Franz Brentano

First published Wed Dec 4, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jan 30, 2019

Franz Clemens Brentano (1838–1917) is mainly known for his work in philosophy of psychology, especially for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He made important contributions to many fields in philosophy, especially to the philosophy of mind, metaphysics and ontology, ethics, logic, the history of philosophy, and philosophical theology. Brentano was strongly influenced by Aristotle and the Scholastics as well as by the empiricist and positivist movements of the early nineteenth century. Due to his introspectionist approach of describing consciousness from a first person point of view, on one hand, and his rigorous style as well as his contention that philosophy should be done with exact methods like the natural sciences, on the other, Brentano is often considered a forerunner of both the phenomenological movement and the tradition of analytic philosophy. A charismatic teacher, Brentano exerted a strong influence on the work of Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Kasimir Twardowski, Carl Stumpf, and Anton Marty, among others, and thereby played a central role in the philosophical development of central Europe in the early twentieth century.

1. Life and Work

Franz Brentano was born on January 16, 1838 in Marienberg am Rhein, Germany, a descendent of a strongly religious German-Italian family of intellectuals (his uncle Clemens Brentano and his aunt Bettina von Arnim were among the most important writers of German Romanticism and his brother Lujo Brentano became a leading expert in social economics). He studied mathematics, poetry, philosophy, and theology in Munich, Würzburg, and Berlin. Already at high school he became acquainted with Scholasticism; at university he studied Aristotle with Trendelenburg in Berlin, and read Comte as well as the British Empiricists (mainly John Stuart Mill), all of whom had a great influence on his work. Brentano received his Ph.D. from the University of Tübingen in 1862, with his thesis On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle.

After graduation Brentano prepared to take his vows; he was ordained a Catholic priest in 1864. Nevertheless he continued his academic career at the University of Würzburg, where he presented his Habilitationsschrift on The Psychology of Aristotle in 1867. Despite reservations in the faculty about his priesthood he eventually became full professor in 1873. During this period, however, Brentano struggled more and more with the official doctrine of the Catholic Church, especially with the dogma of papal infallibility, promulgated at the first Vatican Council in 1870. Shortly after his promotion at the University of Würzburg, Brentano withdrew from the priesthood and from his position as professor.

After his Habilitation, Brentano had started to work on a large scale work on the foundations of psychology, which he entitled Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. The first volume was published in 1874, a second volume (The Classification of Mental Phenomena) followed in 1911, and fragments of the third volume (Sensory and Noetic Consciousness) were published posthumously by Oskar Kraus in 1928.

Shortly after the publication of the first volume, Brentano took a job as a full professor at the University of Vienna, where he continued a successful teaching career. During his tenure in Vienna, Brentano, who was very critical towards his own writing, did not pursue his plans to complete and publish the second and third volumes of his Psychology, but preferred to publish shorter texts, most of which were based on manuscripts for public lectures. The topics range from aesthetics (Das Genie [The Genius], Das Schlechte als Gegenstand dichterischer Darstellung [Evil as Object of Poetic Representation]) and issues in historiography to The Origin of the Knowledge of Right and Wrong, in which Brentano laid out his views on ethics. The latter was Brentano’s first book to be translated into English in 1902.

When in 1880 Brentano and Ida von Lieben decided to wed, they had to confront the fact that the prevailing law in the Austro-Hungarian Empire denied matrimony to persons who had been ordained priests – even if they later had resigned from priesthood. They surmounted this obstacle by temporarily moving to and becoming citizens of Saxony, where they finally got married. This was possible only by temporarily giving up the Austrian citizenship and, in consequence, the job as full professor at the University. When Brentano came back to Vienna a few months later, the Austrian authorities did not reassign him his position. Brentano became Privatdozent, a status that allowed him to go on teaching – but did not entitle him to receive a salary or to supervise theses. For several years he tried in vain to get his position back. In 1895, after the death of his wife, he left Austria disappointed; at this occasion, he published a series of three articles in the Viennese newspaper Die neue freie Presse entitled Meine letzen Wünsche für Österreich [My Last Wishes for Austria] (which soon afterwards appeared as a self-standing book), in which he outlined his philosophical position as well as his approach to psychology, but also harshly criticized the legal situation of former priests in Austria. In 1896 he settled down in Florence where he got married to Emilie Ruprecht in 1897.

Brentano has often been described as an extraordinarily charismatic teacher. Throughout his life he influenced a great number of students, many of who became important philosophers and psychologists in their own rights, such as Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Anton Marty, Carl Stumpf, Kasimir Twardowski, as well as Sigmund Freud. Many of his students became professors in different parts of the Austro-Hungarian Empire, Marty and Ehrenfels in Prague, Meinong in Graz, and Twardowski in Lvov (now Lviv), and so spread Brentanianism over the whole Austro-Hungarian Empire, which explains the central role of Brentano in the philosophical development in central Europe, especially in what was later called the Austrian Tradition in philosophy.

Brentano always emphasized that he meant to teach his students to think critically and in a scientific manner, without holding prejudices and paying undue respect to philosophical schools or traditions. When former students of his took a critical approach to his own work, however, when they criticized some of his doctrines and modified others to adapt them for their own goals, Brentano reacted bitterly. He often refused to discuss criticism, ignored improvements, and thus became more and more isolated, a development that was reinforced by his increasing blindness.

Due to these eye-problems Brentano could not read or write any longer, but had his wife read to him and dictated his work to her. Nonetheless, he produced a number of books in his years in Florence. In 1907 he published Untersuchungen zur Sinnespsychologie, a collection of shorter texts on psychology. In 1911 he presented not only the second volume of his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, but also two books on Aristotle: in Aristotle and his World View he provides an outline and interpretation of Aristotle’s philosophy. In Aristoteles Lehre vom Ursprung des menschlichen Geistes Brentano continues a debate with Zeller. This debate had started already in the 1860s, when Brentano criticized Zeller’s interpretation of Aristotle in his Psychology of Aristotle and became quite intense and aggressive in the seventies and eighties of the nineteenth century.

When Italy entered war against Germany and Austria during World War I, Brentano, who felt himself a citizen of all three countries, moved from Florence to neutral Switzerland. He passed away in Zurich on March 17, 1917.

Brentano left a huge number of unpublished manuscripts, including poetry and letters on a wide range of philosophical topics in his last domicile in Zürich and in his summer-residence in Schönbühel bei Melk; some manuscripts were probably left behind in Florence. After his death, Alfred Kastil and Oskar Kraus, who were students of Brentano’s former student Anton Marty in Prague, worked on the Nachlass, transferring a good part of it to Innsbruck. Their attempt to set up a Brentano-archive was supported by Tomas Masaryk, a former student of Brentano who had become founder and first President (from 1918 to 1935) of the Republic of Czechoslovakia. As a result, in 1932 many of the original manuscripts were moved to Prague where an archive was founded. Alas, due to the political turbulences that were to came over central Europe the project made it necessary to transfer the archive again. Substantial parts of the Nachlass were transferred to different places in the United States, some of it has later been brought back to Europe, especially to the Brentano-Forschungsstelle at the University of Graz, Austria, and the Brentano family archive in Blonay, Switzerland. (For a detailed history of Brentano’s Nachlass, cf. Binder (2013)).

Kastil and Kraus did succeed, however, to begin to publish posthumously some of the lecture notes, letters, and drafts he had left. They tried to present Brentano’s work as best as they could, putting together various texts to what they thought were rounded, convincing works, sometimes following questionable editorial criteria. Their work was continued by other, more careful editors, but has by far not yet been completed: a much needed critical edition of his complete œuvre is still to be waited for.

