Notes to Gilbert Ryle

1. Anecdotal evidence (thanks to David Pears) is that Elizabeth Anscombe was scathing about The Concept of Mind when it was published. But what of Wittgenstein himself? On the one hand, in his letters he seemed dismissive of Ryle’s work (McGuinness and Von Wright, 284); on the other, he is quoted (Monk, 436) as having told Ryle’s cousin that Ryle was one of only two philosophers who understood his work. (Monk wonders whether this was a matter of mere politesse but there is reason to believe it was not.)

2. Compare Wittgenstein:

The fundamental fact here is that we lay down rules, a technique, for a game, and that then when we follow the rules, things do not turn out as we assumed. That we are therefore entangled in our own rules.

This entanglement in our rules is what we want to understand (i.e. get a clear view of). (Wittgenstein, §125)

3. Compare Wittgenstein: “The preconceived idea of crystalline purity (of logic) can only be removed by turning our whole examination round…The philosophy of logic speaks of sentences and words in exactly the sense in which we speak of them in ordinary life…” (Wittgenstein, §108).

4. Kim describes in clear terms what the problem is and defends a (functional-reductive) version of physicalism as a solution to the problem.

5. Ryle’s arguments against this supposition are in the chapters on Emotion and the Will (1949a). See Tanney 2009a for an attempt to capture the spirit of this critique.

6. The admission that there may be some mental states (as Freud has shown) that are not within the sight of our “mental eye” as such, is a mere variation, rather than a major deviation, Ryle points out, from the basic framework of the Official Doctrine.

7. In contemporary versions, this feature becomes a special mental property which is nonetheless tied (identical to, or realised by) physical properties (which are, in turn, widely supposed to depend upon the microphysical properties of the individuals). See Kim.

8. See Tanney 2009b for further discussion.

9. The qualifier ‘almost’ is needed in order to accommodate the idea that the inner processes are supposed to be content-bearing. Indeed, the category-error reaches its apex with the idea that mental predicates pick out inner, casually-efficacious, (probably at bottom) physical events with semantic or representational content.

10. It is also usually conceded that the project of analysing actions in terms of muscular behaviour is doomed because there will be any number of different physical behaviours that could be involved, say, in an action (like paying a debt) and because identical physical behaviours admit of various action-descriptions.

11. Or, as he also puts it, the Occamist against the Platonist or Cartesian, or the deflators against the inflators.

12. Ryle does, however, want to deny that in imagining, pretending, and dreaming there is something shadowy that we see, hear, taste, smell, or feel (as we would deny, when a mock-murder is staged, that there is something shadowy that is really murdered). Actors who portray murderers do not commit murders with the elusive quality of being shams: they pretend to murder; they seem to murder. Just as stage-murders are not murders, imagined sights and sounds are not sights or sounds. Therefore they are not, as Hume suggested, vivid or less vivid sights or sounds. Nor, thus, are they private.

There is no answer to the spurious question ‘Where have you deposited the victim of your mock-murder?’ since there was no victim. There is no answer to the spurious question, ‘Where do the objects reside that we fancy we see?’ since there are no such objects. (1949a, 237)

13. The extent to which Ryle sides with the (then still unpublished work of) later Wittgenstein in rejecting descendents of Mill’s theory of meaning is most stark in his “scolding” review of Carnap’s Meaning and Necessity which he characterises as “an astonishing blend of technical sophistication with philosophical naïveté” (1949b, 235).

14. Ryle is here, as elsewhere, insisting on the idea that the primary role of certain (significant, affirmative) indicative sentences, even if they can be construed as having truth-values and as fact-stating, is often different. It is partly because of the multiplicity of jobs he accords to sentences in the region of discourses under consideration, but also for other reasons, that it is difficult to locate his position on the map charted by the realists and irrealists. This topic needs much more development, but see Tanney 2008a for additional discussion.

Notes to Supplement on Some Problems in Contemporary Work on Knowing-How and Knowing-That

15. For a recent statement of the doctrine that (it is argued here) Ryle dismisses, consider the opening words of Stanley (2011a, 207): “Propositional knowledge is the knowledge attributed by sentences of the form ‘x knows that p’.”

