands against both of these interpretations. Passages that make an analogy between warmth, etc. and pain suggest secondary qualities are subjective sensations (e.g., 2.8.17; also 2.8.21), but Robert Wilson (2015: 199) rightly objects that the sub-species, which includes the sun’s power to melt wax and thereby give it the power to cause ideas of liquidity, shows SQs to be powers to affect bodies as well as minds.

George Berkeley’s Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) (hereafter “PHK”) and Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713) (hereafter “TD”) have encouraged this interpretation of Locke’s doctrine of SQs. According to Berkeley, the philosophers’ doctrine of P/SQs states that extension, size, motion, etc. inhere in mind-independent material substance and cause ideas that resemble them, whereas colors, tastes, etc. are ideas that cannot resemble anything without a mind. In his view, philosophers are right about SQs and wrong about the status of PQs. He opposes the doctrine because it promotes a form of materialism. The distinction figures in his idealist, anti-materialist argumentation as a philosophically reputable means by which the admitted mind dependence of SQs can be used to leverage that of PQs. One tactic is to claim that arguments supposed to show that color, etc. cannot exist without a mind can be used against PQs, too, where the arguments in question are his own perceiver relativity considerations (TD [2008: 167–70]; PHK [2008: 88]). This is paired with the contention that we cannot abstract the idea of a PQ from all ideas of SQs, e.g., the sensory idea of a figure cannot be separated from all other visual or tactual qualityies. Either both exist in the mind or neither does (PHK [2008: 70–1, 86]; TD [2008: 115–6]) Many subsequent philosophers wrongly assume that Berkeley’s report of the philosophers’ distinction applies to Locke’s doctrine of qualities (see Stroud 1980; M. Wilson 1982 [1999]])

Most recent scholars hold that Essay 2.8.10 states what colors. etc. are according to Locke: causal capacities with intrinsic or causal ground in the PQs of insensible particles. Mark Johnston develops this in terms of a sophisticated account of a dispositional property understood as a “constituted disposition”: “a higher order property of having the properties which, oddities aside, would cause the manifestations of the disposition in circumstances C.” (Johnston 1992: 230–34) This comports with the structure of a SQ according to Essay 2.9–10, but the text says nothing about conditions or circumstances of manifestation (see discussion of Essay 2.30.2 below in this sub-section).

Scholars also disagree about the metaphysical status of powers that derive from the micro-structures of observable bodies. Are they entities that exist in, say, an almond even though they depend on its basic constituents and presuppose co-existence of a competent perceiver? Or is there nothing in the almond but the real qualities of it and its parts?

Jacovides (2007b) argues for the leaner alternative. He maintains that for Locke, the explanatory entities are PQs, bodies, ideas, and minds. Because they constitute the facts that determine the truth or falsity of our assertions about SQs, we have no need of ideas that track their derivatives (Jacovides 2007b: 630). As he sees it, the doctrine that SQs are powers is not about what is in the world but Locke’s solution to a semantic problem: a way we can speak that makes assertions about SQs true and certain and forestalls the mistaken suggestions of the paronymous use of SQ terms (Jacovides 2007b: 641).

Without objecting to this account of the semantics of names of SQs, we can add that the doctrine of SQs solves an epistemic problem arising from Locke’s thesis that the limited knowledge we have is sufficient for our needs (E 1.5). The solution to this problem is in part about the world. Jacovides overlooks Locke’s semantic theory of simple ideas of sensation in general and its function in his epistemology. The key texts are Essay 2.30.1–2, 2.31.1–2. and 4.4.4. In outline, God sustains steady causal connections among the different internal constitutions of bodies, the constitutions of the bodies of perceivers, and all the simple ideas of sensation that enter their minds. With this foundation in place, the fact, as Locke has it, that we are aware that simple ideas of sensation come from without us enables these ideas to be, and be taken to be, reliable signs of things that are founded in reality (E 2.30.2, 31.2; 4.4.4); for a defense of the natural sign interpretation of simple ideas of sensation, see Ayers 1991: 60–64. Ideas of SQs, in particular, are not ideas of micro-constitutions; they do not inform us of the nature of what they represent. They are ideas of powers that stand in for the causal foundations that underwrite sense perception; see Ayers 1997 on the place-holder function of this idea of power. We cannot have perceptual knowledge of the nature of the foundations. But because ideas of SQs track collections of PQ of insensible particles on which the ideas depend, we have the cogntiive ability to distinguish different objects we have to do with, discern their qualities, and take them for our needs (E 2.30.3; 4.4.4).