2. Philosophy as a Rigorous Science and the Rise of Scientific Psychology

A central principle of Brentano’s philosophy, which should become widely accepted among Brentano’s students, was that philosophy should be done in a rigorous, scientific manner. Already early in his career, in the public defense of his Habilitation in 1866, he stated 25 theses, the fourth of which reads: “The true method of philosophy is that of natural science.” (contained in: ZP, 136, my translation) [“Verae philosophiae methodus nihil alia est nisi scientiae naturarum”]. Brentano, thus, opposed the idea that there was a unique method for philosophy and denied that there was a “first philosophy” that could unveil genuinely philosophical truths and thus play a privileged or foundational role in the overall system of the sciences. According to Brentano, philosophy—and in particular philosophical psychology—should apply a method that is based on observation, description of facts, and induction; just like the (other) natural sciences.

It has been suggested that Brentano’s fourth Habilitations-thesis makes him an advocate of a particular version of the unity of the sciences, according to which there is a unity of method (cf. Haller 1993, 27) and that it stands in contrast to “Dilthey’s view according to which the so-called Geisteswissenschaften or human or moral sciences would somehow call for a special method of ‘understanding’ or Verstehen, as opposed to the ‘explanation’ of the natural sciences.” (Smith 1994, 31). One has to be cautious not to overstate this point, though. While it is true that Brentano uses both the terms “method” [methodus] and “natural science” [scientiae naturarum] in the singular, there is strong evidence that he had a minimal understanding of what this method should exactly consist in. He never suggested that all scientific disciplines could be reduced to other, more basic disciplines, nor did he argue that all natural sciences should apply exactly the same method, nor that mathematization or the use of a formal language was indispensable for scientificity. For Brentano, a method counts as scientific as long as it fulfills the minimal requirements of applying observation, description of facts, and induction. The specific methodological procedures applied in a given scientific discipline depend first and foremost on the objects studied:

“Natural science, thus, requires in no way [...] that we should proceed everywhere in the same manner and in the way we do in the simplest cases of mechanics. On the contrary, it teaches and instructs us to change our procedure [Verfahren] in accordance with the particular nature of the objects” (ZP, 35, my translation).
[“Die Naturwissenschaft verlangt also keineswegs, [...] daß wir überall gleichmäßig und so, wie in den einfachsten Fällen der Mechanik vorgehen sollen. Im Gegenteil, sie unterweist uns und übt uns darauf ein, der besonderen Natur der Gegenstände entsprechend unser Verfahren zu ändern”]

Regarding formal methods he states: “Mathematical analysis, which is the main means of scientific progress in some areas of natural science, does not play nearly any role at all in others.” (ZK 35, my translation) [“Die mathematische Analyse, die auf manchem Gebiet der Naturwissenschaft das hauptsächliche Mittel des Fortschritt ist, spielt darum bekanntlich auf anderen so gut wie gar keine Rolle.”] Brentano has never made an attempt to introduce formal or mathematical methods in philosophy or psychology. On the contrary, he criticized Johann Friedrich Herbart’s attempts to mathematize psychology, pointing out that Herbart’s mathematical deductions lack empirical foundation and therefore lose contact to the actual phenomena (cf. LW, 36). In another place where he discusses Herbart’s position, he states: “Alas, many believed that where there is so much mathematical rigour, there must be exact science” (GA, 53f, my translation). [“Leider meinten viele, wo so viel mathematische Strenge zu finden sei, müsse exakte Wissenschaft gegeben sein.”] For Brentano, any rigorous, scientific method had to be appropriate for the observed phenomena; his position, thus, is closer to classical empiricism and positivism than to the logical positivism as it was developed in Vienna a decade after his death.

Brentano’s views concerning the right method in philosophy was of particular importance to his contributions to psychology, as already the title of his main work, Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint suggests. Also there he argued that the right procedure consisted in observing and describing the relevant phenomena and establishing the general laws on the basis of induction. The particularity of Brentano’s method lies in the fact that psychology is based mainly on observation that is performed from a first person point of view. The psychologist draws on the intimate knowledge concerning her own current mental phenomena that she gains through inner perception (which, as we shall see below, is to be distinguished from inner observation). Brentano does not suggest, however, that these descriptions are infallible: as it is impossible to live and describe a particular experience at the same time, all descriptions of mental phenomena have to rely on memory and inner observation.

“If the attempt to observe the anger which stirs us becomes impossible because the phenomenon disappears, it is clear that an earlier state of excitement can no longer be interfered in this way. And we really can focus our attention on a past mental phenomenon just as we can upon a present physical phenomenon, and in this way we can, so to speak, observe it.” (PES, 26).
[“Wenn der Versuch, den Zorn, der uns bewegt, beobachtend zu verfolgen, durch Aufhebung des Phänomens unmöglich wird, so kann dagegen ein Zustand früherer Aufregung offenbar keine Störung mehr erleiden. Auch gelingt es wirklich, dem vergangenen psychischen Phänomen so wie einem gegenwärtigen physischen mit Aufmerksamkeit sich zuzuwenden, und es in dieser Weise sozusagen beobachten.” (PES, 49)]

Moreover, as inner perception and memory as sources of experience are limited to one’s own mental life, they have to be complemented with the “indirect knowledge of the mental phenomena of others” [“indirekte Erkenntnis fremder psychischer Phänomene”], which we can gain on the basis of the manifest behavior we can observe in others, including their verbal behavior, i.e., when “a person describes them directly in words.” (PES 28) [“jemand geradezu in Worten sie beschreibt”] (PES 53).

Brentano’s approach, like that of other introspectionist psychologists of the late nineteenth century, was harshly criticized with the rise of scientific psychology in the tradition of logical positivism, especially by behaviorists, who argue that empirical psychology must not make use of introspection, but only of data that can be obtained by the observation of the manifest behaviour of human beings from a third-person point of view. This should not obscure the fact that Brentano did play a crucial role in the process of psychology becoming an independent science. He distinguished between genetic and empirical or, as he called it, descriptive psychology, a distinction that is most explicitly drawn in lecture notes form the mid-1880s that have been published in Descriptive Psychology (DP). Genetic psychology studies psychological phenomena from a third-person point of view. It involves the use of experiments and thus satisfies the scientific standards we nowadays expect of an empirical science. Even though Brentano never conducted psychological experiments in laboratories, he very actively supported the installation of the first laboratories for experimental psychology in the Austro-Hungarian Empire – a goal that was achieved by his student Alexius Meinong in Graz. Descriptive psychology (to which Brentano sometimes also referred as “phenomenology” (cf. DP 137)) aims at describing consciousness from a first-person point of view. Its goal is to list “fully the basic components out of which everything internally perceived by humans is composed, and … [to enumerate] the ways in which these components can be connected” (DP 4). Brentano’s distinction between genetic and descriptive psychology strongly influenced Husserl’s development of the phenomenological method, especially in its early phases. But already then Brentano could not approve of Husserl’s development for it involved the intuition of abstract essences, the existence of which Brentano denied. With his so-called “transcendental turn” in the mid of the first decade of the twentieth century, Husserl alienated himself more and more from the Brentanian roots of the phenomenological method.

3. Brentano’s Theory of Mind

Brentano’s main goal was to lay the basis for a scientific psychology, which he defines as “the science of mental phenomena” (PES, 14) [“Wissenschaft von den psychischen Erscheinungen”]. In order to give flesh to this definition of the discipline, he provides a more detailed characterization of mental phenomena. He proposes six criteria to distinguish mental from physical phenomena (PES 61–77), the most important of which are: (i) mental phenomena are the exclusive object of inner perception, (ii) they always appear as a unity, and (iii) they are always intentionally directed towards an object. (The other three criteria are: psychological phenomena – and only those – are presentations or phenomena based upon presentations; they seem to have no spatial extension; and have not only intentional, but also actual existence.) I will discuss the first two criteria in the next sub-section, and the third in a separate sub-section below.

