Reid’s Ethics

First published Tue Jan 4, 2011; substantive revision Wed Oct 12, 2016

We are often told that the moral theories defended by modern philosophers fall into two types. On the one hand are rationalist positions developed by thinkers such as Samuel Clarke, William Wollaston, and Richard Price. The rationalists, it is said, believe that reason is the basis of morality, as morality is (in some sense) both grounded in and grasped by reason. On the other hand are sentimentalist positions championed by philosophers such as the Third Earl of Shaftesbury, Francis Hutcheson, and David Hume. The sentimentalists, it is claimed, hold that affect is the basis of morality. According to the standard classification, the sentimentalists believe that morality has relatively little to do with reason, as it is (in some sense) both grounded in and discerned by sentiment.

Thomas Reid’s (1710–1796) moral philosophy does not neatly fit into this scheme of classification. To be sure, some characterize Reid as a rationalist working within the tradition of Clarke and Price (see MacIntyre 1966 and Rawls 2000, Introduction). One can see why. Reid, after all, affirms core rationalist claims, such as that there is a body of necessary moral principles that are self-evident to the ordinary person. But there are important elements of Reid’s thought that do not fit the rationalist paradigm. For example, Reid defends the view that all normal, mature human beings are endowed with a moral sense. Like philosophers such as Hutcheson and Hume, Reid claims that the moral sense yields sentiments of various sorts that themselves occasion “our first moral conceptions,” such as the apprehension that an act is approbation-worthy (EAP V.ii: 279). This account of concept formation, according to some philosophers, would make Reid’s position a version of sentimentalism (see D’Arms 2005). In this respect, Reid’s position resembles not Clarke’s and Price’s but Hutcheson’s and Hume’s.

There is, then, a sense in which Reid’s moral philosophy resists ready categorization. It is neither a version of rationalism nor sentimentalism, but an attempt to blend those features from both these traditions that Reid found most attractive. This presents a challenge to the contemporary interpreter of Reid’s moral philosophy. One wonders: Is Reid’s theory of morals an exotic hybrid, one which eludes the categories used by contemporary philosophers to describe ethical theories?

Not exactly. Anyone familiar with contemporary moral philosophy could not fail to miss the resemblance that Reid’s position bears to the view defended some one hundred and fifty years later by W. D. Ross (see Ross 2002). Although Ross never mentions Reid as an influence, both thinkers operate within a broadly non-naturalist framework according to which the sciences offer us limited insight into the nature of moral reality. In so doing, they both stood against powerful trends in their day to “naturalize” ethics. Moreover, both reject monistic accounts of the moral domain, such as those defended by Kantians and consequentialists, according to which there is one master ethical principle from which all others are derived. According to both Reid and Ross, there is instead a plurality of self-evident moral first principles, none of which is reducible to another.

In light of this, we might describe Reid’s position as a proto-Rossian version of ethical intuitionism. While such a description is tempting, it would probably be misleading. For the parallels between Reid and Ross extend only so far. The most important difference between the two thinkers is this: Ross frames his project in the light of G. E. Moore’s Open Question Argument and Mill’s utilitarianism—two philosophical topics about which Reid knew nothing. Reid, by contrast, developed his version of ethical intuitionism within the context of a defense of a certain account of human agency, according to which each of us is endowed with “active power” which we can freely exercise. Reid believed that this account of human agency, when coupled with our best scientific knowledge, yields a form of non-naturalist ethical intuitionism. Call a position that grounds many of its core metaethical claims about the nature of moral reality in a particular view of human agency an agency-centered account. Agency-centered views tell us that in order to understand the nature of moral reality we must first examine the nature of agency. Reid’s is an agency-centered version of ethical intuitionism. Ross’s, by contrast, is not.

The project of this essay is to present both the motivations for and fundamental contours of Reid’s agency-centered intuitionist view. Before diving into the details of Reid’s position, however, it may be worth saying a word about the influence of Reid’s views in contemporary ethics. If one were to gauge this influence by the number of books or articles written in the last one hundred years about Reid’s ethics, one would have to conclude that his influence is negligible. Very little has been written about Reid’s moral philosophy. Indeed, Reid is not even included in what is perhaps the standard anthology on the British Moralists, the two-volume work edited by Selby-Bigge of the same title (Selby-Bigge 1965). Moreover, one would also have to conclude that Reid’s influence on moral philosophers who receive a great deal of attention, such as Moore, is marginal. For example, in the flurry of work produced in 2003 on the centenary of the publication of Moore’s Principia Ethica, no one mentions Reid as an influence on Moore’s ethical views.

The reality of the matter, however, is that Reid has indeed exercised considerable influence on contemporary moral philosophy, albeit indirectly. This influence runs primarily through Henry Sidgwick, who knew Reid’s work well (see Sidgwick 2000, Ch. 16). Sidgwick, it seems, exposed his student, G. E. Moore, to Reid’s views (see Beanblossom 1983). Reid’s broadly common sense methodology and his positive views were subsequently taken up by Moore. Among the more salient similarities one finds in their ethical views is that both thinkers are interested in whether the fundamental moral properties are definable. Reid claims they are not; fundamental moral properties are, in Reid’s estimation, simple, indefinable, and sui generis (EAP III.iii.v). Famously, Moore said the same, although for somewhat different reasons. And the rest, as they say, is history. Depending on one’s views, one might view this history as one in which Moore finally put ethical theory on the right track or, alternatively, pushed it off the rails. Whatever one’s opinion on this issue, Reid seems to have had a role in its direction.

1. The System of Necessity

Reid’s moral philosophy, according to the gloss offered thus far, is an agency-centered intuitionist position, which also blends together both rationalist and sentimentalist influences. Given its synthetic character, it is natural to ask how best to enter into Reid’s thought. A promising avenue is to note a pattern of thought present in Reid’s work. In his work in epistemology and philosophy of mind, which is found primarily in An Inquiry into the Human Mind (IHM) and Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (EIP), Reid frames his project as a response to a general position that he calls the Way of Ideas. This position, which Reid says unites philosophers as diverse as Aristotle, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, holds that we are never acquainted with the external world but only with “images” or sense data in the mind. What Reid says positively about our perception of the external world is couched as a response to this view. Although it is rarely noted, Reid’s work in ethics in Essays on the Active Powers of Man (EAP) is also framed as a response to a general position, which he claims is adopted by philosophers as diverse as Spinoza, Leibniz, and Hume. This position Reid ordinarily calls the System of Necessity. Reid’s own positive views about the nature of agency and the moral domain are best viewed as a response to the System of Necessity. Let us, then, enter Reid’s moral philosophy by having before us the rudiments of the System of Necessity.

Suppose you have fallen asleep in your bed after a long day of work. You briefly wake during the night, noting that someone has left a kitchen light on. You do not want, however, to get out of bed at this hour. Still, after pondering the issue for a moment, you know that you should do so. So, you drag yourself out of bed and turn the light off. How should we describe your behavior?

According to advocates of the System of Necessity, there is a sense in which the performance of this action is up to you. No one forced you to get up out of bed. There is also a sense in which you did it because you believed you should. It is this belief, coupled with a desire—perhaps to do what is right—that moved you to get out of bed. Finally, there is a sense in which there is an explanation of your action that is perfectly law-like. Because your desire (let us suppose) to do what is right was stronger than your desire to stay in bed, it won out. Under the supposition that stronger motivations win, we have a perfectly general, law-like explanation of why you acted as you did.

In Reid’s view, then, proponents of the System of Necessity affirm these three claims:

  1. Every human action has a sufficient cause.
  2. Provided normal background conditions obtain, the sufficient cause of a human action is its motive, which is a mental state of an agent.
  3. Every human action is subsumable under a law, which specifies that for any agent S, set of motives M, and action A at t, necessarily, if S performs A, then there is some member of M that is S’s strongest motive, which causes S to perform A at t.

Viewed from on angle, these claims appear not to fit tightly together. One could accept any one and reject the others. Viewed from another angle, however, they express a unified picture of human action, one according to which human action is a natural phenomenon that is subsumable under laws in much the same way that other ordinary natural events are. If one is attracted to this broadly naturalistic position, as Reid claims that figures such as Spinoza, Hume, Priestley, and Kames were, then these claims form a natural package (see Cuneo 2011a).