5.2.4 Resemblance of ideas of PQs and qualities of bodies

Locke’s RT has spawned confusion on at least two points of doctrine:

  • How resemblance between an idea of sensation and a quality existing in actual things is to be understood;
  • Why RT is important, or what Locke intends to convey by asserting it.
How is “resemblance” to be understood?

Ayers (2011: 151–57) observes that Locke has more than one account of what ideas are. According to a Cartesian view, ideas are intentional mental acts by which their objects are presented and represented to the mind (e.g., Essay 1.1.8; 4.1.2)). On this view, it is not difficult to understand what it is for an idea to resemble, or not to resemble, its object: it presents the object as having a feature that resembles (does not resemble) a feature the object has. But Essay 2.8 introduces a different notion of ideas: simple ideas of sensation are effects of the operations of bodies on our sensory organs. They are non-intentional sensations akin to raw pains. They acquire a representative function in virtue of their contingent causal connections to the constitutions of bodies around us. In Ayer’s view, this makes the claim that ideas of PQs resemble qualities existing in bodies “problematic, if not absurd” (Ayers 2011: 154). Here it seems “resembles” must mean “shares a property with”, not “depicts a thing as having a property it has”. Problems with the former include that essentially mind-dependent ideas cannot be like anything that can exist without a mind, as Berkeley says. Also, how can we know what the qualities of bodies are like in themselves given that we know the qualities only by means of the ideas they cause in us? Also, it is difficult to understand how an idea can share with a body the quality being 10 feet long, or moving away from the perceiver at 20 miles per hour, or being solid, and so on. Most scholars are resigned to saying or tacitly allowing that if simple ideas are taken to be non-intentional qualia, the positive resemblance thesis is deeply problematic.

But Jacovides (1999), undertakes to defend the literal interpretation of the positive RT. His defense is limited in two ways: it applies only to visual ideas that are products of experience and metnions only respects of resemblance that Locke and his contemporaries would have found acceptable, such as the image of a tri image of a square and a square. Two broad problems can be mentioned:

  • Locke appears to assert that all ideas of PQs—tactual as well as visual—resemble qualities of their causes and
  • on this interpretation, the resemblance might be far from exact; but the texts speak of “perfect resemblances” and mirror images (E 2.8.16).
Why does Locke want to establish RT?

More central to Locke’s distinction of P/SQs is the question why idea-quality resemblance and non-resemblance are important in Locke’s view. RT is said to be a consequence of the argument that establishes the P/SQ distinction in Essay 2.8–14—what does the further thesis do for Locke? In sections 16–19, the resemblance/non resemblance dichotomy and the real/imputed quality dichotomies coincide (Rickless 2014: 88–90). E. J. Lowe (2005: 51–2) suggests that in denying resemblance in the case of ideas of SQs, Locke “expresses the view that the ideas mislead us into taking a dispositional property to be a real non-dispositional quality”. But although we do commonly make this mistake according to Locke, the fault is not with what ideas represent but our tendency to conflate ideas and qualities.

McCann (1994: 64), among others, suggests that Locke’s purpose in denying that ideas of SQs resemble bodies is to discredit the scholastic theory that we perceive qualities of objects by receiving resemblances of them which are emitted by the objects. One objection is that Locke wholly repudiates this scholastic theory, so this fails to account for the positive part of RT.

Jacovides (2007a: 108–110) suggests that epistemic concerns motivate Locke’s adherence to both parts of RT. As he sees it, Locke is worried that because ideas are the immediate objects of our knowledge, they may not represent external objects. So he thinks we should have a presumption against assuming that ideas of sensation resemble things without us. The pain analogy provides a reason in support of this presumption. However, Jacovides maintains, Locke thinks it is overcome in the case of PQs because they play a part in CT which is our most intelligible account of how things happen in the world. There is some truth to this general description, but it has no clear connection with Locke’s interest in RT. The presumption is not explicitly stated, as far as I know, and the epistemic worry about ideas is stated only in Essay 4.4 where RT is not mentioned.