3.1 Inner Perception, Unity of Consciousness and the Tripartition of Mental Phenomena

All mental phenomena have in common, Brentano argues, “that they are only perceived in inner consciousness, while in the case of physical phenomena only external perception is possible” (PES, 70) [“daß sie nur in innerem Bewußtsein wahrgenommen werden, während bei den physischen nur äußere Wahrnehmung möglich ist.” (PES 128)]. According to Brentano, the former of these two forms of perception provides an unmistakable evidence for what is true. Since the German word for perception (Wahrnehmung), literally translated, means “taking-true”, Brentano says that it is the only kind of perception in a strict sense. He points out that inner perception must not be mixed up with inner observation, which would require that one is having a mental act, the act of observing, that is directed towards another mental act, the act observed. Inner perception, on the other hand, must not be conceived as a full-fledged act that accompanies another mental act towards which it is directed. It is rather interwoven with the latter: in addition to being primarily directed towards an object, every mental act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object. When I see a tree, for example, the primary object of my visual experience is the tree. But I am also aware that I am seeing and not, say, hearing or touching the tree; I am, in other words, aware of the fact that I have a mental phenomenon that is directed towards the tree. This is possible because one and the same mental phenomenon, my visual experience, is directed not only towards its primary object, the tree, it is incidentally directed also towards itself as a secondary object.

“The presentation of the sound and the presentation of the presentation of the sound form one single mental phenomenon; it is only by considering it in its relation to two different objects, one of which is a physical phenomenon and the other a mental phenomenon, that we divide it conceptually into two presentations. In the same mental phenomenon in which the sound is present to our minds we simultaneously apprehend the mental phenomenon itself. What is more, we apprehend it in accordance with its dual nature insofar as it has the sound as content within it, and insofar as it has itself as content at the same time.” (PES, 98)
[“Die Vorstellung des Tones und die Vorstellung von der Vorstellung des Tones bilden nicht mehr als ein einziges psychisches Phänomen, das wir nur, indem wir es in seiner Beziehung auf zwei verschiedene Objekte, deren eines ein physisches, und deren anderes ein psychisches Phänomen ist, betrachten, begrifflich in zwei Vorstellungen zergliederten. In demselben psychischen Phänomen, in welchem der Ton vorgestellt wird, erfassen wir zugleich das psychische Phänomen selbst, und zwar nach seiner doppelten Eigentümlichkeit, insofern es als Inhalt den Ton in sich hat, und insofern es zugleich sich selbst als Inhalt gegenwärtig ist.” (PES, 179)]

According to Brentano, every mental phenomenon is directed towards itself as a secondary object; inner perception is, thus, a form of mechanism on the basis of which we become aware of our own mental phenomena.

As a consequence, Brentano denies the idea that there could be unconscious mental acts: since every mental act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object, we are automatically aware of every occurring mental act. He admits, however, that we can have mental acts of various degrees of intensity. In addition, he holds that the degree of intensity with which the object is presented is equal to the degree of intensity in which the secondary object, i.e., the act itself, is presented. Consequently, if we have a mental act of a very low intensity, our inner perception of the act or, as he puts it, our secondary consciousness of it will also have a very low intensity. From this Brentano concludes that sometimes we are inclined to say that we had an unconscious mental phenomenon when actually we had a conscious mental phenomenon of very low intensity.

Consciousness, Brentano argues, always forms a unity. While we can perceive a number of physical phenomena at one and the same time, we can only perceive one mental phenomenon at a specific point in time. When we seem to have more than one mental act at a time, like when we are listening to a melody while tasting a sip of red wine and enjoying the beautiful view from the window, all these mental phenomena melt into one, they become moments or, to stick with Brentano’s terminology, divisives of a collective. If one of the divisives ends in the course of time, e.g., when I swallow the wine and turn my eyes to the fireplace, but continue to listen to the music, the collective goes on to exist. Brentano’s views on the unity of consciousness entail that inner observation, as explained above, is strictly impossible, for this would require us to have two distinct acts in the very same moment. Of course it is possible to remember another mental act one had a moment ago, or expect future mental acts, but due to the unity of consciousness one cannot have two distinct mental acts, one of which being directed towards the other, at the same time.

The fact that we can be directed towards one and the same object in different ways allows Brentano to introduce a classification of mental phenomena. He distinguishes three basic kinds: presentations, judgments, and emotions (which he refers to as “phenomena of love and hate”). These are not three completely distinct classes, though. Presentations are the most basic kind of acts; we have a presentation each time when we are directed towards an object, be it that we are imagining, seeing, remembering, or expecting it, etc. In his Psychology Brentano held that two presentations can differ only in the object, towards which they are directed. Later he modified his position, though, and argued that they can also differ in various modes, such as temporal modes (cf. PES 217 [This text is part of the appendix to the second part of PES from 1911 – for the German original cf. PES, vol II, 142]). The two other categories, judgments and phenomena of love and hate, are based on presentations. In a judgment we accept or deny the existence of the presented object. A judgment, thus, is a presentation plus a qualitative mode of acceptance or denial. The third category, which Brentano names “phenomena of love and hate,” comprises emotions, feelings, desires and acts of will. In these acts we have positive or negative feelings or attitudes towards an object.

Brentano’s tripartition of mental phenomena is a basic element of his theory that remained central for his whole life. The fact that he saw himself constrained to make minor adjustments shows that Brentano did approach philosophy in a very systematic manner and always had the bigger picture in mind. It can, thus, be taken as evidence that “in his mind Brentano was continuously refining and chiseling away at a unified system, a system that harmonized and stabilized the bits and pieces in his messy literary state” (Kriegel 2017a, 29).

Moreover, his conception of secondary consciousness, in combination with this thesis of the unity of consciousness have had a strong echo in the philosophy of mind, in particular in the recent debate concerning the nature of consciousness. It has been suggested that Brentano’s notion of secondary consciousness (i.e., the thesis that every mental phenomenon is incidentally directed also towards itself as a secondary object) can provide the means to overcome higher-order theories of consciousness that have been widely discussed in the late twentieth century. In this debate, the exact reading of Brentano’s thesis was often at stake. Some philosophers have suggested that Brentano’s view, according to which every mental phenomenon is object of inner perception, was an early expression of a higher-order perception theory of consciousness (cf., for example, Güzeldere 1997, 789). This interpretation, however, does not pay due attention to the fact that according to Brentano, inner perception is not a self-standing mental phenomenon of a higher level, but rather a structural moment of every mental phenomenon. Moreover, with his unity of consciousness thesis Brentano explicitly rejects the basic assumption of all higher-order perception theories of consciousness, i.e., the idea that we can have two mental phenomena (of distinct levels) at the same time, one of them being directed towards the other: higher-order perception theories postulate what Brentano calls ‘inner observation’ (as opposed to inner perception), which according to him was impossible, as we have seen above.

Accordingly, a number of recent interpreters have suggested that Brentano was an advocate of a one-level account of consciousness: “Since the features that make an act conscious are firmly located within the act itself rather than bestowed on it by a second act, this locates Brentano’s view as a one-level view of consciousness” (Thomasson, 2000, 192). This reading has given place to neo-Brentanian theories such as Thomasson’s adverbial account (cf. Thomasson 2000) or self-representational approaches (cf., for example, Kriegel 2003a, b) that build on the thesis that “every conscious state has a dual representational content. Its main content is the normal content commonly attributed to mental representations. But it also has a (rather peripheral) special content, namely, its own occurrence” (Kriegel 2003a, 480), which they take as Brentano’s central thesis. Moreover, Kriegel suggests that for Brentano this self-representational aspect is a necessary condition for having a presentation (Kriegel 2013).

