Locke’s Philosophy of Science
John Locke has been widely hailed for providing an epistemological foundation for the experimental science of his day, articulating the new, probabilistic form of knowledge appropriate to it. Yet, while he is in important respects a devotee of that new science, there are also significant tensions in his thought. He stands behind its experimental methods as he targets the earlier, speculative or rationalist philosophies for relying on methodologies and epistemological expectations unsuited to natural philosophy. He also frequently appears to embrace the new science’s corpuscular hypothesis, whose powers and minute particles figure prominently in his attempt to understand why we cannot hope for demonstrative certainty about natural phenomena. Still, the new science’s methodology was evolving. Just how far did Locke travel with that evolution, and what aspects of his thought prevented him from going further? As for the corpuscular hypothesis, what exactly was his stance toward it? He frequently speaks of particles and powers as if they belonged to established knowledge, and yet in explaining the hypothesis’s flaws, he seems to consider them fatal. This article will mainly emphasize the second of those related questions, though both have spurred scholarly investigation and debate.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Locke on knowledge in natural philosophy: Scientia and human knowledge
- 3. Tension in Locke’s thought and a consequent debate
- 4. Locke and Newton
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Two features of Locke’s intellectual landscape are most salient for understanding his philosophy of science, one of which concerns the new science’s methodology, and the other its content. First, then, is the new methodological approach to understanding the natural world. This approach is accompanied by profound shifts in disciplinary boundaries and in conceptions of induction and scientific knowledge. Locke’s reaction is mostly progressive. Impressed by experimental methods and cognizant of their poor fit with the Aristotelian ideal, he defines a distinct kind of knowledge, one inferior to genuine scientific knowledge but appropriate to human sensory capacities. In so doing, he develops an epistemological basis for the new, experimental philosophy. Yet his reaction also has its conservative aspect, one that some see as having limited him in the face of the new science’s evolving methodology. He retains an ideal notion of scientific knowledge as demonstrative and certain, and while the speculative systems of the Aristotelians and the Cartesians. are the two main targets of his Essay, he shares that ideal with them.
The second salient feature is the dominant scientific theory of Locke’s day: the new science’s corpuscular hypothesis. As defined for the purposes of this article, the corpuscular hypothesis (i) takes observable bodies to be composed of material particles or corpuscles, (ii) takes impulse (action by surface impact) to be either the primary or sole means of communicating motion, and (iii) attempts to reduce colour and other qualities at the level of observable bodies to the primary or inherent properties of the particles composing those bodies. In what may be called its orthodox version (“pure mechanism,” as Ayers (1981, p. 212) calls it) the corpuscular hypothesis restricts those inherent properties to size, shape, number, and motion, and holds that all other qualities and operations are explicable in terms of that restricted set of properties. The orthodox version thus implies a proviso of contact action—that bodies causally interact only locally, by impact, such that unmediated action at a distance is deemed impossible. (Although a number of commentators use the terms ‘corpuscular hypothesis’ and ‘mechanism’ interchangeably, distinguishing them has certain benefits. For instance, it permits us to classify Isaac Newton among the corpuscularian theoristis without engaging the debate about whether he adhered to the contact action proviso. The definitions given here also agree largely with those in the entry on John Locke.) Plenist and atomist versions of the corpuscular hypothesis may be distinguished. Plenist theorists deny the void and assert a plenum of matter, as Descartes does by identifying matter with extension, and though these theorists speak of particles, their particles are not atoms, being infinitely or at least indefinitely divisible. Atomist theorists, by contrast, accept the void and take the particles or corpuscles comprising compound bodies to be indivisible, or at least probably so. Since Locke’s sympathies clearly lie with the atomist version, the term ‘corpuscular hypothesis’ shall refer to that variant throughout this article unless indicated otherwise. Locke develops central theses of the Essay in close conjunction with the corpuscular hypothesis. The most notable of these is the distinction between real and nominal essences, the former denoting a substance’s internal constitution and the latter denoting the observable properties we use to name or categorize it. Although Locke develops that distinction in connection with the primary-secondary quality distinction associated with corpuscular theorists, including his mentor, Robert Boyle, it does not follow that the two distinctions are interchangeable. Locke often treats the hypothesis with skepticism, and its status and purpose are a source of controversy.
This article examines questions connected with the two salient features noted, and in connection with the first, it also examines Locke’s relationship to Newton, a figure instrumental to the changing conceptions of scientific knowledge. Section 2 addresses questions connected to those conceptions. What does Locke take science (scientia) or scientific knowledge to be generally, why does he think that scientia in natural philosophy is beyond the reach of human beings, and what characterizes the conception of human knowledge that he develops for natural philosophy? Section 3 addresses the question provoked by Locke’s apparently conflicting treatments of the corpuscular hypothesis. Does he accept or defend the corpuscular hypothesis? If not, what is its role in his thought, and what explains its close connection to key theses of the Essay? Since a scholarly debate has arisen about the status of the corpuscular hypothesis for Locke, Section 3 reviews some main positions in that debate. Section 4 considers the relationship between Locke’s thought and Newton’s. All citations of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding are indicated by ‘E’, followed by the book and section numbers. Page numbers referring to the Nidditch edition are also provided.
Locke’s great epistemological contribution to philosophy is a conception of human knowledge suitable for the experimental science of his day, one that in natural philosophy will replace the old, Aristotelian conception. According to the Aristotelian conception, scientific knowledge—scientia—is certain knowledge of necessary truths, which can be expressed in syllogistic form, the conclusion following from self-evident premises. In the domain of natural philosophy, it is certain knowledge of real essences. Although Locke does not seriously entertain a radical skepticism—finding “a very manifest difference between dreaming of being in the Fire, and being actually in it” (E IV.ii.14, pp.537–538)—he recognizes that the demands of scientia are too stringent for the new, experimental science. Nevertheless, the concept of scientia plays an important role as he develops his conception of the probabilistic sort of knowledge that is possible for humans in the domain of natural philosophy: it serves as a foil as he explains why humans must settle for probabilistic knowledge in natural philosophy, where scientia will always remain out of reach. Scientia can serve as a foil because it is attainable for human beings in certain domains; however Locke thinks that for nobler spirits, notably angels, it is also attainable within natural philosophy.
This section begins by reviewing the history of the concept of scientia and the factors that prevent human beings from attaining it in natural philosophy, which impel Locke to develop an alternative conception of human knowledge there. This section also explains what Locke thinks scientia in natural philosophy would amount to and the lesser human knowledge that must serve us in its place.
The conception of genuine scientific knowledge that Locke inherits and to some extent retains, scientia, has its roots in Aristotle, specifically in the beginning of Book I, §2 of the Posterior Analytics. For Aristotle, scientific knowledge can have only necessary truths as its objects and requires a knowledge of causes. Accordingly, scientific knowledge of a fact requires knowing its necessity by knowing its necessary relations to its causes. Although there are manifold causes, the main one at issue here is the formal cause—the nature or essence—as Aristotle indicates elsewhere.
We suppose ourselves to possess unqualified scientific knowledge of a thing, as opposed to knowing it in the accidental way in which the sophist knows, when we think that we know the cause on which the fact depends, as the cause of that fact and of no other, and, further, that the fact could not be other than it is….The proper object of unqualified scientific knowledge is something which cannot be other than it is (Aristotle, Posterior Analytics, I.2).
The knower’s epistemic stance toward a necessary truth and its relation to causes is one of certainty. The certain fact is demonstrable via a syllogism in which the premises are self-evident, requiring no demonstration themselves.
We do know by demonstration. By demonstration I mean a syllogism productive of scientific knowledge, a syllogism….The premisses must be primary and indemonstrable; otherwise they will require demonstration in order to be known, since to have knowledge, if it be not accidental knowledge, of things which are demonstrable, means precisely to have a demonstration of them. The premisses must be the causes of the conclusion, better known than it, and prior to it; its causes, since we possess scientific knowledge of a thing only when we know its cause; prior, in order to be causes; antecedently known, this antecedent knowledge being not our mere understanding of the meaning, but knowledge of the fact as well (Aristotle, Posterior Analytics, I.2).