The arguments addressed to RT turn out to show that a quality is real just in case it resembles the idea of it. Essay 2.8, sections 17 and 18 explicitly state that PQs are real qualities, i.e. qualities that are in a body whether it is perceived or not, and SQs are not real qualities; the point is reiterated in sections 22 and 23. Rickless takes the emphasis on reality and non-reality to show that for Locke, the most fundamental difference between PQs and SQs is that the former are real qualities of bodies and the latter are not in the strictest sense. We can suggest that although this may be the basic difference from the perpective of natural philosophy, Locke’s interest in the P/SQ distinction derives from his more fundamentl interest in the relation between perception and reality (see E 2.8.7, .22), From Locke’s perpective, the basic difference is at the level of sorts of ideas of sensation and the difference has to do with how they represent the real qualities present in bodies perceived by the senses.

6. Thomas Reid

Thomas Reid, known for his theory of perception and an epistemic theory he calls “common sense”, urges a version of the distinction of qualities in two of his main philosophical works: An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764) and Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785). Both use an empirical method to investigate basic faculties of the human mind such as perception, conception, and judgment. Qualities of bodies are identified as the objects of perception. Among them, Reid finds the foundation of a division aligned with the standard lists of PQs and SQs presented as a difference in how we know them. Some scholars maintain his doctrine of P/SQs is entirely epistemic (Lehrer 1978; McKitrick 2002), but others contend it depends on a metaphysical distinction (Van Cleve 2015: 110–12).

Reid is also known for his extended critique and unrelenting repudiation of the way of ideas. He finds it in the whole of philosophy from Democritus to Berkeley and Hume. Characterizing it as the view that there is a single sort of mind-dependent entity that we must immediately apprehend in order to apprehend anything else, he contends it precludes all cognition of things outside the mind (Reid 1785 [2002: 27–32, 199–200]; Nichols 2003; Van Cleve 2015: 57–98). In his view, it is the source of most false and mistaken philosophical accounts of perception (Reid 1785 [2002: 249, 261–5]).

Reid’s concept of sensation is a main instrument of his opposition to the theory of ideas. He holds sensations to be non-intentional objects of consciousness which have potential to be conceived; they are what they are felt to be and felt to be what they are (Reid 1785 [2002: 36–8, 193–4]). Perceptions, by contrast, are cognitive. An episode of perception breaks down to an act of conceiving an external object and an act of believing in its present existence. Sensations are, then, wholly extrinsic to perceptions. But with one exception, perception of all sorts of objects is attended by a simultaneous sensation which is the effect of the object operating on sensory organs of the perceiver (Reid 1785 [2002: 193–4])[5]

Two terms are used for the mind’s shift from a non-intentional sensation to a perception. The sensation is a “sign” to the mind of the presence of the quality that causes it, in particular, a natural sign grounded in the constitution of our nature (Reid 1785 [2002: 119]). The sensation “suggests” a certain conception and firm belief; the one is “naturally and necessarily annexed” to the others. The transition is non-inferential, not due to habit, experience, or education. It follows, according to Reid, that the conjunction of acts is a consequence of the naturally inexplicable constitution of human nature (Reid 1764 [1997: 7–8, 40–44]; 1785 [2002: 96–101]).

That sensations and perceptions of the qualities that cause them are distinct mental acts is, like the theory of ideas, a point on which philosophical theories of perception founder as Reid sees it (e.g., Reid 1785 [2002:199–200]). His empirical evidence shows that sensations and the corresponding qualities have the same names in virtually all human languages: “smell of a rose” is ambiguous as between an aromatic feeling and a quality possessed by a kind of flower. The quality and the sensation are generally confounded by imagination as if they were the same operation (Reid 1764 [1997: 43]; 1785 [2002: 193–99]). This is benign for ordinary purposes, according to Reid, but a thorn in the side of philosophers. It obscures a difference among the various qualities perceived by sense that Reid’s decisive division of sensation and perception brings to light.

According to Reid, when experiencing the smell of a rose, you have a pleasing sensation and directly perceive the quality of a body that causes it. The sensation is felt; the external cause is conceived and firmly believed to exist. By contrast, an experience of hardness or softness involves faint and uninteresting sensations that serve just as signs to which the mind immediately responds by conceiving and believing in the bodily qualities they stand for. Pressing a hand on the top of a table, you have a sensation which is typically unnoticed and you notice a property of the table, a cohesion of its parts sufficiently firm to resist any change of its shape. Tactual perception of figure is similar: when you press your hand around the surface of a ball, you feel the figure; although the feeling can be noticed with attention and practice, it is usually disregarded (Reid 1785 [2002: 193–7]; 1764 [1997: 55–7]).

