First published Tue Aug 17, 2004; substantive revision Fri Apr 10, 2020

Reism is the doctrine that only things exist. The name is derived from the Latin noun res (‘thing’). The interpretation of this very rough view depends on how things are understood. Reism was anticipated by many nominalists (that is, philosophers maintaining that only individuals exist) and materialists, particularly by the Stoics, medieval doctrines of singularia (particulars) or Hobbes’ considerations on corpora (bodies). Some tenets of reism are to be found in Leibniz. Brentano defended reism very strongly in his later philosophy, when he argued against entia rationis (objects of thought; he meant by this objects which exist in thought alone). Brentano became a reist in about 1904 and attracted to this position some of his younger followers (so-called younger Brentanists), like O. Kraus, A. Kastil and G. Katkov. The most developed version of reism can be credited to Tadeusz Kotarbiński (1886–1981), a Polish philosopher and one of the leading members of the Lvov-Warsaw School. He introduced the term ‘reism’ to denote the philosophical view that the category of things is the sole ontological category. In other words, reism reduces all categories to that of things. Yet reists differ in their views about what exactly is included in the category of things. For example, if one takes the Aristotelian table of categories (ten rubrics: substance, relation, etc.) the reist would say that substances interpreted as things are the only existents. Reism also has a semantic dimension, for it recommends that only singular names, that is, names referring to concrete things, should be used, and abstract words avoided. Eventually, one can use sentences with abstract words provided that they have translations into statements with singular terms.

1. Brentano’s Reism

When arguing for reism Brentano was conscious of some related views of Leibniz. He even referred to Leibniz’s statements (in Nouveaux essais) about the dangers caused by using abstract words. Brentano’s reism was an effect of his departure from Aristotelian ontology. Brentano’s first metaphysics has a rich list of categories, including substances, modifications, circumstance, etc. Later, he divided being into things and irrealia, and the latter into immanent objects, contents, relations and so-called collectiva. All items belonging to irrealia had the status of entia rationis (beings in the mind or thought objects). Ultimately, Brentano rejected all entia rationis, that is, intentional objects, immanent objects, states of affairs, existence and non-existence, modalities, relations, probabilities, universals, Gestalten, time and space, Aristotelian forms, contents of judgements, etc.. His final ontological theory was based on the equality: being = entia realia = things. According to Brentano’s later philosophy, things are concrete (particular) entities. They are fully determined in their properties and are extended in time. Brentano distinguished two kinds of things, namely bodies (temporal and spatially extended) and souls (only temporal).

Brentano offered some methods on how to speak about entia rationis without being committed to their existence. Take the sentence:

a is a thought object.

One can maintain that (1) refers to an immanent object (sense-data in the theory of perception are a good example here). According to Brentano, this sentence means:

A person X is thinking about a.

Now, (2) is about X not about a. Another instructive example concerns universals. Consider:

Redness is a color.

Apparently, it seems to refer to two abstracts, namely Redness and Color. However, (3) means that all red things are red, and, by the rule of conversion of categorical sentences implies

some colored things are red;

hence, the ontological commitment of (3) is reducible to individuals (red things). According to Brentano, terms referring to entia rationis are actually not expressions functioning as names, but they belong to so-called syncategorematica (or synsemantica), that is, the category of expressions not having an autonomous meaning, but only a contextual one as for example, logical constants (‘and’, ‘or’, etc.). Omitting sentences, only names of particulars are categorematic (or autosemantic). On the other hand, the nouns used to refer to entia rationis are useful because they simplify our discourse. Nevertheless, we could live without abstract terms.

Brentano also offered a quite general argument for reism based on the idea of intentionality as direction of thinking (and other mental acts). According to Brentano, the expression ‘to think’ is univocal in the sense that it always refers to a definite mental act directed to something. Accordingly ‘to think’ always means ‘to think of something’. This implies that the expression ‘something’ is univocal too, because there is no generic concept comprising both things and non-things as object to which intentional acts refer. This argument assumes that ‘something’ is co-extensional with ‘being’. Now, if ‘being’ is the most general noun, there is no noun which refers to being and non-being. Hence, if ‘something’ refers to a thing at time t, it cannot refer to a non-thing at different time. Although Brentano himself considered this argument as fully conclusive, it is dubious whether he was right in this respect. His argument eventually implies that if ‘something’ refers to the objects a and b, both belong to the same ontological category, but not that they are things, at least, in any ordinary sense. Thus, Brentano’s argument for reism is at most an argument for a unicategorial ontology, that is, an ontology based on only one kind of object. See section 4 for the further discussion.