The stipulation that the premises of a scientific demonstration must be indemonstrable, that is, self-evident, leads to a prima facie difficulty. This conception of scientific knowledge is intended to encompass not only conceptual propositions, but also propositions about the real natures or essences of substances, which are propositions about the world. As with any other demonstration, a demonstration in natural philosophy must have premises that are self-evident, since otherwise a regress would ensue. Propositions about the world are experience-based, however, and therefore, it is not clear how a demonstration’s premises could be self-evident.
It would be overstating matters to say that this problem appears only from a contemporary perspective; there was some recognition of it in the ancient and medieval periods. Still, before the advent of the experimental science, the problem was not strongly felt because experience was understood in a different way. For one thing, the notion of an experiment—an artificially constructed, single event or series of events designed to test for a predicted outcome—did not exist. Moreover, among the scholastic Aristotelians, a single, naturally occurring event could not by itself be regarded as revealing of natural processes; such an event could be a “monster,” that is, an event that conflicts with nature rather than having been produced by it. Events as generally experienced, however, were regarded as being revealing of nature and consequently, they could provide the universal truths needed as premises in the syllogism. How was the gap between events as usually experienced—which still amounts to a limited sample of evidence—and the universal claim derived from them bridged? It is only from the modern and contemporary perspectives that such a gap exists to be bridged. For Aristotle and medieval thinkers, human faculties are so constituted as to be able to apprehend nature, that is, to discern the essences of substances. In short, then, because the internal essences that form the content of natural philosophy are real, and because our faculties are constituted to apprehend those real essences, natural philosophy can be a science; it is a domain in which certain, demonstrative knowledge can be had, despite its dependence upon experience.
The exemplars of scientific knowledge, to be sure, are conceptual disciplines, not only geometry, but also rational theology, the latter being the quintessential science for the medievals. Yet for the most part, natural philosophy stands side by side with conceptual disciplines, even into the modern period. Bacon, though associated with induction, accepts the demonstrative conception of scientific knowledge, and so does Galileo, who uses experiments to reveal fundamental principles (though also using them in other ways). As empirical methods are refined and more widely applied, however, the belief that natural philosophy can stand under the umbrella of scientia comes under increasing pressure. Some thinkers resist the pressure, most notably Descartes, who derives his laws of nature by an a priori reflection upon God’s nature, and, placing his confidence in these rationalist methods, denies that his third law of nature is undermined when observations of colliding bodies conflict with it. Yet for the experimentalists themselves, including Locke’s mentor, Boyle, observations and experiments are the primary route to knowledge. (It should be noted, however, that most advocates of experimentalism did not consider speculation wholly illegitimate, instead insisting that it be delayed until considerable experimental and observational evidence had been amassed; see Anstey (2011, pp. 4,5).) It is this approach that puts natural philosophy on the path to Hume’s problem of induction and most influences Locke.
As indicated earlier, scientia serves as the backdrop against which Locke develops the conception of the type of knowledge that is humanly possible in natural philosophy. Having retained the ideal of scientia exemplified by geometry while also having assimilated the significance of Boyle’s experimental method, Locke is driven to his characteristic pessimism about the kind and extent of knowledge possible for us in natural philosophy. “The meanest, and most obvious Things that come in our way, have dark sides, that the quickest Sight cannot penetrate into” (E IV.iii.22, p. 553). Due to the weakness of our faculties, Locke suspects, “natural Philosophy is not capable of being made a Science” (E IV.xii.10, p. 645). This section considers Locke’s general notion of scientia, what would be required for scientia in natural philosophy, and the obstacles that prevent human beings from attaining scientia in that domain.
2.2.1 Scientia in general
Locke takes knowledge generally to consist in “the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas” (E IV.i.1–2, p. 525), and among the three kinds of knowledge that he distinguishes—intuitive, demonstrative, and sensitive—the former two are kinds of certain knowledge. Intuitive and demonstrative knowledge differ in the number of intuitions involved, and consequently, differ in their degree of certainty (E IV.ii.14, pp.537–538). Intuitive knowledge is the most certain because the truth is grasped immediately. There are no intermediate steps, and doubt is impossible because the mind can no more avoid recognizing the truth than the open, functioning eye could avoid seeing light when turned toward the sun (see E IV.ii.1, p. 531). Demonstrative knowledge, though also qualifying as certain, is less so because it involves intermediate steps. We cannot grasp immediately that the three angles of any triangle are equal to two right triangles but must instead construct the steps of a proof. Upon doing so and grasping the connections among the proof’s steps, we have demonstrative knowledge (E IV.ii.2–3, p.531–532). Intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are forms of scientia, then, which Locke defines as “certain universal Knowledge” (E IV.iii.29, p. 559). Mere “particular matters of fact” (E IV.iii.25, pp. 555–56) do not qualify.
To understand Locke’s notion of scientia, we must consider its objects: real essences and the necessary connections that flow from them. According to the Aristotelian view, a single essence both grounds the properties of a thing, making it what it is, and provides the basis for classifying it. Repudiating that view, Locke draws a distinction between real and nominal essences. Whereas the nominal essence consists of the set of observable qualities we use to classify a thing (which implies that the nominal essence could vary across time or communities), the real essence (or real or internal constitution, as he sometimes writes) is that which makes a thing what it is.
Essence may be taken for the being of any thing, whereby it is what it is. And thus the real internal, but generally in Substances, unknown Constitution of Things, whereon their discoverable Qualities depend, may be called their Essence. This is the proper original signification of the Word, as is evident from the formation of it; Essentia, in its primary notation signifying properly Being. And in this sense it is still used, when we speak of the Essence of particular things, without giving them any Name (E III.iii.15, p. 417).
Discussion of real essence often focuses upon the real essences of material substances, and in that case we say that the real essence is the causal ground of the substance’s perceivable properties (for further details and a useful chart, see the entry by Jones, “Locke on Real Essence”). As will be discussed in a subsequent section, many commentators interpret Locke as identifying a material substance’s real essence with some subset of its constituent corpuscles’ primary qualities, but that identification presums Locke’s acceptance of the corpuscular hypothesis (e.g., Osler 1970, p. 12; Mandelbaum 1964, p.1). According to another interpretation, the real-nominal essence distinction is metaphysical, and thus more fundamental than the primary-secondary quality distinction, which is a physical distinction, belonging as it does to a particular physical theory, the corpuscular hypothesis. Yet leaving that debate aside for the moment, we may note from the first sentence of the above-quoted passage that Locke does not restrict the notion of real essence to substances. This means that we can speak of, say, the real essence of a triangle, understanding it as that which grounds the triangle’s qualities, making it what it is.
Since a substance’s qualities flow from its real essence, having scientific knowledge of a substance requires knowing both its real essence and the necessary connections between that and its other qualities. Geometry serves as an exemplar, as it did for so many of Locke’s predecessors. In knowing what a triangle is, we cannot conceive things being otherwise than that the sum of its three angles equals the sum of two right angles.
Such knowledge is so certain that we cannot conceive even of God having made things otherwise:
Thus the Idea of a right-line Triangle necessarily carries with it an equality of its Angles to two right ones. Nor can we conceive this Relation, this connexion of these two Ideas, to be possibly mutable, or to depend on any arbitrary Power, which of choice made it thus, or could make it otherwise (E IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560).
Scientia is possible in another conceptual domain also: morality. Morality is characterized by discernible necessary connections, and Locke is adamant that we can have the same level of certainty there as in geometry.
Where there is no Property, there is no Injustice, is a Proposition as certain as any Demonstration in Euclid: For the Idea of Property, being a right to any thing; and the Idea to which the Name Injustice is given, being the Invasion or Violation of that right; it is evident, that…I can as certainly know this Proposition to be true, as that a Triangle has three Angles equal to two right ones (E IV.iii.18, pp. 549–50).
2.2.2 Scientia in natural philosophy
What would be required for scientia in natural philosophy? Since scientia generally concerns real essences, and since natural philosophy for Locke concerns material substances and their powers, scientia in natural philosophy would be knowledge of material substances’ real essences and their necessary connections to the qualities flowing from them.