The contrast provides the foundation of Reid’s distinction between qualities listed as primary and secondary. The senses give us “a direct and a distinct” notion of the primary qualities and inform us “what they are in themselves”, but “only a relative and obscure” notion of the SQs, one that tells us “only that they … produce in us a certain sensation” and “leave us in the dark” about “what they are in themselves” (Reid 1785 [2002: 200–203]; 1764 [1997: 61–2]). By a “distinct notion”, Reid means one that provides clear and distinct understanding of its object. Our notion of hardness is said to inform us perfectly of what that quality is; “it is manifest to sense” (Reid 1785 [2002: 203]). By a “direct notion”, he means one that is not relative. A relative notion of a thing, “is, strictly speaking, no notion of the thing at all, but only of some relation which it bears to something else” (Reid 1785 [2002: 200–03]). For instance,

That smell in the rose is an unknown quality … which is the cause … of a sensation which I know well…The same reasoning will apply to every secondary quality. (Reid 1785 [2002: 202])

Two of Reid’s reflections on this contrast are especially important. First, there are no disputes about the natures of the primary qualities because the are exhibited to sense. Primary qualities are investigated by the a priori methods of the mathematical sciences. Reid attributes this to the distinctness of our concepts of them and the knowledge of their natures the concepts provide. They are subjects of conceptual necessary truths. But because secondary qualities are obscure to sense, they are an appropriate subject of the sort of formal inquiry conducted in natural philosophy. Their natures are not known directly by the senses but may be discovered by observation, reasoning, and deft use of hypotheses; e.g., we know vibrations cause sounds and reflected light causes sensations of colors (on the proper method of natural philosophical inquiry (see Reid 1785 [2002: 267–75]).

The second reflection concerns the “capitol part” sensations bear in the “notion we form of the [object perceived]” (Reid 1785 [2002: 204]). Unlike the easily forgotten sensations that accompany perception of PQs, many sensations caused by SQs have a salience that makes us attend to them and form concepts of them. They are not just signs of the qualities when we perceive them: “the thought of a secondary quality always carries us back to the sensation it produces”, This is because although each perception is conjoined with a sensation proper to it (Reid 1785 [2002: 199]), relative notions specify every object as an unknown cause. We have only their known effects by which to reflect on them and mark them as different from each other. This has been called the “capitol part” thesis. In effect, post-perceptual apprehension of SQs is mediated by conception of the sensation that is its sign—apparently, a mediation Reid considers innocuous (see Reid 1785 [2002: 134]; for different views about what that might be, see Nichols 2007: ch. 10; Copenhaver 2004; Buras 2011; Van Cleve 2015: 297–300). The implications of this for the meanings of SQ terms is disputed by scholars.

Two main issues are debated in the literature on Reid’s P/SQ distinction:

  • Whether SQs as known by our senses are dispositions or causal bases of them;
  • Whether or not the capitol part thesis commits Reid to the view that sensations are semantic constituents of the meanings of SQ terms (Lehrer 1989: 27).

6.1 Are SQs dispositions or causal bases?

Some texts suggest that secondary qualities as known by the senses are dispositions, notably:

[color] is a certain power … in bodies that in fair daylight exhibits to the eye an appearance which is very familiar to us although it hath no name. (Reid 1765 [1997: 87])

But there are more texts that identify SQs with the unknown causes of familiar sensations, such as:

The qualities in bodies we call heat and cold are unknown. They are only conceived by us, as unknown causes or occasions of the sensations which we give the same names. (Reid 1765 [1997: 54; especially 86]; 1785 [2002: 202–04], among others)

Nowadays it is generally accepted that a disposition and the cause of its manifestations are distinct; it is not possible that they be the same thing.