Reid, however, believed that this package of claims provides a deeply distorted picture of human action. Why did he believe this? In large part because he could not see how it could account for genuinely autonomous human agency in at least two senses of this multivalent term. In the first place, autonomous actions are ones that can be properly ascribed to an agent. But if the System of Necessity were true, Reid claimed, there is no proper sense in which actions that appear to be performed by an agent could justly be attributed to that agent—the human agent being simply a theater in which various drives and impulses vie for dominance. One could, if the System of Necessity were right, attribute actions to mental states such as desires. And this might be adequate to describe the behavior of animals and addicts. But, Reid claims, it is not adequate to describe purposeful human action. For human action, in Reid’s view, must be attributable to the person as a whole, not some force working in or on her (see Korsgaard 2009, xii).

Secondly, autonomous agency is such that an agent can exercise a certain type of control over the various impulses that present themselves when deliberating. Suppose, to return to our earlier case, that you briefly wake during the night, noting that someone has left a kitchen light on. You want not to get out of bed at this hour. Must you capitulate to your strongest desire? Not if you are autonomous. For genuinely autonomous agents, according to Reid, are reflective. Any desire is such that an autonomous agent can direct his attention not only to its object, but also to the desire itself, asking: Should I act on it? That is, any such agent can ask these two questions: First, would acting on this desire contribute to my genuine well-being? And, second, is there a sufficient moral reason or obligation for acting on or ignoring it? These two questions advert to what Reid calls the rational principles of action (see EAP, III.iii.i). The first principle Reid calls the principle with “regard to our good on the whole,” the second the “principle of duty.” The fact that you needn’t capitulate to your desire to stay in bed but can step back and critically assess it with reference to these two rational principles of action, in Reid’s estimation, is what separates normal, mature human beings from the rest of the natural order.

This point was important enough to Reid that he highlights it in the Introduction to Essays on the Active Powers and elsewhere:

The brutes are stimulated to various actions by their instincts, by their appetites, by their passions: but they seem to be necessarily determined by the strongest impulse, without any capacity of self-government…. They may be trained up by discipline, but cannot be governed by law. There is no evidence that they have the conception of a law, or of its obligation.

Man is capable of acting from motives of a higher nature. He perceives a dignity and worth in one course of conduct, a demerit and turpitude in another, which brutes have not the capacity to discern….

[Men] judge what ends are most worthy to be pursued, how far every appetite and passion may be indulged, and when it ought to be resisted…. In them [the brutes] we may observe one passion combating another, and the strongest prevailing; but we perceive no calm principle in their constitution that is superior to every passion, and able to give law to it. (EAP, 5 and II.ii: 57)

When Reid talks about our capacity to be governed by law he has in mind our capacity to regulate our behavior by assessing it in terms of the two rational principles of action. Reid, then, champions what we might call a regulation account of autonomy. We are autonomous, rational agents, in Reid’s estimation, in virtue of the fact that we can regulate or govern our behavior by stepping back from our various impulses, desires, instincts, and assess prospective actions in light of the two rational principles of action. It is this dimension of human action, according to Reid, that is missing altogether from the description of agency offered by advocates of the System of Necessity.

1.1 Reid’s alternative

In Reid’s view, then, the System of Necessity fails to offer an accurate account of human agency. What alternative account of agency did Reid propose? One that accepts the following three claims:

(1′) Every human action has a cause, which in the case of free human action is not itself a motive, but the agent himself.

(2′) Motives are not mental states but the ends for which an agent acts.

(3′) Human action is nomic only to this extent: If an agent fails to exercise autonomy when deliberating (and he is not in a state of indifference), then his strongest desire to act in a certain way will prevail. If he exercises autonomy when deliberating, however, then he will act on the motive that seems to him most rationally appropriate.

Let us consider these three claims in turn.

The first statement, (1′), expresses Reid’s commitment to an agent causal account of human free action. Reid presents various arguments for this view in Essays on the Active Powers of Man, but it is worth emphasizing that a central consideration that Reid furnishes in its favor appeals not to common sense but to what science appears to tell us. Reid, like most of his contemporaries, was a Newtonian. In Reid’s judgment, however, Newtonian science is committed to the claim “that matter is a substance altogether inert, and merely passive; that gravitation, and the other attractive or repulsive powers … are not inherent in its nature, but impressed upon it by some external cause” (EAP 34). Matter, according to this view, does not cause anything. On the assumptions that there is genuine causality in the world and that agents are causes, it follows that agents, who are not material things, in Reid’s view, are the only causes. Reid takes Newtonian science to imply a mitigated version of occasionalism according to which the only genuine causation in the world is agent causation.

The second statement above, (2′), expresses Reid’s commitment to a broadly teleological account of human agency, according to which autonomous human action is explained not by the impulses that present themselves to an agent when deliberating but by the ends for which she acts. In his defense of this view, Reid argues that, contrary to the adherents of the System of Necessity, motives are not mental states that cause us to act, for motives are not the right sort of thing to be causes: They are not agents. In some places, in fact, Reid says that motives (as he thinks of them) have no “real existence,” by which he seems to mean (at least) that they are not part of the spatio-temporal manifold but are abstracta (see EAP IV.iv: 214).

These claims might take us aback: Motives are not causes and have no real existence? How could that be? When evaluating these claims, two things should be noted. First, Reid is working with a rather narrow understanding of what it is for something to be a cause (and to exist)—an understanding, we’ve seen, he thinks fits best with a Newtonian understanding of the world. Second, Reid’s considered view about the role of motives is actually more complicated than (2′) would have us believe. (2′) expresses the view that Reid defends in Essay IV of Essays on the Active Powers, “Of the Liberty of Moral Agents.” But anyone who has read Essay III, “Of the Principles of Action,” knows that Reid claims that motives or “principles of action” divide into three kinds: mechanical, animal, and rational. Mechanical principles of action are what we would call instincts, such as the unreflective impulse to protect oneself from perceived harm. Animal principles of action are a more varied lot. Under this category, Reid places the so-called benevolent affections, such as the affection felt between kin, gratitude to benefactors, pity and compassion, friendship, public spirit, and the like (see EAP III.iii.iv). He also includes the so-called malevolent affections, such as resentment and the desire to dominate others. (In section III, we will see a reason to believe that some animal principles, by Reid’s own lights, are not ones that could be had by the animals.)

All this complicates Reid’s picture. Reid seems to want to allow that motives come in two varieties. On the one hand, Reid says that rational motives function as “advice” or “exhortation” which do not push but pull us to action. On the other, he describes the mechanical and animal motives as “impulses,” which do not pull but push us to action (EAP II.ii and IV.iv). How best to understand what Reid is saying? Perhaps the best conclusion to draw is that Reid does not have a unified account of motives. Some of the rational motives are best described as being either those ends for which we act or principles by which we evaluate those ends for which we act. Other motives—the mechanical and a range of the animal ones—are not; they are what push or impel us to action (see Cuneo and Harp 2016).

Are these latter motives best described as having a causal influence on behavior? Perhaps they are, according to a more relaxed understanding of causality than that with which Reid officially works. For suppose we agree that there are processes that are instigated by the exercise of active power, such as the process that is instigated by an agent’s willing to raise her arm. In Reid’s view, this process includes the exercise of active power, which is the agent’s willing to raise her arm, the activity of nerves and muscles and, finally, the raising of her arm. If we allow ourselves to talk of elements of this process as causes in a “lax and popular sense,” then perhaps some motives, in Reid’s view, could be called causes. Of course Reid would have to say that in some cases the motives that “cause” us to act are not part of a causal process that we ourselves instigate. Not every desire or mental state we have is the causal consequence of the exercise of our active power in a given way. (That I desire to eat an ice cream cone, for example, appears to be a causal consequence not of the exercise of my active power but of your handing me an ice cream cone.) Reid would have to say, then, that those mental states and events that are not simply the causal consequence of the exercise of active power are parts of processes instigated by some other agent cause, such as God. This may seem odd. But it seems to be the broader picture within which Reid operated. All causal processes in nature (which are not due to us) are instigated by the exercise of God’s active power. A typical case of human action involves the coincidence of the exercise of our active power with God’s (see EAP and Cuneo 2011a).

Let us now turn to the third statement above, namely, (3′). This claim expresses Reid’s two-fold conviction that free human action is (i) not in any interesting sense nomic, and (ii) that we can assess our motives along two dimensions. We can assess them, first, according to their psychological strength and, second, according to their rational authority.