If we could have scientia in natural philosophy, we could know a substance’s qualities without making observations or experiments. To take one of Locke’s frequent examples, if we could know gold’s real essence, we would then know its qualities, even if not a single sample of gold existed.
Had we such Ideas of Substances, as to know what real Constitutions produce those sensible Qualities we find in them, and how those Qualities flowed from thence, we could, by the specifick Ideas of their real Essences in our own Minds, more certainly find out their Properties, and discover what Qualities they had, or had not, than we can now by our Senses: and to know the Properties of Gold, it would be no more necessary, that Gold should exist, and that we should make Experiments upon it, than it is necessary for the knowing the Properties of a Triangle, that a Triangle should exist in any Matter, the Idea in our Minds would serve for the one, as well as the other (E IV.vi.11, p. 585).
Which qualities exactly would we be able to deduce? We would be able to deduce a substance’s tertiary qualities, that is, its powers to produce certain effects in other substances. If we knew the real essences of opium and hemlock, then just as if we were performing a geometric deduction, or just as a locksmith understands why a given key will open one lock rather than another, we could deduce that opium produces sleep, that hemlock causes death and why each substance produces its effects.
I doubt not but if we could discover the Figure, Size, Texture, and Motion of the minute Constituent parts of any two Bodies, we should know without Trial several of the Operations one upon another, as we do now the Properties of a Square, or a Triangle. Did we know the Mechanical affections of the Particles of Rhubarb, Hemlock, Opium, and a Man, as a Watchmaker does those of a Watch, whereby it performs its Operations, and of a File which by rubbing on them will alter the Figure of any of the Wheels, we should be able to tell before Hand, that Rhubarb will purge, Hemlock kill, and Opium make a Man sleep….The dissolving of Silver in aqua fortis, and Gold in aqua Regia, and not vice versa, would be then, perhaps, no more difficult to know, that it is to a Smith to understand, why the turning of one Key will open a Lock, and not the turning of another (E IV.iii.25, pp. 555–56) (cf. Boyle, who had had the same idea, explaining it at length in The Origin of Forms and Qualities, 1666, pp. 16–19).
Knowing real essences would enable us to deduce tertiary qualities, then. What about secondary qualities, however? Here, matters are initially less clear; Locke seems to be saying that while having more acute senses would not eliminate the secondary quality of sound, but might do away with the secondary quality of color. In a passage where he imagines our having very acute senses, including “microscopical eyes,” he unquestionably assumes that we would still experience the secondary quality of sound: “If our Sense of Hearing were but 1000 times quicker than it is, how would a perpetual noise distract us” (E II.xxiii.12, pp. 302–303). Yet, in a preceding passage, he suggested that if our faculties were designed for detecting real essences, we would not experience color at all:
Had we Senses acute enough to discern the minute particles of Bodies, and the real Constitution on which their sensible Qualities depend, I doubt not but they would produce quite different Ideas in us; and that which is now the yellow Colour of Gold, would disappear, and instead of it we should see an admirable Texture of parts of a certain Size and Figure. This Microscopes plainly discover to us: for what to our naked Eyes produces a certain Colour, is by thus augmenting the acuteness of our Senses, discovered to be quite a different thing; and the thus altering, as it were, the proportion of the Bulk of the minute parts of a coloured Object to our usual Sight, produces different Ideas, from what it did before….Blood to the naked Eye appears all red; but by a good Microscope, wherein its lesser parts appear, shews only some few Globules of Red, swimming in a pellucid Liquor; and how these red Globules would appear, if Glasses could be found, that yet could magnify them 1000 or 10000 times more, is uncertain (E II.xxiii.11, pp. 301–302).
Reflecting upon these examples, however, suggests that he is not, or not always, imagining that microscopical eyes would do away with color altogether; rather, it might in some cases enable us to view tinier particles having different colors than those we perceive in the aggregate object. In his example, only as an aggregate body does blood as an aggregate body appears uniformly red; under a microscope, only the globules appear red, while some other parts of it seem translucent. Once the microscope is used, color is not eliminated from the experience of seeing blood, but is instead seen as being differently distributed. A pixelated painting provides a rough analogy; a shape seen from afar may appear uniformly green, but up close is seen as comprising tiny blue and yellow dots.
2.2.3 Obstacles to human attainment
Scientia in natural philosophy would require knowledge of both real essences and their necessary connections among qualities, yet neither is possible for human beings, Locke concludes. One obstacle to scientia, then, is that real essences escape us. God has given us sensory capacities that are suitable for such practical endeavors as finding our way to the “market and exchange,” but as the “microscopical eyes” passage indicates, they are not useful for detecting the minute parts of bodies.
Another obstacle is that we are almost entirely unable to discern the necessary causal connections among the qualities of substances. (And Locke does take those connections to be necessary—but does he construe them in terms of nomological or logical necessity? Given his view that demonstrative knowledge in natural philosophy is possible for immortals and serves as an ideal for mortals, he seems to be thinking in terms of logical necessity, much like the Aristotelians he was reacting against (see Ott, 2009, p. 13). Locke does find two instances in which we can discern necessary connections between qualities of bodies: “Some few of the primary Qualities have a necessary dependence, and visible connexion one with another, as Figure necessarily presupposes Extension, receiving or communicating Motion by impulse, supposes Solidity” (E IV.iii.14, p. 546). Apart from these two exceptions, however, necessary connections escape us. In part, this is due to the first obstacle, our inability to discover real essences, due to the minuteness of particles. It is also due, however, to the remoteness of so many bodies, those which lie “beyond this our Earth and Atmosphere…even beyond the Sun, or remotest Star our Eyes have yet discovered” (E IV.vi.11, p.586–87, and IV.vi.12, p.587). For according to Locke’s speculations, all things might be causally interconnected in complex ways, in which case knowing one real essence would require knowing all those with which it is causally connected.
Still, while human beings cannot attain scientia in natural philosophy, there are other epistemic agents who can. God certainly knows real essences (E III.vi.3, p. 440), and “’tis possible Angels have” ideas of real essences as well (E III.vi.3, p. 440).
It be not to be doubted, that Spirits of a higher rank than those immersed in Flesh, may have as clear Ideas of the radical Constitution of Substances, as we have of a Triangle, and so perceive how all their Properties and Operations flow from thence, but the manner how they come by that Knowledge, exceeds our Conceptions (E III.xi.22, p. 520).
That Locke finds it natural to speak in the same breath of matter and spirits marks him as belonging to the age of natural philosophy rather than science. It is because knowledge of necessary connections can be referred to these higher epistemic agents that scientia is so strongly entrenched as an ideal, even though he recognizes the need for a quite different conception of knowledge.
The conclusion that no intuitive or demonstrative knowledge of substances is possible for us because their real essences and necessary connections remain out of reach leaves Locke at a crossroads. One path is the skeptical belief that without certainty, no knowledge of substances is possible at all. He rejects that path, denying that hyperbolic doubt could be genuine for either the self (E IV.ix.2, pp. 619–20) or for external objects (E IV.xi.3, p. 631). The other path is the one that he follows. Here, he lowers the bar by admitting a third kind of knowledge, which lacks certainty: sensitive knowledge. 
Sensitive knowledge is knowledge of the “effects [that] come every day within the notice of our Senses,” without an understanding of their causes; “we must be content to be ignorant of” those causes (E IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560). Instead of knowing real essences, the causal basis of the properties we perceive, we know only those perceived properties, from which we construct nominal essences. Instead of employing deduction, we are forced to rely upon “trials”—observations and induction. Instead of knowing the necessary connections holding between a substance’s real essence and its other qualities, including its tertiary qualities (which might include, recall, causal connections with substances beyond the remotest star), we know only the co-existences of properties. And from the mere, regular co-existence of properties found in observed cases, Locke observes, we could not know with certainty that the same set will be found co-existing in the next case.