Other interprets have taken more cautious lines. Mark Textor (2006), for example, has stressed the ties between Brentano’s notion of secondary consciousness and his thesis of the unity of consciousness. A mental phenomenon, according to Textor’s interpretation of Brentano’s theory, does not become conscious by representing itself, but rather by its being unified or fused with an immediately evident cognition of it. Dan Zahavi, on the other hand, has insisted that Brentano does distinguish two levels of perception, which sheds doubts on the one-level interpretation: “It could be argued that Brentano’s claim that every conscious intentional state takes two objects, a primary (external) object and secondary (internal) object, remains committed to a higher-order account of consciousness; it simply postulates it as being implicitly contained in every conscious state” (Zahavi, 2006, 5). In short, Brentano’s distinction between primary and secondary consciousness “introduces some kind of level-distinction into the structure of experience” (Brandl 2013, 61) but does not conceive of higher-perception as a full-fledged mental phenomenon at its own, which is why Brandl has recently proposed to regard it a ‘one-and-a-half-level theory’ (Brandl 2013, 61f).

While the debate concerning the exact interpretation of his views concerning secondary consciousness is still open, it underlines the relevance of Brentano’s contributions to contemporary philosophy of mind.

3.2 Intentionality

Brentano is probably best known for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He first characterizes this notion with the following words, which have become the classical, albeit not completely unambiguous formulation of the intentionality thesis:

“Every mental phenomenon is characterized by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction toward an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing), or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself...” (Brentano PES, 68)
[“Jedes psychische Phänomen ist durch das charakterisiert, was die Scholastiker des Mittelalters die intentionale (auch wohl mentale) Inexistenz eines Gegenstandes genannt haben, und was wir, obwohl mit nicht ganz unzweideutigen Ausdrücken, die Beziehung auf einen Inhalt, die Richtung auf ein Objekt (worunter hier nicht eine Realität zu verstehen ist), oder die immanente Gegenständlichkeit nennen würden. Jedes enthält etwas als Objekt in sich…” (Brentano, PES 124f)]

This quotation must be understood in context: in this passage, Brentano aims at providing one (of six) criteria to distinguish mental from physical phenomena with the aim to define the subject matter of scientific psychology – and not to develop a systematic account of intentionality. The passage clearly suggests, however, that the intentional object towards which we are directed is part of the psychological act. It is something mental rather than physical. Brentano, thus, seems to advocate a form of immanentism, according to which the intentional object is “in the head,” as it were. Some Brentano scholars have recently argued that this immanent reading of the intentionality thesis is too strong. In the light of other texts by Brentano from the same period they argue that he distinguishes between intentional correlate and object, and that the existence of the latter does not depend on our being directed towards it.

When Brentano’s students took up his notion of intentionality to develop more systematic accounts, they often criticized it for its unclarity regarding the ontological status of the intentional object: if the intentional object is part of the act, it was argued, we are faced with a duplication of the object. Next to the real, physical object, which is perceived, remembered, thought of, etc., we have a mental, intentional object, towards which the act is actually directed. Thus, when I think about the city of Paris, I am actually thinking of a mental object that is part of my act of thinking, and not about the actual city. This view leads to obvious difficulties, the most disastrous of which is that two persons can never be directed towards one and the same object.

If we try to resolve the problem by taking the intentional object to be identical with the real object, on the other hand, we face the difficulty of explaining how we can have mental phenomena that are directed towards non-existing objects such as Hamlet, the golden mountain, or a round square. Like my thinking about the city of Paris, all these acts are intentionally directed towards an object, with the difference, however, that their objects do not really exist.

Brentano’s initial formulation of the intentionality-thesis does not address these problems concerning the ontological status of the intentional object. The first attempt of Brentano’s students to overcome these difficulties was made by Twardowski, who distinguished between content and object of the act, the former of which is immanent to the act, the latter not (cf. Twardowski 1977). This distinction strongly influenced other members of the Brentano School, mainly the two students for who the notion of intentionality had the most central place, Meinong and Husserl.

Meinong’s theory of objects can best be understood as a reaction to the ontological difficulties in Brentano’s account. Rather than accepting the notion of an immanent content, Meinong argues that the intentional relation is always a relation between the mental act and an object. In some cases the intentional object does not exist, but even in these cases there is an object external to the mental act towards which we are directed. According to Meinong, even non-existent objects are in some sense real. Since we can be intentionally directed towards them, they must subsist (bestehen). Not all subsisting objects exist; some of them cannot even exist for they are logically impossible, such as round squares (cf. Meinong 1981). The notion of intentionality played a central role also in Husserlian phenomenology. Applying his method of the phenomenological reduction, however, Husserl addresses the problem of directedness with his notion of ‘noema’ as intentional correlate of the act (for a more detailed discussion, cf. the entry on Husserl).

Brentano was not very fond of his students’ attempts to resolve these difficulties, mainly because he rejected their underlying ontological assumptions. He was quick to point out that he never intended the intentional object to be immanent to the act. Brentano thought that this interpretation of his position was obviously absurd, for it would be “paradoxical to the extreme to say that a man promises to marry an ens rationis and fulfills his promise by marrying a real person” (PES, 299). In later texts, he therefore suggested to see intentionality as an exceptional form of relation. A mental act does not stand in an ordinary relation to an object, but in a quasi-relation (Relativliches). For a relation to exist, both relata have to exist. A person a is taller than another person b, for example, only if both a and b exist (and a is, in fact, taller than b). This does not hold for the intentional quasi-relation, Brentano suggests. A mental phenomenon can stand in a quasi-relation to an object independently of whether it exists or not. Mental acts, thus, can stand in a quasi-relation to existing objects like the city of Paris as well as non-existing objects like the Golden Mountain. Brentano’s later account, which is closely related to his later metaphysics, especially to his turn towards reism, i.e., the view that only individual objects exist, can hardly be considered a solution of the problem of the ontological status of the intentional object. He rather introduces a new term to reformulate the difficulties.

3.3 Time-Consciousness

According to Brentano’s thesis of the unity of consciousness, we can have only one mental phenomenon at a time. Next to this synchronic unity, however, there is also a diachronic unity of consciousness: my present mental phenomenon and the one I had just a moment or a few minutes ago form a unity as well. This becomes particularly evident when we consider cases in which we are intentionally directed towards temporally extended objects such as melodies, movies, or goals in a soccer game.

Brentano regards time as a continuum of which only one point, the present moment, is real. As a consequence, mental phenomena do not have temporal extension (very much like like mathematical points on a line). The question, now, is: how can mental phenomena, which do not have any temporal extension, be directed towards objects that are extended in time? Can we be directed towards the melody, or only towards a (very small) temporal part of it? Brentano solves this problem by arguing that the object of a presentation does not vanish immediately from consciousness in the moment the presentation is over, it is rather retained in consciousness for a short while. In order to explain this process, he introduces the notion of “original association” or “proteraesthesis”, which, as de Warren suggests, “occupies a notable place in the list of Brentano’s conceptual innovations; in contrast to other distinguishing concepts of descriptive psychology ... it is without precedence in the history of philosophy” (De Warren 2009, 57f).

Brentano has reflected on time consciousness throughout his life, but has never given a systematic exposition of his position that would give it a static form. Rather, he has changed his position several times, often to accommodate it to changes in his overall views. Based on the testimonies of his students and manuscripts contained in the Nachlass, we can distinguish different phases of Brentano’s views on time-consciousness (cf. Fréchette 2017).