That free human action is not nomic is simply an implication of Reid’s conviction that we are endowed with libertarian free will, the exercise of which does not fall under any natural law in the sense described by Newtonian science. That our motives can be assessed along two dimensions, by contrast, is an implication of Reid’s regulation account of autonomy.

To see how Reid is thinking about the strength of motives, consider a case in which you are moved to action by some animal principle of action. Imagine, for example, you are incited to reprimand someone in your family because you believe that he or she has acted irresponsibly by leaving a kitchen light on during the night. One way to assess this action would be to ask whether it conforms to the rational principles of action. Let us suppose that, in the case we are considering, by reprimanding you risk alienating yourself from those with whom you live; the circumstances you’re in call for a calm and measured response. While there may be good reasons to alienate yourself from others, expressing your anger in these circumstances is not one of them. This motive in these circumstances, then, has no rational authority.

Now consider the same motive not with respect to its rational authority but with regard to its psychological strength. Is this motive the strongest of your motives? Reid maintains that this is a difficult question to answer. One of the complaints Reid raises about the System of Necessity is that it sheds no light on the matter. Although advocates of the System of Necessity claim that human actions can be subsumed under natural laws, the laws to which they appeal in order to assess the strength of motives are either false or trivial. For recall that, according to the System of Necessity:

(3) Every human action is subsumable under a law, which specifies that for any agent S, set of motives M, and action A at t, necessarily, if S performs A, then there is some member of M that is S’s strongest motive, which causes S to perform A at t.

Reid finds this claim totally unpersuasive. It is worth quoting at length what he has to say about it:

It is a question of fact, whether the influence of motives be fixed by laws of nature, so that they shall always have the same effect in the same circumstance. Upon this, indeed, the question about liberty and necessity hangs. But I have never seen any proof that there are such laws of nature, far less any proof that the strongest motive always prevails. However much our late fatalists have boasted of this principle as of a law of nature, without telling us what they mean by the strongest motive, I am persuaded that, whenever they shall be pleased to give us any measure of the strength of motives distinct from their prevalence, it will appear, from experience, that the strongest motive does not always prevail. If no other test or measure of the strength of motives can be found but their prevailing, then this boasted principle will be only an identical proposition, and signify only that the strongest motive is the strongest motive … which proves nothing. (C, 176–77)

According to Reid, (3), then, is either false or trivial (for discussion, see Yaffe 2004, Ch. 6).

We should now have a better picture of Reid’s favored account of human agency. It is one according to which agents are causes, at least some motives are not causes but ends, and autonomous action is non-nomic. Earlier I said that this picture of agency grounds his non-naturalist account of the ethical domain. Let me now explain how.

1.2 Reid’s moral non-naturalism

Like most of his contemporaries, Reid’s worldview was Newtonian. While he was convinced that the natural sciences should conform to Newtonian methods, Reid held that these methods have their limitations. In a passage from an unpublished review composed toward the end of his life, Reid writes:

There are many important branches of human knowledge, to which Sir Isaac Newton’s rules of Philosophizing have no relation, and to which they can with no propriety be applied. Such are Morals, Jurisprudence, Natural Theology, and the abstract Sciences of Mathematicks and Metaphysicks; because in none of those Sciences do we investigate the physical laws of Nature. There is therefore no reason to regret that these branches of knowledge have been pursued without regard to them. (AC, 186)

In this passage, Reid tells us that Newton’s rules pertain only to the physical laws of nature and what is subsumable under them. But the rational principles of action, we have seen, are not themselves the physical laws of nature. They do not concern how the universe in fact operates. Rather, they concern how rational agents ought to conduct their behavior. Nor are these principles subsumable under Newton’s laws (EAP IV.ix: 251). They are, in Reid’s view, not part of the space/time manifold. It follows that Newton’s methods should not guide our theorizing about the rational principles of action. Since moral principles are among the rational principles of action, it follows that they are not identical with or subsumable under Newton’s laws. Given the additional assumption that natural science must conform to Newton’s rules, Reid concludes that morality is not the subject matter of natural science. That this is so, Reid continues, is “no reason to regret.” It is a matter of simply acknowledging the implications of Newton’s system—implications, Reid maintains, that philosophers such as Hume and Priestley, who also took themselves to be followers of Newton, had failed to appreciate.

In sum: Suppose we understand moral naturalism to be the view that moral facts are natural. And suppose we say, in a rough and ready way, that a fact is natural just in case it pulls its explanatory weight in the natural sciences (see Wiggins 1993). Reid maintains that Newtonian methods exhaust the limits of natural science. Newtonian science, however, does not investigate the ends or rational principles for which we act. The ends for which we act neither fall under Newtonian laws nor are identical with them. But moral facts, Reid says, are among the ends or rational principles for which we act. It follows that, in Reid’s view, moral facts are not the proper object of scientific inquiry. The moral domain is autonomous.

2. The Rational Principles of Action

Philosophers such as Hume and Priestly were eager to apply Newton’s methods to the moral domain. Reid, however, viewed attempts to use Newtonian methods to understand the moral domain as mistaken—not, once again, because he viewed Newtonian science as suspect, but because he held that Newton’s methods themselves require this. That said, we have seen that there is a sense in which Reid believes that human action is law-governed. We can regulate our behavior by reference to the rational principles of action. Earlier we saw that these principles are of two kinds: They concern our good on the whole and duty. Reid holds that these principles stand in a certain kind of relation to one another. We can better identify this relation by having the notion of motivational primacy before us.

Suppose we say that a state of affairs P has motivational primacy for an (ordinary adult) agent S just in case three conditions are met. First, in a wide range of ordinary cases, P is a type of consideration in light of which S would act. Accordingly, were S to deliberate about what to do, P is a type of state of affairs that S would, in a wide range of cases, not only use to “frame” his practical deliberations, but also endeavor to bring about. That my loved ones flourish is such a state of affairs for many of us.

Second, P is a sufficient reason for S to act. Roughly put, P is a sufficient reason for S to act just in case were S to deliberate about what to do, then (in a wide range of ordinary cases) S would take P to be a reason to act and would endeavor to bring about P even if he believed (or presupposed) that his doing so would not bring about (or increase the likelihood of his bringing about) any further state of affairs that he values. Imagine, for example, S is like many of us inasmuch as he takes himself to have a reason to bring about the flourishing of his loved ones. This is a sufficient reason for S to act since he would endeavor to bring about the flourishing of his loved ones even if he believed that his doing so would not bring about any further state of affairs that he values, such as his gaining increased notoriety among his peers.

Third, P has deliberative weight for S. For our purposes, we can think of this as the claim that P is a reason of such a type that, in a wide range of circumstances, were S to deliberate about what to do, then S would take P to trump other types of reasons, even other sufficient reasons. Many of us, for example, hold that there is a beautiful sunset on the horizon is a sufficient reason to stop whatever we are doing and enjoy it. Still, for most of us, that an act would bring about or preserve the flourishing of our loved ones has greater deliberative weight than this. If a person had to choose between enjoying a beautiful sunset, on the one hand, or protecting her child from danger, on the other, then the latter reason trumps.

2.1 Reid’s defense of The Hierarchy Thesis

Having introduced the notion of motivational primacy, we can now identify a claim that is arguably the centerpiece of Reid’s discussion of rational motivation, namely:

The Hierarchy Thesis: In any case in which an agent must decide what to do, considerations of what is morally required should have motivational primacy. Specifically, what is morally required of an agent should have motivational primacy over what he takes to be his good on the whole.

Eudaimonist positions, such as those defended in the broadly Aristotelian tradition, reject The Hierarchy Thesis. They maintain that when an agent deliberates about what to do he assumes, or ought to assume, that considerations concerning his own well-being or eudaimonia have motivational primacy in a very robust sense. Every act that an agent performs, say eudaimonists, either is or should be taken for the sake of his own happiness. Accordingly, if eudaimonism is true, an agent operates, or ought to operate, with the following principle of action selection: Perform only those actions that, to the best of one’s knowledge, positively contribute to one’s own well-being or eudaimonia. Moreover, in so doing, an agent treats, or ought to treat, considerations concerning his own well-being as being both a sufficient reason to act and having deliberative weight. When asked: “Why did you do that?” an agent’s ultimate justification will, or ought to, appeal to the way in which acting in that fashion contributes to her own well-being.