For all the Qualities that are co-existent in any Subject, without this dependence and evident connexion of their Ideas one with another, we cannot know certainly any two to co-exist any farther, than Experience, by our Senses, informs us. Thus though we see the yellow Colour, and upon trial find the Weight, Malleableness, Fusibility, and Fixedness, that are united in a piece of Gold; yet because no one of these Ideas has any evident dependence, or necessary connexion with the other, we cannot certainly know, that where any four of these are, the fifth will be there also, how highly probable soever it may be (E IV.iii.14, p. 546).
Our discoveries about co-existing properties—are merely contingent particulars, or, insofar as they are applied beyond the particular cases we have actually observed, are mere probability. Nevertheless, they can qualify as real knowledge. To qualify, our ideas must meet certain conditions. The complex idea that we refer to as a substance must comprise all and only those simple ideas that we have found to co-exist in nature. With this, Locke aims to show that sensitive knowledge deserves its appellation, since it can be distinguished from arbitrary or otherwise poorly grounded claims (e.g., that fluidity has been found to co-exist with brittleness, in a single substance and at a single given temperature.) Sensitive knowledge is something far less than scientia but far more than ungrounded opinion.
Herein therefore is founded the reality of our Knowledge concerning Substances, that all our complex Ideas of them must be such, and such only, as are made up of such simple ones, as have been discovered to co-exist in Nature. And our Ideas being thus true, though not, perhaps, very exact Copies, are yet the Subjects of real (as far as we have any) Knowledge of them (E IV.iv.12, p. 568).
As for general claims about substances based upon observed particular matters of fact, these too can qualify as real knowledge. Admittedly, when four of the five properties previously found co-existing together occur again, it is only probable that the fifth will be present as well. Yet we can still form an abstract idea of gold, as a substance having all five properties, and call this general claim knowledge because “whatever have once had an union in Nature, may be united again” (E IV.iv.12, p. 568).
Has contemporary science enabled us to go beyond sensitive knowledge? In particular, have discoveries about compounds, elements, and subatomic particles provided us with knowledge of real essences? Much of the force of this question derives, to paraphrase Nicholas Jolley, from the fact that many of those discoveries about matter’s structure were not conceived empirically, but only confirmed empirically; they were initially conceived as possibilities through the hypothetico-deductive model, and the predictions deduced from the models were then compared to empirical data (Jolley 2002, p. 69). Yet as Jolley also points out, these commentators may have missed the full import of Locke’s geometric model; in a passage quoted earlier, Locke tells us explicitly that if we knew the real essence of gold, we could deduce its qualities even if the metal did not exist. So while the predictions of any model developed via the hypothetico-deductive model must survive the test of observations, observations in Locke’s scientia are wholly unnecessary. To put the point another way, Locke takes natural philosophy to be an empirical domain only for human beings, whose faculties are impoverished. For nobler spirits, it would resemble geometry.
The last few decades have seen a lively debate about the role of the corpuscular hypothesis in Locke’s Essay. This section examines the sources of that debate and reviews some of the main positions figuring in it.
As we have seen, Locke develops some central theses of his Essay in connection with the corpuscular hypothesis. In his theory of ideas, corpuscles provide at least a structural basis for simple ideas, and depending upon one’s interpretation, there may be a causal relationship as well. Further, and of particular interest here, Locke often appears to identify a material substance’s real essence with the set or some subset of its component particles’ primary qualities. In the following well-known passage, for instance, he points to the primary qualities of a body’s parts—their bulk or solidity, motion, and shape—as the causal ground of the qualities we perceive.
The particular Bulk, Number, Figure, and Motion of the parts of Fire, or Snow, are really in them whether any ones Senses perceive them or no: and therefore they may be called real Qualities, because they really exist in those Bodies. But Light, Heat, Whiteness, or Coldness, are no more really in them, than Sickness or Pain is in Manna. Take away the Sensation of them; let not the Eyes see Light, or Colours, nor the Ears hear Sounds; let the Palate not Taste, nor the Nose Smell, and all Colours, Tastes, Odors, and Sounds, as they are such particular Ideas, vanish and cease, and are reduced to their Causes, i.e. Bulk, Figure, and Motion of Parts (E II.viii.17, pp. 137–138).
He similarly seems to identify the real essence of bodies with primary qualities just prior to the “microscopical eyes” passage. There, he suggests that instead of seeing colors (or instead of seeing them as we currently do), we could discover bodies’ internal constitutions, if only we knew the “texture and motion of the minute Parts of corporeal things” (E II.xxiii.12, pp. 302–303). A commitment to the corpuscular hypothesis is again suggested when he despairs of understanding the production of secondary qualities: even if “we could discover the size, figure, or motion of those invisible parts, which immediately produce them [secondary qualities],” we still cannot discover any “undoubted Rules” concerning their production or connection, nor “conceive how any size, figure, or motion of any Particles, can possibly produce in us the Idea of any Colour, Taste, or Sound” (E IV.iii.13, p. 545). Here, he appears to despair of understanding how secondary qualities are produced by primary ones; he appears to take the corpuscular hypothesis’s reductionist claim to be true, but he despairs that we could understand how the reduction works.
His discussion of tertiary qualities is similar. If we knew the “Figure, Size, Texture, and Motion of the minute Constituent parts of any two Bodies,” we would then be able to derive tertiary qualities; we would be able to deduce that opium causes sleep, and we would understand why (E IV.iii.25, pp. 555–56; see also E IV.iii.13, p. 545). In all of these passages, then, and in many similar ones, Locke appears to accept at least some components of the corpuscular hypothesis—that material bodies are compounded from minute particles, and certain observable qualities are reducible to the particles’ primary qualities of size, shape, and motion. This tendency to speak as though the corpuscular hypothesis is true, either in whole or in part, has been termed Locke’s “dogmatic” side (Downing 2007).
In apparent tension with this so-called dogmatic side is what has been termed his “agnostic” or “skeptical” side. The following features of his discussion seem to suggest that he has reasons either for remaining agnostic about whether the corpuscular hypothesis is true, or more seriously, for believing that it is wholly unable to explain the phenomena it purports to explain and therefore cannot be true.
First, he refers to the corpuscular hypothesis as a hypothesis, and one that falls well short of providing us with scientific knowledge. Further, he remarks that it is not his aim to adjudicate among competing hypotheses.
I have here instanced in the corpuscularian Hypothesis, as that which is thought to go farthest in an intelligible Explication of the Qualities of Bodies; and I fear the Weakness of humane Understanding is scarce able to substitute another, which will afford us a fuller and clearer discovery of the necessary Connexion, and Co-existence, of the Powers, which are to be observed united in several sorts of them. This at least is certain, that which ever Hypothesis be clearest and truest, (for that it is not my business to determine,) our Knowledge concerning corporeal Substances, will be very little advanced by any of them, till we are made see, what Qualities and Powers of Bodies have a necessary Connexion or Repugnancy one with another; which in the present State of Philosophy, I think, we know but to a very small degree (E IV.iii.16, pp. 547–548).
The hypothetical status of all physical theories is underscored also in Some Thoughts Concerning Education: “The systems of natural philosophy…are to be read, more to know the hypotheses…than with hopes to gain thereby a comprehensive, scientifical, and satisfactory knowledge of the works of nature” (Locke, quoted in Rogers 1982, p. 230). Still, while all physical theories are ultimately hypotheses, it is useful to bear in mind Peter Anstey’s remarks about this one’s genesis. The hypothesis originated among theorists championing an experimental method over a purely speculative one, and while they did not exclude speculation entirely, they circumscribed its role, engaging in it only after observation and experiment had already given the theory a solid foundation. Furthermore, the corpuscular hypothesis had credibility insofar as its theorists avoided the question about matter’s infinite divisibility and thereby adhered to their prohibition against questions they thought could never be answered experimentally (see Anstey, 2011, pp. 4–5).
Second, if Locke indeed identifies material bodies’ real essences with the primary qualities of their constituent corpuscles, that view of real essences combined with his pessimism about ever discovering them implies pessimism about the corpuscular hypothesis. Specifically, it implies pessimism about the claims that bodies are made of corpuscles and that those bodies’ observable qualities are reducible to the corpuscles’ qualities. In the same passages where Locke seems to support or assume the corpuscular hypothesis’s central tenets—that observable bodies are made up of corpuscles and that those corpuscles have a restricted set of inherent properties—he simultaneously appears very skeptical about the possibility of reducing observable properties such as color and taste to that restricted set of primary properties.