16. In the Introduction to his seminal The Language of Thought, Fodor (1975, 5) remarks that it is difficult to think of an area of cognitive psychology in which the array of arguments in The Concept of Mind would not apply or in which Ryle does not apply them. If, indeed, it is a mistake to give mechanistic answers to (what Ryle considers instead to be) conceptual questions then, Fodor acknowledges, “I am in trouble”, and spends a great deal of energy responding to them. See Tanney (2011) for an argument that these responses are not successful and for a more in-depth discussion of Ryle’s regress argument. See Tanney (1998) for a detailed criticism of the introduction of mental representations.

17. Ryle’s (1965, 161) discussion begins,

Even though we aim to be as factual or scientific as possible when we start to think about thoughts, perceptions, memories, resolutions and the rest, we still know, so to speak, in our bones that our theories about them, because couched in factual idioms echoing those of chemistry, mechanics, hydraulics or physiology, have inevitably omitted something that is cardinal to their being actions, thoughts, perceptions, memories or resolutions at all. For such theories, couched in such idioms, are necessarily silent about the purposive nature of our doings, thinkings, perceivings, etc. It is essential to them that they merit good, medium or bad marks. In our actions, unlike our mere reactions, either there is success or there is failure, and either dexterity or clumsiness. …Now the same thing is true of thoughts…. Thinking, like fencing and skating, is a consortium of competences and skills. Like them, it has tasks which it may accomplish or may fail to do so. It has room in it, therefore, for high and low degrees of these competences and skills, i.e. of low and high degrees of stupidity and silliness. In our thinking we exercise good, moderate or bad craftsmanship.

18.  For the contrasting view, consider the interpretation of Bengson and Moffett (ibid, 7) of Ryle’s view of Intellectualism as follows:

As suggested by [the] quotation from Ryle [“there are many activities which directly display qualities of mind which are neither intellectual operations nor yet effects of intellectual operations”], intellectualism can be understood as the conjunction of two theses, the first of which concerns the aforementioned states of Intelligence and the second of which concerns the relation between these states and action (the exercise of Intelligence):

[IMIND] A state σ is a state of Intelligence if and only if σ is or involves[…] a certain type of internal state of engaging propositional content.

[IACTION] An individual x exercises a state of Intelligence in performing an action φ (i.e., x φ-s Intelligently) if and only if x φ-s and x has some state σ such that (i) σ is or involves a certain type of internal state of engaging propositional content and (ii) σ is appropriately causally (or otherwise explanatorily[…]) related to the production of φ.

Note also Stanley’s (2011a, 207-208) description of Ryle’s position, introducing the notion of cogntive states:

“According to Gilbert Ryle…knowing how to F is not a species of propositional knowledge. Instead, knowing how is a distinctive kind of non-propositional mental state. On this view, knowing how to find coffee in New York City is a fundamentally different kind of cognitive state from [others Stanley describes]. The latter are propositional knowledge states, whereas the former is not; the fact that it is expressed with the same word is an accident of the English language.”

19. Consider the argument here in relation to Ginet’s (1975, 7) claim (and others, cited in Bengson and Moffett (2012, 22) and Fantl (2017)) that Ryle’s regress does not touch on the possibility that I manifest my knowledge-that in any number of ways without prior theoretical operations.

I exercise (or manifest) my knowledge that one can get the door open by turning the knob and pushing it (as well as my knowledge that there is a door there) by performing that operation quite automatically as I leave the room; and I may do this, of course, without formulating (in my mind or out loud) that proposition or any other relevant proposition.

What is to count as manifesting knowledge-that? Is it that, for example, “[t]he intellectual state—a propositional attitude—is such that it is simply exercised, and its being exercised leads directly (non-Intelligently) to an Intelligent action” (Bengson and Moffett, 2012, p. 22)? It is not clear either what explanatory work this accomplishes, or what would count as evidence for it.  Perhaps Ginet’s example is illustrative instead, as suggested here, of nothing more than the unremarkable interchangeability of these expressions in certain contexts.

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Julia Tanney <>

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