Reid rejects eudaimonism thus understood. It is safe to assume that Reid took Butler’s attack on what we might call descriptive eudaimonism to be decisive: There is no plausibility to the idea that agents necessarily will their own happiness, as they understand it, for they can knowingly act in self-destructive ways (cf. EAP III.ii.i: 95). But Reid realized that Butler’s attack left prescriptive eudaimonism, or the view that the practically rational agent takes her own well-being to have motivational primacy, relatively untouched. According to this view, whatever may be the case about how agents actually act, they ought to view their own well-being as having motivational primacy.

Like Butler, Reid did not wish to recommend a picture of agency according to which agents should disregard or ignore their own well-being. “To serve God and be useful to mankind, without any concern about one’s own good and happiness,” Reid writes, is “beyond the pitch of human nature” (EAP III.iii.iv: 166). Indeed, Reid holds that, when properly understood, a concern for one’s good on the whole naturally leads to the acquisition of the moral virtues, such as justice and benevolence (EAP III.iii.iii: 163; see also EAP V.i). Still, Reid insists that our good on the whole ought not to be the “only regulating principle of human conduct” (EAP III.iii.iv: 164). Why?

For four main reasons. First, Reid claims that “the greater part of mankind can never attain such extensive views of human life, and so correct a judgment of good and ill, as the right application of this principle requires” (EAP III.iii.iv: 164). Reid’s point here is that a principle of action should be action-guiding. It should be the sort of thing that, in a wide range of cases, an agent could consult when determining what to do and thereby come to understand what she morally ought to do. The principles of morality are action-guiding. “Every man of common understanding,” says Reid, is such that he is capable of knowing his duty (EAP V.i: 277). But gaining a conception of one’s good on the whole, let alone an accurate one, and an understanding of what genuinely contributes to it, is something that is very difficult to do. It requires that one “observe the connections of things, and the consequences of our actions,” thereby “taking an extended view of our existence, past, present, and future” (EAP III.iii.i: 153). Many ordinary persons will have neither the time nor the ability to do this, let alone actually gain an accurate notion of that in which their good on the whole consists. If this is right, however, then one’s good on the whole is not sufficiently action-guiding to be the most general and fundamental principle of action, as eudaimonists claim.

Second, since one’s good on the whole is concerned not only with present satisfaction, but also with the enjoyment of future goods, it proves not to be as motivationally charged as one might hope. We would like to have a clearer and more efficacious guide to conduct. Reid puts the point thus:

Men stand in need of a sharper monitor to their duty than a dubious view of distant good. There is reason to believe, that a present sense of duty has, in many cases a stronger influence than the apprehension of distant good would have of itself. And it cannot be doubted, that a sense of guilt and demerit is a more pungent reprover than the bare apprehension of having mistaken our true interest. (EAP III.iii.iv: 165)

Duty is, then, according to Reid, in many cases, a better guide to action than interest. Moreover, it is often motivationally more powerful than an appeal to interest, as it connects more intimately with powerful motivating considerations such as one’s own guilt.

The third point that Reid makes is that “a steady pursuit of our own good may, in an enlightened mind, produce a kind of virtue which is entitled to some degree of approbation, yet it can never produce the noblest kind of virtue, which claims our highest love and esteem” (EAP III.iii.iv: 165). So, Reid’s view is not that a concern for one’s own well-being is crass egoism or self-centeredness. To the contrary, there is something admirable about it; to pursue one’s own well-being properly requires virtue. For example, if concern for one’s self is such that it helps one to discount temptations to a life of ease, leisure, or frivolity, then it is much to be admired (cf. EAP III.iii.iv: 165; but also cf. EAP 272). That said, to be genuinely dedicated to the moral life, one cannot grant motivational primacy to one’s good on the whole. For our esteem, Reid writes, “is due only to the man whose soul is not contracted within itself, but embraces a more extensive object: who loves virtue, not for her dowry only, but for her own sake: whose benevolence is not selfish, but generous and disinterested” (EAP III.iii.iv: 166). For Reid, then, virtue requires caring not only about particular persons (they are, according to Reid, the objects of benevolence), but also about virtue itself. Being virtuous requires being committed to the idea that the moral life is, in and for itself, worth living. It is not to be made subordinate to considerations about one’s well-being.

Reid’s fourth point echoes one of Butler’s most famous observations regarding the pursuit of happiness: If one primarily aims to secure one’s own happiness, one often increases the risk of not obtaining it. This is not only because directly aiming for one’s own happiness can “fill the mind with fear, and care, and anxiety” (EAP III.iii.iv: 167). It is also because a “concern for our own good is not a principle that, of itself, gives any enjoyment” (EAP III.iii.iv: 166). What does give enjoyment, however, are those particular activities and objects to which our affections are directed, such as friendship and the common good. To achieve one’s good on the whole, then, one must, at least part of the time, be focused on and motivated by considerations that are not identical with it.

Earlier we said that a consideration has motivational primacy for an agent just in case the following three conditions are met: First, it is a type of consideration in light of which an ordinary adult agent would act in a wide array of cases; second, it is a sufficient reason for that agent; and, third it has deliberative weight for him. Eudaimonists believe that one’s good on the whole has motivational primacy. Indeed, they believe that one’s good on the whole has motivational primacy in a very robust sense. Eudaimonists hold that every act that an agent performs is, or should be, taken for the sake of his own happiness and that there is, or should be, no deeper practical justification for so acting. Reid maintains that eudaimonism thus understood is false. In many cases, agents do not act for the sake of their good on the whole. Nor, in many cases, should they do so. For one thing, appealing to one’s good on the whole is insufficiently action-guiding, since many agents simply do not have an adequate understanding of that in which it consists. For another, to make happiness the final court of appeal when deliberating is to undermine the rightful primacy of virtue.

There is a substantial challenge facing views such as Reid’s. Consider a case in which considerations of well-being conflict with duty, such as when moral duty requires that one stand up for the innocent at the cost of one’s life and those of one’s family. Reid is committed to the claim that, in a case such as this, one is required to surrender one’s life. Could that be right? Reid insists that it is. For any such conflict, Reid says, is “imaginary” (EAP III.iii.viii: 194). So long as “the world is under a wise and benevolent administration, it is impossible, that any man should … be a loser by doing his duty.” Reid’s theism, in short, grounds his allegiance to The Hierarchy Thesis. God guarantees that the two principles of action never come into genuine conflict since performing one’s duty will not detract from one’s good on the whole in the long run (see Cuneo 2010).

3. Moral Principles

According to the picture sketched thus far, Reid’s account of autonomous action is as follows: We human beings can act from a great variety of principles, including the so-called mechanical and animal principles. What renders us rational agents distinct from the rest of the animals is our ability to gain critical distance from these incentives and regulate our conduct by appeal to the two rational principles of action, asking whether a given course of action truly contributes to our good on the whole and is consonant with moral duty. Finally, the principle of duty enjoys motivational primacy. Although I have not yet emphasized the point, the similarities between Reid’s and Kant’s thought in these respects are unmistakable. (We have, however, no evidence that Reid was aware of Kant’s work.) According to both Reid and Kant, we are rational beings not primarily because we can engage in means-end practical reasoning. Rather, we are practically rational agents primarily because we can assess the various impulses to act by appeal to a “certain general principle” or law – this law consisting, in Reid’s view, in the rational principles of action. Indeed, if J. B. Schneewind is correct, Reid and Kant were unique among the moderns inasmuch as that they conceived of morality primarily in terms of rational self-governance (see Schneewind 1998).

Still, we saw earlier that there is an important difference between Reid and Kant. Kant is an ethical monist, holding that there is one master principle of morality—the categorical imperative—which is fundamental and from which all our particular duties can be derived. Reid, by contrast, rejects ethical monism, maintaining that there is no such master principle, but only a variety of moral principles that are self-evident and irreducible to one another. The locution “the principle of duty,” in Reid’s mouth, is probably best understood to be a shorthand way of referring to one or another of these principles which can govern practical deliberation.

In his chapter “Of the first principles of morals,” Reid presents the first principles of morality “without pretending to a complete enumeration” (EAP V.i: 270). The constellation of principles that Reid presents is a hodgepodge. Some are metaethical principles that specify certain properties of moral principles, such as that they apply only to free actions, while others are normative principles that one might consult when deliberating. Among the normative principles that Reid presents are these:

We ought to prefer a greater good, though more distant, to a less; and a less evil to the greater.

Every man ought to consider himself as member of the common society of mankind, and of the subordinate societies to which he belongs, such as family, friends, neighborhood, and country, and do as much good as he can, and as little hurt to the societies of which he is a part.