Third, Locke arguably believes that the corpuscular hypothesis’s limitations are so serious that they amount to fatal flaws, an interpretation that Wilson (1979) was perhaps the first to defend. Although Wilson develops her line of argument mainly in connection with difficulties Locke raises about the corpuscular hypothesis’s purported ability to explain sensation and more generally, the relation between thought and matter, some other phenomena are troublesome as well. Locke appears to consider such phenomena so obscure that we can attempt to understand them only by attributing them to God’s direct action.
The coherence and continuity of the parts of Matter; the production of Sensation in us of Colours and Sounds, etc. by impulse and motion; nay, the original Rules and Communication of Motion being such, wherein we can discover no natural connexion with any Ideas we have, we cannot but ascribe them to the arbitrary Will and good Pleasure of the Wise Architect (E IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560).
Elsewhere, Locke will use the term ‘superaddition’ to refer to God’s role. For the moment, superadded properties may be neutrally described as those that God confers by fiat. Section 3.3., which reviews some of the main positions in the debate about Locke’s stance toward the corpuscular hypothesis, will also address the various interpretations of superaddition.  First, however, we will examine the problematic phenomena.
This section examines the four phenomena that Locke seems to consider too obscure for the corpuscular hypothesis to illuminate. The above-quoted passage mentioned three of these phenomena— the production of sensation, the communication of motion, and cohesion. Locke discusses the fourth, gravity, only outside the Essay.
As we saw in passages discussed earlier, in connection with scientia’s impossibility, Locke finds the production of sensation to be utterly obscure. One side of the difficulty is the nature of the mind. While in all probability, it is immaterial, Locke allows the possibility that God superadded the power of thought directly to matter. The other side of the difficulty concerns the nature of secondary qualities as powers to produce sensations. The appeal of the corpuscular hypothesis lay largely in its reductive promise. Reduction was expected particularly for secondary qualities, such as colors and sounds, but was also anticipated for ideas of macro-level primary qualities, including visual sensations of shapes and sizes, and tertiary qualities. All would be reduced to the primary qualities of bodies’ component corpuscles as they interact with one another and our perceptual systems.
One part of the corpuscular hypothesis’s purported explanation is conceivable, namely, the interactions among the primary qualities of bodies, which are supposed to be part of the causal basis of our sensations:
That the size, figure, and motion of one Body should cause a change in the size, figure, and motion of another Body, is not beyond our Conception; the separation of the Parts of one Body, upon the intrusion of another; and the change from rest to motion, upon impulse; these, and the like, seem to us to have some connexion one with another (E IV.iii.13, p. 545).
Indeed, we are capable of discerning necessary connections in two instances, as noted earlier. (One case involves only primary qualities— “Figure necessarily presupposes Extension” (E IV.iii.14, p. 546)—while the other involves tertiary and primary qualities—“receiving or communicating Motion by impulse, supposes Solidity” (E IV.iii.14, p. 546).) If we knew more about the primary qualities of bodies, we might multiply such instances: “And if we knew these primary Qualities of Bodies…we might be able to know a great deal more of these Operations of them one upon another”. That is, if we knew real essences, we could derive more necessary connections, to know the causal relation between opium and sleep, for instance, and as certainly as we now know that impulse requires solidity.
Still, knowing real essences would not give us any genuine knowledge of how sensations are produced by primary qualities. While corpuscular theorists such as Galileo (The Assayer) sketched a reductive account of our sensations of taste in terms of particles striking our tongues, Locke suggests that any attempt to discover the process’s details will be foiled. For as far as we can imagine, a body that strikes other bodies can produce “nothing but Motion”  (E IV.iii.6, pp. 540–541), and motion may itself be hopelessly obscure, as indicated below. The roles of shape and size are equally obscure; we cannot imagine how they could help produce sensations.
We are so far from knowing what figure, size, or motion of parts produce a yellow Colour, a sweet Taste, or a sharp Sound, that we can by no means conceive how any size, figure, or motion of any Particles, can possibly produce in us the Idea of any Colour, Taste, or Sound whatsoever; there is no conceivable connexion betwixt the one and the other (E IV.iii.13, p. 545).
Although Locke mentions only secondary qualities here, his point presumably applies to all sensations, including our sensations of macro-level primary qualities, such as the shape and size of a snowball or lump of gold. For again, genuine knowledge is knowledge of necessary connections, with the conceptual relations in geometry being the model, and it does not seem possible to discover such connections between any sensation and the sizes, shapes, and textures that are alleged to cause them. Macro-level primary qualities to micro-level ones and accordingly resemble them. but the idea of a quality is nonetheless very different than the quality itself.
Locke finds that our only way of understanding the production of sensation is to attribute the process to God. If we try to understand how motion could produce a color, sound, or taste, “we are fain to quit our Reason, go beyond our Ideas, and attribute it wholly to the good pleasure of our Maker” (E IV.iii.6, p. 540–541; see also IV.iii.28, p. 559). Locke was certainly not alone in grappling with this problem. Commenting upon Descartes’s account, Walter Charleton (1654, p. 197) had observed earlier that even a detailed knowledge of light behavior would still leave us with the “superlative difficulty” of understanding why a certain reflection or refraction should be “transformed into a Vermillion rather than a Blew,” and further details about our sensory apparatus do not reveal “any Analogy betwixt the Retina Tunica … and any one Colour”. Locke was also not alone in resorting to a divine cause; in De gravitatione’s creation account of bodies, for example, Newton suggested a divine basis for bodies’ abilities to stimulate perceptions in minds.
Newton’s Principia implied the possibility of unmediated action at a distance, and with its publication, gravity became the most nettlesome phenomenon for the orthodox version of the corpuscular hypothesis due to its proviso of contact action. Locke was initially sympathetic to the proviso, writing in the first three editions of his Essay, “How bodies operate one upon another…is manifestly by impulse and nothing else. It being impossible to conceive that body should operate on what it does not touch” (E II.viii.11, editions 1–3). Yet for the fourth edition, he replaced that claim about how bodies do operate with one about how we can conceive of them operating: “How Bodies produce ideas in us is manifestly by impulse, [this being] the only way which we can conceive Bodies [to] operate” (E II.viii.11, edition 4). He also omitted a clause denying unmediated action at a distance, which had appeared in II.viii.12 of previous editions. These subtle emendations reflect a dramatic shift, one expressed directly in his correspondence with Stillingfleet.
The gravitation of matter towards matter, by ways inconceivable to me, is not only a demonstration that God can, if he pleases, put into bodies powers and ways of operation, above what can be derived from our idea of body, or can be explained by what we know of matter, but also an unquestionable and every where visible instance, that he has done so (Second Reply to the Bishop of Worcester, 1699, The Works of John Locke, Vol. IV, p. 467).
The phenomenon of gravity—as explained by “Mr. Newton’s incomparable book” (ibid.)—apparently led Locke to abandon the contact action proviso and to attribute to matter the power of acting distantly, even though he considered the process by which such interactions could occur so obscure that it drove him to invoke superaddition. This is the prevailing interpretation of Locke (and was assumed by Leibniz, who targeted Locke for it in Against Barbaric Physics), though not all commentators agree, as indicated in a subsequent section.
Locke takes the notion of impulse, in which bodies communicate motion to one another by surface impact, to be, along with extension and cohesion, fundamental to our concept of body. Indeed, regardless of how motion may actually be communicated, impulse is the only means by which we can conceive of its being communicated, a view of our conceptual abilities that Locke maintains, as we saw, despite his changing thoughts about gravity. Impulse is also fundamental to the corpuscular hypothesis’s explanation of phenomena, being either the exclusive means of interaction among bodies, as adherents of the contact action proviso hold, or the means of at least many interactions. Yet how exactly does a moving body communicate motion to a resting one simply by impacting it? When we attempt to discover the precise nature of the process, Locke suggests, we find that it is just as mysterious as the process by which the mind moves the body.
