Notes to Sakya Paṇḍita [sa skya paṇ ḍi ta]

1. This summary is necessarily brief and selective. For precision and detail, see Jackson 1987: 15–29 and the sources discussed there, as well as Stearns 2001:159–169.

2. For fuller treatment of the topics in this section, see Dreyfus (1997), Kapstein (2000:85-120), Hugon (2008, 2009, 2014), Stolz (2006, 2008), and Gold (2014).

3. Dreyfus (1997: 173 & 189) cites Gyeltsap and Uyukpa as examples of such false friends.

4. Dreyfus 1997, Tillemans 1999:212ff and Gold 2014. There is evidence of Indian Buddhist moderate realism as well, as Dreyfus (1997: 198) credits Franco 1984 with revealing.

5. Dharmakīrti’s most important arguments in defense of apoha, which Sapaṇ cites at various points in the Treasury, come from the Pramāṇavārttika (Dunne 2004: 113–144). Sapaṇ’s grandfather Sachen Kunga Nyingpo apparently studied all of Dharmakīrti’s seven epistemological treatises except the Pramāṇavārttika with a disciple of Rngog’s (Stearns 2001:136–7).

6. As Hugon (2014: 472–3) notes, Sapaṇ paints his opponents with a broad brush, and there is internal complexity that is of interest but not acknowledged in his work. Hugon also argues that, Sapaṇ’s criticisms and his opponents’ protestations aside, they might be acting on principled reasons in their different approach to Indian sources.

7. Gold (2014: 368). The term “concept” as suggested by Stolz (2008) is adopted here as a felicitous replacement for “meaning generality” as a translation of don spyi. The more literal translation is still useful when delving into Sapaṇ’s terminological analyses.

8. In this section I have largely adopted the translation terms used in Rhoton (2002), but I refer to the systems of vows as “vows” and not “codes”.

9. Ronald Davidson has argued that monastics, who relied upon lay donors, were motivated to keep traditions that constituted their normative character and authority—a social pattern he calls “the economy of previous forms” (Davidson 1995: 290).

10. This list is my combination of two separate lists Sapaṇ provides. The first is at III.432–451 (Rhoton 2002: 152–155) and contains the first eight. They are not numbered, but are treated in separate verses that end with some version of the phrase, “this may be an altering of essentials”. The second is a list of four at III.610–611 (Rhoton 2002: 175). The first and second are repeated versions of (4) and (8) above, and the third and fourth are listed as (9) and (10).

11. This section treats arguments in I.2–58 (Rhoton 2002: 41–48).

12. This practice also applies to other widespread Buddhist vows of the Disciples’ path, such as a one-day abstention (upavāsa).

13. For fear of prolixity, I have started from the middle of Sapaṇ’s argument. His first opponent in fact believes that the Disciples’ vows last beyond a single lifetime just on their own; it is only after he has dispensed with this view that he discusses the case of Disciples’ vows motivated by bodhicitta, the bodhisattva’s altruistic intention.

14. He calls them “common and uncommon vows”.

15. This argument spans almost half of the first chapter (I.59–142, Rhoton 2002: 49–58), which makes it nearly10% of the whole work.

16. The texts he cites include the Uttaratantra, Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, Prajñāpāramitā-sutra, Saṃpuṭatantra, Guhyasamāja-tantra, and Ratnāvalī.

17. If one were to point out that the aspiring bodhisattva who has not yet attained the vision of emptiness still envisions a real object of dedication, Sapaṇ could say that this is the point: If you are dedicating according to Individual Liberation perceptions, your aspirational bodhicitta will never mature into active bodhicitta.

18. III.68–72 (Rhoton 2002: 104–105). This abstract claim is parallel to the idea that the fact that human culture and values are ultimately contingent historical constructions tells you nothing about which cultural practices are best, or which values are consistent or inconsistent with one another.

19. On this argument and the paragraphs that follow, see D. Jackson (1990, 1994, 2015), R. Jackson (1982), van der Kuijp (1986), and Ruegg (1989).

Copyright © 2017 by
Jonathan C. Gold <>

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