In every case, we ought to act that part toward another, which we would judge to be right in him to act toward us, if we were in his circumstance and he in ours. (EAP V.i)

Principles such as these, Reid says, form a system of morality, but only in a weak sense. They form a system only in the sense that we can organize them in such a way that facilitates “apprehension and memory.” In this respect, a system of morals, according to Reid, is not like a system of geometry “where the subsequent parts derive their evidence from the preceding” but “resembles more a system of botany … where the subsequent parts depend not for their evidence upon the preceding” (EAP V.ii: 281). So, while Reid admits that the last principle stated above is the “most comprehensive,” he does not claim that it is fundamental in the sense that it grounds the other moral principles. Rather, he holds that each of the principles of morality is self-evident, at least to those who have a sound understanding, a satisfactory moral education, and are not in the grip of self-interest or passion. These principles are self-evident, in part, because they are not amenable to direct argument or proof, for any such argument “will either take for granted the thing to be proved” or be “something not more evident” (EAP V.i: 361; for more discussion, see Cuneo 2004, 259 and Davis 2006, Ch. 6).

Those familiar with the history of ethical intuitionism know that its critics have found the view unsatisfactory because the intuitionists had almost nothing informative to say about why, in a given situation, a particular moral principle takes precedence, and how we could know that it did (see McNaughton 1996). In hindsight, it is remarkable that Reid shows little interest in this problem, stating that it is usually clear to a candid mind which moral principles take precedence and what one should do (see EAP V.i; although see Roeser 2010a, 15–16). Instead, Reid is more concerned to argue that there must be first-principles of morality. In his argument for this claim, Reid appeals to a traditional regress-style argument according to which there must be some fundamental moral principles which both ground and justify our moral deliberation on pain of our being unable to engage in such deliberation, which we clearly can (see EAP V.i).

At first glance, this can give the impression that moral judgments must, in Reid’s view, derive their warrant from moral first principles, presumably by being inferred from them. Although Reid might encourage this impression in places, in other places he clearly indicates that this is not how he views things. In his account of particular moral judgments, for example, Reid insists that we ordinarily form them immediately or non-inferentially. A moderately virtuous agent “will rarely be at a loss to distinguish good from ill in his own conduct, without the labour of reasoning” (EAP V.ii: 280). If the first principles of morality were warrant-conferring axioms, however, this presumably would not be the case (see Cuneo 2014).

Suppose, then, that in Reid’s view appeal to moral first principles rarely plays a role in the formation of particular moral judgments. It is natural to wonder about the role Reid envisions moral first principles to play in ordinary moral thought. On this matter, Reid says less than one might like. A promising strategy of interpretation, however, is to draw a parallel between the first principles of morality, on the one hand, and what Reid says about the first principles of common sense in the Inquiry and Essays on the Intellectual Powers, on the other.

In his discussion of the principles of common sense, Reid presents various first principles, including the claims that memory is reliable and that those things exist that we distinctly perceive. Although sometimes he seems to claim that our particular perceptual judgments are derived from them, a closer look at what Reid says makes it clear that this is not his considered view. For, in Reid’s view, ordinary perceptual judgments are formed non-inferentially and are not self-evident. What role, then, do these principles of common sense play? Nicholas Wolterstorff (2001, Ch. IX and 2004) argues that Reid thinks of such principles as being similar to what Wittgenstein, in On Certainty, called “framework propositions.” They are propositions that ordinary people do not typically explicitly believe but rather take for granted in their everyday comings and goings. Similarly, one might hold that, properly understood, Reid’s view is that the moral first-principles are not propositions that ordinary agents who have received a decent moral education ordinarily consciously believe at some time or other. Rather, they are what these agents take for granted in their moral deliberations; they form the horizon or background against which they deliberate—although these agents would, presumably, assent to them if they were explicitly presented (for an alternative but, in principle, complimentary account, see Davis 2006, Ch. 6).

Be that as it may, Reid’s deep impulse for affirming the existence of these principles is not so much to reply to traditional worries about stopping a regress of reasons as to make an anti-Humean point. (Hume, after all, also accepts the regress argument; see EAP V.vii.) According to Reid’s construal of it, the aim of Humean practical reason is not to determine the ends that we should have, but merely to ascertain how most effectively to satisfy our passions (EAP III.iii.i: 153; cf. also EAP II.ii: 54). Reid, by contrast, takes it to be evident that we can form a conception of our good on the whole and regulate our actions in accordance with it. But if we can do this, Reid contends, then Hume’s account of practical reason cannot be correct. We can reason not just about means but also ends. Moreover, if Reid is correct and it is the province of reason to form a conception of one’s good on the whole, then Hume’s more extravagant claims about reason also cannot be correct. For, if Reid is right, not only is it reason’s province to form a notion of one’s good upon the whole, it is also its role to guide action in such a way that it is conducive to one’s own good. It cannot be true, then, that it is not contrary to reason for an agent to prefer his lesser good to his greater, as Hume claimed.

3.1 Reid’s defense of the objectivity of moral first principles

So far, then, we have a sense of what, according to Reid, the first principles of morality are and the roles that Reid wished them to play. What should be added is that Reid thinks them to be objective in a fairly strong sense. Or to put things somewhat more guardedly, if we interpret Reid’s claims that motives do not exist to mean only that they do not exist in space/time, then Reid thinks they are objective in a fairly robust sense (for different interpretations, see David 1985, Nichols 2002, Yaffe 2004, and Van Cleve 2015, ch. 10).

In the first place, Reid believes that the fundamental moral principles cannot be the product of convention. His argument in this case is directed against Hume. In Reid’s view, Hume defends a conventionalist account of justice, which rides on a quasi-genetic account of the emergence of the norms of justice. According to Hume’s story, we begin with a notion of our good on the whole. Out of a concern to secure our good on the whole, we create the rules of justice by convention. In response, Reid notes that to have the concept of one’s good on the whole, one must also have the concepts of ‘being a favor’ and ‘being an injury.’ These concepts, however, are “early in the mind of man as any rational notion whatever” (EAP V.v: 309). Reid contends that Hume would seem also to be committed to as much. Hume, after all, believes gratitude and resentment to be “natural” sentiments that are concerned with favors and injuries. Call those concepts that cluster around the notion of justice, such as ‘being wronged,’ ‘being what is deserved,’ and ‘being that to which one is entitled,’ our concepts of primary justice. Reid argues that Hume’s quasi-genetic story faces a problem, for a person cannot have the concepts ‘being a favor’ and ‘being an injury’ without first having the concepts of primary justice.

Consider favors. Favors, says Reid, are naturally connected with the benevolent affection of gratitude; they are what merit this response. But to express gratitude toward someone who has performed a favor is to believe or presuppose that that agent has benefited you by going beyond what is owed. Or consider being injured (as opposed to simply being harmed). Being injured, says Reid, is naturally connected with the malevolent affection of resentment. To express resentment toward an agent who has injured you is, however, to believe or presuppose that he has wronged you, given you less than you deserve. If this is right, we do not derive the primary concepts of justice from an interest to secure our good on the whole. To the contrary, the reverse is true; we can arrive at a notion of our own good on the whole only if we possess the concepts of primary justice. But if so, we cannot hold that we somehow constructed our notions and the rules of justice from a concern to secure our good on the whole. Our notion of our good on the whole presupposes them (see Cuneo 2015 and Powell and Yaffe 2015).

In fact, Reid believes that reflection on our concepts of primary justice reveals more than this. It also reveals that these concepts are irreducible to other normative concepts and fundamental to moral thinking. Reid’s way of making this point is to note that Hume attempts to ground the rules of justice not just in our notion of our good on the whole, but also in considerations of utility. Reid holds that this is a mistake. To “have the conception of justice,” it is necessary that “one perceive its obligation distinct from its utility” (EAP V.v: 306). Considerations of utility, Reid holds, are the wrong sort of reasons to ground accountability relations, which are among the objects of our concepts of primary justice. In his book, The Second-Person Standpoint, Stephen Darwall puts the point like this: To see that something is required of another is to take up the “second-person standpoint” with regard to him. To occupy this standpoint is to have the authority to hold that person accountable for not doing what is required of him. Failure to perform an act that increases utility, however, is not the right sort of thing for which to hold someone accountable (see Darwall 2006, especially the discussion of Reid in Ch. 8; see also Wolterstorff 2010).