Another Idea we have of Body, is the power of communication of Motion by impulse; and of our Souls, the power of exciting of Motion by Thought…. But if here again we enquire how this is done, we are equally in the dark. For in the communication of Motion by impulse, wherein as much Motion is lost to one Body, as is got to the other, which is the ordinariest case, we can have no other conception, but of the passing of Motion out of one Body into another; which, I think, is as obscure and unconceivable, as how our Minds move or stop our Bodies by Thought….The increase of Motion by impulse, which is observed or believed sometimes to happen, is yet harder to be understood. We have by daily experience clear evidence of Motion produced both by impulse, and by thought; but the manner how, hardly comes within our comprehension; we are equally at a loss in both (E II.xxiii.28, p. 311).
Since the corpuscular hypothesis holds impulse to be the primary if not the sole means by which bodies causally interact, then any phenomenon that the corpuscular hypothesis purports to explain by impulse will remain obscure if impulse itself remains obscure. All of the hypothesis’s reductions of observable primary, secondary, and tertiary qualities, would inherit impulse’s obscurity; thus Locke appears to be suggesting here that the corpuscular hypothesis cannot fulfill its promise of explaining and reducing those properties and powers.
Since the claim that observable bodies are made up of particles is central to the corpuscular hypothesis, an immediate question for its proponents asks how the particles cohere into compound bodies. Plenists have some resources for answering that question, though those resources may introduce worse difficulties. Descartes, for instance, though he speaks in terms of particles, understands an individual body as an area of extension moving as one with respect to surrounding areas. It is not possible for any particle to move away into empty space, there being no such thing as empty space once matter is identified with extension; with every bit of matter pressed from all sides by other matter, there is no problem about cohesion per se, though there is certainly a problem about individuating bodies from one another. In the same vein, Malebranche can invoke the pressure of the air to explain the coherence of bodies, and then invoke the pressure of an aether to explain the coherence of air particles. Locke objects that this explanation fails because it leaves us with the question of what causes the particles of the aether to cohere (E II.xxiii.23, p, 308). The objection reveals Locke’s atomist sympathies, drawing its power from the presumption that there is such a thing as empty space into which the aether particles could move. The problem for atomist versions of the corpuscular hypothesis is that the restricted set of properties that they allow the particles —size, shape, and motion—provides no obvious resources for explaining how the particles cohere with one another to form compound bodies. In various forms, the problem about cohesion has dogged atomists since ancient times.
The problem arises in two forms, which, to borrow James Hill’s terminology (Hill 2004), may be called the limited and the foundational problems. The limited problem, arising for those who take corpuscles to be genuine atoms, that is, to be indivisible, is the problem of explaining how those indivisible corpuscles cohere with one another. This is the problem one finds in Newton’s writings. Although Rule 3 of the Principia allows the possibility that the least parts of matter could turn out to be divisible, his atomist sympathies are evident throughout his writings. He speculates in Query 31 that in all probability, bodies are made up of hard particles that only God could divide, and in the body of the Opticks (Book II, Part III, Proposition VII) he suggests that more powerful microscopes might permit us to see the larger particles. In answer to the problem of how those naturally indivisible particles cohere, he rejects the ancient solution of hooked particles as begging the question, proposing instead some short-range forces modeled on the gravitational force (Query 31). Newton’s speculations about such forces are driven by an absence of any resolution to the problem about cohesion within the corpuscular theory itself.
The foundational problem pushes the question about cohesion into the corpuscles themselves. The problem was raised by Joseph Glanvill: “If it be pretended…that the parts of solid bodies are held together by hooks, and angulous involutions; I say, this comes not home: For the coherence of the parts of these hooks…will be of as difficult a conception, as the former” (Glanvill, The Vanity of Dogmatizing, p. 18, quoted in Hill 2004, p. 616). Without any grounds for asserting that the divisibility of matter bottoms out in indivisible corpuscles, then, the question arises of how the parts of a corpuscle could cohere, how the parts of those parts could cohere, and so on, ending in the question of how extended bodies are possible at all.
Whatever his ultimate view of the corpuscular hypothesis, Locke inevitably faces the atomist’s problem about cohesion, accepting as he does void space (see II.xiii.11, 12–14, 21–23), and holding that our ideas of body depend fundamentally upon cohesion. One of the ideas “proper and peculiar” to body, he writes, is “the cohesion of solid, and consequently separable parts” (E II.xxiii.17, p. 306), and the extension of body, as opposed to the extension of space, is “nothing, but the cohesion or continuity of solid, separable, moveable Parts” (E II.iv.5, p. 126). Yet we have no understanding of cohesion, and so our idea of body does not rest on any genuine understanding of it. In trying to understand how bodies are extended, we are as much in the dark as when we try to understand how the soul thinks.
’Tis as easie for him to have a clear Idea, how the Soul thinks, as how Body is extended. For since Body is no farther, nor otherwise extended, than by the union and cohesion of its solid parts, we shall very ill comprehend the extension of Body, without understanding wherein consists the union and cohesion of its parts; which seems to me as incomprehensible, as the manner of Thinking, and how it is performed (E II.xxiii.24, p. 309).
One scholarly debate about cohesion concerns the question of whether Locke acknowledged only the limited problem, as one would expect from commentators who read him as accepting atomism (e.g. Mandelbaum 1964, p. 1), or whether he looked further, to the more serious, foundational problem, as Hill argues (2004). A related controversy, to be discussed in the next section, concerns the question of whether Locke concludes that the corpuscular hypothesis simply cannot resolve the problem (e.g., Hill 2004; Downing 2007, p. 408) or instead remains agnostic on the issue (e.g., McCann in Chappell 1998, p. 244).
The four problematic phenomena winnow away the components of the corpuscular hypothesis, as defined at the outset of this article. The problem about sensation threatens the corpuscular hypothesis’s promise of reducing secondary, tertiary, and macro-level primary qualities to microlevel primary qualities. Newton’s results about gravitational phenomena cast grave doubts upon the contact action proviso, and according to some commentators, those results led Locke to abandon the belief that impulse is the only means of causal interaction. A corpuscular theorist might hope to preserve some part of the theory by insisting that impulse is still the means by which most other causal interactions are effected; but this runs up against the problem about impulse, in that the process by which motion is communicated seems utterly obscure. Finally, even the core claim that observable bodies are composed of tiny corpuscles is threatened by the problem of cohesion. This last problem threatens to be the most serious of four phenomena, for as James Hill has pointed out (2004, p. 628), the problems about gravity, sensation, and motion arise subsequent to our having conceived of body, whereas the problem about cohesion may thwart our very ability to conceive clearly of body.
This section considers some main responses to the tension between Locke’s seeming acceptance of the corpuscular hypothesis, most notable in his apparent identification of a material substance’s real essence with the size, shape, and texture of its insensible parts, and his pessimism about the hypothesis’s explanatory power, most notable in his remarks about the four phenomena discussed above.
One approach to the tension is to understand it as a genuine inconsistency. Margaret Wilson has defended such an interpretation, though in the 1979 paper that launched the debate, her intent is to show how acutely Locke understood the explanatory limitations of “Boylean mechanism”. Specifically, Wilson argues, the inconsistency reveals Locke’s recognition “that some presumed properties of matter cannot be conceived as ‘natural’ consequences of Boylean primary qualities” (Wilson 1979, p. 197). Thus, our ignorance about bodies has more profound causes than our ignorance about the primary qualities of a body’s constituent corpuscles. In accordance with her view that Locke’s agnostic tendencies (just like his dogmatic ones) are genuine, Wilson interprets Locke’s concept of superaddition robustly, as a sort of divine action that goes beyond the corpuscular hypothesis. According to this “non-essentialist” or “divine annexation” reading, Locke understands superadded properties as properties that God has annexed to matter by fiat, and that bear no intrinsic connection to matter’s real essence. This reading implies a distinction in etiology for superadded qualities. Whereas the other qualities of matter are either given initially, as those qualities constituting the real essence, or else flow from the real essence, superadded qualities are added on independently of the real essence, such that the substance would have been complete without them. This view implies that while superadded properties are consistently present, they are inexplicable by physical theory and, accordingly, are evidence of divine action. 