According to his early view, time consciousness depends on the mode of judgment. I can be intentionally directed towards a past object if I judge (correctly) that, say, “Caesar was stabbed on the Ides of March, 44 B.C.”. The reason for characterising temporal differences as modes of judgments is probably the fact that in language we express these temporal differences with the tense of the verb (past, present, future) – but the verb also serves to express our accepting or denying the existence of an object in a judgment.

In his second phase, which he held from the early 1870s to the early 1890s, Brentano introduced the notion of original association. A mental phenomenon does not disappear from consciousness from one moment to another, it is rather retained for a short period of time. When I hear a melody a, b, c, d, for example, I first hear a. When, in a second moment, I hear b, a still persists in my consciousness, but is modified as “past”. When, another moment later, I hear c, both b and a are retained in original association; now also b is given as “past”, while a is “pushed back” even further into the past, as it were, etc. In this way, Brentano can explain how the melody (as a whole) can be the intentional object of a mental phenomenon: in each moment, the present and the (very) recent tones are given, but the latter are not given in the same way (or else we would not hear a melody, but we would hear all the tones at once; we would, in other words, not hear a melody, but a cacophony). The tones that are past are given with temporal modifications – which do not further determine them, but rather modify their ontological status from real to not real. In this period Brentano holds that two presentations can differ only in the object towards which they are directed; the continuously changing temporal moment, thus, is a modification of the objects. An object that sinks back into the past undergoes, according to this view, continuous modifications.

In the early 1890s Brentano modifies his views again, suggesting that the temporal modification is not a modification of the content, but of the attitude of acknowledgement in judgments. With this change, Brentano avoids problems of his earlier view: he no longer needs to suggest that temporal modifications are parts of the intentional objects that are given in original associations, nor does he need to explain how the real, present object can form a continuum with the past objects that are not real.

In later years, Brentano makes further changes to his theory of time-consciousness. Since temporal modifications can be observed also in mental phenomena that do not contain a judgment (for example when one imagines vividly hearing a melody), he gives up his view that two presentations can differ only in their intentional object and allows for modes of presentation – such as temporal modes. Finally, in a late manuscript that was dictated in 1915, Brentano introduces another minor modification of his theory, suggesting that past objects can be presented only in modo obliquo, while present objects are presented in modo recto.

Brentano’s reflections on time-consciousness illustrate very well his way of doing philosophy, but also the way in which his views have had an influence on others. As Oskar Kraus notes in his Recollections (cf. Kraus 1919, 39), Brentano has vividly engaged with the problem of time and the origins of time consciousness throughout his life. He presented it several times to students in class and discussed i in letters with colleagues at different moments in time. He never presented a systematic exposition of his views in publication, though. As a result, Brentano’s views on the topic were very dynamic, as he did not hesitate to revise them when he encountered problems or when changes in other parts of his overall theory made it necessary. As he never published a systematic statement of his views on time-consciousness, interested scholars could learn about it only from the expositions of Brentano’s students like Carl Stumpf, Anton Marty, and in particular Edmund Husserl who, however, used Brentano’s views as departing point for their own reflections, very often in an attempt to overcome the difficulties inherent to the version of Brentano’s theory they were acquainted with. Brentano’s own views were, thus, very influential, but risked to become eclipsed by the contributions of his students, who further developed them.

4. Logic, Ethics, and Aesthetics

According to Brentano, psychology plays a central role in the sciences; he considers especially logics, ethics, and aesthetics as practical disciplines that depend on psychology as their theoretical foundation. He collocates these three disciplines in his larger systematic outlook by tying them to the three kinds of mental phenomenon: presentations, judgments, and phenomena of love and hate, i.e., emotions. The “triad of the Beautiful, the True, and the Good ... [is] related to the three aspects of our mental life” (PES, 203). Moreover, the three disciplines essentially build on his views that presentations are intrinsically valuable and that not only judgments, but also emotions can be correct or not correct.

Logic, according to Brentano, is the practical discipline that is concerned with judgments; i.e. with the class of mental phenomena in which we take a positive or a negative stance towards the (existence of the) object by affirming or denying it. In addition, judgments are correct or not; they have a truth-value. According to Brentano, a judgment is true when it is evident, i.e., when one perceives (in inner perception that is directed towards the judgment) that one judges with evidence. Brentano, thus, rejects the correspondence theory of truth, suggesting that “a person judges truly, if and only if, his judgment agrees with the judgment he would make if we were to judge with evidence” (Chisholm 1986, 38). Notwithstanding this dependence on the notion of judgment, however, truth, for Brentano, is not a subjective notion: if one person affirms an object and another person denies the same object, only one of them judges correctly. (For a more detailed discussion of Brentano’s contributions to logic, cf. the entry Brentano’s Theory of Judgement.)

Ethics, on the other hand, is concerned with emotions or, as Brentano calls them, phenomena of love and hate. Brentano sees a structural analogy between judgments and phenomena of this class: just like judgments, that are either affirmative or negative, also emotions consist in taking a positive or a negative (emotional) attitude towards an object: love or hate, inclination and disinclination, being pleased and being displeased, etc. Moreover, just as (positive and negative) judgments can be correct or incorrect, Brentano holds that also (both positive and negative) emotions can be correct or incorrect. An emotion is correct, according to Brentano, “when one’s feelings are adequate to their object — adequate in the sense of being appropriate, suitable, or fitting” (ORW, 70). [“Wer richtig liebt und haßt, dessen Gemüt verhält sich den Gegenständen adäquat, d.h. es verhält sich konvenient, passend, entsprechend” (USE, 76)]

If it is correct to love an object, we can say that it is good; if it is correct to hate it, it is bad:

“We call a thing true when the affirmation relating to it is correct. We call a thing good when the love relating to it is correct. In the broadest sense of the term, the good is that which is worthy of love, that which can be loved with a love that is correct.” (ORW, 18)
[“Wir nennen etwas Wahr, wenn die darauf bezügliche Anerkennung richtig ist. Wir nennen etwas gut, wenn die darauf bezügliche Liebe richtig ist. Das mit richtiger Liebe zu Liebende, das Liebenswerte, ist das Gute im weitesten Sinne des Wortes.” (USE 17)]

Not any experience of pleasure is taken into consideration, one needs some sort of evidence that the pleasure is correct. Brentano characterizes the relevant form of pleasure with the following words: “it is a pleasure of the highest form; it is thus the analogue of something being evident in the sphere of judgment” (ORW, 22) [“Es ist ein Gefallen von jener höheren Form die das Analogon ist von der Evidenz auf dem Gebiet des Urteils” (USE 21)]. In this way Brentano avoids a subjectivist position. While it is true that correct pleasure is an emotion experienced by subjects, it is impossible that one person can evidently and correctly love an object and another correctly and evidently hate it. In some cases, pleasure or love might be misguided by our prejudices, instincts or habits.

Brentano presented his reflections on ethics in a lecture in 1889. The manuscript was published as a short monograph in the same year, an English translation had appeared as early as 1902 and was, for a long time, the only text by Brentano available in English. This might explain why Brentano’s views on ethics have received more attention in English speaking countries than in central Europe. In particular, Brentano’s basic insight that moral and aesthetic value are related to attitudes we take towards objects and that these latter attitudes can be correct or incorrect, have had a revival in recent years, as it has inspired fitting attitude theories of value.

Aesthetics, finally, is based on the most basic class of mental phenomena: on presentations. According to Brentano, every presentation is in itself of value; this holds even for those that become the basis of a correct, negative judgment or emotion.