In addition to rejecting moral constructivist accounts of justice, Reid rejects what we today would call response-dependent accounts of moral facts. Roughly put, response-dependent views, which Reid attributes to sentimentalists such as Hutcheson and Hume, maintain that moral reality is determined by the sorts of affective reactions we have to the world. It is because certain actions and events elicit certain types of affective states in us that they have properties such as being wrong or being obligatory. Drawing upon what rationalists such as Balguy and Price had argued, Reid asks us to consider fundamental moral principles, such as the claim that, in ordinary conditions, an agent ought to honor his promise. Claims such as this, Reid says, are necessarily true. But if the response-dependent view were correct, it is difficult to see how that could be so. After all, we can imagine being constituted in such a way that we failed to disapprove of those who do not honor their promises. If the response-dependent view were true, then in those counterfactual circumstances honoring one’s promises would not be obligatory; failing to honor them, accordingly, would not be wrong. But that is false, for basic moral principles do not exhibit this sort of contingency. Even in those counterfactual conditions it would be wrong not to honor one’s word. If so, sentimentalists views, Reid concludes, are false (see EIP 494–95).

4. The Moral Sense

We noted earlier that contemporary philosophers tend to think of modern philosophers as being either rationalists or sentimentalists about morality. We also noted that Reid does not fit comfortably in either category, as his views tend to blend together both rationalist and sentimentalist commitments. This becomes especially evident in Reid’s discussion of the moral sense. (See Davis 2006 for a discussion of how Reid’s account of the moral sense is influenced by the legal practices of his day.)

It was Francis Hutcheson who first developed the claim that we are endowed with a moral sense. While Hutcheson’s position has been variously interpreted, his considered position appears to run as follows. Rationalists tell us that our moral judgments are the output of reason. But many of our ordinary, nonmoral judgments are not the output of reason. Our perceptual judgments concerning the external world, our judgments about our own pain and pleasure, and our aesthetic judgments, for example, are not the products of reason. Rather, they are the products of various “senses” or “determinations of our minds to receive Ideas independently of our Will” (ONC, 17). Moral judgments, Hutcheson claims, are no different in this respect. They are also the product not of reason but of a sense, in this case, the moral sense. Although Hutcheson himself describes this sense in different ways, it is probably best to think of it as a faculty that has two basic functions.

In the first place, it is that faculty by which we form moral ideas or concepts and in such a way that does not involve any sort of reasoning or calculation. Rather, the “author of Nature” has designed us in such a way that, in a certain range of circumstances, when an agent is aware of the behavior of himself or others, this awareness evokes in him states of approbation. These states of approbation, in turn, elicit states of love and esteem for the person whose behavior of which he’s aware. States of approbation, Hutcheson indicates, thus function as signs of an agent’s benevolence, indicating its presence. Love and esteem, by contrast, do not indicate benevolence but are rather appropriate affective responses to it. Second, these affective states move us to benevolent action. The moral sense at once puts us in contact with moral reality and motivates us to act (see Cuneo 2013; Kail 2007).

4.1 Reid’s view compared with Hutcheson’s

Those familiar with Reid’s writing on perception will immediately notice rather striking similarities between Hutcheson’s account of the moral sense and Reid’s account of external sense. To see this, consider a case of ordinary tactile perception, such as when one perceives that the table before one is hard by touching it. In cases such as these, how do we perceive the table’s hardness? According to Reid, in such cases, it is pressure sensations—which, Reid stresses, largely go unnoticed and unnamed—that immediately produce in us a “conception and belief” of the table that it is hard. As such, Reid says, the best explanation of how we perceive things such as a table’s hardness is that the “Author of our Nature” has designed us in such a way that, when all goes well, feelings of a certain range function as signs or indicators of it. (God, Reid emphasizes, could have easily fashioned us in such a way that the perceptual process worked differently. For all we reasonably believe, God could have constructed us in such a way that signs of an entirely different sort, such as noises or smells of a certain range, indicate a table’s hardness.) Reid stresses that, according to this account of perception, pressure sensations are not ideas in the sense that Locke or Hume thought of them. For pressure sensations do not function as intermediaries of which we are aware that imagistically represent the table’s hardness and from which we infer its existence.

In order to explain judgments of these sorts, then, both Hutcheson and Reid appeal not to reason but to an indigenous sense with which we come hardwired. Both thinkers maintain that (in the ordinary case) inference plays no role in the production of such judgments—feelings being such as to immediately evoke them. Both, moreover, offer thoroughly teleological accounts of perception, which appeal to the plan of the “Author of our nature.” And, finally, both champion semiotic accounts of perceptual judgment formation. According to the relevant design plans, sensations or feelings of various kinds play the role of being signs for or indicators of qualities of things in the world.

At various points, Reid himself highlights the similarities between the two senses (see EAP 179–80 and PE, 144). Having noted these similarities, however, Reid goes on to claim that there is also an important disanalogy between the judgments produced by external sense, on the one hand, and the moral sense, on the other: In the former case, when all goes well, feelings elicit judgments about the external world. In the latter case, the order of explanation is reversed: “In the approbation of a good action … there is feeling indeed, but there is also esteem of the agent; and both the feeling and the esteem depend upon the judgment we form of his conduct,” not vice-versa (EAP V.vii: 349; for discussion, see Broadie 1998 and Cuneo 2006). By stressing that states of approbation are not mere feelings but include full-blooded moral judgments, Reid takes himself to have corrected a deficiency in Hutcheson’s view. For while Hutcheson nowhere denies that the outputs of the moral sense include the acceptance of moral propositions neither does he affirm this. Rather, what Hutcheson tells us is that states of approbation are feelings of pleasure and that they yield “love” for the benevolent. But Hutcheson, Reid points out, says next to nothing about this latter state, never specifying whether it includes moral propositional content. By explicitly specifying that the outputs of the moral sense have moral propositional content—indeed, a wide range of such contents—Reid takes himself to have identified more accurately the character of its outputs.

Let us pull these strands of argument together. Both Hutcheson and Reid, we’ve seen, maintain that we come equipped with a moral sense that bears certain resemblances to external sense. The Reidian moral sense differs in two important respects, however, from the Hutchesonian one. First, the outputs of the Reidian moral sense include not only moral conceptions, but also full-blooded moral beliefs with moral propositional content. (Reid, incidentally, understood Hume to deny that moral judgments have moral propositional content; for his attack on this view, see EAP V.vii and Cuneo 2004). These moral beliefs themselves concern not only general moral truths, such as the moral first principles, but also particular ones, such as that this particular person’s behavior merits approbation.

Second, we have seen that Reid reverses the order of explanation between sentiment and moral judgment. In the paradigmatic case, moral judgments elicit moral sentiments, not vice-versa. Although Reid reverses Hutcheson’s order of explanation claim, he still thinks of a range of particular moral judgments as being cases of moral perception. His basic approach is to claim that, in moral perception, it is not sentiments that function as signs of moral properties. Rather, it is the behavior and countenance of agents that play this role. Roughly, the guiding idea is that moral properties of a certain range attach to the mental states of agents such as their beliefs, desires, and intentions. For example, the property being kind can attach to an agent’s intention to perform a certain act. These mental states and their properties manifest themselves in the behavior and countenance of agents. Ordinary mature agents are so constituted that, when all goes well, upon becoming aware of the behavior and countenance of these agents, this awareness non-inferentially evokes in us the conception and belief of those agents that they have properties such as being kind, deceitful, faithful, and so forth. In this regard, moral perception exhibits the same fundamental structure as our perception of what Reid calls visible figure, such as an object’s length and height (see Cuneo 2003, 2006, Kroeker 2010, Copenhaver 2014). In both cases, features of our environment function as signs for a given quality, these signs being such as to non-inferentially produce conception and belief. Here is how Reid himself puts the point:

Intelligence, design, and skill, are not objects of the external senses, nor can we be conscious of them in any person but ourselves….

A man’s wisdom is known to us only by the signs of it in his conduct; his eloquence by the signs of it in his speech. In the same manner we judge of his virtue, of his fortitude, and of all his talents and qualities of mind.

Yet it is to be observed, that we judge of men’s talents with as little doubt or hesitation as we judge of the immediate objects of sense.

… We perceive one man to be open, another cunning; one to be ignorant, another very knowing; one to be slow of understanding, another quick. Every man forms such judgments of those he converses with; and the common affairs of life depend upon such judgments. We can as little avoid them as we can avoid seeing what is before our eyes.

