Supplement to Gilbert Ryle

Some Problems in Contemporary Work on Knowing-How and Knowing-That

Ryle’s work, and in particular his arguments against “The Intellectualist Legend”, have garnered a great deal of attention in the past 20 years by epistemologists. The purpose of this (necessarily brief) section is to sound a warning about how this work, insofar as it is attributed to Ryle, has mis-appropriated, if not misunderstood, him. It ignores (among other things) most of the arguments in The Concept of Mind and in his Philosophical Papers about the use of mental conduct concepts, Ryle’s admonition against the ‘cargo-content’ model of thoughts, his antipathy toward Propositions or Meanings, and the elasticities of significance of most, if not all, natural language expressions. The discussion here presupposes some familiarity with the contemporary literature, and note, first, that re-framing Ryle’s arguments against the Intellectualist by presupposing mental representations or content-bearing, causally efficacious mental states surreptitiously reintroduces the very difficulties the introduction of ‘know-how’ was meant to solve. Second, unless they are used in a special sense (as does Ryle), the English expressions ‘know-how’ and ‘know-that’ cannot be said to pick out or refer to anything, a fortiori to different ‘states of knowledge’.

1. It has become commonplace to assume that thinking involves the grasp of Propositions or ‘propositional content’ (whatever that may turn out to be): for what else are the ‘accusatives’ of acts of thinking specified by an indicative sentence in a ‘that’-clause?[15] But in one of his earliest essays, Ryle argues that it is pointless to construe what is thought or meant as substantial Propositions or other “denizen of the realm of Platonized ‘that-clauses’” (Ryle, 1930b, 34). He has several arguments against these supposed objects of thought, which should be a concern for any theory of representational ideas: Lockean or Fodorian.[16] We concentrate here on the regress argument.

When evaluating Ryle’s claim against the Intellectualist that “there are many activities which directly display qualities of mind which are neither intellectual operations nor yet effects of intellectual operations”, we should ask ourselves, first, what counts for Ryle as an intellectual operation or its effects. Calculating, rehearsing lessons one has been taught, following instructions such as recipes, maps, or other ‘rules’, broadly speaking, are among the examples he uses. But since calculating, rehearsing lessons, following instructions, commands, or ‘rules,’ are themselves achievements, admit of error, often need correction, and are mastered by practice, skill, or drill —in short, they require intelligence—the Intellectualist has simply pushed back the problem and not resolved it by invoking these operations. And merely to push the problem back without resolving it is tantamount to admitting that the putative explanation fails.

But what if these rules are preconscious and their operations tacit or implicit? If this simply means that we no longer need to rehearse the lessons we have learned because, as a result of training and practice, we now know how to act in accordance with them and are on the alert to correct our errors and those of others, or to justify our actions in the light of the lessons we have learned, and so on, this would be one thing. For the following of rules will eventually culminate in knowing how to act or in acting in accordance with a practice—“I have been trained to react to this sign in a particular way, and now I do so react to it” (Wittgenstein 1953, §198). That is to say, having mastered a particular skill (say), we will be able to act in accordance with instructions (say), without having to go through the procedure of making sense of them, of understanding how they are to apply in the present situation, and of succeeding in acting as they prescribe. But if these successful operations are supposed to occur via some sort of preconscious ‘mental mechanism’ or ‘rational causation’ then what explains their success is left mysterious.

We do not need to go so far as to consider the ‘operations’, for we have the same difficulty accounting for the success of the posited ‘mental states’ or (more recently) ‘states of intelligence’ which are alleged to figure in these operations. Consider, for example, the relation between the ‘mental state’ and its supposed content. It does not matter if this is ‘apprehending’ (Frege, 1956), ‘latching onto’ or ‘epistemically engaging with’ (see, for example, Bengson and Moffett, 2012), or ‘entertaining under a particular mode of presentation’ (Stanley and Williamson 2001), and so on. We still must ask whether the (alleged) content is ‘apprehended’, ‘engaged with’, ‘latched onto’, or ‘entertained’ properly, reasonably, or ‘under the correct mode’. Attempting to conceal or halt the regress at any point once these entities and their operations are introduced—by, for example, suggesting that an ‘intelligent state’ is ‘triggered’, ‘deployed’, ‘applied’ or ‘utilized’ appropriately but not intelligently (see Bengson & Moffett, 29 ), or that “behavior can be informed in a non-deliberative way by propositional attitude states” (Stanley, 2011b, 19, italics added)—even if this strategy made sense—invites the question why these theoretical posits and their operations are needed in the first place when they fail to explain what they were introduced to explain. But this strategy does not make sense. The merit of understanding propositions as grammarians do, as statements, inscriptions, or what we “think and talk in” (Ryle, 1930b, 39), is that we can specify what would count in particular circumstances as following a rule or acting in accordance with it, and, most importantly, what would count as evidence either way. In any case, once the (undiscoverable) supposed rational process is mechanized, we should wonder whether our subject matter really is that of thinking. For, daydreams presumably aside, “[thought] is not something that just happens to us and in us, like digestion. It is something that we do, and do well or badly, carefully or carelessly, expertly or amateurishly.” Ryle (1965, 161)[17]