“Every presentation, taken by itself, is a good and recognizable as such, since an emotion that is characterized as being correct can be directed towards it. It is out of question that everyone, if they had to choose between a state of unconsciousness and the having of any presentation whatsoever, would welcome even the poorest presentation and would not envy lifeless objects. Every presentation appears of value in that it constitutes a valuable enrichment of life.” (GA, 144 [my translation])
[“Jedes Vorstellen ist aber, an und für sich betrachtet, ein Gut und als solches erkennbar, weil sich eine als richtig charakterisierte Gemütstätigkeit darauf richten kann. Ohne Frage würde jedermann, wenn er zwischen dem Zustand der Bewußtlosigkeit und dem Besitz irgendwelcher Vorstellungen zu wählen hätte, auch die ärmlichste begrüßen und die leblosen Dinge nicht beneiden. Jede Vorstellung erscheint als eine Bereicherung des Lebens von Wert.” (GA, 144)]

Thus, while judgments and emotions consist in taking either a positive or a negative stance, the value of a presentation is always positive, but comes in degrees: some presentations are of higher value than others. Not every presentations is of particular aesthetic value, though; in order to be so, it has to become the object of an emotion in which one correctly takes a positive stance towards it. In short, according to Brentano, an object is beautiful if a presentation that is directed at it arouses a correct, positive emotion, i.e., a form of pleasure; it is ugly, on the other hand, if a presentation that is directed at it arouses a correct, negative emotion, a form of displeasure.

Like secondary qualities, the aesthetic value is not an intrinsic property of the object but rather depends on the way we experience it. We tend to attribute beauty to the objects of experience, but strictly speaking, the experienced objects are neither beautiful nor ugly:

“When we call a girl beautiful, the term is used in a figurative sense. It is similar when we call objects that are outside of us green, red, warm, cold, sweet, bitter. All these expressions refer initially to what appears, and are then also transferred to that which possibly evokes in us this appearance by having an impact on us.” (GA 123 [my translation])
[“Wenn wir ein Mädchen schön nennen, so wird der Name in übertragenem Sinn gebraucht. Es ist ähnlich, wie wenn wir Körper, die außer uns sind, grün, rot, warm, kalt, heiß, biter nennen. Alle diese Ausdrücke bezeichnen zunächst das, was erscheint, werden dann auch auf solches übertragen, was unter Umständen auf uns einwirkend diese Erscheinungen hervorruft.” (GA 123)]

Even though Brentano’s views on ethics and aesthetics are somewhat sketchy and not worked out in detail, we can note that his treatment of the three practical disciplines of logics, ethics, and aesthetics are unified by a common principle: the idea that judgments or emotions not only can be positive or negative, they can also be fitting or appropriate to their object. Moreover, by tying the three disciplines to his tripartition of mental phenomena (presentations, judgments, emotions), he also assigns them an exact collocation in his overall philosophical system. For these reasons, recent commentators have insisted in the systematicity of Brentano’s philosophy, arguing that he “was the last philosopher to have offered a system in the sense of a structurally unified account of the true, the good, and the beautiful.” (Kriegel 2017a, 29). Kriegel acknowledges, however, that “Brentano was not a systematic writer” (ibid., 21). This shows in the fact that Brentano saw his task mainly in sketching the basic views on aesthetics and ethics in lectures, but never presented a longer or systematic treatise of these topics, which can be explained by his conviction that science was a collective enterprise and by his aversion of the cult of the genius that was widespread in his times. Brentano probably hoped that others would continue to work out the details within the parameters he had set. We know about his views on aesthetics and ethics only from lecture notes that have been cut, revised, and amended by his students, who typically did not bother to document their substantial editorial changes in the published text. Moreover, Brentano never presented his philosophical position as a system, probably because he did not want to be associated with German system philosophers of the early and mid-nineteenth century. Thus, the claim that Brentano was a system-philosopher is somewhat questionable, though he definitely was a systematic thinker in the sense that he always kept the overall picture in mind when working on a specific problem.

5. Psychologism and the Historiography of Philosophy

The discussion of Brentano’s views on logic, ethics and aesthetics shows that his philosophy has strong psychologistic tendencies. Whether or not one is to conclude that he does adopt a form of psychologism depends on the exact definition of the latter term: Brentano vehemently rejects the charge of psychologism, which he takes to stand for a subjectivist and anthropocentric position. At the same time, however, he explicitly defends the claim that psychology is the theoretical science on which practical disciplines of logic, ethics, and aesthetics are based. In LW he explicitly notes that, like all other philosophical disciplines, also aesthetics is rooted in psychology and continues: “And similarly one could show for aesthetics and any other philosophical discipline that separated from psychology it would have to wither like a branch that is detached from the trunk.” (LW, 39 [my translation]) [“Und ähnlich ließe sich für die Aesthetik und jede andere Disciplin der Philosophie aufs leichteste nachweisen, daß sie, losgetrennt von der Psychologie, wie ein vom Stamm losgetrennter Zweig verdorren müsste.”] Hence, Brentano does adopt the form of psychologism Husserl seems to have had in mind in the Prolegomena to his Logical Investigations, where he defines logical psychologism as a position according to which:

… [T]he essential theoretical foundations of logic lie in psychology, in whose field those propositions belong — as far as their theoretical content is concerned — which give logic its characteristic pattern. … Often people talk as if psychology provided the sole, sufficient, theoretical foundation for logical psychology (Husserl 2001, 40).
[Die wesentlichen theoretischen Fundamente liegen in der Psychologie; in deren Gebiet gehören ihrem theoretischen Gehalt nach die Sätze, die der Logik ihr charakteristisches Gepräge geben. … Ja nicht selten spricht man so, als gäbe die Psychologie das alleinige und ausreichende theoretische Fundament für die logische Kunstlehre. (Husserl, 1900, 51)]

Brentano’s tendency to offer psychological explanations is shown also in his approach to the history of philosophy, in particular in his explanations of the mechanisms that explain the historical development in this discipline. In his text The Four Phases of Philosophy and Its Current State (1998) he defended the metaphilosophical thesis that progress in philosophy can be explained according to principles of cultural psychology. According to Brentano, philosophical progress takes place in circles. He divides the whole history of philosophy in three periods (ancient, medieval, and modern philosophy), each of which can, according to him, be subdivided in four phases. The first is a creative phase of renewal and ascending development; the other three are phases of decline, dominated by a turn towards practical interests, by scepticism, and finally by mysticism. After the fourth phase, a new period begins with a creative phase of renewal.

Brentano has presented his model to a larger audience quite late in his life, but he had come up with it very early in his career; Carl Stumpf reports that Brentano first came up with this idea in 1860 and that he used it in his lectures on the history of philosophy already in Würzburg in the mid-sixties (cf. Stumpf 1919, 89f). While both the historical accuracy of and the principles of cultural psychology that gave rise to the model can be put in question (cf. Gilson 1976), it definitely tells the reader much about Brentano’s conception of philosophy and his vivid interest in its history. Brentano’s short text can, thus, best be read as a simplifying narrative that allows the author to explain his conviction that philosophy ought to pursue of pure, theoretical interests and to express his fascination for philosophers like Aristotle, Thomas, or Descartes as well as his dislike of Plotinus, Nicolas of Cues, Kant, Hegel, and Schelling.

6. Brentano’s Metaphysics

Even though Brentano worked on problems in metaphysics and ontology throughout his life, he hardly published on these topics during his lifetime. The impact of his views is due to the fact that from his early lectures at the University of Würzburg on he discussed them with his students, both in class and (especially in later years) in correspondence.

Even though Brentano’s views have underwent considerable changes over the years, his general attitude can be characterized as sober, parsimonious, and (in the current use of the term) nominalistic; at no point did he admit the existence of universals, he rather relied on mereological principles to account for classical problems in ontology.