2. Kotarbiński’s Reism

Although Kotarbiński was a philosophical grandson of Brentano (via K. Twardowski, a student of the latter), he developed his version of reism independently (Woleński 1996, 357). This took place in the 1920s. The most extensive treatment of Kotarbiński’s reism is to be found in his book Elementy, published in 1929 (in Polish). In general, Kotarbiński followed Brentano’s criticism of abstract objects. Kotarbiński worked with a simplified table of ontological categories proposed by W. Wundt at the end of the 19th century. This table includes: things, states of affairs, relations and properties. Accordingly, Kotarbiński stated reism by two theses:

Any object is a thing.
No object is a state of affairs, relation or property.

The thesis (R1) was supplemented by a closer characterization of things given by

a is thing = a is a resistant and extended object (a material body).

Kotarbiński called (R3) “the thesis of pansomatism” (pansomatism is derived from the Greek term soma which means ‘body’; hence, pansomatism claims that every object is a body, assuming that bodies are material). It indicates that reism defined by (R1)–(R3) is a kind of materialism. Kotarbiński sometimes used the terms ‘reism’, ‘pansomatism’ and ‘concretism’ as equivalents.

The theses (R1)–(R3) concern an ontological dimension of reism or ontological reism. However, Kotarbiński’s reism, like Brentano’s version of this view, also has a semantic dimension. Semantic reism is a theory of language. In particular, it is a theory of names. According to this account, names occurring in ordinary parlance can be divided into two categories: genuine names and non-genuine names (i.e., apparent names, onomatoids). The former category is reduced to names of things in the sense of (R1) and (R3). Now, onomatoids seem to refer to abstract objects, but that is a mistake, because such objects do not exist by standards of reism. Kotarbiński supplemented this distinction with a theory of sense. Only sentences with genuine names (and logical constants) have a literal meaning (sense). If a sentence with onomatoids is replaceable by a sentence with genuine names only (call such sentences “reistic”), it is meaningful, if not it is meaningless. Consider:

Wisdom is a property of some people.

It contains two apparent names, namely ‘wisdom’ and ‘property’. Now, according to Kotarbiński, the content of (5) can be fully expressed by:

Some people are wise.

This sentence does not have any apparent name. On the other hand, the sentence:

States of affairs are abstract objects.

is not replaceable by any sentence in which onomatoids are replaced by genuine names. At first glance, onomatoids are similar to empty names. Yet there is an important difference between them because sentences with empty names are meaningful. For example,

Centaurs are horses,

does not need to be replaced by a reistic sentence because it is itself reistic. Kotarbiński believes that (8) is meaningful, unlike (7), and that this shows that sentences with empty names are already reistic, unlike sentences with onomatoids, which are meaningless. Sentences with apparent names have either meanings via reistic translations or they are meaningless strings of words. Onomatoids are dangerous, because they are sources of hypostatisation, which consists in committing abstract objects as really existing, although their existence is apparent only. In particular, hypostatisation is very common in philosophy (see the sentence (7) above) and leads, according to Kotarbiński, to pointless speculations about abstract objects, their kinds, etc. Therefore, reism provides a weapon against involving philosophy in unending pseudocontroversies. In particular, reism accuses all kinds of Platonism to be the source of the hopeless problems and discussions that stem from admitting the existence of beings, like Platonic forms.

Some points of Kotarbiński’s reism can be illuminated by pointing out its connections with Leśniewski’s calculus of names (the Leśniewski’s Ontology, LO, for brevity). According to LO, a name is an expression which can stand for the variable b in the sentence:

a is b.

(Leśniewski wanted to have names in the predicative position). It is assumed that the copula ‘is’ has so-called fundamental meaning. It is established by the axiom of LO, which is, the conjuction of three following sentences:

  • There is some x, such that x is a.
  • For any x, if x is a, then x is b.
  • For any x and y, if x is a and y is a, then x is y.

This axiom implies that, in order to be true, any sentence of the form (9) must have a singular name (that is, a name denoting exactly one object) at the place a. Furthermore, the copula ‘is’ is devoid of any temporal or spatial connotations. Any sentence with an empty name in the position of a or b is false; thus, (8) is false. The sentence,

a is a thing,

which is crucial for reism, is true only if the term a is a name of a particular. Thus, the logical basis of reism implies that names of things are singular. LO justifies also Kotarbiński’s account of common nouns (general names, according to traditional logic) as genuine names. Consider the sentence:

John is a sportsman,

where ‘John’ is a proper name, that is, referring to an individual person. The expression ‘sportsman’ should be interpreted as ‘one of the sportsmen’, that is, it refers to any individual belonging to the class of sportsmen. It enables the reader to see a connection between ‘John’ and ‘sportsman’ as expressed by:

If a person is denoted by ‘John’, it is also denoted by ‘sportsman’.