Some other interpretations absolve Locke of inconsistency, either by emphasizing his so-called dogmatic side while downplaying or reinterpreting his agnostic tendencies, or emphasizing his agnosticism while downplaying his dogmatism. One line of interpretation, then, reads Locke as in some manner accepting the corpuscular hypothesis (Mandelbaum 1964, chapter 1; Osler 1970, p. 12; Ayers 1975; McCann 1994, §1 and p. 85; McCann 2002, pp. 354–355). According to weaker versions of this reading, Locke’s project is the naturalistic one of pursuing the philosophical implications of the best available scientific theory, and developing an epistemological basis for it. McCann, for example, reads Locke as defending the atomist version of the corpuscular philosophy over its Cartesian competitor by providing an epistemology for it. While Descartes had provided an epistemology for his plenist version, there was nothing comparable for the atomist version associated with Gassendi and Boyle until Locke supplied it (McCann 2002, pp. 354–355). According to Ayers’ stronger interpretation, Locke accepts “pure mechanism,” that is, the orthodox version of the corpuscular hypothesis, which includes the contact action proviso. According to this view, all of matter’s qualities flow from its real essence (Ayers 1981).
Since this line of interpretation seeks to downplay Locke’s agnostic tendencies, one challenge is to account for Locke’s pessimism about the possibility of our knowing real essences. Mandelbaum meets the challenge by confining Locke’s pessimism to the real essences of particular material substances; we are able to know “the general properties possessed by all material substances,” and are ignorant only of the “particular sizes, shapes, number, or motions of the particles which go to make up any specific object” (Mandelbaum 1964, p. 54). A related challenge is to account for Locke’s appeals to superaddition, since prima facie, Locke’s reason for invoking God is that he thinks the corpuscular hypothesis has no resources for explaining the four problematic phenomena. Ayers responds by rejecting Wilson’s divine annexation interpretation of superaddition in favor of a deflationary one. According to Ayers’ “divine architect” interpretation, Locke makes no distinction in etiology by calling a property superadded; he means only that God selected the property with particular care when first creating matter. To diffuse the effect of Locke’s remarks to Stillingfleet, in which Locke appears to embrace action at a distance, Ayers points to Locke’s late manuscript, “The Elements of Natural Philosophy,” interpreting certain passages as referring gravitational effects to an undetectable medium (Ayers 1981, pp. 212–214). This move has been challenged by Stuart. Claiming that the manuscript was probably written for the education of a child, Stuart denies that it could trump Locke’s remarks to Stillingfleet (see Stuart 1998, pp. 378–379).
Another way to absolve Locke of inconsistency is to emphasize his agnosticism or skepticism, while downplaying or reinterpreting passages that appear to commit him to the corpuscular hypothesis. Interpretations in this vein tend to emphasize Locke’s pessimism about our ability to know real essences, to discern necessary connections, and consequently, have scientia in natural philosophy. Commentators pursuing this line include Downing (1998, 2007), Jolley (2002), and Connolly (2015); the latter argues for an even greater epistemic humility, one extending to real essences, along with superaddition (mentioned briefly below).
The central challenge facing such interpretations is to account for the passages in which Locke speaks as though he accepts the corpuscular hypothesis, most notably those in which he appears to identify the real essences of material substances with the corpuscles’ primary qualities. Jolley (2002) accounts for Locke’s so-called dogmatic tendency in strategic terms. Locke’s Essay targets both Aristotelians and Cartesians, and though agnosticism, which targets the Cartesians, is ultimately the dominant tendency in his thought, Locke emphasizes the explanatory power of the corpuscular hypothesis whenever he has the Aristotelians in his sights. Downing (1998, 2007), meanwhile, interprets Locke’s Essay as developing metaphysical distinctions that constrain physical theory, and then downplays his dogmatic side by taking the corpuscular hypothesis to be truly only a hypothesis for him, and denying that real essence can be identified with primary qualities. Properly understood, Downing argues, the distinction between real and nominal essence is a metaphysical distinction. It is thus more fundamental than the distinction between primary and secondary qualities, which belongs to a particular physical theory, the corpuscular hypothesis. To be worth its salt, a physical theory must meet the metaphysical constraint provided by the real-nominal essence distinction. That is, the physical theory must provide some way of making sense of the notion that material bodies have an internal constitution that is inaccessible to us while producing qualities that are accessible. Locke explains his metaphysical distinction using one physical theory, the corpuscular hypothesis, as an illustration, and he often appears to accept or even defend that hypothesis. Still, this is only an appearance, an appearance due to a certain advantage that the corpuscular hypothesis has over other physical hypotheses: it is the theory best suited to our sensory capacities and understanding. Despite its unique status, Locke sees it as a mere hypothesis, one crippled by the explanatory limitations evidenced by the problematic phenomena discussed earlier. For Downing, then, Locke’s dogmatic tendencies disappear, leaving only his agnostic side.
Taking a different approach to the situation, Jacovides (2017) treats Locke’s descriptions of what we perceive, intuit, and are capable of conceiving as providing a case for testing some Kuhnian theses; as the normal science of his day, the corpuscularian hypothesis sets limits upon what Locke can conceive.
Locke and Newton probably first met in 1689 (though the exact date is not known; Westfall 1980, p. 488; Rogers 1982, p. 219), and their main works were written independently of one another; Locke’s Essay,though published subsequently, was essentially complete by the time he read the Principia. A noticeable intellectual affinity may nevertheless be seen in those works, and the opportunity for mutual influence followed as they established a friendship, exchanging views on a wide variety of subjects, not least certain unorthodox theological convictions (see Westfall 1980, 490–91). The influence did not run in one direction alone; in a draft passage probably penned shortly after the Principia’s second edition, for example, Newton adopts a Lockean tone as he denies that any ideas are innate. As for Newton’s influence upon Locke, the best-known example concerns action at a distance, as noted below, though there are deeper questions about methodology.
A good deal of resemblance to Locke’s epistemological approach can be seen in Newton, who holds that, revelation apart, we must gather what knowledge we can from our perceptions, and anything like a real essence eludes us. In the early manuscript, De gravitatione, for instance, Newton denies knowing the “essential and metaphysical constitution” of matter (Newton, 2004, p. 27). He reiterates this position in later texts, including the 1713 General Scholium:
We certainly do not know what is the substance of any thing. We see only the shapes and colors of bodies, we hear only their sounds, we touch only their external surfaces….But there is no direct sense and there are no indirect reflected actions by which we know innermost substances (Principia, 942).
Locke and Newton also share the problem of an evidentiary deficit, insofar as they subscribe to corpuscularianism. Thinkers who did subscribe tended to rely on transduction (also called transdiction)—an inductive inference that is empirical insofar as it relies upon observed cases, but which generalizes not only to unobserved cases but to those that are unobservable.) Newton’s Rule 3 licensed such inferences, from the Principia’s second edition onward, for qualities of invariable intensity, i.e., extension, impenetrability, hardness, mobility, and the vis inertiae. The rule explicitly permits inferences to the realm of the unobservable: “Because the hardness of the whole arises from the hardness of the parts, we justly infer from this not only the hardness of the undivided particles of bodies that are accessible to our senses, but also of all other bodies” (Principia, Book 3, p. 795). As for Locke and the problem of transduction, how serious it is for him depends largely upon the status of the corpuscular hypothesis. If he takes an agnostic or skeptical stance toward it, then he owes no solution to the problem.
Although the endeavors of Locke and Newton are often considered complementary, there are questions about how Locke responded to the Principia, both in terms of its methodology and its epistemological implications. With regard to the former, how far did Locke go in absorbing or incorporating the methodology that Newton had forged? As a number of commentators have emphasized, the new science was itself in flux at this time, with natural history being gradually sidelined by Newton’s approach, an experimentalism that was theoretical and mathematical (see, e.g., Anstey 2011; Roux, 2013). Given that Locke had had Boyle as his mentor but was greatly impressed by Newton’s Principia, it is natural to ask whether a similar shift was occurring in Locke’s own thought. Although Locke was influenced by Newton, his allegiances to certain older ideas ran deep. De Pierris (2006) explains Locke’s failure to adopt the method of inductive proof in terms of his devotion to the ideal of demonstrative knowledge, as combined with a belief in hidden primary qualities.