Brentano’s early metaphysics, which is the result of his critical reading of Aristotle, is a form of conceptualism. He does distinguish between substance and accidents, but argues that both are but fictions cum fundamentum in re. With this, he wants to suggest that they do not have actual existence, but that we can make judgments about real things that are correct and contain references to substances and accidents. This view is closely connected to his epistemic notion of truth, according to which the question of whether a judgment is true does not depend on its corresponding to reality, but rather on whether it can be judged with evidence. Brentano elucidates the relation between a thing and its properties on the basis of the mereological notions of “logical part” and “metaphysical part,” the former of which account for abstract, repeatable properties, the latter for the concrete properties of a thing. Both are not considered to be denizens of reality in a narrow sense, but rather fictions that have a foundation in reality. (For a reconstruction and discussion of the details of Brentano’s early ontology, cf. Chrudzimski 2004).

After the introduction of the notion of intentionality in his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874), Brentano struggled to account for the ontological status of the intentional object. When he first introduces the notion, suggesting, as we have seen above, that “[e]very mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself” (PES, 88), he seems to be interested primarily in presenting a psychological thesis and does not seem to be overly worried with its ontological implications; at this point, the talk of an “immanent object” might have been a mere façon de parler(cf. Chrudzimski and Smith, 2003, 205). Soon Brentano finds himself in the need, however, to address this question and, as a result, to enrich the domain of objects in his ontology. He seems to admit that next to concrete things there are irrealia, that is, objects that to not really exist but have the status of thought-objects or, as he puts it, entia rationis, that do not have an essence and do not stand in causal relations. Brentano does not systematically elaborate his ontological position in this period, we rather find a bundle of ideas of which he did not seem to be fully convinced. This underlines that the formulation of these views was not made with the intention to make a contribution to ontology, but rather to reply to concerns that have emerged from his introduction of the notion of intentionality.

In his late philosophy, from 1904 on, Brentano rediscovers the virtue of ontological parsimony and takes up the main insights of his conceptualist period, developing (and radicalizing) them to a form of reism, according to which the only items that exist are individual things (res). “While young Brentano tried to ontologically play down certain ways of speaking, late Brentano tried to eliminate them from philosophical discourse” (Chrudzimski 2004, 177) [my translation. “Der junge Brentano versuchte gewisse Redeweisen ontologisch zu bagatellisieren, der späte Brentano versuchte sie aus dem philosophischen Diskurs zu eliminieren”] . He abandons the notion of irrealia, which he now regards as linguistic fictions, and continues to deny the existence of universals or abstract entities. Instead, he conceives both substances and accidents as real things that are related to one another by a particular mereological relation: an accident does not only ontologically depend on the substance, it also contains the substance as a part without, however, containing any supplementary part. A white table, accordingly, is an accident that contains the table as a part. If we were to paint it red, the white table would cease to exist and the red table would come into existence – the continuity between the two being guaranteed by the table, which was part of the white table and is now part of the red table.

Brentano’s ontology is known to a broader audience only through posthumously published works that were edited by his late students Oskar Kraus and Alfred Kastil, who considered his late position most important and accordingly put less emphasis on Brentano’s earlier phases. Only recently the development of Brentano’s views on ontology has gained more attention, mainly through the work of scholars who were able to study unpublished manuscripts in the archives (cf., for example, Chrudzimski 2004). This underlines once more the need of a critical edition of Brentano’s entire Nachlass, which would make it possible for a broader audience to critically assess the development of Brentano’s views in ontology.

7. The Impact of Brentano’s Philosophy

7.1 Early Reception: The Brentano School

Brentano’s contributions to philosophy were widely discussed among philosophers and psychologists at the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth century. Moreover, he had a strong impact on an impressive number of students who became famous philosophers on their own right. Often, these philosophers are referred to as the “School of Franz Brentano,” (cf. Albertazzi 1996) in order to underline that all of them drew explicitly (and when not explicitly, then recognizably) on Brentano’s work. All members of the school have become acquainted with Brentano’s philosophy in his lectures or through conversation or correspondence with him, but they form a quite heterogeneous group that did not make attempts to jointly develop a shared position: there was no general acceptance of a specific unifying doctrine of the “School”, nor did its members make attempts to unite forces and cooperate on specific projects. What unites the School is a vivid interests in the topics that Brentano discussed in his lectures, first and foremost in psychology and in the idea that philosophy should adopt a rigorous, scientific method (cf. Dewalque 2017a, b). In fact, it was Brentano’s methodological maxim that has raised the interest in most members of the school in the first place, cf., for example, Stumpf (1919) and Husserl (1919), both of who suggest that Brentano’s conception of philosophy as a rigorous science had a decisive impact on their decision to pursue a professional career in philosophy.

Brentano’s influence on students has seen different phases that are loosely connected to the places where he taught. In his early years in Würzburg (1866–1873), Brentano became noted mainly for his attempt to renew philosophy on the basis of a rigorous, scientific method. His most important students at the time, Carl Stumpf and Anton Marty, made a significant academic career in their own right. As Brentano was not yet appointed professor and could, in consequence, not yet supervise PhD theses, both completed their PhD with Lotze in Göttingen. Stumpf then held positions in Prague, Halle, Munich, and Berlin, where he founded a psychological laboratory and gave decisive impulses for the development of Gestalt psychology. Anton Marty became professor at the University of Prague and had a strong influence with his work on the philosophy of language. Both Stumpf and Marty developed their own positions and deviated locally from Brentano’s views, but they remained faithful followers who continued to acknowledge the influence that Brentano has had on them.

When Brentano took up teaching at the University of Vienna in 1874, his lectures soon became very popular among students. In the first years, Thomas Masaryk (who later became the first president of the Czechoslovakia), Alexius Meinong, Alois Höfler, and Christian von Ehrenfels attended Brentano’s lectures. In the years after 1880 (when Brentano had lost his chair and was teaching as Privatdozent, which meant that he could no longer supervise PhD theses) Franz Hillebrand, Edmund Husserl, and Kazimierz Twardowski studied with him. Unlike Stumpf or Marty, Brentano’s students in Vienna encountered a mature professor who had his opus maximum already published. Their relation to Brentano, in consequence, was less that of a friendship, and more that between a student and a renowned professor. Soon many of them have felt the urge to overcome Brentano’s influence and define their own, independent philosophical position – and possibly form a school in their own right. In particular Meinong and Husserl, who are probably the most famous representants of Brentano’s school, came to have a rather troublesome relation to their former teacher. It is not by accident that both used the term “Brentano School” only to distance themselves from it.

In 1895, when Brentano gave up his position as Privatdozent in Vienna and moved to Florence, he gave up teaching and could no longer exert a direct influence on students. In this period, the center of the Brentano school moved to Prague, where Anton Marty held regular meetings with interested students, among them Oskar Kraus and Alfred Kastil. These second-generation members of the Brentano school – who are often called “Brentanoten” or “orthodox Brentanists” – stayed very faithful to Brentano’s philosophy, (in particular to his last, reistic phase that they knew first-hand). They saw it as their main task to preserve Brentano’s view and to defend them against the developments introduced by Husserl and the early phenomenologists as well as those introduced by Meinong and other members of the Graz School, respectively. After Brentano’s death in 1917, they tried to set up and archive for Brentano’s Nachlass and publish texts from it posthumously. While in the first years they achieved considerable results, not at least due to the help of the Czech president Jan Masaryk, the German invasion of Czechoslovakia in 1938 forced them into emigration and so brought an end to the Brentano School.