In sum, Ryle does indeed deny that intelligence requires the apprehension of truths, that it requires specific internal acts, and that practical activities merit the description ‘intelligent’, ‘clever’, and so on only because they are accompanied by some such ostensibly internal acts. But this cannot be reinterpreted on Ryle’s behalf as an argument against the view that “internal, non-overt, mental states of grasping propositions are… to make the difference between the Intelligent and the non-Intelligent” (Bengson and Moffett, 2012, 6–7).[18] The dispute between the Intellectualist and his adversaries cannot invoke propositional attitude states or mental representations without begging the question against Ryle at the outset.

2. Ryle puts his regress argument in a memorable way by saying that knowing-how is logically prior to knowing-that, making clear in the context what he means by ‘knowledge-that’ (viz. the consideration of regulative propositions, such as recipes or other instructions, in order to guide one’s actions) and ‘knowledge-how’ (viz. the ability to act intelligently without consideration of such maxims.) But these catchy phrases have been reintroduced in contemporary debates as “two types of knowledge” and great energy is expended attempting to glean how they, together with knowledge-when, where, what, etc., are used in snippets of ordinary discourse in order to theorize about ‘nature’ of these types of knowledge—that which the expressions are alleged to pick out.

But these, like most natural language expressions, are not names: they do not pick out or refer to anything. They are more akin to tools, employed for various purposes, with different situation-dependent inflections of meaning and, indeed, interchangeable in many contexts. My puppy, Rasteau, has learned, within a few days, to sit and stay when commanded. Does he know that he should sit down when commanded? But is that not what I just said—in other words? Does he know how to sit down when commanded? Yes; did I not say so—using a slightly different expression? Should I attribute to him two kinds of knowledge? The dog?? Yet this ordinary, unremarkable interchangeability of expressions is taken by philosophers to show that ‘factual’ knowledge—understood as the grasp of true propositions—accompanies, or is prior to, abilities acquired by training and drill. Nobody would think, however, to attribute to Rasteau the apprehension of a ‘proposition’ or ‘truth’. Why should this be different for my husband, John? How would the apprehension of a truth, or the grasp of a proposition add to, explain, or elucidate my claim that John knows, for example, how to clean up after the dog? Or that it is his turn? John, unlike Rasteau, has the ability to learn by following diagrams, symbols, propositions written down in books or the instructions I give, and later to teach, and to justify, if needed, the moves he makes in his cleaning-up-after-the-dog practice. Rasteau can follow—through training, drill, reward, and correction—simple commands. Eventually, it is to be hoped, the dog (perhaps even the husband) will engage in these respective behaviors automatically. In Ryle’s technical sense, Rasteau will know how to behave properly. But no one should doubt that Rasteau knows both how to sit and that he should sit when I so command. In natural language, in this context, these say the same thing. Thus, when Ryle contrasts ‘knowledge-that’ and ‘knowledge-how’ he employs the expressions in a technical sense: specially tailored for the particular view he wishes to rebut: viz., that intelligence requires the apprehension of truths, or effects of operations upon them. Attempting to chart the way the expressions figure in ordinary discourse, without acknowledging Ryle’s introduction of a special, technical context when he employs them will get us nowhere.[19] No wonder there is no agreement as to which is logically prior: unless a special use is introduced, they are often ways of saying the same thing.

Copyright © 2021 by
Julia Tanney <>

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