From this it appears, that it is no less part of the human constitution, to judge of men’s characters, and of their intellectual powers, from the signs of them in their actions and discourse, than to judge of corporeal objects by our senses. (EIP 503–4)

It is Reid’s view, then, that we can apprehend both the external world and moral reality. He also holds that the beliefs formed on the basis of these apprehensions are generally in good epistemic order. So, in the case of our perception of external objects, Reid rejects skepticism. Admittedly, Reid says, we may lack a complete explanation of how we become aware of external reality. But this, says Reid, is no reason to doubt that we can in fact apprehend it.

In fact, Reid claims, there are powerful reasons to reject skepticism about external sense. For consider our indigenous or “original” epistemic faculties such as memory, introspection, reasoning, and perception. The outputs of these faculties include judgments of various sorts—judgments about what happened, what one is feeling, what to conclude given one’s evidence, and so forth. The practices of forming these judgments are socially well-established over time. Indeed, they are so deeply entrenched that engaging in them is, for all practical purposes, inescapable; we cannot avoid forming memory judgments, introspective judgments, perceptual judgments, and so forth. Moreover, we have sophisticated methods of evaluating judgments made in these domains, including ways of checking their reliability and the appeal to experts of various sorts. Finally, many of the judgments made in these domains are not subject to systemic disagreement among competent participants. By and large, our judgments about the external world, for example, converge.

Should we trust the deliverance of indigenous faculties of this sort? In one of his better known dialectal maneuvers, Reid claims that we should. For, Reid says, our situation is this. If we didn’t trust any of our indigenous faculties, we would face wholesale skepticism. Our most basic processes of reasoning would be rationally undercut, for we could not trust their deliverances. If we trust only some but not all of our original faculties, then Reid claims we are being arbitrarily partial. Given that these faculties exhibit similar features, what reason could we have—at least at the outset of theorizing—for trusting one but not the other? In a well-known passage, Reid puts the point like this:

Reason, says the sceptic, is the only judge of truth, and you ought to throw off every opinion and every belief that is not grounded on reason. Why, Sir, should I believe the faculty of reason more than that of perception; they came both out of the same shop, and were made by the same artist; and if he puts one piece of false ware into my hands, what should hinder him from putting another? (IHM VI.xx: 169)

Reid continues in this vein, noting that trusting our indigenous faculties does not imply that we must suppose that they operate flawlessly:

There is no more reason to account our senses fallacious, than our reason, our memory, or any other faculty of judging which nature hath given us. They are all limited and imperfect…. We are liable to error and wrong judgment in the use of them all; but as little in the informations of sense as in the deductions of reasoning. (EIP II.xxii: 251–52; for discussion, see Greco 2002 and 2004)

4.2 Reid’s defense of the reliability of the moral sense

In Essays on the Active Powers, Reid extends this line of argument to the moral sense. The fact that we have no well-worked out theory of how we form moral judgments does not itself rationally undercut the epistemic status of these judgments (see EAP V.ii: 282–83). More importantly, the moral sense, Reid argues, is also indigenous. All normal human beings raised in a normal environment have it. Moreover, its outputs include judgments of various sorts—judgments about what is wrong, right, approbation-worthy, and so forth. The practice of forming moral judgments is, furthermore, socially well-established over time. In fact, it is so deeply entrenched that it is, for all practical purposes, inescapable; try as we might, we cannot avoid forming moral judgments. We also have sophisticated methods of evaluating moral judgments, such as appeals to what we today would call reflective equilibrium (see EAP Finally, many moral judgments—in particular, those that concern the first principles—are not subject to systemic disagreement among competent participants. By and large, in Reid’s view, our judgments about these principles converge (see EAP; for discussion, see Cuneo 2011b, 2011c and Levy 1999. Davis 2006 and 2010 explore Reid’s treatment of moral disagreement).

Given all this, Reid contends that we should reject moral skepticism. At the outset of inquiry, the deliverances of the moral faculty, like the deliverances of our other indigenous cognitive faculties, deserve an innocent until proven guilty status. Unlike Ross after him, Reid seems to think that our beliefs about not only moral first principles but also particular cases can count as instances of knowledge.

To this point, we have seen important respects in which Reid’s account of the moral sense both articulates with and deviates from Hutcheson’s. On the one hand, Reid is, like Hutcheson, concerned to distance his view from the rationalists, who come very close to characterizing moral knowledge as a species of ordinary theoretical knowledge such as that achieved in mathematics. On the other, Reid also wants to correct certain deficiencies in the sentimentalist program, such as the tendency to drive a sharp wedge between reason and “sense” and to think of the deliverances of the moral sense as mere feelings. This allows Reid to defend the claim that the moral sense is reliable in a perfectly straightforward sense.

Still, while Reid wishes to emphasize that the moral sense issues in bona fide moral judgments, he also emphasizes that it issues in more than mere moral judgments. Reid writes: “Our moral judgments are not, like those we form in speculative matters, dry and unaffecting, but from their nature, are necessarily accompanied with affections and feelings …” (EAP III.iii.vii: 180). Reid calls the complex state that combines moral judgment, affection, and feeling “moral approbation.”

Moral approbation, then, comprises three elements: moral judgment, affection, and feeling. Reid is clear that the moral judgments in question are not general ones that concern the first principles of morals, but particular judgments that concern whether someone has behaved well or badly or exemplifies a virtue or vice. The affections that accompany them are, in turn, dispositions “to do good or hurt to others,” which have a de re structure since they have “persons, and not things” [i.e., propositions] as their immediate object (EAP III.iii.iv: 107). Finally, Reid accepts a minimalist account of the feelings that comprise moral approbation. Feelings such as pleasure and pain, in Reid’s view, have no intentional object; they are not about anything. Rather, they are, as it were, adverbial modifiers of mental states and events: one esteems another pleasurably or disapproves of another painfully. By distinguishing approbation from feeling, Reid clearly rejects the position according to which (what we today would call) desires are to be identified with feelings of one or another sort.

It is not difficult to discern the theoretical work that this account of moral approbation is supposed to do for Reid. Under a natural reading, in both the Treatise and the second Enquiry, Hume charged rational intuitionists with having no account of why moral judgments, which are the output of reason, should have such an intimate connection with motivation. Reid’s answer to this challenge is to “go nativist”: We are so constituted that when we judge that, say, an action is unjust, we are moved to action. That the moral sense should yield both judgments and motivational states is built into its functional profile or design plan. By emphasizing that this is how things go in the moral realm, Reid takes himself to employ a strategy he has used elsewhere in his elaboration of our perception of the external world.

Recall in this regard Reid’s account of tactile perception. In the case of tactile perception, Reid says that given certain experiential inputs, such as the pressure sensations evoked upon touching a table, we form judgments about the hardness of the table. The pressure sensations function as signs of the table’s hardness, which immediately evoke the judgment in question. According to this account, there are no mental images or “ideas” from which we infer the hardness of the table. Likewise, in the moral case, we are presented with various kinds of experiential inputs such as the behavior and countenance of agents. These experiential inputs function as signs, immediately evoking in us moral judgments of various sorts. When all goes well, these judgments, in turn, yield affection and feelings of various sorts. Once again, there are no ideas from which we infer moral judgments and the process of judgment formation is itself noninferential. By emphasizing the similarities between these two cases, we have seen that Reid takes himself to defend an account of moral perception. It is an account, in Reid’s view, which blends together the most promising features of both the rationalist and sentimentalist traditions (see Cuneo 2007a, forthcoming b). For it implies both that moral judgments express genuine moral propositional content and that these judgments bear an intimate connection with moral motivation.

5. Conclusion

Reid’s view is a version of agency-centered ethical intuitionism. The view is agency-centered because Reid develops his account of moral motives in light of his broadly agent causal account of agency and regulation account of autonomy, according to which our rational nature consists in our ability to regulate our conduct by appeal to the rational principles of action. This account of moral motives, we have seen, borrows a great deal from the rationalists. The moral first principles, says Reid, are self-evident necessary truths which are knowable to a person with a sound understanding, a decent moral education, and not in the grip of distorting influences. Reid, however, was no ideologue, and freely borrowed from sentimentalists such as Hutcheson. In particular, he borrows from the sentimentalists the conceptuality of the moral sense, which figures so importantly in his work. The idea that the moral sense is at once an information-processing system whose deliverances are affective states that move us to action, we’ve seen, resembles closely what figures such as Hutcheson claim. Finally, we have also seen that, at various points, Reid’s thought coincides with Kant’s. This is especially evident when one considers Reid’s regulation account of autonomy and his defense of what Darwall calls the second-person standpoint.