7.2 Recent Reception: Rediscovering Brentano

Brentano’s impact in a larger philosophical audience was soon eclipsed by that of his students who founded philosophical traditions on their own: Husserl started the phenomenological movement, Meinong the Graz school, Twardowski the Lvov-Warsaw School. As a result, in the second half of the twentieth century Brentano was often mentioned as the philosopher who had (re-)introduced the notion of intentionality, as “grandfather” of the phenomenological movement, or for his influence on early analytic philosophy, but his own philosophical views and arguments were hardly discussed.

There are notable exceptions to this tendency, though. Roderick Chisholm, for example, made a continuous effort to show Brentano’s significance to contemporary philosophy by adopting his results in his own contributions to the philosophy of mind, but also in presentations of various aspects of Brentano’s thought (cf. Chisholm 1966, 1982, and 1986). Moreover, in recent decades the tradition that is often referred to as “Austrian philosophy” has gained increasing interest in a broader philosophical audience, which is due mainly to the work of Rudolf Haller, Barry Smith, Peter Simons, and Kevin Mulligan, among others. By showing the systematic relevance of Brentano’s (and other Austrian philosophers’) contributions to problems discussed in ontology, logic, the theory of emotions, or consciousness, they could counteract the tendency to reduce Brentano’s contributions to the introduction of the notion of intentionality.

It is quite interesting to note, however, that in the last two decades the philosophical contributions of Brentano have gained a new life as an increasing number of philosophers from different fields are rediscovering and elaborating on different themes from Brentano’s work. His contributions to the philosophy of mind have been taken up and play a central role in the debate concerning the nature of consciousness and the relation between consciousness and intentionality, the unity of consciousness and time-consciousness; his views on ethics have been inspired fitting attitude theories of value, which analyze ethical value in terms of correct or incorrect forms of approval or disapproval. Moreover, the recent centenary of Brentano’s death (2017) has given occasion to a number of conferences and publications that put Brentano’s contribution at the center of attention (cf., for example, Kriegel 2017). This shows that the interest in Brentano’s systematic contribution to philosophy is still strong and vivid.


Works by Brentano

Abbreviations for Works Cited

DP Descriptive Psychology
GA Grundzüge der Ästhetik
LW Meine letzten Wünsche für Österreich
ORW The Origin of the Knowledge of Right and Wrong
PES Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint / Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt
USE Vom Ursprung sittlicher Erkenntnis
ZP Über die Zukunft der Philosophie – quoted from the 1929 ed.

Works (in German)

  • Die Abkehr vom Nichtrealen. Briefe und Abhandlungen aus dem Nachlass, ed. by F. Mayer-Hillebrand, Bern: Francke, 1952.
  • Aristoteles Lehre vom Ursprung des menschlichen Geistes, Leipzig: Veit & comp., 1911 [Available online] (2nd ed., intr. by Rolf George, Hamburg: Meiner, 1980).
  • Aristoteles und seine Weltanschauung, Leipzig: Quelle & Meyer, 1911 [Available online] (2nd ed., intr. by Rolf George, Hamburg: Meiner 1977).
  • Briefe an Carl Stumpf 1867–1917, ed. by Gerhard Oberkofler, Graz: Akademische Drucks- und Verlagsanstalt, 1989.
  • Deskriptive Psychologie, ed. by R. Chisholm and W. Baumgartner, Hamburg: Meiner, 1982.
  • Das Genie, Leipzig: Dunker und Humblot, 1892. [Available online]
  • Geschichte der griechischen Philosophie, ed. by Franziska Mayer-Hillebrand. Bern: Francke, 1963.
  • Geschichte der mittelalterlichen Philosophie im christlichen Abendland, ed. by Klaus Hedwig, Hamburg: Meiner, 1980.
  • Geschichte der Philosophie der Neuzeit, ed. by Klaus Hedwig, Hamburg: Meiner, 1987.
  • Grundlegung und Aufbau der Ethik, ed. by Franziska Mayer-Hillebrand, Bern: Francke, 1956.
  • Grundzüge der Ästhetik, ed. by Franziska Mayer-Hillebrand, Bern: Francke, 1959.
  • Kategorienlehre, ed. by Alfred Kastil. Leipzig: Meiner, 1933.
  • Die Lehre vom richtigen Urteil, ed. by Franziska Mayer-Hillebrand, Bern: Francke, 1956.
  • Meine letzten Wünsche für Österreich, Stuttgart: Cotta, 1895. [Available online]
  • Philosophische Untersuchungen zu Raum, Zeit und Kontinuum, ed. by Stephan Körner and Roderick Chisholm, Hamburg: Meiner, 1976.
  • Die Psychologie des Aristoteles, insbesondere seine Lehre vom Nous Poietikos, Mainz: Verlag von Franz Kirchheim, 1867. [Available online]
  • Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt, Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1874. [Available online]; (2nd, enl. ed. by Oskar Kraus, 1924, Leipzig: Meiner).
  • Religion und Philosophie, ed. by Franziska Mayer Hillebrand, Bern: Francke, 1954.
  • Das Schlechte als Gegenstand dichterischer Dastellung, Leipzig: & Humblot, 1892. [Available online]
  • Über Aristoteles, ed. by Rolf George, Hamburg: Meiner, 1986.
  • Über die Zukunft der Philosophie, Wien: Hölder, 1893. [Available online]. Reprinted in: Über die Zukunft der Philosophie, ed. by Oskar Kraus, Leipzig: Meiner 1929; 2nd edition, intr. by Paul Weingartner, Hamburg: Meiner, 1968.
  • Über Ernst Machs “Erkenntnis und Irrtum”, ed. by Roderick Chisholm and Johann Marek, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1988.
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  • Vom Dasein Gottes, ed. by Alfred Kastil, Leipzig: Meiner, 1929.
  • Vom sinnlichen und noetischen Bewußtsein, (Psychologie vom empirischen Standpukt, vol. 3), ed. by Oskar Kraus, Leipzig: Meiner, 1928.
  • Vom Ursprung sittlicher Erkenntnis, Leipzig: Dunker & Humblot, 1889 [Available online], (2nd. ed. by Oskar Kraus, Hamburg: Meiner 1921).
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Works (English Translations)

  • Aristotle and His World View, transl. by R. George and R.M. Chisholm. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1978.
  • Descriptive Psychology, transl. by Benito Müller, London: Routledge, 1995.
  • The Foundation and Construction of Ethics, transl. by Elizabeth Schneewind, New York: Humanities Press, 1973.
  • “The Four Phases of Philosophy and Its Current State”, B. Mezei and B. Smith (eds.) The Four Phases of Philosophy, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1998.
  • On the Existence of God, transl. by Susan Krantz, Dordrecht: Nijhoff, 1987.
  • On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle, transl. by Rolf George, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1975.
  • The Origin of the Knowledge of Right and Wrong, transl. by Cecil Hague, Westminster: Archibald Constable, 1902 [Available online], (2nd transl. The Origin of Our Knowledge of Right and Wrong, by Roderick Chisholm and Elizabeth Schneewind, London: Routledge, 1969).
  • Philosophical Investigations on Space, Time, and the Continuum, transl. by Barry Smith, London, New York: Croom Helm, 1988.
  • Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, transl. by A.C. Rancurello, D.B. Terrell, and L. McAlister, London: Routledge, 1973. (2nd ed., intr. by Peter Simons, 1995).
  • The Psychology of Aristotle, transl. by Rolf George. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1977.
  • Sensory and Noetic Consciousness. Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint III, transl. by M. Schättle and L. McAlister. London: Routledge, 1981.
  • The Theory of Categories, transl. by Roderick Chisholm and Norbert Guterman, The Hague: Nijhoff, 1981.
  • The True and the Evident, transl. by Roderick Chisholm, Ilse Politzer, and Kurt Fischer. London: Routledge, 1966.

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