A further possible step consists in appealing to mereology (i.e., the theory of parts and wholes) and interpreting the class of sportsmen as a collective (mereological) set. On the other hand, LO does not motivate the division of names into genuine names and onomatoids. In particular, Leśniewski himself was not a reist.

Kotarbiński argued for reism mostly pragmatically. One of his arguments (concerning the dangers of hypostatization) has been pointed out already. Moreover, Kotarbiński saw reism as a very natural interpretation of natural language. He stressed that concrete terms precede abstract nouns in language acquisition and that only bodies (as defined by (R2), that is, pansomatically) are beings which we encounter in our everyday experience. Kotarbiński himself considered the above arguments for reism as sufficient, but he was perfectly conscious that they provide an inductive and partial support for the reistic standpoint.

3. Problems and Prospects for Reism

Reism had to meet several serious problems. It was very soon observed that (R2), one of the most important theses of reism, contained apparent names ‘state of affairs’, ‘relation’ and ‘property’. Hence, it should be disqualified as meaningless by reistic standards. In order to cope with this objection, Kotarbiński sharply distinguished semantic reism and ontological reism. He gradually ascribed a greater importance to semantic issues. For example, he was inclined to consider (R2) as a statement about the reistic language, that is, providing the condition for which names are admissible in our language. Another difficult problem came from various special fields and concerned the reistic interpretation of mathematics, logic, semantics, psychology sociology and the humanities. How should a reistic interpretation of set theory be presented? Is the concept of meaning explainable reistically? How should psyche, social rules or pieces of art be understood in the reistic frameworks? Kotarbiński hoped that mereology would provide a reistic alternative of set theory. He also offered a partial solution to other difficulties, but he finally recognized that the successes of reism were very partial. At the last stage, Kotarbiński considered reism rather as a program than as a theory of the world and language. However, he always stressed that every form of progress in reism, even regional or local, is a cognitive success, because it introduces a language which is free of the dangers that result from using abstract words. In spite of these difficulties, reism attracted many philosophers, mainly in Poland. Perhaps Tarski is the most notable example. He expressed sympathy for reism and even translated one of Kotarbiński’s papers into English, but he used Platonistic methods in his works on the foundations of mathematics.

4. Some Comparisons

Kotarbiński’s reism has some affinities with logical empiricism. Pansomatism is a version of physicalism and semantic reism which is similar to the formal mode of speech in Carnap’s sense. Although Kotarbiński’s later formulation of semantic reism was influenced by logical empiricism, pansomatism appeared earlier than the Viennese physicalism. There are several similarties between Kotarbiński and Brentano, but there are also important differences. For Brentano, an object is what can be presented. This definition of object is psychological. Kotarbiński wanted to give an ontological or semantic (an object is what is denoted by a genuine name) explanation of the concept of object. For Brentano, ‘to exist’ means ‘to exist now’, but for Kotarbiński, existence is free of all temporal connotations. The crucial difference is this: Brentano’s reism is dualistic (things are bodies or soul), but Kotarbiński’s reism is monistic (only bodies are things). This difference suggests an interpretation of reism. If we add Leibniz to this company, we see that he, Brentano and Kotarbiński share the following thesis:

Only particulars (individuals, concreta) exist.

On the other hand, the inventory of particulars is different in all three cases. For Leibniz, only spiritual monads exist, for Brentano, there are spiritual souls and material bodies, but for Kotarbiński, only material bodies occur in the world. Thus, we have one formal ontological thesis (RO) and its three different metaphysical concretisations. Using Kotarbiński’s terms, concretism points out an ontological feature of reism, but pansomatism concerns metaphysical matters. If this is accepted, reism in the sense of (RO) becomes a kind of nominalism. Due to its connection with LO, it is a fairly strong version of nominalism, probably stronger than any other. This is due to the fact that identity is defined in elementary Ontology, but is not definable in standard first-order logic.


An extensive bibliography on reism (current to 1990) is to be found in Woleński 1990. Brentano’s reism is mostly expounded in his works published in 1911, 1930, 1933 and 1954.