Rather few contemporary philosophers could accept all of Reid’s central claims—agent causation, teleological accounts of action, and occasionalism not being the dominant views of our day. Still, for those who resonate with a broadly realist version of ethical non-naturalism with emphases similar to Kant’s, Reid’s view is intriguing. Its resources remain to be mined.


Primary Literature

Reid’s Work

[C] The Correspondence of Thomas Reid. Paul Wood (ed.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2002.
[AC] Thomas Reid on the Animate Creation: Papers Relating to the Life Sciences, Paul Wood (ed.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1995.
[PE] Practical Ethics, Knud Haakonssen (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
[EAP] Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788). Knud Haakonssen and James Harris (eds.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2010.
[EIP] Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785). Derek R. Brookes (ed.), Edinburgh University Press, 2002.
[IHM] An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764). Derek R. Brookes (ed.), Edinburgh University Press, 1997.

Works by Others

  • Balguy, John, 1778. The Foundation of Moral Goodness. New York: Garland, 1976.
  • Clarke, Samuel, 1705. A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Other Writings, Ezio Vailati (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Hutcheson, Francis, 1728. On the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, with Illustrations on the Moral Sense, edited and with an Introduction by Aaron Garrett, Indianapolis, IN: Liberty Fund, 2002 (abbreviated as ONC and IMS respectively).
  • –––, 1726. An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, revised edition, edited and with an introduction by Wolfgang Leidhold, Indianapolis, IN: Liberty Fund, 2008.
  • Price, Richard, 1787. A Review of the Principal Questions in Morals, D. D. Raphael (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1948.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. Essays on Ethics and Method, Marcus G. Singer (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.

Secondary Literature

  • Beanblossom, Ronald, 1983. “Introduction,” in Ronald Beanblossom and Keith Lehrer (eds.), Thomas Reid: Inquiry and Essays, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Broadie, Alexander, 1998. “Reid Making Sense of Moral Sense,” Reid Studies, 1: 5–16. Reprinted in Roeser 2010.
  • –––, 2000. “The Scotist Thomas Reid,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 74: 385–408.
  • Copenhaver, Rebecca, 2014. “Reid on the Moral Sense,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 41 (Supplement 1): 80–101.
  • Cuneo, Terence, 2015. “Does Reid Have Anything to Say to (the new) Hume?” in Todd Buras and Rebecca Copenhaver (eds.), Mind, Knowledge, and Action: Essays in Honor of Reid’s Tercentenary, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 232–48.
  • –––, 2014. “Reid on the First Principles of Morals,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 41 (Supplement 1): 102-21.
  • –––, 2013. “Hutcheson and Reid on Reason and Passion,” in James Harris (ed.), The Oxford Handbook to 18th-Century British Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 226-47.
  • –––, 2011a. “A Puzzle Regarding Reid’s Theory of Motives,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 19: 263–81.
  • –––, 2011b. “Reidian Metaethics, Part I,” Philosophy Compass, 6: 333–40.
  • –––, 2011c. “Reidian Metaethics, Part II,” Philosophy Compass, 6: 341–49.
  • –––, 2010. “Duty, Goodness, and God in Thomas Reid’s Moral Philosophy,” in Roeser (ed.) 2010.
  • –––, 2007a. “Intuition’s Burden: Thomas Reid on the Problem of Moral Motivation,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 6: 21–44.
  • –––, 2007b. “Critical Review: William C. Davis’ Thomas Reid’s Ethics: Moral Epistemology on Legal Foundations,” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 6: 91–104.
  • –––. 2006. “Signs of Value: Reid on the Evidential Role of Feelings in Moral Judgment,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 14: 69–91.
  • –––, 2004. “Reid’s Moral Philosophy,” in Cuneo and van Woudenberg 2004.
  • –––, 2003. “Reidian Moral Perception,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 33: 229–58.
  • Cuneo, T., and René van Woudenberg (eds.), 2004. The Cambridge Companion to Thomas Reid, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cuneo, T., and R. Harp, 2016. “Thomas Reid,” in K. Timpe (ed.), The Routledge Companion to Free will, London: Routledge, ch. 10.
  • D’Arms, Justin, 2005. “Two Arguments for Sentimentalism,” Philosophical Issues, 15: 1–21.
  • Darwall, Stephen, 2006. The Second-Person Standpoint. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1994. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought.’, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • David, Marian, 1985. “Non-Existence and Reid’s Conception of Conceiving,” in R. Haller (ed.), Non-Existence and Predication, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Davis, William B., 2010. “Thomas Reid on Moral Disagreement,” in Roeser (ed.) 2010.
  • –––, 2006. Thomas Reid’s Ethics: Moral Epistemology on Legal Foundations, London: Continuum.
  • Gallie, Roger, 1998. Thomas Reid: Ethics, Aesthetics and the Anatomy of the Self, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Greco, John, 2002. “How to Reid Moore,” Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 544–63.
  • –––, 2004. “Reid’s Reply to the Skeptic,” in Cuneo and van Woudenberg 2004.
  • Harris, James, 2005. Of Liberty and Necessity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Jensen, Henning, 1989. “Reid versus Hume: A Dilemma in the Theory of Moral Worth,” in Melvin Dalgarno and Eric Matthews (eds.), The Philosophy of Thomas Reid, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kail, P. J. E., 2001. “Hutcheson’s Moral Sense: Skepticism, Realism, and Secondary Qualities,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 18: 57–77.
  • –––, 2007. Projection and Realism in Hume’s Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Korsgaard, Christine, 2009. The Constitution of Agency, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kroeker, Esther, 2010. “Reid on Natural Signs, Taste and Moral Perception,” in Roeser (ed.) 2010.
  • Lehrer, Keith, 1989. Thomas Reid, New York: Routledge.
  • Levy, Sanford, 1999. “Thomas Reid’s Defense of Conscience,” History of Philosophical Quarterly, 16: 413–35.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1966. A Short History of Ethics, London: Macmillan.
  • McGregor, Joan, 1987. “Reid on Justice as a Natural Virtue,” The Monist, 70: 483–95.
  • McNaughton, David, 1996. “An Unconnected Heap of Duties?” Philosophical Quarterly, 46: 433–47.
  • Nichols, Ryan, 2002. “Reid on Fictional Objects and the Way of Ideas,” Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 582–601.
  • Powell, Lewis and Gideon Yaffe, 2015. “Reid on Favors, Injuries, and the Natural Virtue of Justice,” in Rebecca Copenhaver and Todd Buras (eds.), Thomas Reid on Mind, Knowledge and Value, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 249-66.
  • Pritchard, Michael, 2008. “Justice and Resentment in Hume, Reid, and Smith,” The Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 6: 59–70.
  • Rawls, John, 2000. Lectures in the History of Moral Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Roeser, Sabine (ed.) 2010. Reid on Ethics, London: Palgrave-Macmillan.
  • Roeser, Sabine, 2010a. “Introduction: Thomas Reid’s Moral Philosophy,” in Roeser (ed.) 2010.
  • Ross, W. D., 2002. The Right and the Good, Philip Stratton-Lake (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rowe, William, 1991. Thomas Reid on Freedom and Morality, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B., 1998. The Invention of Autonomy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Selby-Bigge, L. A. (ed.), 1965. British Moralists (Volume 1), New York: Dover.
  • Van Cleve, James, 2015. Problems from Reid, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiggins, David, 1993. “A Neglected Position?,” in John Haldane and Crispin Wright (eds.), Reality, Representation, and Projection, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 2001. Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2004. “Reid on Common sense,” in Cuneo and van Woudenberg 2004.
  • –––, 2010. “Reid on Justice,” in Roeser (ed.) 2010.
  • Yaffe, Gideon, 2004. Manifest Activity: Thomas Reid’s Theory of Action, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2007. “Promises, Social Acts, and Reid’s First Argument for Moral Liberty,” Journal for the History of Philosophy, 45: 267–89.


Portions of this entry draw from Cuneo 2011 a, 2022 b, and 2010. I thank Tyler Doggett, Tom Dougherty, and Lori Wilson for comments on an earlier draft of this entry.

Copyright © 2016 by
Terence Cuneo <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free