Wolterstorff offers this argument:

if green were a disposition in things to cause certain sensations under certain conditions and not the physical basis of that disposition, we would know what it was. (Wolterstorff 2000: 112)

This might well be based on a paragraph in Essays on the IntellectuaI Powers of Man (Reid 1785 [2002: 203–04]). It states that feeling informs us that the fire is hot but not what heat is in the fire; it notes that this may seem to be a contradiction but says it ought to be accepted. It allows that if we had no notion of heat we could not understand the assertion that fire is hot, and concludes “we have a notion, but it is a relative notion. We know they are the causes of certain known effects” (Reid 1785 [2002: 203–04]). This might naturally be understood to invoke the obscurity of relational specifications of qualities to dispel the seeming contradiction.

Van Cleve (2015: 105–110) dismisses Wolterstorff’s argument on the ground that there is an equally good counter argument as follows. It is an epistemic principle that you know X is F only if you know what it is to be F; Reid thinks we know of many things that they are green; so, we must know what it is to be green. Someone might object that Reid adheres to a different epistemic principle in the passage we just discussed. In a note citing this text, Van Cleve admits Reid’s position is unclear but takes the last part of the passage to say the relative notion enables us to know what it is to be green, namely, to manifest certain sensations. In his opinion, Reid favors this view of SQs. Reading the passage this way renders the contradiction irrelevant but leaves the many texts that would seem to identify SQs with the unknown causes of known effects out of account. As Nichols (2007: 6.4) puts it, the dispositional interpretation makes nonsense of Reid’s frequent claims that he does not know what SQs are. Nichols finds evidence of the causal basis theory in Reid’s use of SQ terms in talking about the causes of SQ sensations and concludes that all relevant texts considered, we should take him to accept a physical microstructural account of SQs (Nichols 2006: 6.6).

Van Cleve elaborates on the dispositional interpretation in two ways. First, noting that Reid is drawn to the view that SQs are unknown causes, he suggests that although it was not available to Reid, a second order dispositional account might accommodate the conflicting texts: to have a SQ is to have a property P such that P would cause certain sensations in circumstances C (Van Cleve 2016: 109). Second, he notes that if SQs are dispositions manifested by human responses, they are relational properties, whereas PQs seem to be intrinsic. He argues that the latter is borne out under a test of intrinsicality along lines proposed by G.E. Moore (Winkler 2016: 225–31 challenges this; Van Cleve 2016: 240–44 is his response). From this, Van Cleve concludes that Reid’s P/SQ distinction rests on a metaphysical foundation (Van Cleve 2016: 110–12).

6.2 The capitol parts thesis and the semantics of SQ terms

This is an issue on which more recent scholars tend to disagree with some earlier ones. The capitol part thesis states that we cannot reflect on or distinguish among SQs without conceiving the sensations that signify them. This suggests a close conceptual connection between qualities and their proper sensations. Lehrer (1989: 27) maintains it commits Reid to a view on which the meaning of, say, “X is red” essentially contains concepts of sensations of red. If Reid holds that SQs are dispositions manifested by sensations. he is committed to this semantic claim. But the present question is whether or not the capitol part thesis commits him to the semantic claim.

The thesis about post-perceptual conception of a SQ entails two claims that are directly relevant: that we cannot form the concept of a SQ without at the same time forming the concept of the sensation it causes and that we cannot have the concept of a SQ unless we have experienced the quality. The need for experience is often taken to support the view that PQs and SQs differ in respect of how their meanings are specified: in particular, it is said that “X is red” means that X manifests sensations of red under certain circumstances, whereas the meaning of “X is solid” can be specified without reference to sensations of solidity. But recent scholars argue that the semantic claim about SQ terms is not entailed by the capitol part remark. They point to reasons for a person’s needing to have the concept of the sensation caused by a quality in order to have the concept of that quality—the capitol part thesis—that are independent of the truth or falsity of the semantic claim. Van Cleve points to the use Kripke might make of the perception of SQs to fix the reference of “red” in its rigid use, i.e., use as a name for just those qualities that cause a certain sort of sensation in the actual world. Nichols (2006: 6.4) offers a different reason for a similar conclusion. But although recent scholars agree about this, they disagree over how Reid intended the capitol part thesis to be understood.

Van Cleve reports his belief that Reid meant it to entail that SQs are dispositions which cannot be conceived unless conceived as manifesting certain sensations. SQs are, then, essentially phenomenal or human response dependent (Van Cleve 2016: 107–9). No argument is offered other than the one purporting to show that Reid can be read as urging a dispositional theory of SQs (see above). There seems to be no consensus on the interpretative issue.


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