With regard to its epistemological implications, what precisely did Locke take the Principia to have achieved? To pose the question in the starkest possible terms, might Newton’s Principia have tempted Locke to retreat from his belief that natural philosophy cannot be made a science (much as it led him to retreat from the contact action proviso)? Perhaps Locke categorized Newton’s epistemological achievement in natural philosophy as a contribution to sensitive knowledge alone. That is, perhaps he saw Newton’s “mighty Designs in advancing the Sciences” (Essay, Epistle to the Reader, pp. 9–10) as confined to providing a firm basis for natural philosophy through his experimental method. But did he perhaps instead take Newton’s mathematical methods as offering the demonstrations needed to push natural philosophy into the domain of demonstrative knowledge and hence scientia?
Commentators interpreting Locke as seeing Newton’s contribution in terms of sensitive knowledge alone include Yolton (1969); Woolhouse (1994); and Downing (1997, see especially pp. 292–93). Winkler (2008), however, reads Locke’s correspondence with Stillingfleet and other writings from the 1690s as a defense of Newton’s mathematical physics, and one that draws from his mathematical demonstrations a greater optimism about the possibility of certain knowledge in natural philosophy. This move has been contested by Domski (2012), who argues that Locke advocated Newton’s mathematical methods only in connection with astronomy, whose objects are unavailable for experimentation; and that Locke maintained his emphasis upon natural historical methods for questions about terrestrial bodies. The debate over the extent to which Locke prioritized natural history over experimentalism directly concerns his stance on hypotheses (a controversy mapped by Priselac, 2017), while a related debate concerns the relationship between medicine and natural philosophy. Opposing Yost (1951) among others, Lu-Adler (2021) has recently argued that Locke did not assume that the scientific methodology most appropriate to medicine could be generalized to physics.
Locke’s discussions of space, body, mind, and God bear some striking similarities to Newton’s, raising questions about the extent of those similarities as well as points of influence. Newton presents his mature concept of space in the Principia, having formulated important aspects of it earlier in the manuscript De gravitatione. In both texts, space is distinct from body and is real, infinite, three-dimensional, and homogeneous. Whereas body has separable parts, Newton’s eternal, infinite space is immobile and indivisible, having merely distinguishable parts. Although space is neither substance nor attribute, it would be a mistake to suppose that it is nothing; as he emphasizes in De gravitatione (2004, p. 21, 22), by explaining space’s properties he has shown that it is something.
Unlike Newton, Locke initially accepted a relationist view of space; in journal entries of 1676–78 and the Early Draft of the Essay, space is nothing more than a relation between bodies that do not touch (see Gorham, 2020, p. 221). In the Essay, however, his discussion of space and its relation to body is strongly reminiscent of the Principia’s absolutist conception. Locke confesses himself to be among those “who persuade themselves … that they can think on Space, without anything in it, that resists, or is protruded by Body” (E II.iii.5, p. 126). Declaring that explicating extension in terms of partes extra partes would be tautological (E II.iii.15, p. 173) and declining to answer the question of whether space is substance or accident (E II.iii.17, p. 174), Locke describes our idea of “pure Space” (E II.iii.5, p. 126) as an extension consisting of “the continuity of unsolid, inseparable, and immoveable Parts” (ibid.; see also E II.xiii.13, 14, which further discuss space’s perpetual rest and the impossibility of separating its parts, either actually or mentally). Lacking solidity, space poses no resistance to a body’s motion (E II.xiii.12, p. 172). Again recalling Newton, who takes space to be a consequence of God’s existence (2004, p. 21), Locke invokes God when defending his conception of space: “Those who assert the impossibility of Space existing without Matter, must not only make Body infinite, but must also deny a power in God to annihilate any part of Matter” (E II.xiii.21, p. 176).
Analyzing remarks such as the above, most commentators have concluded that by the time of the published Essay, Locke had fully abandoned the relationist view (see Gibson, 1960; Di Biase, 2016; Gorham and Slowik, 2014; Gorham, 2020). However, Locke tends to describe our ideas rather than things themselves, and the gap between the two has led a few commentators to conclude that Locke retained his earlier relationism or, at least, some inclination toward it (e.g., Thomas, 2016; see also Rogers, 1978).
Locke’s concept of body also overlaps considerably with Newton’s. In developing a concept of body, Locke notoriously finds the related, general problem about a substratum or substance vexing, whereas Newton dispenses with the problem more easily. In De gravitatione, Newton eliminates the unintelligible notion of prime matter by associating perceived properties with determined quantities of extension. Both thinkers attack Descartes’ identification of matter with extension, instead sympathizing strongly with the notion of atoms in a void. Further, Newton’s list in Rule 3 of body’s universal qualities includes not only extension, hardness, impenetrability, and mobility, but also the vis inertiae—the inherent force or power of resisting (Principia, Definition 3), which some commentators take Newton to identify with mass. Locke’s concept, however, emphasizes extension, mobility, and solidity, without mentioning mass. Still, since Locke explicates solidity in terms of impenetrability, which arises from resistance (E II.iv.1), there may be grounds for holding that his concept does after all include mass, a position defended by Woolhouse (2005). At the least, Locke’s discussion of action by impulse presupposes mass, as Stein has noted. Nevertheless, presupposing the concept may not amount to including it in the concept of body, since as Stein points out, mass for Locke “cannot be construed to correspond to a simple idea, but can only be understood as a power ‘mediately perceivable’” (Stein 1990, p. 36).
The question about gravity’s relation to body is also a persistent source of controversy for both thinkers. One point of clarity and consensus is that neither Locke nor Newton considers the power of gravitational attraction to be essential to matter. Newton consistently denies that it is essential (for instance in his explanatory remarks following Rule 3 of the Principia) and Locke refers to it only as power superadded or endowed by God. Locke’s concept of superaddition is controversial, as noted earlier, but he does appear to embrace action at a distance in his letter to Stillingfleet. Newton’s writings contain no such dramatic pronouncements. So, while a few commentators interpret Newton as accepting action at a distance, grounded either in a superadded property (Henry 1994) or in a relational quality of matter (Schliesser 2011), his more favorable remarks are at best indirect. Most commentators interpret him as at least having very grave misgivings about distant action, so perhaps Locke was wise to credit his change of heart about gravity to “Mr. Newton’s incomparable book,” rather than to Newton himself.
With respect to mind, Locke and Newton are both circumspect about its nature and yet may be considered substance dualists. Although Newton indicates in De gravitatione that he does not pretend to know the substantial foundation of minds, he consistently presents minds as immaterial, lacking certain characteristics of body, namely, hardness, impenetrability and resistance. Similarly, while Locke explicitly allows the possibility of thinking matter in his Essay and discusses it at length with Stillingfleet, he emphasizes that in all probability, the soul is immaterial (E IV.iii.6, pp. 540–541). Does Locke share Newton’s view that even immaterial spirits are spatially extended, such that a mind can co-occupy place with a body? A Cartesian interpretation does not seem impossible given Locke’s remarks about the possibility of thinking matter, which contrast matter against an immaterial soul that is unextended. Still, at several passages in the Essay, Locke seems to agree with Newton. At E II xxvii.2 (p. 329), he locates minds spatially: “Finite spirits having had each its determinate time and place of beginning to exist, the relation to that time and place will always determine to each of them its identity, as long as it exists”.
Finally, Locke seems to share Newton’s belief in God’s substantial ubiquity and its implications. As the above-quoted passage’s discussion of finite spirits continues, he remarks more generally on the possibility of co-presence: “These three sorts of substances, as we term them, do not exclude one another out of the same place” (ibid.). His later remarks about the “infinite Space … possessed by God’s infinite Omnipresence” (E II.xvii.20, p. 222) are similar, but by framing them in terms of third parties’ ideas, Locke leaves more room there for interpretive controversy.
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