A. Primary Sources

  • Brentano, F., Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt, Leipzig: Duncker und Humblot, 1874 (2nd edition, with notes by O. Kraus, Leipzig, Meiner, 1924); English translation, Psychology from Empirical Standpoint, trans. by A. C. D. B. Terell and L. McAllister. London, Routledge (2nd edition, by P. Simons, 1995).
  • –––, Von der Klassifikation der psychische Phänomene (Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt, Volume 2), Leipzig: Duncker und Humblot, 1911; Eng. tr. as above.
  • –––, Versuch über die Erkenntnis, A. Kastil (ed.), Leipzig: Meiner, 1925.
  • –––, Vom sinnlichen und noetischen Bewusstein (Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt, Volume 3), O. Kraus (ed.), Leipzig: Meiner, 1928; English translation, Sensory and Noetic Consciousness, Psychology from the Empirical Point of View III, trans. by M. Schättle and L. McAllister, London: Routledge 1981.
  • –––, Wahrheit und Evidenz, O. Kraus (ed.), Leipzig: Meiner, 1930; English translation, The True and Evident, trans. by R. Chisholm and I. Politzer and K. Fischer, London: Routledge, 1966.
  • –––, Kategorienlehre, A. Kastil (ed.), Leipzig: Meiner, 1933; English translation, The Theory of Categories, trans. by R. Chisholm and N. Guterman, Hague: Nijhoff, 1981.
  • –––, Abkehr vom Nichtrealen. Briefe und Abhandlungen aus dem Nachlass, F. Meyer-Hillebrand (ed.), Bern: Francke, 1954.
  • Kotarbiński, T., Elementy teorii poznania, logiki formalnej i metodologii nauk, Lwow: Ossolineum, 1929; English translation (with several appendixes concerning reism), Gnosiology. The Scientific Approach to the Theory of Knowledge, trans. by O. Wojtasiewicz, Oxford: Pergamon Press, 1966.
  • Kraus, O., Wege und Umwege der Philosophie, Prague: Calve’sche, 1934.

B. Secondary Literature

  • Ajdukiewicz, K., 1935, “On the Problem of Universals”, in K. Ajdukiewicz, The Scientific World-Perspective and the Other Essays, 1931–1963, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1978, 95–110, translated by Jerzy Giedymin from the original in Polish.
  • Chrudzimski, A., Smith, B., 2004, “Brentano’s Ontology: From Conceptualism to Reism”, in D. Jacquette (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Brentano, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 197–219.
  • Grzegorczyk, A., 1990, “Consistent Reism”, in Woleński 1990, 40–45.
  • Janoušek, Hynek and Robin Rollinger, 2017, “The Prague School”, in Uriah Kriegel (ed.), The Routledge Handbook of Franz Brentano and the Brentano School, New York: Routledge, pp. 313–322.
  • Körner, S., 1978, “Brentanos Reismus und extensionale Logik”, Grazer philosophische Studien, 5: 29–43.
  • Kriegel, Uriah, 2015, “Thought and Thing: Brentano’s Reism as Truthmaker Nominalism”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 91(1): 153–180.
  • Lejewski, Cz., 1976, “Outline of Ontology”, Bulletin of the John Rylands University Library of Manchester, 59(1): 127–147.
  • –––, 1979, “On the Dramatic Stage in the Development of Kotarbiński’s Pansomatism”, in P. Weingartner and P. Morscher (eds.), Ontology and Logic, Berlin: Duncker und Humblot, 197–218; reprinted in Woleński (ed.) 1990, 137–183.
  • Poli, R., 1993, “A Dispute over Reism”, in F. Coniglione, R. Poli and J. Woleński (eds.), The Polish Scientific Philosophy: The Lvov-Warsaw School, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 339–354.
  • Rand, R., 1937–1938, “Kotarbińskis Philosophie auf Grund seines Hauptwerkes: ‘Elemente der Erkenntnistheorie, der Logik und der Methodologie der Wissenschaften’ ”, Erkennntis, 7: 92–120.
  • Sauer, W., 2017, “Brentano’ Reism”, in U. Kriegel (ed.), The Routledge Handbook of Franz Brentano and the Brentano School, New York: Routledge.
  • Simons, Peter, 2015, “How to Do Things with Things: Brentano’s Reism and its Limits”, in Denis Seron, Sebastion Richard, and Bruno Leclercq (eds.), Objects and Pseudo-Objects: Ontological Deserts and Jungles from Brentano to Carnap, De Gruyter, 3–16.
  • Smith, B., 1990, “On the Phases of Reism”, in Woleński 1990, 137–183.
  • Terrell, B., 1978, “Quantification and Brentano’s Logic”, Grazer Philosophische Studien, 5: 45–65.
  • Woleński, J., 1987, “Reism and Leśniewski’s Ontology”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 7: 167–176.
  • –––, 1989, Logic and Philosophy in the Lvov-Warsaw School, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • –––, 1994, “Brentano, the Univocality of ‘Thinking’, and Reism”, Brentano Studien 5, 149–166.
  • –––, 1996, “Reism in the Brentanian Tradition”, in L. Albertazzi and al. (eds.), The School of Franz Brentano, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 357–375.
  • Woleński, J. (ed.), 1990, Kotarbiński: Logic, Semantics and Ontology, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Wolniewicz, B., 1990, “Concerning Reism”, in Woleński (ed.), 199–204.

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